Supplement to Analysis

Ancient Conceptions of Analysis

1. Introduction to Supplement

This supplement provides a brief account of the conceptions of analysis involved in ancient Greek geometry and Plato’s and Aristotle’s philosophies. The aim is not to explore in any detail the intricate conceptual, textual and historical interrelationships but simply to highlight the key features of the relevant methodologies. Central to these methodologies is the regressive conception of analysis, as outlined in §2 of the main document.

Annotated Bibliography, §2.1

2. Ancient Greek Geometry

Immediately after his characterization of the method of analysis and synthesis in his Mathematical Collection (as quoted in §2 of the main document), Pappus goes on:

Now analysis is of two kinds. One seeks the truth, being called theoretical. The other serves to carry out what was desired to do, and this is called problematical. In the theoretical kind we suppose the thing sought as being and as being true, and then we pass through its concomitants (akolouthôn) in order, as though they were true and existent by hypothesis, to something admitted; then, if that which is admitted be true, the thing sought is true, too, and the proof will be the reverse of analysis. But if we come upon something false to admit, the thing sought will be false, too. In the problematic kind we suppose the desired thing to be known, and then we pass through its concomitants (akolouthôn) in order, as though they were true, up to something admitted. If the thing admitted is possible or can be done, that is, if it is what the mathematicians call given, the desired thing will also be possible. The proof will again be the reverse of analysis. But if we come upon something impossible to admit, the problem will also be impossible. [Full Quotation]

According to Pappus, then, a distinction should be drawn between theoretical and problematical analysis, depending on whether we are seeking to demonstrate a theorem (such as Pythagoras’s theorem) or to carry out a construction (such as constructing an equilateral triangle on a given line). This distinction was also stressed by the last of the great classical Greek philosophers, the Neoplatonist Proclus, who wrote a commentary on the first Book of Euclid’s Elements in the fifth century [Quotations]. Geometry, Proclus remarks, “is divided into the working out of problems and the discovery of theorems. It calls “problems” those propositions whose aim is to produce, bring into view, or construct what in a sense does not exist, and “theorems” those whose purpose is to see, identify, and demonstrate the existence or nonexistence of an attribute.” (CEE, 157; cf. 63.) Although Euclid’s ‘Propositions’ do divide into theorems and problems, however, these are complementary, since, for every construction we carry out fulfilling the required conditions, there is a corresponding theorem to be proved demonstrating that the construction has the desired properties, and for every theorem, there will be some associated construction to be made. Pythagoras’s theorem, for example, might be put in ‘problematic’ form thus: “To construct three squares, one on each side of a triangle, such that the square on the longer side is equal to the other two squares.” The analysis required to solve this problem will at the same time provide the material to demonstrate Pythagoras’s theorem itself.

What analysis involves is the finding of appropriate principles, previously proved theorems, and constructional moves by means of which the problem can be solved (the desired figure constructed or the relevant theorem proved). Within Euclidean geometry, the constructional moves must be in accord with the first three postulates (drawing a line between any two points, extending a line and drawing a circle with any given center and radius). Working back to principles (axioms) and previously proved theorems suggests that the regressive conception of analysis reflected in Pappus’s account is indeed central. But it is not the only conception involved in ancient Greek geometrical analysis. The main aim in identifying appropriate principles and previously proved theorems is to reduce the problem set to a number of simpler problems which either have already been solved or can more easily be solved, so that transformation and resolution are also involved. That analysis includes both transformation and resolution has been noted by a number of commentators (see esp. Hankel 1874, 137-50; Heath E, I, 140-2).

The most important feature of ancient Greek geometrical analysis concerns the role played by the construction of figures, and in particular, by the construction of auxiliary lines—lines that are not strictly part of the figures that are mentioned in the specification of the problem but which are essential in arriving at those figures or proving the relevant theorem. Not only does this suggest that analysis is more creative than is usually supposed today (inspiration may be required in coming up with appropriate auxiliary lines), but it also makes the examination of the interrelationships between the various elements of the constructions a crucial part of analysis. This aspect has been stressed by Hintikka and Remes in their classic study of the method of analysis in ancient Greek geometry (1974). Hintikka and Remes distinguish between directional and configurational analysis, corresponding, respectively, to the regressive and decompositional conceptions outlined in the main document (§1.1), and argue that the latter is of far greater importance than the former. This may be overcompensating for the one-sidedness of the ‘directional’ interpretation, but there is no doubt that configurational analysis does play an essential role. Although there is continuing debate as to the nature of analysis in ancient Greek geometry, it is certainly more complex than suggested by Pappus’s classic account. (See especially Knorr 1993, Behboud 1994, Netz 2000.)

A further issue raised by Pappus’s text concerns the problem of reversibility. If we translate the term ‘akolouthôn’ by ‘consequences’, as Heath, for example, does (E, I, 138-9), then it looks as if Pappus conceives analysis and synthesis as deductively symmetrical. We assume ‘what is sought’ and follow through its consequences until we reach something accepted as true, when we reverse the process and derive the consequences of what we reached, in demonstrating the truth of what we sought. But this raises an obvious objection. For if Q is a consequence of P, it does not necessarily follow that P is a consequence of Q; so that deriving the consequences of ‘what is sought’ will not necessarily yield principles that can then be used to prove it. There is normally no backward road from consequents to antecedents.

There are two responses to this. One is to deny that ‘akolouthôn’ is to be understood as ‘consequences’ (in the logical sense) and to interpret it as something more like ‘concomitants’—in the weaker sense of ‘things that go together with one another’. Hintikka and Remes have powerfully argued for this interpretation, pointing out, for example, that Pappus seems to distinguish between ‘akolouthôn’ (‘concomitants’) and ‘epomena’, which does appear to mean ‘consequents’ here (1974, ch. 2; 89-91). The other response is to accept the understanding of ‘akolouthôn’ as ‘consequences’, but to then insist on the reversibility of all the steps (i.e., that what we typically have here are equivalences and not just implications), pointing out that this is precisely why synthesis is also needed, to show that the steps are reversible. These two responses are not necessarily in conflict, however. ‘akolouthôn’ may mean ‘concomitants’ rather than ‘consequences’, but investigating consequences may be one way of finding concomitants that can then be used in a rigorous synthesis. The issue of reversibility was to be a major theme in the history of the regressive conception of analysis.

Annotated Bibliography, §2.2

3. Plato

If one root of modern conceptions of analysis lies in ancient Greek geometry, the other main root lies in the elenctic method followed by the Socrates of Plato’s early dialogues. The term ‘elenctic’ derives from the Greek word ‘elenchein’, meaning to cross-examine or refute, and Socrates’s method consists in asking questions of the form ‘What is F?’, where ‘F’ is typically the name of some virtue, and attempting to find a definition through dialogue with his interlocutors. For example, the question in the Charmides is ‘What is temperance [sôphrosunê]?’, in the Laches ‘What is courage [andreia]?’, in the Euthyphro ‘What is piety [hosiotês]?’, and in the Meno ‘What is virtue [aretê]?’ On the whole, commentators agree that what Socrates is seeking are real rather than nominal definitions, definitions that specify the essential nature of the thing concerned rather than the properties by means of which we can recognise it or the meaning of the term used to designate it. But there has been more controversy over precisely what the presuppositions of the elenctic method are, and how to respond, in particular, to the charge that Socrates commits the so-called Socratic fallacy. Socrates appears to be committed to the principle that if one does not know what the F is, then one cannot know if F is truly predicable of anything whatever, in which case it seems pointless to try to discover what the F is by investigating examples of it via the elenctic method.

Plato can be seen as facing up to this charge in the Meno, the dialogue that marks the transition from his early to his later work. If Socratic definition anticipates conceptual analysis, then the paradox that is formulated in this dialogue—Meno’s paradox—anticipates the paradox of analysis. Either we know what something is, or we do not. If we do, then there is no point searching for it. If we do not, then we will not know what to search for. (Cf. Meno, 80d-e.) It is in response to this paradox that Plato introduces his theory of recollection, about which there has been enormous controversy, and his conception of knowledge as true belief plus an account. But what is of greatest significance in this dialogue, as far as analysis is concerned, is Socrates’s famous interrogation of the slave-boy. For it is here that he discusses a geometrical problem, and shows the emerging influence of Greek geometry.

The influence of Greek geometry, and of the method of analysis, in particular, is evident in Plato’s introduction of the method of hypothesis, described and applied in the Meno (86e-87b), and discussed further in the Phaedo (100a-101d). Just as in geometrical analysis, the idea is to ‘hypothesize’ some supposedly prior proposition (e.g. that virtue is knowledge) by means of which the proposition under consideration (e.g. that virtue comes from teaching) can be demonstrated. As in the case of geometrical analysis, there has been a great deal of controversy over what the relationships are supposed to be between the various elements involved here, and there are also important differences between geometrical analysis and the method of hypothesis. But it does seem that interpreting the method of hypothesis against the background of ancient Greek geometry is the right approach (see esp. Sayre 1969, Mueller 1992).

In the later dialogues, Plato both refines his conception of knowledge as true belief plus an account (in the Theaetetus) and develops the method of hypothesis into the method of collection and division (in the Phaedrus, Sophist, Politicus and Philebus). The latter method involves, paradigmatically (but not exclusively), ‘collecting’ things generically and then ‘dividing’ them by a series of dichotomies into species. This is Plato’s mature method, in which we can see the method of analysis adapted to provide a metaphysical framework for his Socratic concern with definition. Although many have criticised the method of division, most notably, Ryle (1966), who wished to distinguish it from genuine philosophy or dialectic, it does seem that, properly understood, it forms the heart of Plato’s later methodology. Its importance lies not just in the resulting classificatory trees but in the structural relationships they reveal and the insights it encourages into the formal concepts involved (cf. Ackrill 1970).

Annotated Bibliography, §2.3

4. Aristotle

Plato was, without doubt, the major influence on Aristotle, who was trained in Plato’s Academy. But this is not to say that Aristotle was not critical of Plato’s methodology. He criticises the method of division, for example, in Parts of Animals (I, 2-3). But like Plato, he was inspired by ancient Greek geometry. There are three passages in which Aristotle directly refers to geometrical analysis. The most famous passage occurs in the Nicomachean Ethics (III, 3), in which Aristotle compares reasoning about the means to a given end to analysis in geometry [Quotation]. Just as in geometrical analysis (see §2 of the main document), we work back from what is sought to something we already know how to construct or prove, so too in practical deliberation, according to Aristotle, we work back from what we want to something which we know how to do, which results in what we want. The second passage occurs in section 16 of On Sophistical Refutations, where Aristotle considers the question of how we can learn to diagnose bad arguments [Quotation]. Although the passage is not easy to interpret, his main point seems to be to emphasize that analysis must be supplemented by synthesis to yield a full solution of anything. The third passage occurs in the Posterior Analytics (I, 12), in which Aristotle recognises the problem of reversibility mentioned at the end of §2 above [Quotation].

But it is in relation to Aristotle’s development of syllogistic theory, expounded in the aptly named Analytics, that there are the most striking similarities. Just as the aim of the geometer is to solve geometrical problems (construct figures or prove theorems), so too Aristotle was concerned to solve logical problems (construct arguments or prove propositions). The Prior Analytics provides the framework to do this in the same way that Euclid’s Elements provided the framework in the case of geometry. And even more than in the case of geometry, analysis in Aristotle’s Analytics involves not just the regression to first principles, but also the entire process of elaborating the structural relations between the various elements of arguments and showing how one argument can be ‘reduced’ to another. Arguments are ‘analyzed’ to the extent that they can be set out as ‘syllogisms’, each syllogism being a combination of two premises and a conclusion taking one of the specified forms of valid inference. Working back from a given proposition, assumed as conclusion, to premises by means of which that proposition can be derived, is facilitated by a thorough training in the whole syllogistic system, which it was the aim of the Analytics to provide. The richness of Aristotle’s conception of analysis, and the influence of ancient Greek geometry, has been superbly elucidated by Patrick Byrne (1997).

While the Prior Analytics is concerned with the theory of the syllogism in general, the Posterior Analytics is concerned with one particular type of syllogism, the demonstrative or scientific syllogism. A demonstrative syllogism is “one in virtue of which, by having it, we understand something” (71b17-19), that is, one in which the premises are “true and primitive and immediate and more familiar than and prior to and explanatory of the conclusion” (71b21-2). Aristotle distinguishes between understanding ‘the fact’ (to hoti) and understanding ‘the reason why’ (to dioti). He gives the example of the following two syllogisms (I, 13):

First Syllogism
The planets do not twinkle
What does not twinkle is near
The planets are near
Second Syllogism
The planets are near
What is near does not twinkle
The planets do not twinkle

Both are valid arguments, but whilst the first merely ‘gives the fact’, the second ‘gives the reason why’, that is, the second provides an explanation of what is stated in the conclusion in terms of the more basic facts expressed by the premises. That the planets do not twinkle is hardly an explanation of why they are near; but that they are near, according to Aristotle, is (part of) an explanation of why they do not twinkle (78a23-b3).

This distinction, and indeed the model of explanation involved here, was to play a crucial role in subsequent conceptions of analysis. For causal explanation itself became identified with logical deduction, and the movement from cause to effect was represented as the passage from premises to conclusion in a logical argument, and the finding of the cause of something as a matter of determining appropriate premises—something which could itself be done in a logical argument. On this conception, then, there could be a logic of discovery as well as a logic of proof. In the first case above, we start with an effect (the planets not twinkling) and determine its cause (the planets being near) by finding an appropriate additional premise, and in the second case, having determined the cause, we reverse the process to display the passage from cause to effect. The first was understood as analysis, providing a method of discovery, and the second as synthesis, providing a method of proof. Such a conception presupposes that the steps are reversible (i.e., in this case, the convertibility of ‘What does not twinkle is near’ and ‘What is near does not twinkle’), but with this assumption, there is a nice symmetry between analysis and synthesis. This conception of analysis and synthesis was to take center stage in the Renaissance and early modern period.

For more on the Analytics, see the entry on Aristotle’s logic.

Annotated Bibliography, §2.4

Copyright © 2014 by
Michael Beaney <>

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