Notes to Xunzi

1. For the alternation between the surnames Sun 孫 and Xun 荀, see Knoblock 1988–94: I, 233–39.

2. Sections 2–8 of this entry are based on Goldin 2011: 67–98, with revisions and corrections.

3. For the sake of convenience, such references will follow the chapter and paragraph divisions in Knoblock 1988–94. There is no standard citation system for Xunzi (unlike the Confucian Analects or Mencius). All translations, however, are my own.

4. Another possibility, less likely in my view, is that the sense of xing changed after Mencius, so that by 300 BCE it had come closer to Xunzi’s understanding of it.

5. Note that this word often has a pejorative connotation in Classical Chinese (“forged” or “feigned”). Xunzi’s distinctive usage must have surprised ancient readers.

6. I am indebted to Yuri Pines for encouraging me to expand on this point.

7. For this reason, tian in Xunzi is sometimes construed as akin to natural law and accordingly translated as “nature” or “Nature” (see the evenhanded discussion in Wong 2016: 142–47), but I prefer “Heaven” in order to retain the rhetorical overtones of archaic religion and politics, which postulated a notion of divine-right monarchy by “Heaven’s Mandate” (tianming 天命).

8. In this connection, he is often compared to Émile Durkheim (1858–1917), e.g., by Radcliffe-Brown 1952: 157–60 and Campany 1992. For objections, see Goldin 1999: 64–65 and Robson 2014: 140.

9. Because such paradoxes and their various proposed “solutions” seem straightforwardly reducible to logic problems familiar from Western philosophy, they have received an inordinate degree of attention over the last few decades. The likeliest interpretation of the “white horse” paradox, from a historical point of view, is Harbsmeier 1991.

10. Note that this word is unrelated to li 禮 (ritual), and would not have been confused in Old Chinese.

11. For similar analogies in Guanzi 管子, see “Xinshu shang” 心術上 and “Qichen qizhu” 七臣七主 (Li Xiangfeng 2004: 759 and 988, respectively). The heart-mind is to the person as the lord is to the state.

12. This section is based on Goldin 2007, radically condensed.

13. For the important exception of Ling Tingkan 凌廷堪 (1755–1809), see Chow 1994: 191–97.

Copyright © 2018 by
Paul R. Goldin <>

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