Ancient Political Philosophy
Ancient political philosophy is understood here to mean ancient Greek and Roman thought from the classical period of Greek thought in the fifth century BCE to the end of the Roman empire in the West in the fifth century CE, excluding the development of Jewish and Christian ideas about politics during that period. Political philosophy as a genre was developed in this period by Plato and, in effect, reinvented by Aristotle: it encompasses reflections on the origin of political institutions, the concepts used to interpret and organize political life such as justice and equality, the relation between the aims of ethics and the nature of politics, and the relative merits of different constitutional arrangements or regimes. Platonic models remained especially important for later authors throughout this period, even as the development of later “Hellenistic” schools of Greek philosophy, and distinctively Roman forms of philosophical adaptation, offered new frameworks for construing politics from a philosophical point of view. Engagement in these Greek and Roman traditions of political philosophy among late antique scholars continued through and beyond the eventual abdication of the last pretenders to the Roman imperial throne in the Western part of the empire in 476 CE, and further still among medieval scholars and their successors writing in Greek, Latin, Hebrew, and (later on) Arabic.
- 1. The Scope of Ancient Political Philosophy
- 2. Politics and Philosophy in Ancient Greece
- 3. Socrates and Plato
- 4. Aristotle
- 5. Hellenistic Philosophies and Politics
- 6. The Roman Republic and Cicero
- 7. Political Philosophy in the Roman Empire
- 8. Conclusion
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1. The Scope of Ancient Political Philosophy
We find the etymological origins of two key terms in the title of this article, “political” and “philosophy”, in ancient Greek: the former originally pertaining to the polis or city-state; the latter being the practice of a particular kind of inquiry conceived literally as the “love of wisdom” (philosophia). These ideas were transmitted beyond the confines of the classical polis as the Greek city-states came under the suzerainty of larger kingdoms after an initial Macedonian conquest at the end of the fourth century B.C; those kingdoms in turn were eventually conquered and significantly assimilated by the Roman republic, later transmuted into an empire. Philosophers writing in Latin engaged self-consciously with the earlier and continuing traditions of writing about philosophy in Greek. Already from its origins, Greek political philosophy put the question of the forms of regimes or “constitutions” (politeia, singular) at the center of its concerns. The classification of types of constitutions already found in Herodotus, fleshed out by Plato, and further adapted by Aristotle—in Aristotle’s version, there were three “good” regimes, namely, monarchy, aristocracy, and a moderate form of democracy, as well as their three “perversions,” namely tyranny, oligarchy, and a bad form of democracy—would continue to inform the discussion of politics into the context of the “mixed regime” of the Roman republic, held to combine elements of all three of the good regimes. These discussions were indexed to the particular historical setting under consideration while also offering general principles that remain relevant in many ways, even as the questions and contexts for political philosophy have changed.
Because the field of political philosophy so delineated has had a long history since then, long past the time when the ancient models were accepted as defining the field and determining the “problems” to be considered, it is a mistake to approach their thought with a modern menu of expectations of what the subject will contain. At the same time, because the Greeks also developed other genres widely recognized today—among them, history, tragedy, comedy, and rhetoric—no understanding of their thought about politics can restrict itself to the genre of political philosophy alone. Some argue, for example, that Thucydides’ elaboration of the nature of the political through his History of the fifth-century Peloponnesian War between leagues led by Athens and Sparta is more important and instructive than that issuing from Plato’s philosophical dialogues (Geuss 2005). While that argument is contentious, it rests on an important broader point. “Politics” and what is “political” emerged as part of a widespread set of sociolinguistic practices, most notably and best documented in Athens, while “philosophy” was invented by a relatively small number of self-professed “philosophical” thinkers. Thus the invention of “political philosophy” as a genre can be understood as a deliberate challenge to existing practices, and conceptions, of “the political.” The challenge was directed in particular, though not exclusively, to democratic practices in mid to late fifth century Athens, which was the polis both intellectually dominant and in many ways politically exemplary at the time, as well as bequeathing the lion’s share of our surviving evidence from ancient Greece (Meier 1990, Ober 2008; on the surviving evidence for ancient Greek philosophy in general, see the entry on doxography for ancient philosophy).
This article therefore begins by surveying political practices and the reflective accounts to which they gave rise in the classical Greek period of the independent polis. It then turns to the thinkers who invented “political philosophy” par excellence: Socrates, Plato and Aristotle. It continues to Hellenistic Greek thinkers before considering the main currents and roles of political philosophy in the Roman republic. While offering a survey of certain developments in the Roman empire, it leaves aside the distinctive contributions made by Jewish and Christian thinkers in that period, and in particular the great upheaval of thought effected by Augustine, who was deeply engaged with classical authors such as Plato and Cicero, who became in turn a crucial starting point for medieval political philosophy. The article concludes with some reflections on how the nature of “ancient political philosophy” should, and should not, be understood.
2. Politics and Philosophy in Ancient Greece
2.1 Politics and Justice
The distinctive understanding of “politics” forged in Greece was marked by the historical emergence of the independent city-state and the variety of regimes which it could harbor. Notwithstanding fantasies of a pre-political “Age of Kronos”, the polis was widely understood as the acme of human civilization and the principal domain in which human fulfillment could be sought. The city was the domain of potential collaboration in leading the good life, though it was by the same token the domain of potential contestation should that pursuit come to be understood as pitting some against others. Political theorizing began in arguments about what politics was good for, who could participate in politics, and why, arguments which were tools in civic battles for ideological and material control as well as attempts to provide logical or architectonic frameworks for those battles.
Such conflicts were addressed by the idea of justice, which was fundamental to the city as it emerged from the archaic age into the classical period. Justice was conceived by poets, lawgivers, and philosophers alike as the structure of civic bonds which were beneficial to all (rich and poor, powerful and weak alike) rather than an exploitation of some by others. Hesiod’s late eighth-century epic poem Works and Days, for example, contrasts the brute strength with which a hawk can dominate a nightingale (“You are being held by one who is much stronger… I will make a meal of you, if I want, or let you go,” lines 206–208), with the peace and plenty which flourishes wherever justice, such as rendering fair verdicts to foreigners, is preserved (lines 225–230).
So understood, justice defined the basis of equal citizenship and was said to be the requirement for human regimes to be acceptable to the gods. The ideal was that, with justice as a foundation, political life would enable its participants to flourish and to achieve the overarching human end of happiness (eudaimonia), expressing a civic form of virtue and pursuing happiness and success through the competitive forums of the city. Whether justice applied to the city’s relation with other cities was a further and highly contested point, memorably explored in Thucydides’ recounting of the “Melian Dialogue” in 416 BCE, in which emissaries of the Athenians debated the meaning of justice with the leaders of the island-city of Melos, a city they were threatening with death and disaster should they fail to submit to Athenian imperial demands (Thuc. V. 84–114).
2.2 Politics, Justice, and Equality
Justice, then, depended on treating equals equally, and distributing citizenship and the privileges of officeholding accordingly. Yet how should “the equal” be understood? This became the major political faultline of the Greek fifth century BCE. Oligarchical regimes might consider only the kalokagathoi—the elite and well-born, usually also wealthy landowners —to be full equals; democratic regimes, by contrast, tended to treat the “many” (or some large proportion of them) as political equals of the elite “few,” in the fullest democracies enfranchising all free- and native-born men. Sparta, a unique political entity, still exemplified the same broad pattern in naming its citizens “the equals” or (more literally) “the peers” (hoi homoioi). The absence of slave status made one free but not necessarily a citizen. Slavery for its part was little discussed as an explicit political question, though Aristotle recognized that the question of its justice or injustice had indeed been raised at least in theoretical debate and needed to be addressed, which he did himself by sketching out a kind of slavery that could in principle (so he claimed) be just by nature (see 4.3 below; Garnsey 1996 on slavery in Greek thought from Aristotle to Augustine). The exclusion of women from active citizenship in Athens was more consciously felt, giving rise to fantasies of female-dominated politics in Aristophanic comedy (Lysistrata, Assemblywomen) and to tortured reflection in many tragedies (consider the titles of Medea and Trojan Women, both Athenian works setting explorations of women’s roles in the dramatic contexts of archaic foreign polities).
Among equals, however defined, the space of the political was the space of participation in decision-making concerning public affairs and actions. That invention of the political (what Meier 1990 calls The Greek Discovery of Politics) was the hallmark of the classical Greek world. Citizens, whether the few (usually the rich) or the many (including the poorer and perhaps the poorest free adult men), gathered together to conduct public affairs, sharing either by custom, by election, or by lot—the latter seen in Athens as the most democratic, though it was never the sole mechanism used in any Greek democracy—in holding, or holding accountable, the offices for carrying them out. Rhetoric played an important role in shaping those decisions, especially, though not only, in democracies, where discursive norms shaped by the poor majority were hegemonic in public even over the rich (Ober 1989).
At the same time, politics was shaped by the legacy of archaic poetry and its heroic ethos and by the religious cults which included, alongside pan-Hellenic and familial rites, important practices distinct to each city-state. This was a polytheistic, rather than monotheistic, setting, in which religion was at least in large part a function of civic identity. It was a world innocent of modern bureaucracy and of the modern move to intellectual abstraction in defining the state: the entity we would call “Athens” in the abstract was called in its own day by the collective noun for its living and breathing citizens, “the Athenians.” So if ancient political philosophy left out much that modern political philosophy would include (e.g., for the most part, the question of the justness of slavery), it also included much that the latter would tend to exclude. Not only the civic religious cult, but also the patterns of child-rearing, cultural stories expressed in music, epic, and drama, gender roles and sexual practices, military participation, and so on, were features of the “way of life” which constituted the politeia or “constitution” in its broadest sense (Lane 2014a, 59–62). This broadest sense was initially most evident to the Athenians when they looked at the peculiar customs of Sparta, but Plato taught them to recognize that democratic Athens was as distinctive a regime (Schofield 2006: 31–43), one embodying a particular set of ethical goals and practices in its political arrangements.
Most of those generally recognized as “wise men” (sophoi) and “students of nature” (physikoi) who appeared in this milieu, thought within the same broad terms as the poets and orators. Justice was widely, if not universally, treated as a fundamental constituent of cosmic order. Some of the physikoi influenced political life, notably a number of the Pythagoreans in southern Italy. Others held themselves aloof from political action while still identifying commonalities or consonances between nature and politics, for example, Democritus of Abdera, whose atomist philosophy comported with a defense of political life, and so of the justice that it required individuals to enact, as being necessary for individual flourishing (see e.g. Democritus’ fragment DK B252 = Taylor D116). However, these portraits of broad consonance between nature and politics were challenged in the mid to late fifth century BCE by some among a new breed of thinker and actor, the professional teachers (“sophists”), who began to ask whether the laws and customs (nomos, singular; nomoi, plural) embodying political justice were truly a reflection of justice in nature (phusis), or merely an imposition of arbitrary human norms. Most of the sophists argued the latter, though they did so along a spectrum of interpretation (for which our evidence rests heavily on Plato, who portrays Socrates arguing with a considerable number of sophists): for example, for Protagoras (an itinerant teacher from Abdera who is depicted in Plato’s Protagoras and Theaetetus), the human creation of political life was a cause of celebrating human virtues and practical abilities; whereas for Thrasymachus (an ambassador to Athens from Chalcedon, a city in Asia Minor near modern Istanbul, who is depicted in Plato’s Republic), it was a cause of condemnation, the powerful in any city imposing laws to serve their own advantage. In addition to the question of how laws fit into the natural order, many sophists raised the question of whom the laws benefited: were laws a socially and individually useful set of restrictions on bad behavior, as some including Antiphon and an author known today as the Anonymous Iamblichi seemed to think? Were they the exploitative impositions of the strong on the week, as Plato had his character Thrasymachus argue? Or were they the means by which the many tamed and controlled the naturally powerful, preventing the latter from using their strength for their own profit, as Plato had his character Callicles argue? (See the entry on Callicles and Thrasymachus.) These varied dimensions of the nomos-phusis debate raised challenges for the governing intellectual assumptions of the polis, even though the sophists advertised themselves as teaching skills for success within it, a number of them being employed as diplomats by cities eager to exploit their rhetorical abilities. Socrates and Plato would respond to this challenge in shaping a new genre of “philosophy” which broke the mould of their predecessors (on the genre of philosophy, see Nightingale 1993a). While it is broadly true to say that Greek political thinkers generally presupposed the importance of justice, in the fifth and fourth centuries BCE many of them also increasingly problematized it.
2.3 Politics and Philosophy
In giving birth to philosophy, the polis also gave birth to a tension between what Aristotle would describe as two lives: the life of politics and the life of philosophy. A faultline between ethics and politics, so closely connected in an ancient culture preoccupied with flourishing (eudaimonia) and virtue (aretê), opened here. Should philosophers act politically (and if so, should they engage in ordinary politics in existing regimes, or work to establish new ones), or should they abstain from politics in order to live a life of pure contemplation? There was likewise a question as to whether philosophers should think politically: were human affairs worth thinking about in the broadest perspective opened by the study of nature and of the gods? In engaging with questions of rhetoric, virtue, knowledge, and justice, Socrates’ philosophical life was engaged with the political even before his death (his trial and execution at the hands of the Athenian democratic regime) embattled him with it. But for his student Plato and Plato’s student Aristotle, the practice and even the study of human affairs such as politics were less divine, and so less admirable, than the broader study of truth about the natural and the divine realms. Philosophy might have to address the political but its highest calling soared above it. If Socrates’ political fate was part of the stimulus for Plato to invent a new metaphysics and epistemology in order to articulate an alternative realm of political possibility, Plato’s dialogues show Socrates simultaneously asserting an independence for those disciplines from the bonds of the political alone.
This distinctive Greek—and particularly Platonic – outlook must condition any historical understanding of the development of ancient political philosophy. While one influential approach to the history of political thought takes its bearings from what a thinker was trying to do in and by what he or she said or wrote, it is important to recognize that the founders of ancient political philosophy were in part trying to define a new space of doing as philosophizing, independent of ordinary political action. This is not to say that they did not also have ordinary political intentions, but rather to stress that the invention of political philosophy was also intended as a mode of reflection upon the value of ordinary political life.
3. Socrates and Plato
According to Cicero, Socrates (469–399 BCE) was the first to bring philosophy down from heaven, locating it in cities and even in people’s kitchens (Tusc.V.10). A humbly born man who refused the lucrative mantle of the sophistic professional teacher, yet attracted many of the most ambitious and aristocratic youth of Athens to accompany him in his questioning of them and their elders as to the nature of the virtues they claimed to possess or understand, he left no philosophical writings. We know him only through the surviving testimony of others, first the lampoons in Aristophanes’ comic plays, and above all the “Socratic” dialogues written by his student Plato and his associate Xenophon (dialogues by others are known only by titles or fragments), and the remarks of Plato’s student Aristotle, as well as other sources from after or even long after his death (for a collection, see Giannantoni 1990, and see the entry on Socrates).
3.1 Socratic Ethics and Politics
Socrates seems to have been the first philosopher to treat ethics—as opposed to cosmology and physics—as a distinct area of inquiry. Asserting in Plato’s Apology (38a) that “the unexamined life is not worth living,” he pressed for definitions of the virtues or excellences which were widely recognized and claimed by his fellows, but which they found difficult to explain. As depicted by Plato, the search for such definitions led invariably to a concern with knowledge of how best to live, as not only one of the conventional virtues (in the form of wisdom) but also as underpinning, even constituting, them all. That elevation of knowledge in turn led Socrates to militate against the practices of rhetoric and judgment which animated political institutions of Athens such as the law-courts, Assembly and Council. Instead he posited the existence, or at least the possibility, of political expertise, claiming (in Plato’s Gorgias) to be the one person in Athens who at least tried to pursue such a true politikê technê, a complex notion that can be understood as meaning politics as a kind of professional expertise (Grg. 521d). The notion of political knowledge limited to one or a few experts, as opposed to the embedded and networked knowledge produced and exercised by the whole dêmos of Athens in their judgments and political roles (Ober 2008), struck at the central premises of Athenian democracy and those of Greek politics more generally (in oligarchies, wealth rather than knowledge was the relevant criterion for rule; in tyrannies, sheer power). Thus the nature of Socrates’ concern with ethics led him directly into a form of political philosophizing. The relation between politics and knowledge, the meaning of justice as a virtue, the value of the military courage which all Greek cities prized in their citizens, all seem to have been central topics of Socratic conversation.
3.2 Socrates’ Trial: The Political Philosophy of Citizenship
That engagement with political philosophy was dramatically intensified when Socrates was, at the age of seventy, arraigned, tried, and sentenced to death by an Athenian popular jury. In a prosecution brought by a group of his fellow citizens who claimed to be shouldering that burden for the sake of the city (the usual way in which prosecutions were brought in Athens), the charges laid were against him were three-fold: not acknowledging the city’s gods; introducing new gods; and corrupting the young (Apol. 24b). Each of these had a political dimension, given the civic control of central religious cults mentioned earlier, and the broad political importance of educating the young to take their place in the civic order. Timed a few years after the overthrow of a short-lived oligarchic regime (known as that of “The Thirty”) which had been led by several of Socrates’ sometime associates Critias and Charmides (their oligarchic regime having been imposed after the ignominious Athenian defeat in the war with Sparta which had earlier seen another associate of Socrates (Alcibiades) turn traitor to Athens), the trial must be suspected of having served as a substitute for the prohibited political trials of the oligarchic partisans (such trials having been generally barred by an amnesty passed in 403 BCE by the restored democracy; see Cartledge 2009, Ch.7, Carawan 2013, Shear 2011).
Socrates’ speeches in the court trial—literary versions of which were produced by Plato, Xenophon, and a number of other followers—forced him to confront directly the question of his role in an Athens defined by its democratic institutions and norms. Socrates had played his part as an ordinary citizen, allowing his name to go forward for selection by lot to serve on the Council, and serving in the army when required. But he had not engaged actively in “public affairs” (ta pragmata, Apol. 32e): he had not spoken in the Assembly (31c), nor, so far as we know, brought any prosecutions in the law-courts. In Plato’s account, after countering the religious accusations, Socrates acknowledged this abstention from public affairs but claimed to have had a more significant mission laid on him by the god Apollo when his oracle at Delphi declared that no man was wiser than Socrates: his mission was to stir up the city like a gadfly (30e), discussing virtue and related matters (38a), and benefiting each person by “trying to persuade him” to care for virtue rather than wealth for himself and for the city (36c–d). He went so far as to claim that as a civic benefactor, he deserved not death but the lifelong publicly provided meals commonly awarded to an Olympic champion (36e–37a). Socrates here depicts himself as a new kind of citizen, conceptualizing the public good in a new way and so serving it best through unprecedented actions, in contrast to the conventionally defined paths of political contest and success (Villa 2001).
While depicting himself in his defense speeches in Plato’s Apology as a new kind of virtuous citizen, Socrates makes three remarks which have in modern times been seized upon as indications of the principled limits which he might have put on the requirement to obey the law. The first two recalled political incidents: while serving on the Council, he had voted against an illegal proposal (32b–c); and under the brief oligarchical domination of “The Thirty”, he had disobeyed an order of the ruling body to arrest a democratic partisan for execution (32c–d). The third is a hypothetical remark. If, he imagines, the jurors were to say to him, “we acquit you, but only on condition that you spend no more time on this investigation and do not practice philosophy, and if you are caught doing so you will die,” his reply would be: “I will obey the god rather than you, and as long as I draw breath and am able, I shall not cease to practice philosophy” (both quotations excerpted from longer sentences, 29c–d). Particularly in twentieth-century Anglophone scholarship, these remarks have engendered a view of Socrates as endorsing civil disobedience in certain circumstances, and so have framed the question of civil disobedience and the grounds for political obligation as arising in Plato. A significant debate on these matters took shape in the United States in the 1960s and 1970s at the time of widespread civil disobedience relating to civil rights and the Vietnam War: see for example Konvitz 1964, Woozley 1972.
That debate has had to confront the fact that Socrates did not actually disobey his own death sentence with which his trial concluded: when the time came, he drank the poisonous hemlock as prescribed by the jury. Before that moment, Plato imagines Socrates being visited in prison by his friend Crito (in a dialogue which bears the latter’s name), and urged to escape for the sake of his friends and family, a practice which was frequently tolerated in Athens so long as the escapee fled into exile. Socrates is not persuaded by Crito’s arguments. He begins his examination of them by recalling principles to which he and Crito had in the past agreed, including the principle that it is better to suffer injustice than to commit it (Cri. 47a–50a). He then goes on to ventriloquize a series of speeches against escape, which he ascribes to the “Laws of Athens”. These speeches articulate a set of special connections between Socrates and the Laws of Athens which, depending on one’s reading, either flesh out the principle that it is better to suffer injustice than to do it (by dramatizing reasons for which it would unjust for Socrates to escape), or else stand in tension with it by invoking absolutist grounds with implications more extensive than such a principle would authorize (Harte 1999). On any reading, it is important to bear in mind that Socrates is choosing to obey a jury verdict that has commanded him to suffer what is arguably an injustice, but not to commit one, so that one of his fundamental ethical principles here as elsewhere in Plato (that it is better to suffer an injustice than to commit one) is at least compatible with his acceptance of the jury’s sentence.
The “Laws of Athens” appeal to a kind of social contract made between themselves and Socrates. The contract is unequal: the “Laws” compare themselves to parents and slaveowners, and Socrates to child and slave. Obedience to them is owed, they claim, because the “Laws” have provided the whole basis for Socrates’ education and life in the city, a city in which he has notably chosen to remain, never traveling abroad except on military service. But the “Laws” also speak of the opportunity they afford to Socrates to “persuade or obey” them (51b; 51e–52a). The meaning of this clause and its relevance to civil disobedience is again much debated (Kraut 1984 remains a landmark). Nevertheless, the image of Socrates tried, convicted, and made to die (by his own hand) at the city’s command has come to be a vivid and powerful symbol of tension in the relationship between political philosophy and political authority.
3.3 The Defense of Justice in the Republic
The Crito depends upon a notion of justice and injustice which it never defines. In the Republic, by contrast, a dialogue in which Socrates is also the main character (and first-person narrator) but in which the views he advances go beyond the tight-knit pattern of debates in the dialogues discussed in section 3.1, Plato (424/3–348/7 BCE) offers an account of justice linking the political to the psychological and justice to a higher understanding of true goodness. (See the entry on Plato.) The Republic is, with the Laws, an order of magnitude longer than any other Platonic dialogue. Readers today are likely to think of the Republic as the home par excellence of political philosophy. But that view has also been challenged by scholars who see it as primarily an ethical dialogue, driven by the question of why the individual should be just (Annas 1999). This section argues that the ethical and political concerns, and purposes, of the dialogue are inextricably intertwined.
Near the beginning of the dialogue, a challenge is launched by the character Thrasymachus, mentioned above, asserting that all actual cities define justice so as to serve the advantage of the rulers. He takes this to mean that the laws which their subjects are bound to obey and the associated ethical virtue of justice which they are enjoined to cultivate (traditionally seen as the necessary bond among citizens and the justification for political rule), in fact amount to a distorted sham. (See the entry on Callicles and Thrasymachus.) The question which Thrasymachus poses and which Plato’s brothers Glaucon and Adeimantus reformulate—why should the individual be just if he or she can get away with not being just, when elevated above the demands of ordinary justice either by special power or good fortune?—thus already has a political valence from the outset.
Socrates then launches a speculation as to the origins of cities: the city is held to have an existence independently of ethical concerns, coming into being for economic reasons and immediately needing to defend itself in war (and also to be able to make offensive war for economic gain). However, this origin already gives rise to a proto-ethical dimension, first insofar as the members of the primitive city each do their own work (the structure of what will emerge as the virtue of justice), which is fleshed out when political rulers are established who are able to use their wisdom to help their subjects maintain a psychological balance in their souls that approximates, if it does not fully embody, the virtues of moderation and justice and so enables them to enjoy a unified rather than a divided soul. The question of why the individual should be just, figured at the outset by the contrast with the putatively happy tyrant, is resolved eventually by demonstrating that the tyrant will necessarily, in virtue of the disorder of his soul, be at once maximally unjust and maximally unhappy.
That resolution rests on the division of the soul into three parts by which the Republic places moral psychology at the heart of political philosophy. Both soul and city are posited by Socrates in arguments in Books II–IV and VIII–IX, in particular, to have a tripartite structure when the soul is embodied in a living person. In the soul and city respectively, the rational part or class should rule; the spirited part or class should act to support the rule of that rational part; and the appetitive part of the soul and producing class in the city should accept being governed by it. Both soul and city are therefore in need of, and capable of exhibiting, four virtues (427e–444a). Two of these pertain to individual parts: the rational part being capable of wisdom, the spirited part of courage. Two however are defined by relations between the parts: moderation as the agreement of all three parts that reason should rule, justice as each part doing its own (this echoes, in a radically new context, a conservative Athenian suspicion of excessive democratic polupragmosunê or busybody interference).
The result is that justice is defined as primarily a condition of one’s soul or city as a whole, not as any specific just action; yet if the soul or city is so ordered, the individual will have no cause to engage in the paradigmatically unjust action of pleonexia or grasping for more than one’s fair share. A just soul will indeed reliably issue in traditionally just actions, such as refraining from theft, murder, and sacrilege (contra Sachs 1963, who argues that Plato has simply abandoned the usual domain of justice). But what makes its ‘justice’ count as such goes beyond these particular actions and omissions, lying in the health and orderliness of such a soul contrasted with the chaotic or even tyrannical character of an unjust soul (Burnyeat 2013). To be a truly effective, because wholly unified, agent, one must be just, moderate, courageous and wise. The just person enjoys psychic health, which is advantageous no matter how he is treated (fairly or unfairly) by gods and men; correspondingly, the just society enjoys civic unity, which is advantageous in being the fundamental way to avoid the assumed supreme evil of civil war. In contrast, all other cities are characterized as riven by civil war between the rich and the poor; none of them counts as a single, unified city at all (see Rep. 422e–423a, and more generally, Book VIII of that dialogue).
By treating these ethical and political questions as interrelated, and then going on to depict both an ideal political regime (“a kallipolis”, the fine or beautiful city) in which they could be solved, and the imperfect regimes into which such an ideal regime will decay, the Republic lays out a novel and ambitious template for political philosophy: not only to interrogate the meaning of virtue and citizenship, but also to develop an ideal regime and an account of how and why such regimes may fail. That template will be followed by Aristotle’s Politics, by Cicero’s De re publica, and by Thomas More’s Utopia, among other successors. In Plato’s hands, however, this template included some specific political prescriptions to maintain the unity of the ideal city which most of his successors abhorred. In particular, Book V of the Republic suggests that a sufficiently unified regime can be achieved only by depriving its guardian-rulers of private property and of private families, instead making them live in austere communal conditions in which they are financially supported by their money-making subjects and allowed to procreate only when and with whom will best serve the city. In Book II of his Politics, Aristotle would read this prescription as applying to all the citizens in the city envisaged in the Republic, and both he and, later on, Cicero would deplore what they construed as this abolition of private property. Even those following and radicalizing Plato precisely by advocating the abolition of property for all the citizens, rather than only deprivation of it for the rulers, as would the sixteenth-century Sir Thomas More, were generally opposed to if not also scandalized by the suggestion of procreative communism.
The Republic initiates a further tradition in political philosophy by laying out a template for the integration of ethics and political philosophy into a comprehensive account of epistemology and metaphysics. By making the claim of the philosophers to rule depend on their knowledge of the good and of the other Platonic Forms (in conjunction with their moral character and tested practical experience), the dialogue vindicates the Socratic and Platonic thought that ruling well—what we might call “rule” proper – requires a rare form of expertise rather than lay judgment, rhetorical advice, or common knowledge. In the Republic, the knowledge required for rule is not specialized, but comprehensive: the knowledge of the good and the Forms is somehow to translate into an ability to make laws as well as the everyday decisions of rule. The rulers are philosophers who take turns over their lifetime in exercising political authority. They define their vocation as that of philosophizing, engaging in rule out of some sort of compulsion or necessity (see the entry on Plato’s ethics and politics in the Republic). To that extent the Republic presents a paradox: if it is widely considered the first major work of political philosophy, it envisages a constitution in which philosophers rule but do so separately from their role of philosophizing.
3.4 The Definition of Political Knowledge in the Statesman
In the Statesman, Plato turns his attention to precisely the topics identified at the end of the last section above. In a discussion led by an unnamed person, a philosopher visiting Athens from Elea, political expertise (harking back to the politikê technê met above with Socrates, sect. 3.1) is identified by separating it progressively by a set of distinctions from other forms of expertise. The discussion is interrupted but ultimately enriched by a story or myth in which politics is shown to be a matter of humans ruling other humans in place of living under divine guidance (O’Meara 2020). That human expertise of statecraft is ultimately distinguished by its knowledge of the correct timing (kairos) as to when its closest rivals should be exercised: these are three forms of expertise that in fact corresponded to key political roles, some of them formal offices, in Greek cities at the time, namely, rhetoric, generalship, and judging (Lane 1998, Lane 2013c). The statesman is wholly defined by the possession of that knowledge of when it is best to exercise these and the other subordinate forms of expertise, and by the role of exercising that knowledge in binding or weaving the different groups of citizens together, a knowledge which depends on a broader philosophical grasp but which is peculiarly political (El Murr 2014). Here, political philosophy operates not just to assimilate politics to a broader metaphysical horizon but also to identify its specificity.
The Statesman also raises an important question about the nature and value of rule by law, as opposed to rule by such expert knowledge as embodied in a rare and likely singular individual. For its part, the Republic had taken law in its stride as the standard formulation to be utilized in the construction of the city in speech by the dialogue’s principal interlocutors from Book II onward, who constitute themselves as the ideal constitution’s ‘founders’ (Annas 2017, Lane 2013a). By contrast, the Statesman analyzes law as in principle a stubborn and imperfect substitute for the flexible deployment of expertise (293e–303c). However, the principal interlocutors of the latter dialogue go on to agree that if the choice is between an ignorant imitator of the true political expert who changes the laws on the basis of whim, and a law-bound polity, the latter would be preferable, so bringing law back into the picture as an alternative to the ideal after all.
3.5 The “Second-Best” Regime of the Laws
The Laws, a work reported to have been still on wax tablets, and so possibly left unfinished when Plato died (Diogenes Laertius III. 37), treats the specificity of politics as a matter not of distinct vocational expertise but of the requirements of a “second-best” (739a) city, one in which private property is allowed, as opposed to an ideal or implicitly first-best regime in which private property would be prohibited to all (thus going beyond even the ideal regime of the Republic). In this section, as in most scholarly discussions, I will assume that the second-best city for which laws are laid out in the later books is the projected Cretan colony of Magnesia, of which the Cretan (Cleinias) among the dialogue’s three interlocutors has announced himself to be one of the intended founders. (For an alternative argument, that the second-best city is not meant to be Magnesia, see Bartels 2017.) In this second-best city, the legislation for which is sketched out in speech by the three interlocutors of the dialogue, politics still aims at virtue, and at the virtue of all the citizens, but those citizens all play a part in holding civic offices; the ordinary activities of politics are shared, in what is described as a mixture of monarchy and democracy. That description gives rise to an idea of the “mixed regime” or “mixed constitution” which later became influential in its own right, as we shall see below (section 6).
Another influential aspect of the Laws is its positive evaluation of the nature of law itself as a topic proper to political philosophy. While the Laws shares with the Statesman the notion of law in an isolated and singular sense as being brutish and stubborn compared to expert knowledge, it recommends a “double” notion of law, in which each such command is prefaced with a persuasive account of its rationale, addressed to the citizens, who are expected to read and understand it (719b–723d, and passim). Some scholars have found that to be a distinctively democratic and liberal account of law (Bobonich 2002; see also the entry on Plato on utopia). That arguably goes too far in a proceduralist direction, given that the value of law remains its embodiment of reason or understanding (nous), so that while adding persuasive preludes is a better way to exercise the coercive force of law, no agreement on the basis of persuasion could justify laws which departed from the standard of nous (Laks 2005). Nevertheless, the emphasis on law as an embodiment of reason, and as articulating the political ideals of the city in a form that its citizens are to study and internalize (Nightingale 1993b, 1999), is distinctive to this dialogue.
Also notable is that the Laws’ emphasis on all citizens as eligible, and so presumptively capable, to hold offices, differs significantly from the rule reserved for philosophers in the Republic. The outlook in the Laws may have somewhat more affinity with the closing passages of the Statesman, which refer to the offices or quasi-offices of rhetor, general and judge which at least certain citizens will hold, those with the relevant expertise to play each role. The Statesman however reserves a special extraordinary role (presented as falling outside the structure of ordinary civic offices) for the statesman whenever he is present in the city (Lane 2013b). The role of the Statesman’s eponymous figure must therefore be distinguished from that of the “Nocturnal Council” in the Laws (which is actually to meet just before dawn), a body of citizens who are selected for wisdom and judiciousness and whose role is to review the laws and suggest potential changes to a body empowered to change them, rather than (as in the Statesman, at least theoretically) to override them when it is better to do so (Reid 2021).
Much literature on Plato’s political philosophy has debated whether the turn in the Laws to the “second-best” reflects a new form of realism on Plato’s part about politics more generally, invoking other remarks by the Visitor from Athens, one of the three interlocutors, along with Cleinias and the Spartan Megillus, which suggest that no one could ever be uniformly and reliably virtuous and immune to corruption, though this is not unequivocally stated (e.g. 874e–875d). Has Plato in the Laws given up on his earlier idealism which rested on the possibility of the philosopher-king, or on the idea of the perfectly knowledgeable statesman? If so, should that be interpreted as disillusionment or pessimism on his part, or as a more democratic or liberal turn? Or are there more fundamental continuities that connect and underlie even these seeming shifts? These questions structure the broad debate about the meaning and trajectory of Platonic political philosophy (for an overview, compare Klosko 2006 to Schofield 2006).
The two Platonic themes of superior political knowledge and, expressed particularly in his Laws, political participation, also structure the political thought of Aristotle (384–322 BCE), who studied in Plato’s Academy as a youth and researched there for many years thereafter. Living much of his life as a resident alien in Athens, with close familial ties to the extra-polis Macedonian court which would, near the end of his life, bring Athens under its sway, Aristotle at once thematized the fundamental perspective of the Greek citizenship of equals and at the same time acknowledged the claim to rule of anyone of truly superior political knowledge. While building on Plato’s project of demarcating political expertise and depicting ideal as well as imperfect cities, the advances and new directions that Aristotle pioneered in political philosophy reflect certain disagreements with Plato in their wider philosophies, though also with some deep commonalities.
4.1 Aristotle’s Philosophical Method and Ethics
Whereas Plato’s philosophy continually sought a single or small set of unifying truths behind the veil of appearance, Aristotle’s wide-ranging researches into what would now be considered the natural sciences, as well as in logic and other areas of inquiry, manifested respect for the opinions of “the many and the wise” as a starting-point for philosophical understanding. His approach likewise manifested appreciation of the multiplicity of forms of knowledge, in particular the cleavage between theoretical understanding of the world as it necessarily is, and practical knowledge of how to deliberate about acting in relation to whatever “could be otherwise.” Uniting his accounts of phenomena as different as plants, animals, ethics and politics, was a teleological structure of explanation. Biological creatures work to fulfill the realization of their end or telos, a specific way of living a complete life characteristic of the plants or animals of their own kind, which is the distinctive purpose that defines their fundamental nature—just as human artifacts are designed and used for specific ends. While every human being, in acting, posits a particular telos as the purpose making that action intelligible, this should ideally reflect the overall natural telos of humans as such.
Here, however, arises a problem unique to humans. Whereas other animals have a single telos defining their nature (living the full life of a frog, including reproduction, being the sole telos of each frog, in the example used by Lear 1998), humans both have a distinctive human nature—arising from the unique capacity to use language to deliberate about how to act—and also share in the divine nature in their ability to use reason to understand the eternal and intelligible order of the world. Practical reason is the domain of ethics and politics, the uniquely human domain. Yet the political life is not necessarily the best life, compared with that devoted to the divinely shared human capacity for theoretical reason and philosophical thinking (compare Nicomachean Ethics I with X.7–9). Whether it is the life of contemplative reason or the life of practical reason that is best for humans, the good life will require the development of the various human moral and intellectual virtues, which include (without being limited to) courage, moderation, justice, prudence, understanding, and wisdom.
4.2 Ethics and Politics by Way of Law
In considering practical reason to be the domain of both ethics and politics, Aristotle follows Plato in drawing no sharp line between those two domains (see on this point for ancient testimonies and modern arguments respectively, Bodéüs 1993: 22–24 and 59–63, and Vander Waerdt 1991, though for a contrary argument, see Duvall and Dotson 1998). In fact he closes his Nicomachean Ethics by remarking that for most people, the practice of ethics can only be ensured by their being governed by law, which combines necessity (compulsion) with reason and habituates people toward virtuous action (Nicomachean Ethics 1179b32–1180a5) (Duke 2020). Because, for most people, the ethical life presupposes government by law, the student of ethics must become a student of political science, studying the science of legislation in light of the collection of constitutions assembled by Aristotle and his school in the Lyceum. All but part of one of the over one hundred items in this collection reported in antiquity have been lost: a considerable part of the analysis of the “Constitution of Athens” was recovered from a papyrus discovered in the nineteenth century. Aristotle’s theoretical claims about the nature of politics in the Politics must be understood against this backdrop. The legislator (whose standpoint is adopted in the Politics, see the entry on Aristotle’s political theory) needs to have a grasp of the nature of politics as such (pursued especially in Books I and III); an understanding of the major faultlines in the interpretation and practice of politics (pursued especially in Books II and IV–VI); and a grip on the structure and characteristics of the specific city for which he aims to legislate (pursued also in Book II for existing constitutions and constitutional models; Books IV–VI for types of flawed constitutions; and Books VII–VIII for the “best constitution” (1323a14).
At the beginning of Book IV (1288b1–39), Aristotle offers a fourfold account of what the expertise regarding constitutions must encompass. As glossed by Eugene Garver (2011: 107), and drawing on standard Aristotelian terminology distinguishing formal from material causes, these include: “The first, ‘that which is best in the abstract’...orients politics around the end of politics, the best life. The second, the best relative to circumstances, starts with the material cause and organizes political inquiry around the best that can be made out of given material. The third, the best on a hypothesis, starts not from the true end of politics, but any posited end, and so looks for means and devices that will preserve any given constitution. The final inquiry, the search for ‘the form of constitution which is best suited to states in general,’ articulates a formal cause that can organize almost any material, any kind of people.” These four elements of expertise regarding constitution are not tidily segregated in different parts of the text; they are pursued variously, sometimes in combination, and draw on wider discussions of the nature of politics and the human good that are threaded throughout.
4.3 Claims to Rule
The Politics begins by setting the stage for the first kind of understanding of constitutions identified above, by offering an analysis of the teleological ends of life and the human capacity for speech which together support its two most famous contentions: that “it is evident that the state is a creation of nature, and that man is by nature a political animal” (I.2, 1253a2–3). (Hu 2020 discusses the naturalness of the polis.) While for some modern readers this sentence asserts that political participation is necessary for virtuous human flourishing (as for Irwin 1990), others contend that “the argument that man is a political animal does not imply that man must participate in politics to become virtuous, only that he must literally be a part of a polis and live under its laws.” (Mulgan 1990: 205) In either case, as Hannah Arendt (1958) emphasizes, Aristotle’s understanding of civic unity insists on respect for human plurality as the condition of political action; in Book II, he criticizes Plato’s kallipolis (the beautiful city for which a constitution is sketched in the Republic) for interpreting the requirement of civic unity in so extreme a fashion as to have obliterated the properly political domain altogether (Nussbaum 1980). Nevertheless, civic unity is still an aim of Aristotle’s ideal virtuous regime, and a limited Platonic spirit survives in the common meals that this regime would offer to all citizens: VII.10.
If “man is by nature a political animal,” how can it be just to exclude some human beings from a full share, and in some cases from any share, in political life? Aristotle recognizes that this question must be confronted, and he acknowledges some unnamed thinkers who had answered that it is indeed unjust. For these unnamed figures, slavery is not merely a conventional arrangement (rather than a natural one); it is a conventional arrangement which is contrary to what is natural, and this is why it should be counted as unjust. As Aristotle describes their view: “Others affirm that the rule of a master over slaves is contrary to nature [literally: ‘against nature’ (para phusin)], and that the distinction between slave and freeman exists by convention [nomō, dative] only, and not by nature [phusei]; and being an interference with nature is therefore unjust [not dikaion]: for it is force [biaion]” (I.4, 1253b20–23). Aristotle blocks the inference that any relationship of slavery is contrary to nature and therefore unjust, by arguing that there are or could be grounds for a kind of slavery that is indeed consonant with nature: namely, he claims, enslavement of those whose practical reason is incapable of fully ruling their own actions. He contends that the person who is by nature a slave “has no deliberative faculty at all; the woman has, but it is without authority, and the child has, but it is immature” (I.13, 1260a12–14) (on interpretation of this passage in light of Aristotle’s biological works, Karbowski 2012; for an argument that Aristotelian natures are made through habituation, Frank 2005). This does not imply that any or all actually enslaved persons are natural slaves, though Aristotle in the same chapter and elsewhere remarks on “barbarians,” especially peoples who live in certain climates, as fitted for slavery (Kraut 2002: 290–95). Some of the pernicious afterlives of this view and of the Aristotelian account of natural slavery more generally in later defenses of slavery are recounted in Huxley 1980 and Monoson 2011. On many interpretations, the view also leads to some tension in specifying the function of slavery as an institution, since that institution presupposes that the slave can understand and follow the master’s commands, which would seem to require some degree of deliberative capacity even on Aristotle’s own terms. The exclusion of some human beings from a share in political life and their subjection to the domination and exploitation of a relationship of enslavement shadows Aristotle’s exploration of the value of the life of politics for realizing human nature.
Elsewhere in the Politics, the Greek dictum of citizenship among equals—that “a citizen is one who shares in governing and being governed” (III.13, 1283b42–1284a1, also translatable as “ruling and being ruled in turn”)—is presented as an analytical truth, leaving open how such equality is to be conceived in practice (and again, consistent in the logic of the argument with the potential exclusion of some from the domain of equality altogether). The citizen “shares in the administration of justice, and in offices” (III.1, 1275a23–24). In defective regimes, the good citizen and the good man may come apart. The good citizen of a defective regime is one whose character suits the particular regime in question (whether oligarchic, or democratic, say) and equips him to support it loyally; hence he may be deformed or stunted by a role of holding (or a role of holding accountable) offices defined on incorrect terms. In “the best state,” however, the citizen is “one who is able and chooses to be governed and to govern with a view to the life of excellence” (III.13, 1284a1–3). In such a state, “the citizens must not lead the life of artisans or tradesmen, for such a life is ignoble and inimical to excellence” (VII.9, 1328b39–41), nor that of farmers, as political participation requires leisure. Here the limitations and exclusions among actual humans licensed by the principled formulation of the possibility—requiring actual realization—of human virtue become apparent.
Aristotle recognizes that there are other possible claims, or as it were titles, to political rule: “There is also a doubt as to what is to be the supreme power in the state:—Is it the multitude? Or the wealthy? Or the good? Or the one best man? Or a tyrant?” (III.10, 1281a11–13). He develops in particular detail the arguments that might be made on behalf of the many and the knowledgeable one respectively. The many can judge, as they did in Athenian dramatic audiences, juries, and the Assembly (where they “judged”, by voting on, the merits of something advanced for their consideration, whether a play, an indictment, or a speaker’s proposed resolution). Aristotle uses the image of a collectively provided feast to illustrate the potential superiority of such collective judgement; how to interpret this image (whether as a potluck, Waldron 1995, Wilson 2011, Ober 2013, or in a more aggregative way, Bouchard 2011, Cammack 2013, Lane 2013a, Hatzistavrou 2021) and other images that he uses is a matter of some renewed controversy (for a review, see Bobonich 2015). But the lesson Aristotle draws from the various images is clearly limited to vindicating a role of the many in electing and holding accountable incumbents of the highest offices rather than in holding such offices themselves (III.11, 1281b31; Lane 2013a). The many can contribute to virtuous decision-making in their collective capacity of judgment—presumably in assemblies and juries—but not as individual high officials (Lane 2013a, 2014b, Poddighe 2014).
In the contrasting case of the one supremely excellent person, Aristotle argues that such a person has, strictly speaking, no equals, and so cannot be made justly to take a turn in rule, holding office for a time, as one citizen among others. Instead it is right that such a person should rule without the term limits that political office would ordinarily require:
If, however, there be some one person, or more than one, although not enough to make up the full complement of a state, whose excellence is so pre-eminent that the excellence or the political capacity of all the rest admit of no comparison with his or theirs, he or they can be no longer regarded as part of a state; for justice will not be done to the superior, if he is reckoned only as the equal of those who are so far inferior to him in excellence and in political capacity. Such a man may truly be deemed a god among men ….men like him should be kings in their state for life. (III.13, 1284a3–11…1284b32–34; cf. III.17, 1288a24–29)
On one reading, this implies that virtuous monarchy does indeed count as a political regime, albeit one in which only one or a few of the citizens are eligible to hold the highest offices (Riesbeck 2014). Yet this argument is left at the hypothetical level. In the absence of such a superlatively virtuous, even godlike individual, the formulation of political rule as involving some kind of turn-taking by a large body of sufficiently virtuous citizens remains preeminent (though even this should not be read to imply that all should in fact alternate in office, or even that all should necessarily be eligible for all offices).
As Aristotle turn to consideration of the best constitutions relative to particular (and imperfect) circumstances, the major issue is conflict between rival factions over the basis for defining equality and so justice. In the Nicomachean Ethics, Book V, Aristotle had identified two types of equality: geometrical, or proportional to merit; and arithmetical, or proportional to mere numerical counting. In Politics III.9 he picks up this distinction and aligns it with the conflict between oligarchical and democratic justice. As he later puts it, “Democrats say that justice is that to which the majority agree, oligarchs that to which the wealthier class agree…” (VI.3, 1318a18–20), while truly aristocratic justice would enfranchise only those equal in virtue. This attention to the actual political contentions of rival Greek groups leads into a discussion of the relative goodness and badness of imperfect regimes, modeled in part on Plato’s Statesman. Whereas that Platonic text had distinguished monarchy from tyranny, aristocracy from oligarchy, and good from bad democracy on the basis of obedience to law (all these regimes being conceived as lacking the genuine political knowledge of the true statesman), Aristotle instead makes the dividing line the question of ruling for the common advantage as opposed to ruling for the advantage of a single faction. The “bad” democracy, for example, rules for the faction of the many as opposed to the faction of the few, whereas the “good” democracy—which Aristotle baptizes “polity”, using the general word for “constitution” (politeia)—rules for the advantage of all citizens. Aristotle augments this analysis with appeals to historical narrative, overlapping with the narrative of Athenian political history offered in the Constitution of Athens compiled by him or, more likely, by members of his school. On his telling in the Politics, Athenian democracy had degenerated from an aboriginal democracy of non-meddling farmers (VI.4), through various intermediate forms, to a democracy (seemingly that of contemporary fourth-century Athens) in which men rule, not laws. Yet this trajectory does not prevent him from asserting that in general democracy is “most tolerable” of the three perversions (IV.2, 1289b4–5) and noting that it at least involves the characteristic political liberty of ruling and being ruled in turn (VI.2).
A further major turn in the analysis comes when the question of some single “best” regime is replaced by a question about not what is “best” in the “ideal” sense, but the good constitution “that is easily attainable by all” (IV.1, 1288a37–39) and in practice best for most cities (IV.11). This Aristotle calls the middling regime: a political, because sociological, mean between oligarchy and democracy, in which the middle classes hold the preponderance of both wealth distribution and political power. Thus it is attainable through reform of either an oligarchy or a democracy, the most prevalent constitutions among the Greeks. Strikingly, his example of such a regime is Sparta: presented as a case of a characteristically democratic distribution of education (among citizens only, of course) coupled with the characteristically aristocratic principle of election to offices rather than selection by lot (IV.9) (though to be sure, democracies such as Athens made use of election for certain of the highest offices as well).
4.4 Aristotle in Political Philosophy
“All modern discussions of citizenship as a noninstrumental good-in-itself are indebted, if only indirectly, to him [sc. Aristotle]” (Ober 1998: 290). The Politics emphasizes that “a state is not a mere society, having a common place, established for the prevention of mutual crime and for the sake of exchange” but is rather “a community of families and aggregations of families [sc. united] in well-being, for the sake of a perfect and self-sufficing life” (III.9, 1280b30–34, with square brackets added). It has been suggested in this article that the final clause of that sentence is important: Aristotelian citizenship counts as a noninstrumental good-in-itself only so long as it does indeed aim at the telos of a perfect life. That is, while Aristotle indeed valued the possibility of political participation in officeholding and the control of officeholding as part of the best constitution, he saw its value as most fully realized only insofar as it was an expression of virtue, as it would be in that best constitution (whether governed by a collectivity of virtuous citizens as in the regime described in Books VII and VIII, or in the rare and perhaps purely hypothetical case of a superlatively virtuous monarch).
Nevertheless, Ober’s observation rings true more broadly for the historical significance of Aristotle’s political thought. The medieval rediscovery in the West of the full Greek texts of Aristotle’s Ethics and Politics and their translation into Latin in the thirteenth century served as a basis for reconceiving civic life as valuable on the basis of reason independent of revelation. Thus 1260 – the date of William of Moerbeke’s complete Latin translation of the Politics—symbolizes a fundamental turning point in political philosophy, one in which Aristotelian philosophy would be widely deployed within certain strands of thought of the Catholic Church, while also inspiring a wide range of philosophical movements and later becoming the target of others. Indeed, modern debates over the meaning of Aristotle find him a precursor of or inspiration for a range of intellectual and political positions: Aristotle as a communitarian (MacIntyre 1984) vs. Aristotle as an exponent of class conflict (Yack 1993); Aristotle as a democrat, or at least as providing the basis for democracy (Frank 2005), vs. Aristotle in opposition to Athenian democracy in his day (Ober 1998). One interesting development has been the use of Aristotle to articulate an ethics of capability (Nussbaum 1993). In evaluating Aristotle’s political thought, it is important to distinguish between modern democratic assumptions and his own starting points, many of which were in tension with the democracies of his own time.
5. Hellenistic Philosophies and Politics
Important developments in political thinking and practice took place under the Hellenistic kingdoms that supplanted Macedon in its suzerainty over the formerly independent Greek city-states. These included, for example, a genre of rhetorical letters addressed to rulers, and the important analysis of Greek and Roman constitutional change by the second-century Greek historian Polybius (Hahm 2000). As kingships flourished among the Hellenistic kingdoms until they in turn came under Roman rule, not only the value of political participation, but also the proper domains of politics, were widely debated. Different authors would orient themselves respectively to still-surviving polis communities and the various leagues which united many of them in the Hellenistic period; to the kingdoms mentioned above; to the Roman constitution, and eventually to the special forms of imperial power which eventually arose therein; and in more philosophical terms, to the cosmos as a whole and all rational beings within it.
5.1 Persisting and New Schools
In addition to the major movements of Epicureanism and Stoicism treated separately below, other schools also persisted and arose in this period. Those persisting included the Platonic Academy (transformed in a skeptical direction) and the Aristotelian Lyceum (the Peripatetic School). Newcomers, albeit tracing themselves to their own understanding of the figure of Socrates, included the Cynics and the Pyrrhonist skeptics, and we focus on these latter two here.
The Cynics took their name from the Greek for “dog,” referring to the animal-like life indifferent to social conventions which they pursued, carrying out all their bodily functions in full public view. While this generally led them to advocate what might be considered more an anti-politics than a politics, a provocative statement by their founder Diogenes of Sinope (c.404–323 BCE) – answering a query about his birthplace by asserting himself to be a “citizen of the world” (Diogenes Laertius, VI. 63) – would resonate with later Stoics and others developing a political philosophy that has become known as cosmopolitanism (see the entry on cosmopolitanism). Diogenes’ indifference to political power was also reflected in his reported reply to the visiting world-conqueror Alexander the Great, asking him to request a boon: all the Cynic wanted was for the emperor to step out of his light (Diogenes Laertius, VI. 38). In a lineage stretching from Diogenes to his follower Crates, who became the teacher of Zeno, the founder of Stoicism, we can see the Cynic-Stoic kinship especially in the early Stoics’ rejection of many conventional political and moral opinions. Yet the Cynics also manifested some parallels with the Epicureans and even with the skeptics.
One branch of ancient skepticism had its roots in Plato’s Academy, which from the time of Arcesilaus’ headship in the mid-260s BCE turned in a skeptical direction, arguing that there was no clear criterion of truth and so philosophers can only suspend judgment. While that was an “Academic” position within philosophical debate, a possible forebear (Pyrrho) had in the fourth century BCE putatively demonstrated the tranquility of mind which such a position could bring, by living a life seemingly without any investment in the truth of his beliefs (though the question of how, and how far, Pyrrho was guided by appearances would perplex later followers). (See the entry on Pyrrho.) From the first century BCE, a radical movement of “Pyrrhonist” skepticism was developed outside the Academy by Aenesidemus, followed about a century later by Agrippa, in a movement summed up for posterity in the second-century CE work of Sextus Empiricius (Outlines of Pyrrhonism) which would have a considerable influence on early modern philosophy. Meanwhile the milder “Academic” skepticism, allowing the inquirer to incline to one side or another though not to invest in full belief, had significant influence on first-century BCE figures such as Cicero. (See the entry on ancient skepticism.)
Founded by Epicurus in his “Garden” in Athens in the early third century BCE, and elaborated by, among others, the remarkable Latin poet Lucretius in the mid first century BCE, the various members of the Epicurean school did not see politics as a straightforward part of the good life or a fulfillment of the flourishing of human nature, though their views of its origins, nature, and largely instrumental value were complex (for an overview, see Robitzsch 2017). For his part, Epicurus himself (see the entry on Epicurus) is reported in his “Key Doctrines” to have held a contractarian view of justice for mutual protection from harm (reminiscent of Glaucon’s initial proposal about justice in Republic Book II, which itself seems to echo the nomos-phusis debate among the 5th c. BCE sophists). Justice serves utility (Alberti 1995): as Epicurus wrote, “If someone makes a law and it does not happen to accord with the utility of social relationships, it no longer has the nature of justice” (KD 36, LS 22B) (on Epicurean justice, Aoiz and Boeri 2022). The greatest utility is that of tranquility or security, which is the naturally desired end or goal. While, as Annas 1993: 298 argues, the individual Epicurean agent will be disposed to justice as part of the path to tranquility properly understood (“The just <life> is most free from disturbance…”, KD 36, LS 22B), nevertheless laws will be necessary to enforce obedience to the contract by most people, and indeed one should obey the laws in order to attain peace of mind (KD 34–35, LS 22A4–5).
For Epicureans, the city serves a legitimate and necessary function in ensuring security. But this does not mean that an active public life is also normally the most rational path to security. On the contrary, while many people will be attracted to the possible fortune and glory of such a life, and while cities need such people, the Epicurean sage will on the whole refrain from active political participation (for discussion of texts, including some exceptions, both in Lucretius and other evidence, see Fowler 2007). Instead the insecurities of life are best met by the formation of a community of friends living together and sharing their lives. Friendships both secure us against risks and anxieties (more reliably than the hazards of a political career) and also provide pleasures and indeed joy: to quote Epicurus once again, “The man of noble character is chiefly concerned with wisdom and friendship. Of these the former is a mortal good, but the latter is immortal” (Vatican Sayings 78, LS 22F (7)).
A potential sticking point for Epicurean ethics and politics is the justification for a still further dimension of communal life: the willingness to sacrifice oneself for a friend, or to risk breaking the law for the greater good of one’s fellow citizens (Sharples 1996: 122). It would seem difficult to construct a compelling theoretical justification for such actions from Epicurean premises, which privilege obedience to law in order to avoid civic strife (as seen for example in key moments in Lucretius’ poem De Rerum Natura, V.925–1157; see Campbell 2003, especially on lines 1011–1027), though Cicero has Torquatus report in De Finibus (I.69) that at least some Epicureans believed that friendly relationships could mature into love of a friend for their own sake. Whatever the theoretical conundrum, it did not prevent a number of Epicureans from undertaking such risky public service, among them more than one of the assassins of Julius Caesar (Sedley 1997; Fowler 1989 discusses a wide range of Roman Epicurean attitudes). A more modest but still striking example of Epicurean public service is the huge portico inscribed with Epicurean sayings and exegesis in second-century Oenoanda (in modern-day Turkey) by one Diogenes of that city (Smith 1992, 2003). Whether or not his fellow citizens appreciated the instruction, modern archaeologists and philosophers are grateful for this unparalleled source of knowledge of Epicurean philosophy.
While Epicurus held that the sage would not engage in politics except in “some special circumstance,” Zeno, the founder of the Stoic school (see the entry on Stoicism), held rather that a true sage “will engage in politics unless something prevents it” (Seneca, De Otio 3.2, as translated and quoted in Sharples 1996: 124; SVF 1.271). As we shall see, a Stoic commitment to politics generally took it to be part of nature’s rational plan for human happiness, though this was not incompatible with a Cynic tincture of questioning whether existing laws are truly in accordance with the natural law (Vogt 2008). The question however of the nature of the polity in which politics was to be exercised remains contested as a matter of the interpretation of various Stoic figures, who across the lifetime of the school encompassed both the early generation of the school’s leaders (Zeno and his successor Chrysippus) and later figures thriving in the Roman period who wrote variously in Greek and in Latin (for an overview, see Laurand 2005). To be sure, the polity in question was invariably figured as a city, according to the account given in Dio Chrysostom (36.20: “ They [the Stoics] say that a city is a group of people living in the same place and administered by law” (SVF 3.329, as translated in LS 67J). But which people? Whether the members of this city were to be all humans together with the gods, or only human sages and the gods, and whether the city is to be envisaged as a distinct foundation or as identical with the cosmos, has much exercised both Stoic thinkers and subsequent interpreters. And which law? How does or should the law of a particular city relate to the natural law? These questions are canvassed further as this section unfolds.
Both Zeno and Chrysippus wrote works in the Platonic genre entitled Republic, neither of which survives in full. (So too, reportedly, had Diogenes the Cynic.) Zeno’s was written as a young man, allegedly under Cynic influence, rejecting the use of money in the characteristic Cynic vein. His portrait of the republic combines the Stoic idea of a natural law by which human conduct is harmonized with cosmic order, with a classical vision of politics in which a Platonic ideal of friendship through communist and sexual bonding (more erotic than familial for Zeno) persists (following Schofield 1991: 22–56). He seems to have adopted Plato’s prescription for the community of women and children, and at least some aspects of his insistence on the potential civic equality of men and women and political irrelevance of their anatomical differences. Humans share many characteristics and tendencies with other animals, and their initial impulse to form into society is a social rather than strictly political one: they are animated by a tendency to associate with those akin to themselves (the Stoic notion of oikeiôsis).
Such a social tendency is, according to what is reported of the opening of Chrysippus’ lost treatise On Law, transformed into a political relationship by means of law: “Law is king of all things human and divine. Law must preside over what is honourable and base, as ruler and as guide, and thus be the standard of right and wrong, prescribing to animals whose nature is political what they should do, and prohibiting them from what they should not do” (SVF 3.314, as translated in LS 67R). Yet, in keeping with some tendencies in Platonism and Cynicism, such law might have to be radically different from existing laws if it is to be in full conformity with nature and reason. For Chrysippus, even certain forms of incest are said to have been “discredited without reason” (SVF 3.753, as translated in LS 67F): a comparison with animals would license them.
Plutarch’s characterization of Zeno’s Republic as prescribing that “we should regard all men as our fellow-citizens and local residents” (SVF 1.262, as translated in LS 67A), composed around the end of the first century of the Common Era, has often been read as prescribing a kind of cosmopolitanism that builds on Diogenes’ paradoxical Cynic version of that stance. However, the reliability of this text as an account of Zeno has been questioned, and just how this fellowship of all humans relates to the fellowship of rationally perfect sages and to the sharing of humans and gods in the cosmos has been debated (for a defense and interpretation of Plutarch’s claim as applying to all humans, see Vogt 2008: 86–90, contra the views of Schofield 1991 and Vander Waerdt 1991). Arguably, as in the case of Aristotle, the underlying kinship by nature establishes a potential for a full civic membership which is to be based solely on virtue, itself potentially available to all rational beings but realized in practice by few or perhaps even none. This is one interpretation of the report that Zeno presented “only virtuous people in the Republic as citizens, friends, relations and free” (as translated in LS 67B; this is preserved in Diogenes Laertius 7.32–7.33, found in SVF 1.226 and 1.222 respectively).
Especially for the early Stoics, existing cities remained an accepted arena both for political action in practice—Stoic sages and scholars advising kings and serving in offices (SVF 3.686; translated in LS 67W)—insofar as the notion of a distinctive individual city remained the principal framework for defining the nature of politics in terms of justice. Yet the role of natural law already in the early Stoics, and certainly in later ones, came to support an alternative horizon for politics on the scale of the cosmos as a whole (Laurand 2005). Malcolm Schofield (1991: 103) has argued that this development “mediates the transition from republicanism to natural law theory,” so bequeathing a crucial resource to early modern thinkers who sought to construct new versions of the latter. Meanwhile, in the years of the Roman republic, certain affinities between Stoic and republican ideas proved significant, as we shall now see.
5.4 Hellenistic Philosophies and Roman Republican Politics
Roman fascination with Greek philosophy was catalyzed by the Athenian embassy of three leading philosophers sent to Rome to plead the legal case of their city in 156/155 BCE; it continued as late as the early sixth century CE, as seen especially in the life of the eminent philosophical polymath and Roman senator under barbarian rule, Boethius. Roman aristocrats were especially attracted to the Stoic willingness to countenance the kingly and political lives alongside the scholarly one as equally preferable (SVF 3.686, translated in LS 67W). They began to study the Stoa seriously from the late second century BCE. The affinity between Stoicism and Roman republicanism was enhanced by the second-century Stoic teacher Panaetius, who seems to have argued that the Roman mos maiorum or ancient ways and customs were the best form of government, so burnishing philosophical principle with the ancestral piety dear to the Romans. To be sure, in the later throes of civil war, many Stoics would have difficulty in justifying assassination of tyrants, insofar as civil war would be worse than even a monarchy flouting the law, as one Roman adherent to the school would say in rebuffing Junius Brutus’ attempt to recruit him to the conspiracy to murder Caesar (Plut. Brut. 12. 3–4). Other Romans were strongly attracted to Epicureanism or to Cynicism, and some of these, however paradoxically, likewise played significant roles in political life. Thus the distinctive lineaments of the Roman republic, now to be described, were debated and interpreted by the philosophically minded in terms of Greek political theory; conversely, it has been argued that Hellenistic philosophies were significant in shaping the ways in which Roman jurists conceived of law (Brouwer 2021).
6. The Roman Republic and Cicero
While the founders of the city of Rome were said to be the legendary twins Romulus and Remus, Romans would come to identify the origins of their distinctive liberty in the killing of a tyrannical king, generally dated in 509 BCE, by the ancestor of the Junius Brutus who would eventually kill Julius Caesar. The position of king was replaced by two annually elected consuls, the royal council became the Senate, and popular assemblies were established to elect magistrates and pass the laws they proposed. By Cicero’s time, this regime—self-identified as the S.P.Q.R., the “Senatus populusque Romanus” or “Senate and people of Rome”– had become interpreted as a version of the “mixed constitution” which had had a long if complicated and until then relatively minor history as an idea in the works of Thucydides, Plato, and Aristotle (Hahm 2009). An influential account of Rome as such a mixed constitution, in this case combining the three classical regime forms of monarchy, aristocracy, and democracy, had already been given by the Greek historian Polybius, who referred to the distinction between the characteristic powers in each kind of regime and their mutual checking and balancing (Histories 6.11–18; see von Fritz 1954). Whereas in Polybius the achievement of balance between the different powers was portrayed as resulting from mutual rivalrous self-assertion, Cicero would refer to it in more harmonious language, a form of balancing (compensatio, De rep. II. 57) with the ideas of mixing and tempering paramount, as observed by E.M. Atkins (2000: 491). (For a useful overview of Roman political thought, see J.W. Atkins 2018.)
According to Polybius, each element of the constitution exercised a distinctive form of power. The elected consuls wielded imperium, a form of executive command; the Senate enjoyed the power to deliberate and consent to specific policies; and the popular assemblies served as the source of authoritative law, also electing the magistrates, including the popular tribunes who in turn exercised veto powers over the Senate. An originally republican formula relating the consuls to the people as the source of authoritative law survives in a complete prescript of the Augustan period: “Titus Quinctius Crispinus [consul] lawfully asked the people, and the people lawfully resolved,” as translated in Lintott 1999: 3. Moreover, the tumultuous personal quest for office and influence led many aristocrats and politically ambitious men to seek support among the people, sometimes with radical measures of land reform which Cicero, among others, would resolutely oppose. The theorizing of the proper role of aristocratic leadership and Senatorial independence, together with Platonic analogies for the requisite concord and harmony in the city, would become central themes of Cicero’s political philosophy, as he wrote: “What the musicians call harmony with respect to song is concord in the state, the tightest and best bond of safety in every republic; and that concord can never exist without justice” (De rep. II.69.)
6.1 Cicero: Life
Marcus Tullius Cicero (106–43 BCE) was the most famous “homo novus” or new man of Roman politics, hailing from a minor provincial landowning family rather than the great clans of hereditary nobility. He rose to the office of consul and the lifetime Senatorial membership it subsequently conferred by his audacious wit as a lawyer and orator in public prosecutions. His greatest moment as consul in 63 BCE came in exposing a conspiracy by Catiline; the brutal suppression of the conspiracy by executing Roman citizens without trial, however, would tar his political legacy. He became an enemy of Julius Caesar (though accepting a pardon from him at the end of a stretch of civil wars in 47 BCE), seeing the assertion of power first by Caesar and then Marc Antony as fatal to the republic. Having defended in his De officiis the kind of tyrannicide that he took the killing of Caesar in 44 BCE to have constituted, and attacked Antony mercilessly in his series of fourteen Philippics the following year, Cicero was murdered in response by partisans of the then-ruling Triumvirate to which Antony belonged.
The writings of Cicero were virtually canonized subsequent to his death as classic models of rhetoric and philosophy; as Richard Tuck (1990: 43) has remarked, “For fifteen hundred years, from the fourth century to the nineteenth, schoolchildren in Europe were exposed daily to two books. One was the Bible, and the other was the works of Cicero.” His many speeches and letters are themselves of considerable political and often philosophical interest, reworking the evaluative vocabulary of Roman law and politics in ways which suited his overarching (and changing) political purposes (for a critical assessment, see Gildenhard 2011, which concludes that “In his rhetoric Cicero...consistently refused to recognize the positions of his adversaries as genuine political positions and challenged their identities as senatorial peers, Roman citizens, or even human beings ”(Gildenhard 2011: 390). While his philosophical writings—composed for the most part as a student of philosophy in Rome and Athens, and then in a brief period (46–44 BCE) when political developments led him to retreat from active public life—cover a wide range of topics, including for example, among those especially relevant to politics are two works on the political role of the orator and the nature of oratory or rhetoric, celebrating the moral purposes of the orator as essential to the success of republican government.
While Cicero adhered to a moderate skepticism in general philosophical matters, he would draw on a number of Stoic ideas in formulating his own ethical and political teachings: these were shaped by the lectures he had attended by the Stoic Posidonius in Rhodes, the writings of Posidonius’ teacher Panaetius and other earlier and contemporary Stoic texts, as well as (we may speculate) conversation with the Stoic Diodotus whom he accommodated in his household in Rome for many years. In particular, Cicero emphasized the Stoic themes of the natural affinity for society and the existence of natural law. At the same time, Platonic themes and models were also important in his political writings (for overall interpretations, Atkins 2020, Schofield 2021). The discussion below is limited to the two dialogues which are explicitly modeled on Plato’s Republic and Laws, titled by Cicero in Latin De re publica and De legibus ( On the Commonwealth and On the Laws), together with his most important work on political ethics, the De officiis (On Duties), which exercised particular influence on subsequent Western moral and political thought.
6.2 De re publica
De re publica was composed by Cicero between 54 and 51 BCE, a turbulent period of strife in Roman politics. Its dramatic setting is in 129 BCE during the crisis caused by Tiberius Gracchus, a consul who had championed a property redistribution law for the people and whom members of the Senate had violently suppressed as a putative threat to Roman civil order. All of it except the “Dream of Scipio” (Book VI) was lost from the Middle Ages onward; it has been reconstructed from references and excerpts in later authors, supplemented by a palimpsest of much of Books I–III discovered in 1819. Framed as a dialogue between Scipio Aemilianus, a hero of the resistance against Tiberius Gracchus and his like-minded brother, and several others of his actual contemporaries, the dialogue has a discernible structure identified by E.M. Atkins (2000: 490): Books I–II treat “the best condition of the res publica”; Books III–IV treat “justice and human nature”, topics common to the best city and the best citizen; and Books V–VI treat the “best citizen’ in discussing the statesman and in the Dream of Scipio.
While justice was for Cicero, as for the Greeks, the fundamental bond of the commonwealth, he offered distinctive and influential linked definitions of the res publica (”commonwealth“, or more literally the ”public thing“) as the res populi, the ”property/thing of the people“, and of a populus or ”people“ in turn as ”an assemblage associated with one another by agreement on “law” [iuris consensu] and community of interest [utilitatis communione]“ (both, I.39). This could be interpreted either as a strong normative claim—the people agree on ”law“ [ius], also translatable as right or justice, and share a common interest—or alternatively in a weaker deflationary manner, the people nominally accepting a common law and sharing a common conception of their self-interest which may or may not be in accord with justice. Such ambiguity would be famously exploited by Augustine, who used Cicero’s definition to argue that lacking justice, conflicted and divided republican Rome had been no commonwealth, before offering his own even weaker definition of a ”people“ as those united in (any) common love (City of God, II.21). In Cicero’s own hands, the definitions were used to stress that the commonwealth was the property of the people, who entrusted it to the magistrates to be used for the common good (I.51–2), and that the ”welfare of the people is the supreme law“ (”salus populi suprema lex“, De leg. III.8; this was a reference to a maxim in the ancient ”Twelve Tables“ compendium of Roman law). It followed too that just as Plato denied the title of a (single unified) regime to the imperfect regimes torn by civil discord, so Cicero inferred that a corrupt regime was not strictly speaking a res publica at all (III.43–48). The role of the statesman (rector rei publicae) is to aim at the happiness of the citizens, defined in a laxer way than most Greek philosophers would allow, as wealth, true glory, and virtue all combined.
The character Scipio adheres to Greek philosophical principles in declaring that ”the commonwealth cannot possibly function without justice“ (II.70), adhering to the standard abstract definition in an Aristotelian vein of justice as ”giving each their due“ (ius suum cuique tribuere). In Book III, two other dialogue participants present respectively the famous arguments given on one day for justice, and on the next day against justice, by the skeptical Greek philosopher and ambassador to Rome Carneades during the embassy in 156/155 BCE mentioned above. Cicero’s presentation reverses the order, no doubt to give justice the last word.
In Cicero’s hands, Carneades’ case against justice avails itself of the nomos/phusis contrast and of the kind of ambition for power expressed by Plato’s character Callicles in the Gorgias. Justice is not natural, as it differs radically among different peoples; it conflicts with wisdom, which tells us ”to rule over as many people as possible, to enjoy pleasures, to be powerful, to rule, to be a lord“ (III.24b), and it is fatal for states and empires, which can’t survive without injustice. In reply, the speech for justice avails itself of Stoic themes: ”true law is right reason, consonant with nature“; there is ”one eternal and unchangeable law“ [i.e. what has come to be known as ”natural law“] (III.33). This includes rule of the best over the weakest for the benefit of the latter (III.36): as in Plato’s Republic, the justice of rulership is not exploitation but paternalistic benefit. And as in Plato’s Republic Book X, where the myth of Er supplies a revisionary religious justification for justice (it will help you to choose your next reincarnation well), so Cicero’s Republic concludes with a dream recounted by Scipio Aemilianus about his even more eminent Roman ancestor, Scipio Africanus. The dream describes the divine order which not only rewards humans for just service to their city (VI.13), but also puts human affairs in a cosmic perspective designed to embolden them to care more for justice than for petty human advantage:
you must always look at these heavenly bodies and scorn what is human. What fame can you achieve in what men say, or what glory can you achieve that is worth seeking?” (VI.20)
In a dramatic rejection even of the traditional Roman motives of honor and glory as conventional motivations to virtue, the imagined elder statesman asks: “…and even the people who talk about us—how long will they do that?” (VI.21). As Jed W. Atkins has observed (2013:76), glory is in the Dream “first devalued, and then revalued”, in a Platonically inspired image of “the glory of the heavenly realm to which good statesmen will return” (2013: 77–78).
6.3 De legibus
De legibus, or On the Laws, is also written as a dialogue, but one set in Cicero’s own day with himself, his brother, and closest friend as the interlocutors, gathered at his country estate of Arpinum. Probably begun after De re publica, it was likewise written in the years immediately before 51 BCE, and similarly survives only in piecemeal and fragmentary form. Books I–II treat natural law or ius naturae, with “Marcus” (Cicero himself) declaring that “law is the highest reason, rooted in nature” (I.18), and that men, bound to the gods by reason, are “born for justice” (I.28–32). However, “the corruption of bad habits…extinguishes…the sparks given by nature” (I.33) and can result in the formation of bad laws. Such iniquitous laws as those passed by tyrants are not just (I.42); nor is the title of law to be conferred upon “what bandits have agreed among themselves” (II.13).
In Books II–III, the speakers prescribe an ideal law code, based on but modifying Roman law; notably, for example, the institution of the tribunate is defended (III.16–17). As these prescriptions, and the circumstances of their writing (a temporary retreat from active politics), suggest, Cicero had a complex attitude to the Greek dilemma posing the lives of philosophy and of politics as opposed alternatives. He saw philosophy as a source of insight and perspective relevant to politics, but after his early studies, devoted himself to it primarily when temporarily debarred from more active pursuits. One might say that philosophy became, beyond its intrinsic value, a form of alternative public service when the forum was too dangerous for him to enter (here following the reflection along these lines offered by Baraz 2012).
6.4 De Officiis
“The De officiis, not the De re publica, is Cicero’s Republic” (Long 1995: 240). This dictum of A. A. Long holds true not only in the sense that for Cicero, as for Plato and Aristotle, ethics was inseparable from politics. It is true also and more profoundly insofar as the De officiis takes up the same subject as Plato’s Republic, namely the apparent conflict between justice and individual advantage, and proposes broadly the same resolution, namely that the conflict is only ever apparent: violating one’s officia or duties can never serve one’s advantage so long as both are properly understood. Book I treats what is virtuous, or honestas; Book II treats what is advantageous, or utilitas; and Book III considers cases to show that any apparent conflict is illusory.
The most difficult case to resolve according to the overall argument of the book is that of advantage when understood as political ambition, driven by greatness of spirit. As Cicero acknowledges, and as was especially true in the highest echelons of Roman society, “Men are led most of all to being overwhelmed by forgetfulness of justice when they slip into desiring positions of command or honour or glory” (I.26). The solution is to aim only at true glory, such as can be gained only through the fulfillment of one’s officia. Similar casuistry enables Cicero to resolve in accordance with his thesis a range of common cases where advantage might be sought at the expense of justice (in administering the estate of an orphan, for example, a common duty of eminent Romans). Yet such casuistry is always advanced within a context of celebration of justice and natural law: it is not simply that in fact justice never conflicts with advantage, but that justice properly understood is always to one’s advantage as a human being.
As in Plato, a redefinition of the virtues plays a crucial role in the overall argument for the benefits of justice. For Cicero, the virtues are Romanized as officia, understood not only as duties in the abstract but rather as obligations of role or relationship, each attaching to someone in virtue of a distinct persona (whether as father, consul, neighbor, and so on, or simply as a human being). Some virtues are rooted in one’s persona as a human being subject to natural law, others in the specific roles and customs of one’s city. Four principal virtues are identified: wisdom; justice, resting on fides (good faith and credit) and respect for property; greatness of spirit; and decorum. Respect for property is a keystone of Cicero’s political thought, here very far from the current in Platonism which subordinated property to civic harmony.
Strikingly, whereas tyrannicide might appear to be a difficult case for such an ethical code to confront, Cicero presents it—writing later in the year that Caesar was assassinated—as the straightforwardly ethically correct choice. Cicero couches his case in Stoic terms of naturalness and fellowship (Dyck 1996, ad loc. to Off.III.29–32). His pivotal move is to deny that tyrants are party to the otherwise universal nature of human fellowship. Thus he asserts that “there can be no fellowship between us and tyrants…just as some limbs are amputated if they are…harming other parts of the body, similarly if the wildness and monstrousness of a beast appears in human form, it must be removed from the common humanity…of the body” (Off.III.32: ostensibly about the tyrant Phalaris).
7. Political Philosophy in the Roman Empire
Although Rome ruled over an empire long before Cicero died, and the republican constitution that he had served would remain formally intact in many respects long after that date as well, the imperial era of Roman government is standardly associated with the elevation of Octavian by the Senate in 27 BCE by according him the title of “Augustus” (among other novel titles and combinations of offices that he was then and later accorded). Octavian and a number of his successors were also referred to as the princeps, literally the first man, implicitly the first among nominal equals, sometimes translated by the English derivation ‘prince’, and so giving rise to the description of the period from 27 BCE–284 CE as the Principate (to be followed in turn by the Dominate). In this period, Stoicism continued to exercise an important hold, drawing in part on the Hellenistic genre of advice to kings; Platonism too, and forms of Pythagoreanism, regained much sway. Moreover, a number of Stoic-minded writers and orators played their parts in Roman political life, some fashioning the life of a philosopher itself into a distinctive form of what might be called non-political politics (Trapp 2007). In this article, I cannot explore the full ramifications of these philosophical developments under the Empire, in writers in Greek as well as in Latin, and influencing not only pagan but also Jewish and Christian thinkers. The article also leaves aside the many and varied important contributions to political thought in Rome and its possessions made not by philosophers but by historians, including Livy, Sallust, Diodorus Siculus, Tacitus, and Suetonius. (Again, for an overview that seeks to integrate political and historical developments with political theorizing, see J.W. Atkins 2018.)
7.1 Later Stoicism
If Cicero as a new man made senator had to contend with the competitive pressures of republican politics, Seneca (c. 3 BCE–65 CE), as a new man (from Spain) made senator a century later, had to contend with the problem of advising, and surviving, the poisonous politics of intimacy with the princeps. For Seneca, Stoic philosophy (of which he was an avowed exponent, though other philosophical influences can also be found in his ideas), can be best squared with politics if the ruler is supremely virtuous: in that case, the Stoic wise man is the king or prince.
Like Cicero, Seneca wrote essays in natural as well as political philosophy, including for example a significant analysis of the give and take of benefits or reciprocal gifts and favors in political life (De beneficiis, recently translated afresh by Griffin and Inwood, 2011), and even a De officiis (which is lost). Like Cicero, he wrote important collections of letters (and where Cicero wrote poetry, Seneca also wrote plays). The letters include his distinctive “consolations” which would inaugurate a new philosophical and literary genre (see the entry on Seneca).
In this large corpus, arguably his most important surviving work for political philosophy is his De clementia (“On Mercy”), addressed to the emperor Nero whom he served as tutor (in rhetoric, not in philosophy) and later in the capacity of officially designated amicus or friend (Veyne 2003, vii, 19). Presented as a “mirror” in which Nero could see himself and the consequences of his virtue (1.1.1), this text would become a fountainhead of the “mirror for princes” genre in subsequent centuries. The challenge was how to reconcile the virtue of justice with that of clementia, clemency or mercy, a distinctively Roman virtue (not corresponding exactly to any Greek word: Braund 2009, 33) that had been incorporated into public life as a virtue of the Roman people (clementia populi Romani) and attributed specifically in cultic form to Caesar Augustus (previously Octavian) as clementia Caesaris (included as one of “the four virtues attributed to Augustus on an honorific shield,” as observed by Griffin 2000: 540; see more generally Flamerie de Lachapelle 2011). Appealing to the related Stoic virtue of philanthrôpia in Greek, humanitas in Latin, or love of humankind, Seneca claimed that, by taking into account all the circumstances of the affair, clemency can claim to embody, as it were, a more perfect justice (iustissimum), than would the observance of the strict letter of the law (2.7.3, as discussed by Braund 2009, 66–70).
Seneca manages to defend clemency’s claim to the rank of virtue by distinguishing it both from its opposite, crudelitas or cruelty, and from a related disposition, misericordia, pity or compassion, which for the Stoics counted as a vice (2.4.4). The Stoic sage will exercise clemency by attending to the circumstances and causes of the criminal’s act, but also by seeking in various ways to improve the latter’s character (1.14.1–3, 1.16.1–3), an approach that goes back at least to Plato (Prt. 324a–c, Grg.469a–b), doing so with parsimony and discernment between those who are curable and those who are not (again with Plato, Grg.525a–526b). Indeed, Seneca asserts that those who are curable will generally strive subsequently to become worthy of the clemency shown to them by the prince (2.2.1), a principle illustrated by the story of Augustus’ clemency toward the conspirator Cnaeus Cornelius Cinna, who would become his lifelong friend (1.9). In good Stoic fashion, Seneca finally shows that the virtue of clemency is both valuable in itself and also beneficial. It sustains the rule of a prince by inspiring love in his subjects (1.19.6), whereas cruelty augments the number of his enemies (1.8.7). And conversely, whereas misericordia wallows in a wrongful and inefficient emotional pity for the treatment that justice would prescribe of the criminal (2.6.1), clemency improves the criminal more efficiently than cruelty would do (1.22.1), and for this and other reasons better aims at the good of mankind. It is worth noting finally that, while Seneca specifies that clemency should also extend to slaves, his cosmopolitanism stopped short of advocating their manumission or the abolition of slavery (Griffin 1992: 256–85).
Seneca did not limit himself to the political function of advising rulers. Instead, he conceived the role of philosophy as benefiting people generally, in the widest sense of a cosmopolitan ethics and even politics. His De otio (“On Leisure”) contrasts the single commonwealth embracing gods and men in a cosmic citizenship, with the ordinary multiple commonwealths to which the accidents of birth assign us (though these also rightly command allegiance) (4.1). Should such an ordinary regime turn lethal, the philosopher remains a citizen of the cosmic commonwealth, and so his serenity can and should remain intact. That fate befell Seneca himself in 65 CE, when Nero accused him of conspiring in a planned assassination of the emperor and ordered him to commit suicide. To be sure, however, Seneca’s suicide reflected not only political obedience, but also, and perhaps more fundamentally, the belief, previously expressed in his writings (in particular De providentia and De ira, as well as his letters) that suicide is a supreme mark of freedom. No tyranny can so enslave us as to take away this freedom: a freedom to act based on the inner liberation of realizing that death and other worldly losses are in fact indifferent and irrelevant to happiness (Inwood 2005: 307–9).
Seneca was far from the only Stoic politically active in his day or in successive generations. Others like Thrasea Paetus and Barea Soranus under Nero, Helvidius Priscus under Vespasian, and Paconius Agrippinus under Tiberius, chose to defy those whom they saw as tyrannical rulers, becoming known as the so-called ‘Stoic martyrs’. (On the varieties of Stoicism under the principate, see the classic study of Brunt 2013, originally published in 1975.) Some Stoics spoke out against a wider range of customs that they took to be cruel or unfounded or otherwise irrational, most notably Musonius Rufus against such practices as the Athenians’ holding of gladiatorial games in the same theatre of Dionysus where they celebrated religious festivals (assuming that it is indeed he who is described in Dio Chrysostom’s Orationes XXXI, 122), and against the social convention of excluding women from philosophizing (for his fragments, see King 2011). Yet these later Stoics made rather few detailed contributions to political philosophy, even if their fundamental analysis of living according to nature and reason, as further developed by figures ranging from the once-enslaved Epictetus to the emperor Marcus Aurelius, remained an important touchstone for thinking about politics.
7.2 Platonisms and Other Philosophies in the Empire
While the men of affairs in the Roman Senate and imperial court turned often (though not exclusively) to Stoicism, in the Greek centers of philosophy and among provincial Greek men of affairs Platonism remained an important framework for thinking about both ethics and politics, as did a related if somewhat shadowy form of Pythagoreanism which can be seen as a continuation of the genre of Hellenistic kingship treatises (Centrone 2000). The most important contributions made to political thought by the Platonist philosopher of the second-century AD, Plutarch (c.46–c.120 CE), are his paired biographical lives of Greek and Roman statesmen, each with a comparison drawing political morals. Together with the histories of Thucydides, Livy and Sallust, these Lives instructed generations of students in the principles and perils of political ethics, and instituted the distinction between statesman and demagogue as we have come to know it today: with figures like the fifth-century BCE Athenian “Aristides the Just” embodying the ideal statesmen, in contrast to the Platonic view of all past and present statesmen as fatally flawed. Plutarch also made important contributions to political philosophy in the many essays collected in his volumes of Moralia.
Plutarch was a committed but in some ways revisionist Platonist. His attitude to public life was more Roman than Platonic (befitting the role in public affairs that he played in his own city): the political life was for him unproblematically noble, not inferior to the life of philosophy. Similarly, he revised the strict Platonic dictum that philosophers must rule by allowing that philosophers might rule merely in the sense of advising rulers, not of being rulers themselves. (In fact, this move had some Platonic pedigree in the Statesman’s insistence that the science of statecraft is the same whether known and exercised by an advisor or by an actual ruler (259a).) And he considered philosophy to be more of a character-building study than a source of knowledge of exact or politically relevant knowledge. Where statesmen were educated in philosophy, as for example in the Lives of Pericles, Cicero, Brutus, and Cato Minor, he treats this as valuable mainly because of the virtue—in particular, moderation and self-restraint—which it imparts to them (Van Raalte 2005). The study of philosophy serves as a sort of inoculation against greed and immoderate ambition. But it need not impart any particular substantive knowledge to the statesman (so competing philosophies could all be useful in shaping virtue: Anaxagaorean influence on Pericles, an eclectic mixture of Stoicism, Academic skepticism, and Platonism on Cicero; Stoicism on the younger Cato). Indeed, excessively rigid adherence to a philosophy could be deleterious, making a statesman rigid and inflexible. The younger Cato was defeated when he stood for the consulship because, Plutarch says, he experienced the same thing that happens to fruits that appear “out of season” (Phoc. 3.1). Like such fruits, he was admired, but “the weight and grandeur” of his virtue was “out of all proportion to the immediate times” (asummetron tois kathestōsi kairois, Phoc. 3.2–3).
Plutarch’s political sympathies lay with monarchy. He treated the exemplary Greek or Roman statesman as inherently and ideally a kind of monarchical figure, even when functioning within a democratic or republican environment. “Aristocratic and kingly” was his praise for Pericles’ type of true statesmanship (literally, his “politics” or “policy”, politeia), once he has given up his initial recourse to demagogic methods (Per.14.2). Thus for all his admiration for Greek statesmen of the classical age, and his profound later influence on republican sentiments in Europe, Plutarch preferred monarchy as the best constitution and believed that he was following his master Plato in so doing. As John Dillon puts it, he held “that the accomplished statesman, like a first-rate musician, will be able to make the best of any of the three basic constitutions [monarchy, aristocracy, or democracy] that he is given to work on” (Dillon 1997). To quote Plutarch himself on this point from his fragmentary writing “On Monarchy, Democracy, and Oligarchy”:
…if he [the statesman] is given the choice among governments, like so many tools, he would follow Plato’s advice and choose no other than monarchy, the only one which is able to sustain that top note of virtue, high in the highest sense, and never let it be tuned down under compulsion or expediency. For the other forms of government in a certain sense, although controlled by the statesman, control him, and although carried along by him, carry him along, since he has no firmly established strength to oppose those from whom his strength is derived…. (Peri mon. 827bc)
Plato’s collective virtuous aristocracy in the Republic (his philosopher-kings and -queens, in the plural), was transmuted by Plutarch, perhaps under the influence of the singular kingly political expert in the Statesman, into a monarchical ideal.
Later Platonic philosophers, known as Neoplatonists (see the entry on Plotinus), also focused primarily on ethics in the context of cosmology and theology, stressing the ascent of the soul to a disembodied pure understanding of the One. Yet they made room for the political virtues of the embodied soul as a first step in this process of divinization or “becoming like God” (O’Meara 2003). In working out the political implications of such views, Plato’s Laws became an important model for theocratic political reform, especially as Neoplatonism became influential for a certain strand of Christian thinkers, in particular those able to absorb the translation of Greek texts into Arabic.
On a continuum of political rule stretching from the sheer domination of some over others on one extreme, to a vision of collaborative deliberation among equals for the sake of the good life on the other, many ancient Greek and Roman political philosophers clearly staked out the latter ground. The very idea of the city and the civic bond as rooted in justice was common ground across much of the spectrum of ancient political philosophy. Even the Epicureans saw society as rooted in justice, although understanding justice in turn as rooted in utility. Philosophers adhering to this approach were not however ignorant of possible objections to it. The diagnosis of politics as domination has never been more powerfully advanced than by Plato’s character Thrasymachus, nor has the attack on justice as a good life for the individual ever been as powerfully made as by Plato’s character Callicles or the skeptic Carneades. The nostalgic view of ancient political philosophy as predicated on widely shared conceptions of human nature and the human good, before the splintering and fracturing of modernity, is an oversimplification.
It is true that those ancient visions of politics which rooted themselves in a commitment to ethical cultivation and the common good did not have to contend with the absolutist claims of rival versions of monotheistic religions. But the ancients did have to answer various forms of relativism, immoralism, and skepticism, contending with rival philosophical schools which disagreed profoundly with one another. If some of them chose to see politics as a domain of common benefit and a space for the cultivation of virtue, this was not because it had not occurred to them that it could be thought of otherwise, but in part because they had developed powerful philosophical systems to support this view. The experience and practices of the Greek poleis (the plural of polis) and the Roman res publica played important roles in shaping these approaches.
Plato and Aristotle can in many ways be seen as defending some fundamental tenets of Greek ethics (such as the value of justice), but doing so by means of advancing revisionist philosophical doctrines and distancing themselves from the ways in which those tenets were interpreted by the democratic institutions of their day. The range of ethical and political views which they, along with their Hellenistic successors, laid out, continue to define many of the fundamental choices for modern philosophy, despite the many important innovations in institutional form and intellectual approach which have been made since. Many of those innovations, indeed, came in response to a revival of the ancient skeptical and relativist challenges: challenges already known from their evolution within ancient political philosophy itself.
This bibliography focuses on political philosophy rather than the entire corpus of an author’s work, and gives only an overview of some important sources for this vast field. Fuller bibliographies for most of the works and authors discussed can be found in the related articles listed below.
The Oxford Classical Text series has been used for citation of most classical texts. Other editions of reference for many texts include the series published respectively by Teubner in Germany and by Budé in France. Abbreviations are used for the following texts and translations: DK (for the Presocratics): Diels, H., and W. Kranz (eds.), 1951–2, Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker, griechisch und deutsch, 6th edn, 3 vols., Berlin: Weidmann. SVF (for the Stoics): von Arnim, Hans von, 1903–21, Stoicorum Veterum Fragmenta, 4 vols., Leipzig: B.G. Teubner. LS (for translations of the Stoics): Long, A. A., and D. N. Sedley (eds.), 1987, The Hellenistic Philosophers, 2 vols. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press [Greek and Latin texts in vol.2], which is abbreviated LS in the body of this entry. Quotations from Plato are from the translations included in Cooper, John (ed.), Plato. Complete Works (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1993) (occasionally modified); quotations from Aristotle are from Barnes, Jonathan (ed.) The Complete Works of Aristotle, vol. 2 (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984) [this is known as the Revised Oxford Translation, consisting of Barnes’ revision of a complete series of translations published originally by the Oxford University Press between 1912 and 1954] (occasionally modified).
The list below is arranged roughly chronologically in relation to the Greek or Latin texts that are translated in each case. In addition to those listed below, the Loeb Classical Library has been used herein for the English translations of Plutarch’s Lives (in eleven volumes, all translated by Bernadotte Perrin) and Moralia (in sixteen volumes, by various translators).
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- Cooper, J. M., (ed.), 1997, with D.S. Hutchinson (assoc.ed.), Plato: Complete Works, Indianapolis: Hackett.
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- Barnes, J., (ed.), 1984, The Complete Works of Aristotle, 2 vols., Princeton: Princeton University Press.
- Everson, S., (ed.), 1996, Aristotle, The Politics and The Constitution of Athens, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press [uses translations from Barnes (ed.) 1984].
- Long, A. A., and D. N. Sedley, (eds.), 1987, The Hellenistic Philosophers, 2 vols., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press [translations and commentary, volume 1].
- Griffin, M.T., and E.M. Atkins, (eds.), 1991, Cicero, On Duties, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
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- von Fritz, K., 1954, The Theory of the Mixed Constitution in Antiquity: a critical analysis of Polybius’ political ideas, New York: Columbia University Press.
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- Garnsey, P., 1996, Ideas of Slavery from Aristotle to Augustine, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Garver, E., 2011, Aristotle’s Politics: living well and living together, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
- Geuss, R., 2005, “Thucydides, Nietzsche, and Williams,” in his Outside Ethics, Princeton: Princeton University Press, pp. 219–233.
- Giannantoni, G., (ed.), 1990, Socratis et Socraticorum Reliquiae, 4 volumes, Naples: Bibliopolis.
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- Harte, V., 1999, “Conflicting Values in Plato’s Crito,” Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie 81: 117–147; reprinted in Kamtekar 2005, pp. 229–59.
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- Höffe, O. (ed.), 1997, Platon: Politeia, Berlin: Akademie Verlag.
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- Inwood, B., 2005, Reading Seneca: Stoic philosophy at Rome, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
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- Karbowski, J., 2012, “Slaves, Women, and Aristotle’s Natural Teleology,” Ancient Philosophy, 32: 323–350.
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- Kempshall, M.S., 2001, “De Re Publica I.39 in Medieval and Renaissance Political Thought,” in Powell and North (eds.), pp. 99–135.
- Klosko, G., 2006, The Development of Plato’s Political Theory, revised edition, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Konvitz, M., 1964, “Civil Disobedience and the Duty of Fair Play,” in Law and Philosophy: A Symposium, S. Hook (ed.), New York: New York University Press, pp. 19–28.
- Kraut, R., 1984, Socrates and the State, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
- –––, 2002, Aristotle: Political Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Laks, A., 1990, “Legislation and demiurgy: on the relationship between Plato’s Republic and Laws,” Classical Antiquity, 9: 209–29.
- –––, 1991, “L’utopie législative de Platon,” Revue philosophique, 4: 417–28.
- –––, 2000, “The Laws,” in Rowe and Schofield 2000, pp. 258–292.
- –––, 2005, Médiation et coercition: pour une lecture des Lois de Platon, Villeneuve d’Ascq: Presses universitaires du septentrion.
- Laks, A., and M. Schofield, (eds.), 1995, Justice and Generosity: studies in Hellenistic social and political philosophy: Proceedings of the Sixth Symposium Hellenisticum, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Lane, M.S, 1998, Method and Politics in Plato’s Statesman, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
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- –––, 2014a, Greek and Roman Political Ideas, Harmondsworth: Penguin.
- –––, 2014b, “Popular Sovereignty as Control of Officeholders: Aristotle on Greek democracy,” in Popular Sovereignty in Historical Perspective, R. Bourke and Q. Skinner (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 52–72.
- Laurand, V., 2005, La politique stoïcienne, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.
- Lear, J., 1988, Aristotle: The Desire to Understand, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
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- Long, A.A., 1995, “Cicero’s Politics in De officiis,” in Laks and Schofield 1995, pp. 213–40.
- Meier, C., 1990, trans. David McLintock, The Greek Discovery of Politics, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
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This is a partial selection of useful reference works.
- Aalders, G.J.D., 1975, Political Thought in Hellenistic Times, Amsterdam: H.M. Hakkert.
- Algra, K., and J. Barnes, J. Mansfeld and M. Schofield, (eds.), 1999, The Cambridge History of Hellenistic Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Armstrong, A.H., (ed.), 1967, The Cambridge History of Later Greek and Early Medieval Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Atkins, J. and T. Bénatouïl (eds.), 2022, The Cambridge Companion to Cicero’s Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Balot, Ryan K., (ed.), A Companion to Greek and Roman Political Thought, Chichester: Wiley-Blackwell.
- Coleman, J., 2000, A History of Political Thought, vol.1: From Ancient Greece to Early Christianity, Oxford: Blackwell.
- Keyt, D., and F.D. Miller, Jr., (eds.), 1991, A Companion to Aristotle’s Politics, New York and Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1991.
- Keyt, D., and F.D. Miller, Jr., (eds.), 2007, Freedom, Reason, and the Polis: Essays in Ancient Greek Political Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Rowe, C., & M. Schofield, (eds.), 2000, The Cambridge History of Greek and Roman Political Thought, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Sharples, R. W., 1996, Stoics, Epicureans and Skeptics, London: Routledge.
There are useful series of Cambridge Companions, Cambridge Histories, and Blackwell Companions, among other such series, to various authors, texts, and schools, some of which are cited above. An authoritative source of important articles is H. Temporini (ed.), 1972–, Aufstieg und Niedergang der römischen Welt, Berlin and New York: De Gruyter.
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- Plato Bibliography, maintained by the International Plato Society
- Perseus Project of Greek and Roman texts with translations
- Seneca’s works in Latin, from The Latin Library at Ad Fontes Academy
The author would like to acknowledge the research assistance by René de Nicolay for the 2018 revision, and of Ian Walling for the 2023 revision.