Open Letter to Librarians

Dear Librarian,

In this letter, we'd like to lay out for you the various elements of our funding plan, indicate the endorsements it has received, and offer some reasons why we think you should lend your support to the SEP.

We have also prepared a special document focusing on the question, “Why should libraries at small colleges or public universities support the SEP?

Our Funding Plan

Stanford University has partnered with the International Coalition of Library Consortia (ICOLC) and the Scholarly Publishing and Academic Resources Coalition (SPARC) to implement a new model for ensuring long-term open access to the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (SEP). This model was developed by a committee of representatives from Stanford, ICOLC, and SPARC, and our model was endorsed by the National Endowment for the Humanities (NEH) with a $500,000 matching grant. The main elements of our new model are:

The following table indicates the recommended contribution level for institutions in the U.S. and Canada which offer degrees in Philosophy:

Three Annual Payments of
Philosophy Ph.D. granting institutions $5250
Philosophy M.A. granting institutions $2100
Philosophy B.A. granting institutions $1050

For institutions outside the U.S. and Canada, the ICOLC plan calls for contributions that are appropriately calibrated to local economic conditions. You can find the recommended membership dues for institutions outside the U.S. and Canada on the following SEPIA Dues Schedule.

Those who are curious about why we are not following a more traditional funding model are welcome to read the document The Problem With a Traditional Funding Model, which explains the problem we would face.


The NEH has endorsed this plan by offering our library partners a Challenge Grant. The NEH has contributed $500,000. See the following letter from the Director of the NEH in 2004:

Letter from Bruce Cole, Director, National Endowment for the Humanities

which explains how the SEP's funding model went through a rigorous referee process at the NEH.

Tom Sanville, the Executive Director of OhioLINK and the meetings organizer of the ICOLC wrote:

A Call for ICOLC Initiated Global Community Action (283K PDF document)

which outlines many reasons for library participation in our funding plan.

Finally, many institutions have endorsed our plan directly by their participation. The following institutions have already registered their commitment:

List of Libraries and Other Institutions Which Have Registered Their Support

Since the reasons for library participation in our fund-raising plan are scattered throughout the documents linked in above, we have extracted them and put them into the next section.

Reasons for Library Participation

  1. The SEP has become a "must-have" resource, given how widely its entries are read by students and faculty, and how widely its entries are used in course syllabi at major academic institutions. Even for libraries at smaller academic institutions and public libraries, it is the kind of publication that you would like to have but wouldn't be able to afford if it goes behind a subscription wall.
  2. The SEP has developed a "one-time cost" plan (spread over 3 years), rather than an ongoing payment model. This saves the library money. The suggested contribution for your library depends on which degree in philosophy that it offers and where it is located in the world. The details are spelled out in the ICOLC Call to Action. However, even libraries at institutions without philosophy departments should consider contributing, since you will have constituents who are using the SEP (see item 4 below).
  3. The money that libraries contribute to the SEP will be protected. In particular, should the SEP project ever terminate, the money libraries contribute (minus the processing fee) will be returned together with any unspent interest and appreciation. The contracts which implement this arrangement have been vetted by the NEH, PDC, and the Stanford Director of Planned Giving, and they have been approved by the Stanford Provost and Dean of Research. By contrast, commercial and academic publishers never offer to return money used to obtain access to a publication.
  4. There are students and scholars in other departments at your institution who are using the SEP, and so this is not just a resource for philosophers. (Send us email and we can send you a total number of accesses from your campus during recent academic years.) We hope you will agree that funds for the SEP therefore need not come only from the funds reserved for your philosophy collection purchases.
  5. For libraries that contribute to our funding plan, we will facilitate a simple download of our quarterly archives. (We make quarterly archives so as to have a stable method of citing the content of entries. The dynamic portion of the SEP is always changing, and we don't want users to cite the active versions of the entries. So the quarterly archives hold fixed versions of each entry; the material in them will not change.) Full members of SEPIA will be able to download our archives as a single compressed file. By downloading and storing our quarterly archives, you will not simply be licensing the right to examine the material, but you will be building you collection and thereby playing an important role in archiving scholarly material. (Note: the right to actually serve the archives to your constituents will vest only if the SEP project should ever terminate.)
  6. The SEP will ‘brand’ pages delivered to contributing institutions. Once an institution has registered and paid membership dues to SEPIA, our servers will connect IP addresses from their institution with the institution's domain name, and will deliver a customized "thank you banner".
  7. Contributing libraries get to play a role in keeping the SEP free for everyone — becoming part of the solution to the free-rider problem.
  8. Library contributions will play a role in helping to eliminate the collections crisis that has been created by the high pricing structure of many commercial publishers. Indeed, the SEP has been approached by several big name publishers eager to form a partnership, and if its funding plan is not successful, may find that it must contemplate such a partnership. By joining SEPIA and supporting our funding model, academic librarians can help avoid such an outcome. By helping to make the SEP's funding model a success, contributing libraries will help the SEP to set an example as a model that other humanities publications could use to maintain free access.

How to Contribute

We hope you will be convinced by our summary of the reasons for library participation and that you will examine the following URLs and then register your commitment with SEPIA:

We hope you will choose to join us in this effort!

The SEP Project Members
John Perry, Faculty Sponsor
Edward N. Zalta, Principal Editor
Uri Nodelman, Senior Editor
Colin Allen, Associate Editor