[Editor’s Note: The following new entry replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]
Stoicism was one of the dominant philosophical systems of the Hellenistic period. The name derives from the porch (stoa poikilê) in the Agora at Athens decorated with mural paintings, where the first generation of Stoic philosophers congregated and lectured. The school of thought founded there long outlived the physical Athenian porch and notably enjoyed continued popularity in the Roman period and beyond. This entry introduces the main doctrines and arguments of the three parts of Stoic philosophy – physics, logic, and ethics – emphasizing their interlocking structure. We also review the history of the school, the extant sources for Stoic doctrine, and the Stoics’ subsequent philosophical influence.
- 1. Preliminaries
- 2. Physical Theory
- 3. Logic
- 4. Ethics
- 5. Influence
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1.1 The School and its History
The Stoic school was founded around 300 BCE by Zeno of Citium, a voracious reader of Socratic dialogues, who also studied under the Cynic Crates and was influenced by the teachings of Plato’s Academy and the Megarian School. The Stoa competed with the school founded only a little before in Athens by Epicurus, and Stoic and Epicurean views are often compared and contrasted. Zeno was succeeded in the leadership of the Stoa first by Cleanthes of Assos and then by Chrysippus of Soli, who headed the school from around 230 until 206 BCE and was by all accounts its foremost theorist and systematizer. Following Chrysippus, the position of “scholarch” passed to his former students, the last of which being Diogenes of Babylon in the middle of the 2nd century BCE.
Some scholars see this moment as marking a shift in the Stoic school, from the so-called “Old Stoa” to “Middle Stoicism”, though the relevance and accuracy of this nomenclature is debated (see Inwood 2022). The latter term is nonetheless frequently used to encompass the work of Stoic philosophers in the second and first centuries BCE. A significant feature of the second century is the sharp and powerful attacks against Stoic views formulated by the Academic Carneades, to which Antipater of Tarsus, Diogenes’ successor, responded at length. Diogenes and Antipater also heralded increased engagement with Platonic (Sedley 2003; Reydams-Schils 1999) and possibly Aristotelian doctrine, arguably peaking with Panaetius in the second half of 2nd century BCE and his student Posidonius in the first century BCE. For developments from Antipater onwards, see Inwood 2022; for the contributions of Panaetius and Posidonius and their relation to previous thinkers, see Tieleman 2007.
Stoicism became particularly fashionable in the Roman period. Although never identifying as a Stoic himself, Cicero, who studied philosophy in Athens and endeavored to popularize it at Rome, engaged extensively with Stoic theory in his philosophical works and modeled his On Proper Functions (De Officiis) on Panaetius’ treatise of the same name. During the Imperial era, several prominent public figures were associated with the Stoic school. Appointed to the court of Emperor Augustus in the late 1st century BCE was the Stoic philosopher Arius Didymus, and a generation later Seneca served as advisor to Nero. Epictetus, a former slave, was expelled from Rome by Domitian along with other philosophers in 93 CE, and his works, recorded by his student Arrian, heavily influenced Marcus Aurelius, Roman Emperor from 161–180 CE. Also active in the second century CE was the Stoic philosopher Hierocles, whose detailed treatise on psychology and ethical theory, The Elements of Ethics, is partially extant (see Ramelli 2009).
Over this remarkable span of time during which the Stoic school operated in some form or another, evolutions in views and shifts in focus unsurprisingly took place. The nature and extent of these intra-school developments and disagreements – some of which we will consider below – remains the subject of ongoing scholarly debate.
Stoic philosophy was, from Zeno onwards, conceived of as comprising three parts: physics (phusikê), logic (logikê), and ethics (êthikê). Each of these parts includes a wide array of further topics nowadays dealt with separately. Logic, for example, includes not only formal logic, but also questions now typically falling under the remit of philosophy of language, epistemology, and philosophy of mind. In addition, all three parts of philosophy were thought by the Stoics to work together to form an interconnected and coherent system (exactly how strongly the claim of systematization is to be taken is disputed; see below). The Stoics emphasized this point with a number of analogies intended to illustrate how the three parts of philosophy fit together and form a whole:
They compare philosophy to a living being, likening logic to bones and sinews, ethics to the fleshier parts, and physics to the soul. They make a further comparison to an egg: logic is the outside, ethics what comes next, and physics the innermost parts; or to a fertile field: the surrounding wall corresponds to logic, its fruit to ethics, and its land or trees to physics. (Diogenes Laertius, 26B; see our bibliography for a guide to citations in this entry)
The latter two analogies seem to point to the idea that the purpose of philosophy, according to the Stoics, is to become virtuous, that is, to attain wisdom and thereby lead the good life, so that the overarching goal (the crop or the egg white, which the ancients assumed was nourished by the yolk) is ethical. Nonetheless, the other parts of philosophy play an essential and necessary part in achieving this goal, and the orthodox Stoic position is that mastery of all three parts of philosophy is required for human flourishing. This is apparent in the way the Stoics treat a number of philosophical questions and in the many connections visible between the different parts of their theory: conclusions in one part of Stoic philosophy tend to reinforce and ratify those in another. For recent discussion of the unity of the Stoic system, see Bronowski 2019, ch. 1; cf. Christensen 1962, Ierodiakonou 1993, and Inwood 2012. For debates on the connection of Stoic ethics to other parts of the system, especially physics, see Annas 1993, who takes the ethical part to be largely independent of physical theory, and Cooper 1999a and 2012, who sees them as thoroughly intertwined (see also Betegh 2003).
It is impossible to consider the philosophical contributions of the Stoics without noting a significant exegetical challenge: the paucity of original texts. We do not possess a single complete work authored by any of the first three heads of the Stoic school, Zeno, Cleanthes, and Chrysippus, despite their prolific output in antiquity. Chrysippus, for example, is reported to have written over 150 works, of which only fragments remain. Likewise, the treatises authored in the Middle Stoa are no longer extant. The only complete works by Stoic philosophers that survive are those by writers of Imperial times, Seneca, Epictetus, and Marcus Aurelius, as well as by lesser known authors such as Cornutus, Cleomedes, and Hierocles (discussed in Inwood 2022). Seneca, Epictetus, and Marcus focus to a significant degree on ethics and only sparingly present the wide and extensive theoretical bases of the system (for their views on logic, see Barnes 1997). These later Stoics also had philosophical agendas of their own, so that their work might not always straightforwardly reflect the views of their predecessors.
For detailed information about the Old Stoa, we have to depend on either later doxographies, including Diogenes Laertius’ encyclopedia account in book 7 of his Lives of Eminent Philosophers, pseudo-Plutarch’s Philosophers’ Opinions on Nature (Placita), and Stobaeus’ Excerpts (Eclogae) – and their sources Aetius (circa 1st c. CE) and Arius Didymus (1st c. BCE–CE) – or other philosophers who discuss the Stoics for their own purposes. Nearly all of the latter group are hostile witnesses. Among them are the Aristotelian commentator Alexander of Aphrodisias (late 2nd c. CE) who criticizes the Stoics in On Mixture and On Fate and contrasts their views piecemeal with those of Aristotle in other works; the Platonist Plutarch (1st-2nd c. CE) who authored anti-Stoic tracts such as On Stoic Self-Contradictions and Against the Stoics on Common Conceptions; the medical writer Galen (2nd c. CE); the Pyrrhonian skeptic, Sextus Empiricus (2nd c. CE) who sharply criticizes most aspects of the Stoic system, and in so doing provides detailed reports of Stoic doctrine; the Neo-Platonist Plotinus (3rd c. CE); the Christian bishops Eusebius (3rd–4th c. CE), Nemesius (circa 400 CE); and the sixth-century Neo-Platonist commentator, Simplicius. Another important source is Cicero (1st c. BCE). Though his own philosophical position derives from that of his teacher Philo of Larissa and the New Academy, Cicero is not without sympathy for what he sees as the high moral tone of Stoicism. In his philosophical works – especially On Academic Skepticism, On the Nature of the Gods, and On Moral Ends (De Finibus) – he provides summaries in Latin, with critical discussion, of Stoic views. See also the entry on the Doxography of Ancient Philosophy.
From these sources, scholars have assembled collections of quotations and doxographical reports. The first collection of its kind, von Arnim’s Stoicorum Veterum Fragmenta (SVF), gathered fragments of Stoic works and testimonia in their original Greek and Latin into a three-volume set in 1903–5. Fragments and testimonia of the early Stoics are often referred to by von Arnim’s volume numbers and text numeration, e.g. SVF I.345. The second half of the 20th century saw a revival of interest in Hellenistic philosophy and in the Stoics in particular, not least thanks to A. A. Long and D. Sedley’s 1987 The Hellenistic Philosophers (LS) which contains (in vol. 1) English translations and commentary of many important texts on the Stoics, Epicureans, and Skeptics. This was followed by Hellenistic Philosophy in 1988, a collection of primary texts edited by B. Inwood and L. P. Gerson, with a second edition in 1997. In 1987, fragments pertaining to dialectic were collected with a German translation in K. Hülser’s Die Fragmente zur Dialektik der Stoiker (FDS). More recently, in 2022, Later Stoicism 155 BCE to CE 200 by B. Inwood has made available the works of some often neglected Stoic writers.
The surviving evidence so gathered allows readers to piece together a picture of the content and, in some cases, the development of Stoic doctrine. In some areas, there is a fair bit of consensus about what the Stoics thought, and we can even attach names to particular innovations. However, in other areas the interpretation of our meager evidence is hotly contested.
2. Physical Theory
Stoic physical theory included topics traditionally covered by natural philosophy, and it is where the Stoics developed their ontology and metaphysics. As is to be expected of their systematic approach to philosophy, much of Stoic physics is fundamental in underpinning their views in ethics and also interacts with some of their logic and philosophy of language.
2.1 Bodies and Incorporeals
Stoic ontology is radically materialist or, more precisely, corporealist. According to the Stoics, only bodies exist, because only bodies have the capacity to act or be acted upon (Cicero, 45A; Sextus, 45B, Nemesius, 45C). This bold stance has wide-ranging implications: the soul is a body, as are its attributes, so that wisdom, too, for example, is a body (see below, 2.9). This follows from the intricate make up of the world by principles (2.3).
Bodies nonetheless do not exhaust their ontology. Although only bodies exist, i.e. only bodies have being, the Stoics allow for entities with a lesser, or, at any rate, distinct, ontological status, that of “subsisting” (huphistanai). This is the case of the four incorporeals: time, place, void, and lekta. Of these, void is perhaps the most intuitively grasped: it is “incorporeal and intangible, neither has shape nor takes on shape, neither is acted upon in any respect nor acts, but is simply able to receive body” (Cleomedes, 49C). Void is essential to the universe, not least because it surrounds it and allows for bodies to move into it during the cyclical conflagrations (more on which below, 2.5; on void, see de Harven 2015). Place’s incorporeal status is similarly justified insofar as it can be the receptor of body but lacks the power to act or be acted upon. Understanding the incorporeal status of time is trickier (for a recent treatment, see Salles 2018). Some of what we might consider aspects of time are uncontroversially bodies: day and night, or years, for example. We are also told that the past and the future subsist, while the present “obtains” or “is realized” (huparchein, a term which has been the subject of much scholarly attention: see Goldschmidt 1972, Barnes 2007, p. 69, Bailey 2014). One way of understanding the sense in which time is incorporeal is by analogy with place, as the temporal intervals through which bodies pass (cf. Sedley 1999, section 6). Lekta, the final kind of incorporeal item, seem to stand out on this list. Usually translated as “sayables” (from legein, “to say”), they are roughly the sorts of things that can be said or expressed by linguistic expressions and form the contents of impressions and thoughts. They are treated in more detail in the section on logic (3.2), but they also play a role in causation (2.8), and their metaphysical status has been the subject of much debate. For a recent treatment of lekta, see Bronowski 2019; see also Frede 1994b.
It is particularly interesting that the incorporeals are said to “subsist” (huphistanai): the nature of this ontological status remains a puzzle. What, if anything, they depend on for their subsistence is not clear. It is usually agreed that place, void, and time are mind independent, and many agree that this is also the case of lekta (Long 1971 is perhaps the strongest proponent of the alternative view that lekta are mind-dependent). It is in any case generally clear that incorporeals together with bodies are in some way essential to the makeup of the universe, and that bodies and incorporeals share the status of being “something” (ti).
2.2 Something: the Supreme Genus
“Something” (ti) is described as the “supreme genus” (Seneca, 27A), broader than being, which constitutes “the all” (to pan). The Stoics recognize other entities to which they deny being, including fictional entities and concepts or universals, which they place on a par with each other as “figments of the mind” (Diogenes Laertius, 32C). Universals, in particular, are famously said to be quasi-somethings (hosanei ti) or not-somethings (outina) (Diogenes Laertius, 32C; Stobaeus, 30A). This has led to much debate and speculation as to the status of these entities and in particular where they stand relative to the class of “somethings”. For different views on the matter, see Brunschwig 1988; Sedley 1984, 1999; Caston 1999; Sellars 2011; Bailey 2014. The metaphysical status of limits is similarly debated: see Ju 2009.
2.3 Principles and Mixture
Fundamental to Stoic physics and the explanations of natural phenomena it offers are the two principles (archai), the active principle and the passive principle, which bear complex and often debated relations to pneuma, primary matter, the four elements (air, water, fire, earth), and the cosmos as a whole. These terms appear to be used in different senses in the surviving fragmentary evidence, making the task of reconstructing a coherent and unified physical theory somewhat challenging.
The active and passive principles together make up the world and everything in it. To achieve this, the active principle, which is identified with God or Zeus (see 2.7 for further discussion of Stoic theology), acts on the passive principle, which is also called (at least by Zeno) primary matter. Primary matter is eternal, unqualified, formless, and inert. Primary matter is suffused throughout by the active principle in order to create objects in the world. The active and the passive principles in this way both constitute the cosmos and all objects in it. The Stoics stressed that they are entirely blended, or mixed “through and through” (Galen, 47H; Alexander of Aphrodisias, 48C), and developed a theory of mixture which allowed for two bodies to be in the same place at the same time (Hensley 2018; cf. Helle 2018 and 2022).
The vehicle for the divine active principle is called pneuma, literally “breath” (Hensley 2020). Pneuma, by its nature, has a simultaneous movement inward and outward which constitutes its inherent “tensility”. Pneuma passes through all (other) bodies; in its outward motion it gives them the qualities that they have, and in its inward motion makes them unified objects (Nemesius, 47J; cf. Helle 2021). Pneuma comes in gradations and endows the bodies which it pervades with different qualities as a result. The pneuma which sustains an inanimate object is a “tenor” (hexis, lit. “a holding”). Pneuma in plants is, in addition, “physique” (phusis, lit. “nature”), and in animals, it is “soul” (psuchê, see 2.9 below).
The four elements, fire, air, water, and earth, are also important entities to which the Stoics appeal in their physical theory. Sources offer contradicting evidence as to the relationship of the elements to other bodies and notably to the two principles. Unlike the passive principle, elements appear to have some qualities (fire, for example, is hot). Nonetheless, the elements also sometimes seem to constitute or make up the principles themselves. The active principle, for example, is said to be made up of fire and air, while matter is sometimes said to be made up of water and earth (Nemesius, 47D). The active principle is described as fiery (Galen, On the Habits of the Soul, 4.783) and the tensility of pneuma is sometimes accounted for by the interaction of hot fire and cold air which rarefy and condense in turn, modifying the density of other elements.
2.5 Cosmic Cycle and Conflagration
The elements, especially fire, play a central role in the cosmogony and the cosmogonic process (Hensley 2021, Salles 2015, Long 2008, Hahm 1977). The Stoics hold that the cosmos goes through a cycle of endless recurrence with periods of conflagration, a state in which all is fire, and periods of cosmic order, with the world as we experience it (Nemesius, 52C). In between these periods, the generation of the elements occurs to create the cosmos in which all four elements exist. (This apparently orthodox Stoic view was rejected by some, notably Panaetius (Van Staaten, fr. 65).)
This idea of world-cycles punctuated by conflagrations raises a number of questions. Will there be another you reading this encyclopedia entry in the next world cycle? Or merely someone exactly similar to you? Different sources attribute different answers to the Stoics on these questions. (For sameness of person, see Alexander, 52F; for someone indistinguishable, but somehow not identical, see Origen, 52G.) The doctrine of eternal recurrence also bears on the Stoic view of time. Did they suppose that the moment in the next world cycle at which you (or someone indistinguishable from you) reads this entry is a moment in the future (so time is linear) or the very same moment (with some notion of circular time)? The Stoic definition of time as the “dimension (diastêma) of motion” or “of the world’s motion” (Simplicius, 51A) hardly seems to settle the question. For a clear exchange on the issue, see Long 1985 and Hudson 1990; see also Greene 2018 and Salles 2018.
Aside from the basic ontology, the Stoics identify four genera of being usually referred to as “categories” (see especially Menn 1999): matter or substance (hupokeimenon), quality (poion), disposition (pôs echon), relative disposition or relation (pros ti pôs echon). Substance is a portion of passive principles or elements. An object so conceived just is a lump of matter (unlike prime matter, not entirely undifferentiated insofar as it is a portion of it, distinct from some other portion). Quality, which is subdivided into common and proper is a portion of pneuma, organizing the matter so as to give it certain properties. In particular, the portion of pneuma serves to unify the underlying matter or substance so as to make it a particular object. This latter role is likely to be that of what is identified as a proper quality, for example the quality of being Socrates (on proper qualities, see Nawar 2017). Proper qualities play an important role in questions about identity and individuation (cf. Sedley 1982, Lewis 1995). Objects do not exclusively belong to one or the other category. We can speak of an object as the underlying substance (the hupokeimenon) or of a qualified object capable of bearing further qualities. Disposition and relations are paradigmatically properties of already qualified objects, so that the fist, for example, is said to be the hand disposed in a certain way (Sextus, 33P). Relations are properties which depend on the relata, so that a change in the relata causes the relation to cease to exist, for example “being on the right of”. The categories are put to work in various ways, including in ethics and psychology (see Alexander, 29A and Seneca, 29B), e.g. in the claim that knowledge is the commanding faculty disposed in a certain way (Sextus, 33P).
In accord with their ontology, the Stoics make God a corporeal entity, identical with the active principle. God is further characterized as eternal reason (logos: Diogenes Laertius, 44B) or intelligent designing fire or breath (pneuma) which structures matter in accordance with its plan (Aetius, 46A). The Stoic God is thus immanent throughout the cosmos and directs its development down to the smallest detail. The entire cosmos is a living thing, and God stands to the cosmos as an animal’s life force stands to the animal’s body, enlivening, moving and directing it by its presence throughout. The designing fire is likened to sperm or seed which contains the first principles or directions of all the things which will subsequently develop (Diogenes Laertius, 46B; Aristocles in Eusebius, 46G). This makes cosmic nature and all its parts inherently governed by a rational force. God and divine actions are not, like the gods of Greek Mythology, random and unpredictable. It is rather orderly, rational, and providential. The association of God with pneuma may have its origins in medical theories of the Hellenistic period: see Baltzly 2003 and Annas 1992. On the issue of God and its relation to the cosmos in Stoicism, see the essays in Salles 2009.
2.8 Causes and Determinism
An important issue that straddles metaphysics and logic is that of causal determinism. The Stoics are determinists about causation, who regard the present as fully determined by past events, but who nonetheless want to preserve scope for moral responsibility by defending a version of compatibilism.
The Stoic analysis of causation is peculiar and might sound odd to the modern ear. They say that every cause is a body which becomes the cause to a body of something incorporeal. For instance, the scalpel, a body, becomes the cause to the flesh, a body, of the incorporeal predicate “being cut”. (Sextus, 55B; cf. Stobaeus, 55A). In addition, the Stoics develop a taxonomy of causes, the sources on which are complex and not always clear, but which they brought to bear in their defense of compatibilism.
What the Stoics call fate, which they identify with the working out of the – rational and predictable – will of Zeus, is “a certain natural everlasting ordering of the whole: one set of things follows on and succeeds another, and the interconnexion in inviolable” (Aulus Gellius, 55K). In other words, every event that occurs in the world is the result of a cause or chain of causes, so that everything that happens is metaphysically determined by preceding causes in the chain (but not logically necessary; cf. de Harven 2016). This sequence of causes is inescapable.
The inescapability of this sequence of causes leads to concerns about action and moral responsibility. The first worry, which takes the form of the so-called “lazy argument” (Cicero, 55S) is that, if all my actions and their consequences are predetermined, there is no point in acting at all: why call the doctor when ill, if it is determined that the doctor will come? The second worry is that if my actions come about by prior causes, they are not in my power and I am therefore not truly responsible for them.
In response to the former challenge, Chrysippus claimed that not all events are independent of one another. Rather, some are co-fated: part of one and the same causal chain in such a way that they cannot be dissociated. The call to the doctor and the doctor’s coming are so joined, as is the patient’s healing. The doctor will not come if she is not called, and the patient will not heal if the doctor does not come. Calling the doctor is thus not superfluous or pointless. The consequences of our actions may be predetermined, but only insofar as they are caused by our actions. Our actions are thus not pointless: we must act in order to ensure their consequences come about (see further critical discussion in Brennan 2005, ch. 16).
In response to the concern about moral responsibility, Chrysippus begins by distinguishing different types of causes. Although nothing happens without an antecedent cause, he claims, not all antecedent causes are sufficient for bringing about their effect (Plutarch, 55R): some antecedent causes – those which are called “auxiliary and proximate” (Cicero, 62C) – function as merely necessary conditions.
Chrysippus deploys this distinction among antecedent causes in the course of explaining how human actions are both causally determined and subject to moral evaluation. Though the details are difficult, the general strategy is clear enough and illuminated by the famous cylinder and cone analogy:
[Chrysippus] resorts to his cylinder and cone: these cannot begin to move without a push; but once that has happened, he holds that it is thereafter through their own nature that the cylinder rolls and the cone spins. ‘Hence’, he says, ‘just as the person who pushed the cylinder gave it its beginning of motion but not its capacity for rolling, likewise, although the impression encountered will print and, as it were, emblazon its appearance on the mind, assent will be in our power.’ (Cicero, 62C; see also Gellius, 62D)
Consider two differently shaped solids – a cylinder and a cone – both sitting atop the same steep slope. The two solids are given a push of equal strength and begin to tumble down the hill. But whereas the cylinder rolls in a straight path, the cone spins and veers off to the side. Neither of these movements could have occurred without the push, Chrysippus argues, but the particular way each solid moves – whether it rolls or spins – is caused by its own nature and “capacity for rolling”. The push therefore functions as an “auxiliary and proximate” antecedent cause, which on its own is sufficient for causing the solid to move, but not for causing it to roll rather than spin. Rather, it is the individual nature of each solid that is so responsible. (Note that, given the push the solid receives, together with its own nature and capacity for rolling, each solid could not do otherwise than move in the way that it does.)
Now consider two agents with different psychological profiles – for instance, one person who is a glutton for sweets and another who is not – both of whom are presented with a thick slice of carrot cake. That the glutton rushes towards the cake and eagerly gobbles it up, whereas the other agent does not (perhaps picking at it slowly over a few hours), maps onto the cylinder’s rolling and the cone’s spinning. Both agents receive the same external stimulus for action and form “impressions” (mental representations, phantasiai / visa) of the cake, but, like the push in the case of the solids, these are not sufficient to cause the differential behavioral response in the two agents. Rather, it is their individual psychological profiles and the activity of giving or withholding mental “assent” to the impression that eating the cake is fitting to do which cause them to gobble the cake or not (more on impression, assent, and action in 2.9 below). One’s psychological profile is causally efficacious for action, over and above the external stimulus. So among the antecedent causes for human action – and by far the most decisive – is the agent himself, his individual nature or psychological profile, with the result that our actions are “up to us” or “in our power” in a way that is relevant for the notion of responsibility.
Much more could be said on this analogy. Detailed scholarly work on the question of freedom and determinism in Stoicism can be found in Bobzien 1998. See also Brennan 2005, ch. 14–15, Salles 2005, and the entry on Ancient Theories of Freedom and Determinism.
One further topic treated as part of Stoic physics is psychology, the account of the soul. Here the Stoics argue that the soul is corporeal, i.e. a body of a certain kind, since it is causally efficacious in a way that only bodies are. If the soul were incorporeal, as some ancient philosophers maintain, then it could not causally interact with the body it animates, as it does e.g. in feeling pain when the body suffers a flesh-wound or in causing the cheeks to blush when it feels shame (Nemesius reporting Cleanthes, 45C). Furthermore, if x and y come into contact with each other, then x and y must be bodies. But the soul and the body it animates are in constant contact, the Stoics hold, and are later separated from each other at death (Nemesius reporting Chrysippus, 45D). Therefore the soul is corporeal.
What kind of body is the soul? As mentioned above (2.3), the Stoics identify the soul as pneuma at a certain degree of tensility, more rarified than pneuma in the condition of tenor (hexis), which is responsible for the coherence of solid objects, and than pneuma in the condition of nature (phusis), which regulates vital activities such as nutrition and growth (Philo, 47P, Q). Pneuma in the condition of soul enables the animal to take in perceptual information from its surroundings, by forming impressions (phantasiai), and to move itself from place to place, by forming impulses (hormai) (Origen, 53A).
In a noteworthy break from both ordinary Greek usage and earlier philosophical theories, the Stoics deny that all living things have souls. Plants have tenor-pneuma and nature-pneuma but not soul, since they do not engage in perception or self-locomotion (Philo, 47P; Origen, 53A). Ensouled life is therefore distinguished by the possession of the representational and motivational faculties just mentioned: impression and impulse. In narrowing the conception of the soul from a general principle of life to one that refers specifically to these more obviously mental characteristics, the Stoics take an important step forward in the history of the philosophy of mind (on which see Annas 1992, Nawar 2020, and the entry on Ancient Theories of Soul).
Among ensouled creatures, some, such as mature human beings, possess reason (logos) and are called “rational” (logikos), while others, such as dogs or cows, do not and are called “non-rational” (alogos). What can the rational soul do that the non-rational cannot? Arguably, the most important difference is the power of assent (sunkatathesis). Assent is a faculty found only in the rational soul – in particular, only in the ruling part or commanding faculty (hêgemonikon) of the rational soul (Aetius, 53H; Iamblichus, 53K) – which enables us to adopt a critical stance towards our own impressions and pass judgment on them (Origen, 53A). Rational creatures give assent to the impression that p when they deem p to be true; otherwise, they suspend assent on p. (“Dissenting”, or taking p to be false, seems to be more precisely analyzed by the Stoics as suspending assent on p and then giving assent to not-p.) Rational creatures are morally and epistemically responsible for our acts of assent, but not for the kinds of impressions we form: assent is “in our power” or “up to us” in a way that receiving an impression is not (cf. the cylinder and cone analogy above, 2.8). For the Stoics, there is no exaggeration in the claim that what kind of person we are – whether we are virtuous or not, or knowledgeable or not – depends entirely on our acts of assent. The Stoic conception of assent is therefore of far-reaching importance, both within their own system and for a proper understanding of later philosophical debates (cataloged in Nawar 2020; see also Frede 2011).
According to Stoic psychological theory, the outcome of giving assent to the impression that p will be either a doxastic commitment of a certain kind (knowledge, cognition, or the opinion that p; see 3.7 below) or a “rational impulse”. Impulse, in general, is the psychological event responsible for action, and in rational creatures all impulses are “rational impulses” – “movements of thought towards something in the sphere of action” (Stobaeus, 53Q). Since assent is necessary and sufficient for any rational impulse to be created, the Stoics can be seen to endorse a strong form of “motivational cognitivism”: all cases of human action require, and follow upon, the agent forming the judgment that the action in question is appropriate for them to do (Klein 2015; Graver 2007; Inwood 1985). This account would seem to rule out the possibility of occurrent mental conflict, or akrasia, in the form of simultaneously conflicting impulses, since it is impossible for the rational mind as a whole to maintain, at one and the same time, conflicting judgments (acts of assent) about what is fitting to do. (Some Stoics seem to have re-analyzed cases of putatively simultaneous akrasia as instead a rapid oscillation between opposing practical judgments: Plutarch, 65G.) Stoic psychology and action theory can therefore be understood as a rejection of the Platonic-Aristotelian approach of positing non-rational sources of cognition and motivation in the mature human soul, which can potentially oppose the dictates of reason, in favor of a reversion to the monistic intellectualism of Socrates. Like Socrates, the Stoics are committed to the claim that human action invariably reflects the assessment of the rational mind as a whole concerning what is appropriate to do in the scenario.
Given this theory, the Stoics construe the skeptical practice of global suspension of judgment as entailing apraxia, i.e. total inaction (cf. Plutarch, 69A). For further discussion of the apraxia charge, see Obdrzalek 2012 and the entries on Arcesilaus and Ancient Skepticism.
According to the Stoics, human beings are not born with reason but rather acquire it later in life (at age seven, according to Aetius, 39E). In childhood, then, we utilize a non-rational soul, just like non-rational animals, and thus form impulses without the intervention of assent. (On the development of rationality in humans, see Frede 1994c.) Interestingly, the Stoics also distinguish between rational and non-rational impressions, i.e. the impressions formed by rational and non-rational creatures (Diogenes Laertius, 39A). Exactly how rational impressions (phantasiai logikai) differ from their non-rational counterparts remains the subject of lively scholarly debate. It is broadly agreed, however, that only rational impressions are created under the direct influence of the perceiver’s concepts (ennoiai; cf. Galen, 53V), and that only rational impressions express propositions (axiômata, one kind of sayable or lekton) (see Frede 1983, 1994c; Brittain 2002; Shogry 2019; for alternative views, see Caston forthcoming, and Sorabji 1990).
The scope of the branch of philosophy the Stoics called “logic” (logikê) was wide, including not only the analysis of argument forms and the development of a formal system of logic, but also rhetoric, grammar, epistemology, and what we might now call philosophy of language, including extensive theories of language and meaning. Stoic contributions to logic and philosophy of language, as well as the backdrop of Aristotelian and Megarian views in the Hellenistic period, are thoroughly surveyed in Barnes, Bobzien and Mignucci 1999, and in an abbreviated version by Bobzien in Inwood 2003.
3.1 Rhetoric and Dialectic
The branch of logic is subdivided into rhetoric and dialectic (Diogenes Laertius, 31A). The former is described as “the science [or knowledge, epistêmê] of speaking well”, though it also included, for example, extensive study of etymology (for more on rhetoric, and in particular how narrow its scope might have been, see Atherton 1988). Dialectic is “the science [or knowledge, epistêmê] of what is true, false, and neither” or “the science [or knowledge, epistêmê] of what signifies and what is signified” (Diogenes Laertius, 32C), mastery of which is required for wisdom, since “the Sage is always a dialectician” (Diogenes Laertius, 31C; the “Sage” being the Stoic label for the ideal human being, i.e. the wise and virtuous person). Dialectic as a field of study first sprung from the practice of dialectic in the form of questions and answers but became, largely under the influence of Chrysippus, increasingly systematized and more technical to include the in-depth study of language, meaning, arguments, and epistemology (cf. Gourinat 2000; Castagnoli 2010). It is in fact in dialectic that we find most of the material that influences the later so-called technical grammarians (on which see more below, 5.1, cf. Atherton and Blank 2003). This goes hand in hand with the systematicity of Stoic philosophy. The Stoics believed language to be inherently natural and to be such as to match the natural, rational order of things, so that language has a natural propensity to capture objects in the world and its structure. The study of language in dialectic is thus an integral part of Stoic philosophy as a whole.
3.2 Philosophy of Language and Lekta
With the distinction of “what signifies” and “what is signified”, the Stoics introduce what is perhaps their most celebrated innovation in the philosophy of language: the lekta or “sayables”. What signifies is uttered or written language (words, sentences) in the form of air struck or symbols in ink or in clay, and, as such, a body. What is signified, on the other hand, is an incorporeal, namely a lekton. The term itself is notoriously difficult to translate: from the verb legein, “to speak” but also “to reason”, it is literally “what can be said” – and not all lekta are in fact said. Lekta are defined as “that which subsists in accordance with a rational impression” (Sextus, 33B), and they form the contents of rational impressions, concepts, and judgments.
The relationship of language to lekta is the subject of debate, but it seems clear that lekta do not map neatly onto the language that express them (Bobzien 2021). This is likely one of the roots of the Stoic interest in ambiguity (on which see Atherton 1993). Nonetheless, the Stoics identified and classified different parts of speech (proper noun, common noun, verb, conjunction, article, to which some add mesotês, which is usually taken to be the participle, though it could be adverbs: Diogenes Laertius 33A, 33M), each of which appear to express distinct signifieds. Verbs, for example, typically express predicates (katêgorêmata, 33Μ; see detailed discussion in Bobzien and Shogry 2020). Whether all parts of speech express lekta is unclear. Nouns, for example, may signify the elusive cases (ptôseis), or qualities, or both (Diogenes Laertius 33A, 33M, 34K; see Frede 1994a, Gaskin 1997, Bronowski 2019, ch. 8–9).
The Stoics provide an extensive taxonomy of lekta. They begin by dividing them into complete and incomplete. Incomplete lekta include predicates, while complete lekta appear to be those usually expressed by syntactically complete sentences and include wishes, commands, questions, and the all-important propositions (axiômata), which are typically expressed by declarative sentences.
Propositions are the only bearers of truth-value and the central entity in much of Stoic philosophy of language and logic. Sometimes also translated as “assertibles”, Stoic propositions bear some similarities to the modern proposition, but also some important differences. Notably, Stoic propositions change truth-value over time, so “it is day” is true while it is day, will become false when it is night, and true again the following day, etc. The Stoics also distinguish different types of propositions on the basis of their subject (Sextus, 34Η; Diogenes Laertius, 34Κ). The major three types of simple affirmative propositions are the definite or categorical, composed of a deictic or demonstrative and a predicate (“this one walks”); the middle or categoreutical, whose subject is expressed by a noun (“Socrates walks”, “man sits”); and the indefinite whose subject is expressed by an indefinite pronoun (“someone is sitting”). These different types of propositions have different semantic but also epistemological properties, as a result of the modes of references of their subject (Durand 2019). For example, one perhaps surprising property of the definite is that it can only be said of objects to which one has successfully referred, so that, for example, the proposition “this one is dead”, can only be said of something or someone that exists, but is “destroyed”, that is, is no longer a proposition and no longer has a truth-value if and when the referent ceases to exist. As a result, “this one is dead” can never be said truly, since it would be true only of objects to which reference cannot be fixed deictically. This odd feature is appealed to in the Stoic response to competing accounts of modality (3.5).
The so-called simple propositions can be combined to form complex propositions, composed of multiple simple propositions joined by a connective. The Stoics thus developed accounts of the truth-conditions of the conjunction (“p and q”), disjunction (“p or q”), which they treated as exclusive, and entered the lively ancient debate over the correct understanding of conditionals (“if p, then q”). (For more on this, see the entry on Ancient Logic, section 5.2.) They also treated the negation as truth-functional and as negating a whole proposition (“it is not the case that p”: Alex. Aphr., in Ar. An. Pr. 402.12–19 = FDS 921), which could be applied to simple or complex propositions. The Stoic interest in non-simple propositions and their logical relations was shared with, and built upon work by, philosophers in the Dialectical School.
Arguments themselves are composed of complex propositions, including at least two premises and one conclusion (Diogenes Laertius, 31Α). This definition of arguments made the Stoic system one of what we might now call propositional logic, by contrast with Aristotle’s logic of terms or predicate logic.
Syllogisms are arguments that take the form of one of the five so-called “indemonstrables”, which are axiomatic arguments, or can be reduced to one by means of one of four rules of inference, the themata. The five indemonstrables are familiar argument forms presented in the following abbreviated way (Diogenes Laertius, 36Α, cf. Sextus, M 8.224–5, where “the first” and “the second” are used in place of p and q, following standard Stoic practice):
- if p then q; p; therefore q (modus ponens);
- if p then q; not-q; therefore not-p (modus tollens);
- not: both p and q; p; therefore not-q;
- either p or q; p; therefore not-q;
- either p or q; not-p; therefore q.
A syllogism is a valid argument (Diogenes Laertius, 36A), as is any argument whose conclusion follows from the premises, that is, in Chrysippean terms, if the (Chrysippean) conditional formed from its premises as antecedent and its conclusion as consequent is true (Sextus, 72I; Diogenes Laertius, 36A). An argument is sound (literally “true”) if it is valid and its premises are true. For more on the details on Stoic syllogistic, including a reconstruction of the themata, see the entry on Ancient Logic sections 5.3–4 and Bobzien 1996.
The Stoics also contributed to questions about modality, following in the footsteps, indirectly, of Aristotle and, more directly, of the Megarians. At the heart of their interest were issues of possibility and necessity tied in part to their commitment to causal determinism.
These matters primarily came to the fore in discussions of the so-called Master Argument introduced by Diodorus Cronus. The Master Argument itself does not survive and the details are the subject of debate (cf. e.g. Gaskin 1995, Denyer 1999). It involved the three apparently inconsistent claims that (i) past truths are necessary, (ii) nothing impossible follows from the possible, and (iii) there is something possible but does not yet happen (Epictetus, 38A). Just why these claims are incompatible is not entirely clear, though the Master Argument reportedly worked to establish this result. In response, one had to give up one of the claims. Which one of them one rejects has serious implications for one’s commitments with regards to the notions of possibility and necessity. Diodorus Cronus rejected (iii), arguing that what is possible is limited to what either is or will be true at some point in the future (Boethius, 38C). Among the Stoics, Cleanthes reportedly rejected (i), while Chrysippus rejected (ii). He argued that the conditional “if Dion is dead, this one is dead” is a counterexample, by appealing to the semantics of deictic reference and reference failure (Alex. Aphr., 48F, cf. above 3.3 and Durand 2019). This arguably ad hoc argument enables Chrysippus to retain both the necessity of the past and the thesis that there are things which are possible but do not happen. This in turn allows him to introduce a distinction between metaphysical necessity (since all things are fated and pre-determined by antecedent causes, see above 2.8) and logical necessity (de Harven 2016) at the heart of his compatibilist account. For more on Stoic views on modality, see Bobzien 1986.
The Stoics were interested in logical paradoxes and tackled a number of them, including the Liar and the Sorites (Chrysippus, 37G; Cicero, 37H; Plutarch, 37I). The evidence on the solutions they offered is poor but suggests a great deal of thought and sophistication. On the Liar, see Cavini 1993 and Mignucci 1999. On the Sorites, see Bobzien 2002 and Vogt 2022. On the so-called Horned One, see Bobzien 2012. (These logical paradoxes and the Stoic efforts to solve them should not be confused with the “Stoic Paradoxes” discussed by Cicero in his treatise of the same name; the latter refer to Stoic doctrines in ethics running contrary to common opinion.)
The Stoics develop their epistemological theory as a sub-branch of logic, but here, as in so many other cases, their conclusions lend support to, and draw on, doctrines in other parts of their philosophical system. Readers should familiarize themselves with the Stoic psychological theory presented above.
One central task of Stoic epistemology is to provide an account of knowledge (epistêmê). Like Plato and Aristotle, the Stoics conceive of knowledge as the paramount intellectual achievement available to human beings and, accordingly, place demanding conditions on its possession. Knowledge, for the Stoics, is a maximally stable and modally robust grasp of reality, in the sense that if S knows that p, then not only is p true, but also S will not revise their commitment to p in response to any degree of dialectical scrutiny that may be applied to S. This requirement is registered in the Stoic claim that knowledge is “secure and unchangeable by reason” (Stobaeus, 41H) and seems originally born out of reflection on the action of Plato’s Socratic dialogues: whoever asserts p but is led to accept not-p as a result of elenctic cross-examination thereby reveals his own lack of knowledge of p (even in cases where p happens to be true) (Frede 1983).
Crucially, for the Stoics, the immutability characterizing S’s knowledge that p does not rest on churlish stubbornness in S or on their unquestioning faith in p, but rather on S’s ability to understand what makes p true and why the arguments against p, if ever they are presented to S, are unsound. This thesis has two significant consequences. First, to know p requires a mastery of a comprehensive suite of dialectical skills, including “irrefutability”, i.e. “strength in argument, so as not to be carried away into the contradictory” (Diogenes Laertius, 31B), and a grasp of the canons of formal logic and Stoic syllogistic, in order to distinguish valid from invalid arguments and detect when the latter are offered in favor of not-p. Second, knowledge is essentially systematic (Stobaeus, 41H). In knowing p, S is in a position to appreciate how p fits into a larger body of information, both within p’s domain and in other parts of philosophical inquiry. Thus our Stoic sources use “knowledge” to pick out both a stable psychological condition and a token activity: the knowledge that p (token activity) is only possible in a mind in which p has been integrated and organized into a complex unified structure (stable condition) (Vogt 2012, ch. 7; Brennan 2005, ch. 6). For these reasons, the Stoics restrict knowledge to the Sage (Cicero, 41A; Sextus, 41C). Only the perfected human agent genuinely knows anything, because only she possesses the wide-ranging argumentative expertise necessary to defend what she has affirmed against any possible challenge, together with a grasp of the further facts that explain its truth.
Like virtue and happiness (see 4.2 below), knowledge does not come in degrees. One’s endorsement of p is either maximally stable and unable to be overturned through rational means, or it is not, and virtue (as we will see) is itself analyzed as knowledge of what is good, bad, and neither (cf. Stobaeus, 61D, 61H). Since virtue is necessary and sufficient for happiness (Diogenes Laertius, 61A), it follows that those lacking knowledge will not be happy.
Given the fundamental importance of knowledge, how can it be acquired? Attaining knowledge is exceedingly difficult, the Stoics concede – not even the leaders of the school claimed to have it – but, for all that, still humanly possible.
Here it is useful to consider the Stoics’ three-fold distinction between knowledge (epistêmê), cognition (katalêpsis), and ignorance (agnoia) (on which Chrysippus wrote four books, now lost; Diogenes Laertius, 7.201). Whereas knowledge is found only in the Sage, only the non-Sage is afflicted by ignorance (Stobaeus, 41G). Knowledge and ignorance are thus mutually exclusive conditions. This result also falls out of the Stoic definition of ignorance, as “changeable and weak assent” (Stobaeus, 41G). The Stoics therefore divide human agents into two sharply disjoint categories, the knowledgeable and the ignorant, with the overwhelming majority of us falling into the latter camp. To account for the move from a condition of ignorance to a condition of knowledge, Zeno introduces a mental state he calls katalêpsis (translated by Long and Sedley as “cognition” but elsewhere as “grasp” or “apprehension”; in non-technical contexts the Greek word connotes an act of seizing something with the hands).
The basic idea behind Zeno’s proposal is that, when S cognizes (= has katalêpsis of) p, S successfully latches on to or grabs hold of a truth, because the relationship between S and p ensures that p cannot be false: roughly, the process through which p enters S’s mind and the clarity and distinctness with which p is represented are such as to guarantee p’s truth. Cognition is therefore factive – there is no cognition of falsehoods – but not all true judgments amount to cognition, as when, for instance, one assents to p in a state of hallucination or intoxication but p happens to be true (Sextus, 40E). Cognition, then, is a mental state characterized in the first instance by its representational fidelity to the external world and not – as with knowledge and ignorance – by the disposition of the agent to retain or revise it under varying dialectical circumstances. In this sense, cognition is “placed between” knowledge and ignorance (Cicero, 41B): it is an intellectual achievement shared by both Sages and non-Sages (Sextus, 41C). This entails, however, that any token cognition that p will count as either knowledge or ignorance, depending on the character of the cognizer. The Sage’s cognition that p is a piece of knowledge, since it is immutable and systematically organized in the manner described above, while the non-Sage’s is a piece of ignorance (Cicero, 41B), since it is still insecure and prone to be abandoned in the face of contrary argumentative pressure (Plutarch, 31P; see Shogry 2022). This led the Academic skeptic Arcesilaus to object that cognition will be an empty category and have no independent existence apart from knowledge and ignorance (cf. Sextus, 41C). But the Stoics have good reasons for presenting their tripartite distinction as they do, because they see cognition as the “natural foundation” (or “starting point”: principium) for knowledge (Cicero, 41B).
Beginning with Zeno, the Stoics characterize cognition (katalêpsis) as an assent to a special kind of impression, one that functions as a criterion of truth and thus guarantees its own veridicality: such an impression they call “cognitive” (lit. “cognition-prompting”, katalêptikos) (Sextus, 41C; see also PH 3.241 and M 8.397). While some scholars simply transliterate this label as “kataleptic”, Long and Sedley’s translation of “cognitive”, whatever its infelicities, helpfully replicates the connection, visible in the Greek, with the outcome of assenting to such an impression: “cognition”. (Similarly, when katalêpsis is translated as “grasp” or “apprehension”, we find “graspable” or “apprehensive” for katalêptikos; Cicero translates the two terms into Latin as comprehensio and comprehendibile, respectively.) So cognition is guaranteed to be true because it is analyzed as an assent to an impression that is itself guaranteed to be true: cognitive impressions “have a peculiar power of revealing their objects” (Cicero, 40B).
The existence of cognitive impressions makes cognition possible, and knowledge, the Stoics hold, is attained when all of one’s acts of assent amount to cognition: the Sage is distinguished from the non-Sage in assenting exclusively to cognitive impressions. “Assent iff cognitive” therefore functions as a norm of Stoic epistemology and sketches a pathway to progress from ignorance to knowledge. The Stoics assume that cognition, especially of perceptual facts, is commonplace and regularly achieved by the non-Sage, and so that on these occasions there is no great obstacle to obeying the norm. For instance, ordinary agents regularly entertain and accept the cognitive impression that “it is day” when standing in a sunny field at noon. But other cases present greater challenges, such that the non-Sage will assent to an impression that fails to be cognitive and thus infect their mind with “opinion” (doxa) (Plutarch, 41E). By contrast, the Sage is entirely free of opinion, since she withholds assent on any impression that is non-cognitive (Stobaeus, 41G). (Scholars dispute the status of opinion in Stoic epistemology, but on one well-attested usage doxa is the label used specifically for the non-Sage’s acts of assent to non-cognitive impressions; for an alternative view, on which opinion is identical to ignorance, see Meinwald 2005 and Vogt 2012, ch. 7.)
Unsurprisingly, then, the Stoics expend no small effort explaining what distinguishes cognitive and non-cognitive impressions. Zeno eventually settled on the following three-clause definition of the cognitive impression, which was retained throughout the history of the school. According to the Stoics, “a cognitive impression is one which:
- arises from what is, and
- is stamped and impressed exactly in accordance with what is,
- of such a kind as could not arise from what is not.” (Sextus, 40E)
These three clauses are construed by the Stoics as providing individually-necessary and jointly-sufficient conditions for an impression to be cognitive (Nawar 2014). Together, they are supposed to capture the feature(s) shared by all and only cognitive impressions, in virtue of which they serve as criteria of truth (Diogenes Laertius, 40A). However, their precise interpretation remains highly controversial.
One longstanding dispute concerns the meaning of “what is” as it features in clause (1): is it to be understood existentially or veridically? On the existential interpretation, “what is” refers to a being or real object, so that clause (1) requires the cognitive impression to be caused by (“arise from”) an existing object in the external world. So construed, clause (1) rules out cases where an impression is formed solely through the activity of the mind (e.g. in a hallucinatory episode). However, this reading has been challenged on both textual and philosophical grounds. Textually, the Greek phrase translated by Long and Sedley as “what is” does not use a form of “to be” (einai) but rather a different, technical expression: “to obtain” (huparchein). According to Stoic metaphysics (see above, 2.1), only bodies “are” or “exist” (einai), and so if clause (1) were intended to refer specifically to external objects (bodies), we would expect a form of einai, not huparchein. Philosophically, the existential reading implies there are only cognitive impressions of bodies. However, the Stoics acknowledge the possibility of cognition concerning incorporeal propositions, for instance, truths about the nature of the gods (Diogenes Laertius, 40P), and insofar as cognition consists in an assent to a cognitive impression, there should be cognitive impressions of these true incorporeal propositions as well. (On this issue, see Schwab forthcoming, and the recent exchange between Vogt 2022 and Nawar 2022.) The veridical interpretation points to a resolution of both these difficulties. On this reading, “what is” picks out a true proposition, in line with the Stoic claim that true propositions “obtain” rather than “exist” (cf. Sextus, 34D) and with further evidence in Cicero (cf. 40I and Acad. 2.112). Thus clause (1) amounts to a veridicality requirement: all cognitive impressions must be true. Moreover, a veridical reading of clause (1) would also seem to allow for the possibility that there are cognitive impressions of true propositions, though this point is controversial: see Sedley 2002 and Nawar 2014. For an effort to rehabilitate a version of the existential reading, see Stojanović 2019 and Caston forthcoming.
The major debate over clause (2) turns on whether it serves to characterize the cognitive impression’s phenomenological character, causal history, or both, and one’s stance on this question affects one’s interpretation of clause (3) in turn. Both Cicero and Sextus report that clause (3) was added by Zeno to an earlier definition consisting just of clauses (1) and (2) (40D, E), and the grammar of clause (3) itself suggests it should be read as a further elucidation of clause (2). According to what has come to be called the “internalist” interpretation, clause (2) requires that the cognitive impression display a unique level of clarity and phenomenological sharpness, which is lacking in any false impression (clause (3)) (Sedley 2002). By contrast, on the “externalist” reading, clause (2) stipulates that the cognitive impression is appropriately caused, i.e. “exactly in accordance with” the fact it represents and not any other, without speaking to its phenomenological qualities: the causal link between the cognitive impression and its object is “of such a kind as” no false impression will possess (clause (3)) (Frede 1983; for the viability of this interpretation, see the exchange between Perin 2005 and Shogry 2018). A “hybrid” view reads clauses (2) and (3) as stating that the cognitive impression enjoys maximal phenomenological clarity because it is caused in the appropriate way, i.e. by the state-of-affairs it represents and no other (Nawar 2014; cf. Frede 1999).
From its initial formulation by Zeno, the Stoic account of the cognitive impression was fiercely contested by the school’s skeptical opponents, provoking a centuries-long debate over its tenability (Annas 1990). Academic skeptics, such as Arcesilaus and Carneades, argued that no impression could meet all three clauses of Zeno’s definition (40 H, J), with the result that cognition, as the Stoics conceive of it, is impossible, since cognitive impressions do not exist. For discussion of these Academic arguments, see the entries on Ancient Skepticism, Arcesilaus, Carneades, and Philo of Larissa. Sextus Empiricus presents a number of further arguments devised by Pyrrhonian skeptics to show that cognitive impressions cannot serve as criteria of truth.
For helpful comments on the relation in Stoicism between reasonable impressions and cognitive impressions, see Brennan 1996 (with Diogenes Laertius, 40F). For articles exploring the influence of Plato’s Theaetetus on the development of the Stoic account of the cognitive impression, see Shogry 2021 and Long 2002.
Stoic ethics is eudaimonist in structure, in the sense that it posits happiness (eudaimonia) – a well-lived, flourishing life – as the rational agent’s ultimate practical goal or end (telos). Thus the Stoics characterize happiness as “the end, for the sake of which everything is done, but which is not itself done for the sake of anything” else (Stobaeus, 63A). This core eudaimonist thesis is shared by the Epicureans, Peripatetics, and other philosophical schools contemporary with the Stoics, and is regarded as an uncontroversial starting-point for further ethical reflection and theorizing (Annas 1993). Every human agent, it is assumed, wants nothing more than to live a flourishing, happy life and therefore arranges their own projects and efforts according to what they think will accomplish this goal. Unfortunately, however, most human beings are mistaken about what will in fact make them happy. Regardless of what they themselves might say about the value and success of their lives, most humans, according to the Stoics, hold false opinions about what their happiness consists in, i.e. false opinions about what is good. In the eudaimonist framework in which Stoic ethics is articulated, to claim that x is good (or a good) is to claim that x is a constituent or causal source of happiness. Stoic ethical theory therefore aims to provide an account of what really is good and what really brings happiness to a human being, so that we can guide our lives accordingly. In this respect, the Stoics’ aims are continuous with those of the Epicureans, Peripatetics, and other rival ethical schools, but the eudaimonist philosophers of the Hellenistic and Roman periods put forward different accounts of what human happiness genuinely consists in, so that it became standard practice among ancient writers to distinguish each school by its view of “the highest good” (summum bonum) and “the end” (telos / finis) (cf. the title of Cicero’s treatise, De Finibus).
4.1 The Telos
What, then, is the Stoic account of the end? How do they describe the kind of activity in which human happiness consists?
Zeno represented the end as: ‘living in agreement’. This is living in accordance with one concordant reason, since those who live in conflict are unhappy... Cleanthes, [Zeno’s] first successor, added ‘with nature’, and represented it as follows: ‘the end is living in agreement with nature’. (Stobaeus, 63B)
Although our Stoic sources record a number of further descriptions of the telos, some of which we will consider below, the formulation attributed in this passage to Cleanthes (and elsewhere to Zeno himself, see Diogenes Laertius 63C) – “living in agreement with nature” – offers a convenient entry-point into the Stoic ethical system.
One feature of the happy life brought out by Zeno’s shorter formulation – “living in agreement” – is agreement with oneself. The flourishing human being is free of both internal psychological division and vacillation in her practical commitments and priorities, such that she enjoys “a good flow of life” (Stobaeus, 63A). In characterizing the flourishing life as one which adheres to “one concordant reason” (Stobaeus, 63B), i.e. one coherent practical outlook that is never at odds with itself or discordant over time, Zeno respects what is arguably a basic intuition about human happiness (Cooper 2012; cf. Aristotle, Nic. Eth. 1.4, 1095a22–26).
With the longer formulation, the Stoics underscore their commitment to a bolder thesis, that, in living with agreement with herself, the happy agent is also living in agreement with nature and so with the cosmos as a whole:
Therefore, living in agreement with nature comes to be the end, which is in accordance with the nature of oneself and that of the whole, engaging in no activity wont to be forbidden by the universal law, which is the right reason pervading everything and identical to Zeus, who is this director of the administration of existing things. (Diogenes Laertius, 63C)
As we saw above (2.7) in the context of Stoic physics – i.e. the study of nature – God or Zeus is identified with the active principle of the universe, the corporeal mind present everywhere within it, structuring and shaping the underlying matter according to an all-encompassing, perfectly rational plan. For a human being to live “in agreement” (homologoumenôs) with cosmic nature therefore requires attuning her own reason (logos) with that of the whole, by thinking the same thoughts about her situation and circumstances as does Zeus in governing the portion of the world she occupies (Cooper 2012). In this way, the flourishing agent lives in conformity “with the will of the administrator as the whole” (Diogenes Laertius, 63C).
To bring our mind into this state of agreement and achieve the telos, the Stoics argue that only one thing is needed: virtue. Virtue is the perfected condition of human reason (Seneca, 63D), or “a soul which has been fashioned to achieve consistency [or agreement, homologia] in the whole of life” (Diogenes Laertius, 61A). Having developed her own power of reason to its fullest extent, the virtuous agent not only lives a life that is the highest expression of human nature – the best possible condition for a human being to be in, given the kind of creature we are – but also replicates in herself the condition of the divine (Seneca, 60H; Plutarch, 61J). To live virtuously is therefore to live in agreement with both human nature and cosmic or divine nature at once (Chrysippus in Diogenes Laertius, 63C).
Since virtue is the perfection of human rationality, and knowledge is the highest rational achievement open to us, it is unsurprising that the Stoics identify the virtues as forms of knowledge. The virtue of courage, for instance, just is knowledge of what should be endured and feared, and the Stoics argue that this virtue is inseparable from all the rest: whoever has one virtue has them all (61B-H; see Schofield 1984). Thus the knowledge that constitutes courage entails a systematic grasp of further topics in ethics (e.g. of what should be done and what is choiceworthy, the provinces of prudence and moderation, respectively) and also, remarkably, of the truths of logic and physics as well (Cooper 1999a, Menn 1995; for an alternative view, see Annas 1993). One cannot genuinely know (e.g.) what should be endured or feared without also knowing how knowledge itself is acquired (a topic in logic) and how nature operates in both human beings and the cosmos at large (a topic in physics). The knowledge that makes up virtue therefore ranges beyond the narrowly ethical, and since knowledge is an all-or-nothing affair, so too is virtue (Plutarch, 61T). For the Stoics, comprehensive knowledge of reality (including but not limited to moral facts) is what is necessary and sufficient to live in agreement with nature and be happy.
This sketch of Stoic eudaimonism allows us to better appreciate two of their most contentious ethical doctrines: (1) human happiness is fully in our power and (2) virtue is the only good.
Recall that, for the Stoics, the possession of knowledge depends solely on the agent’s acts of assent, and all acts of assent are in the agent’s power (see above, 2.8 and 2.9). So if virtue is knowledge and both necessary and sufficient for happiness, it follows that happiness will also be in the agent’s power and entirely up to them.
Let us grant for the sake of argument that virtue and knowledge are in the agent’s power. Even so, one might object that it is impossible to be happy in the midst of grave misfortune and material deprivation: a terminally ill patient racked with pain, impoverished from medical bills, and reviled by all of society cannot be happy, even if he is virtuous. This intuitive thought led Academic and Peripatetic philosophers working in the eudaimonist tradition to argue that, while virtue is necessary for happiness, it is not sufficient, or to recognize different degrees of happiness and hold that, while virtue is necessary and sufficient for a minimal amount of happiness, it does not suffice for full or maximal happiness (cf. Cicero, De Finibus 5.77; Seneca, Moral Letters 85.18–23). On these views, some things other than virtue and lying outside the agent’s power – i.e. his share of “external goods” – will make a difference to his happiness.
The Stoics reject such approaches:
They [the Stoics] say that some existing things are good, others are bad, and others are neither of these. The virtues – prudence, justice, courage, moderation and the rest – are good. The opposites of these – foolishness, injustice and the rest – are bad. Everything which neither does benefit nor harms is neither of these: for instance, life, health, pleasure, beauty, strength, wealth, reputation, noble birth, and their opposites, death, disease, pain, ugliness, weakness, poverty, low repute, ignoble birth and the like. For just as heating, not chilling is the peculiar characteristic of what is hot, so too benefiting, not harming is the peculiar characteristic of what is good. But wealth and health no more do benefit than they harm. Therefore wealth and health are not something good. (Diogenes Laertius, 58A)
In sharp contrast with eudaimonist theories which regard health, wealth, reputation, etc. as “external goods”, the Stoics maintain that such items are neither good nor bad and, thus, “indifferent” (adiaphora / indifferentia) to human happiness. To establish this conclusion, the Stoics do not rely on the claim that wealth, for instance, sometimes benefits and sometimes harms the agent. Instead, the Stoic position is that wealth “neither does benefit nor harms”: in no case is a human life ever made better or worse by the possession or deprivation of wealth (or health or reputation etc.). Just as what is hot necessarily provides heat, so too what is good necessarily provides benefit (cf. Sextus, 60G). The Stoics’ fundamental axiological thesis, then, is that only virtue benefits a human being and makes our lives go well, so only virtue is good.
The Greek Stoics were prolific in crafting arguments in support of this thesis, a number of which survive in our sources (e.g. Cicero, 60N; see also Seneca, Moral Letters 82, 85, and 87). Among other strategies, Chrysippus appealed to his account of human nature to show that only virtue is good, arguing that human nature is such that only the perfection of reason is genuinely beneficial to us (cf. Cicero, 64K and Brennan 2009; see also Klein 2016). In any event, the Stoics fully embrace the conclusion that Aristotle considers too big a bullet to bite (cf. Nic. Eth. 1.5, 1095b33–1096a2): they maintain that, even while being tortured on the rack, his body mutilated and searing with pain, and isolated from all his family and friends, the virtuous person is maximally happy (Cicero, De Finibus 3.42). Indeed, according to the Stoics, he is equally happy as he was before the torture began, since at both times he possesses the one thing that is really beneficial – virtue – despite having a different share of indifferents (physical pain, health, etc.). Human happiness therefore does not come in degrees, on the Stoic view. Provided that the agent is virtuous (and regardless of how long she continues to possess virtue: Cicero, De Finibus 3.45–7), nothing external will detract from or add to her personal flourishing.
With respect to their contribution to happiness, then, all indifferents are on a par (Diogenes Laertius, 58B). From this bracing thesis, one might be tempted to infer that there is no reason to exert oneself in the pursuit of one type of indifferent (e.g. health) over its opposite (e.g. disease). While some marginal figures in Zeno’s circle endorsed this kind of absolute equality of indifferents, such a position was explicitly rejected by Chrysippus, and it did not become Stoic orthodoxy (Cicero, 58I; cf. Sextus, 58F). Instead, the mainstream Stoic view is that some indifferents – such as health, wealth, and reputation – are of a promoted or preferred type (proêgmena / praeposita), have value (axia / aestimatio), and are according to nature (kata phusin / secundum naturam), such that is appropriate or dutiful or one’s proper function (kathêkon / officium) to select them over their opposites in normal circumstances (Cicero, 59D; Stobaeus 58C-E). For this reason, the virtuous agent will typically pursue (e.g.) health and undertake the further steps needed to obtain it (e.g. eat salad, exercise, etc.), even though her successful acquisition of health – her actually being healthy rather than unhealthy – makes no difference to her happiness and is neither good nor bad. The virtuous agent is therefore not lackadaisical in her attitude toward indifferents, according to the orthodox Stoic account, but rather energetic and conscientious in her pursuit of those which are preferred, valuable, and according to nature: her general policy will be to select these and reject their opposites.
The Stoics’ ancient critics replied that this doctrine was incoherent, even confused, and it is indeed difficult to see how something could be both indifferent to our happiness and nevertheless rational to care about and pursue. The ancient critique of the Stoic account of indifferents can be formulated as a dilemma (cf. Plutarch, 64C; Cicero, 64F, L; see Klein 2015, Barney 2003). According to these critics, there are just two ways the Stoics can explain why we should pursue health, wealth, and other preferred indifferents, both of which leading to self-contradiction: either (i) these items really are good and directly or indirectly contribute to human happiness, or (ii) happiness is not the ultimate practical goal. Option (i) makes the pursuit of these items intelligible, on the grounds that possessing them is good for human beings and happiness-affecting, but is inconsistent with the Stoic claim that only virtue is good. On this option, “preferred indifferents” turn out to be external goods by another name. Option (ii) respects the Stoic insistence that these items are genuinely indifferent to our happiness, but sacrifices the bedrock eudaimonist thesis that happiness is “the end, for the sake of which everything is done” (Stobaeus, 63A). On option (ii), indifferents are pursued for the sake of a goal independent from, and standing outside of, the agent’s own happiness, but this result is one that no eudaimonist school can consistently accept.
Whether the Stoic account is ultimately impaled on these two horns remains the subject of ongoing scholarly debate. However, the epistemic interpretation of Stoic indifferents – first sketched by Cooper 1999a and Brennan 2005 but authoritatively presented in Klein 2015 – deserves further consideration here, as a promising attempt to rescue the Stoics from the dilemma. On this interpretation, the agent is justified in selecting (e.g.) health over its contrary indifferent, illness, not because health is itself good or because there is some happiness-independent reason to be healthy as opposed to sick, but instead because, for finite agents like us, who lack knowledge of future events, selecting promoted indifferents over their opposites is generally the most epistemically responsible way of following the will of Zeus (cf. Chrysippus in Epictetus, 58J).
Recall that the telos is standardly specified as “living in agreement with nature”. Chrysippus holds that this formulation is equivalent to “living in accordance with experience of what happens by nature” (Diogenes Laertius, 63C). According to Diogenes of Babylon, the telos can also be described as “reasoning well in the selection and dis-selection of things in accordance with nature” (Stobaeus, 58K). Diogenes’ formulation suggests that the correct selection of indifferents makes a positive contribution to human happiness, even though their possession does not. Moreover, the Stoics think that a selection can be correct even if Zeus decides not to produce the indifferent that the agent pursues: like excellent dancing, virtuous selection of indifferents does not require the acquisition of any object external to the agent in order to count as successful (Cicero, 64H). So, on the epistemic interpretation, when the virtuous agent selects health over illness, she does not act for the sake of obtaining health, as if being healthy rather than sick would make a difference to her flourishing, but instead because pursuing health on this occasion reflects her “experience of what happens by nature” and follows upon her best assessment of what conformity to Zeus’ providential cosmic plan requires of her in this instance. (See Stobaeus 65Q, with discussion in Inwood 1985, ch. 5, and Brennan 2000, for the “reservations” included in the Sage’s selections of indifferents.)
So far, for ease of exposition, we have focused on a simplified case in which an agent deliberates over whether to select one preferred indifferent over its opposite. But for the Stoics the typical case of deliberation is much more complicated, with more than one agent and more than one kind of indifferent at stake, so that it may not be immediately obvious what the appropriate action or proper function is in a given scenario. However, since failing to perform one’s proper function is incompatible with living in agreement with nature (Stobaeus, 59I; Diogenes Laertius, 59J), it is incumbent upon the Stoic theorist to assist ordinary agents and moral progressors in their deliberation in these cases. To this end, the Greek Stoics composed works On Proper Functions (Peri Kathêkontôn), with Panaetius’ forming the basis of Cicero’s treatise of the same name (De Officiis). The main assumption guiding these Stoic works is that indifferents serve as the subject-matter or raw material of virtue (Plutarch, 59A): the virtuous agent must impartially weigh indifferent against indifferent when deliberating over what to do. For the Stoics, justice requires distributing the right amount of indifferents to each person (cf. Plutarch, 61C and Stobaeus, 61H), and in some cases the just agent will select a dispreferred indifferent for herself, in order to allocate a greater amount of preferred indifferents to others. Since being alive is itself a preferred indifferent, there are cases when one’s proper function is to sacrifice one’s own life (e.g. to save others fleeing the battlefield or to avoid large amounts of future pain and disease) (Cicero, 66G; Diogenes Laertius, 66H). Although it might be tempting to attribute to the Stoics a simple maximization rule, on which one’s proper function just is to maximize the net amount of preferred indifferents for the most agents, our evidence points against the idea that the Stoics accepted any one single principle for determining what one’s proper function is in a given scenario (see Brennan 2005, chs. 11–13, and the exchange between Inwood 1999 and Striker 1987; for defeasible guidelines or rules of thumb that may assist the ordinary agent in finding what is appropriate, see e.g. Seneca, Moral Letters 94 and 95).
4.5 Stoic Cosmopolitanism
How far do the demands of justice extend? To all human-beings, the Stoics insist (Plutarch, 67A; Cicero, 57F; Hierocles, 57G; Anonymous Commentary, 57H). In virtue of our shared rationality, all human beings, together with Zeus, make up the citizenry of one universal city or cosmopolis (Marcus Aurelius, 4.4; Arius Didymus, 67L). The just agent therefore looks beyond her immediate physical proximity and conventional political community when distributing indifferents and takes the interests of every human being – even the “most distant Mysian” (Anonymous Commentary, 57H) – into account.
One motivation for characterizing the cosmos as a kind of city is Stoic thinking on law, which in turn draws on wider tenets of their physical and ethical theory. According to the Stoics, to live in agreement with nature and achieve the human telos involves “engaging in no activity wont to be forbidden by the universal law (ho nomos ho koinos), which is the right reason pervading everything and identical to Zeus” (Diogenes Laertius, 63C; cited above, 4.1). The providential activity of Zeus in administering the cosmos thus serves as universal law, setting a perfectly rational standard for human beings to follow and emulate (Marcian, 67R). So, since “a city is a group of people living in the same place and administered by law” (Dio Chrysostom, 67J), and all human beings are bound by the universal law of Zeus – a law that is “diffused over everyone, consistent, everlasting” (Cicero, 67S) – it follows that the cosmos is a kind of a city.
For further details of Stoic cosmopolitanism, see Vogt 2008, Schofield 1991, and the entries on Ancient Political Philosophy and Cosmopolitanism.
To support their account of cosmopolitan justice and their fundamental axiological thesis that only virtue is good, the Stoics rely on their doctrine of oikeiôsis (“appropriation” or “affiliation”; the Greek term suggests a process whereby objects come to be recognized as oikeion – as “appropriate” or “affiliated” or “belonging” to the creature in question). This doctrine begins with the observation that, straight from birth, every creature seeks to preserve its own constitution, even when this is painful (Diogenes Laertius, 57A; Seneca, 57B): its own constitution is thus the first thing each creature sees as oikeion to it and, hence, as an object of concern. This is because each animal is born with a capacity for self-perception, which enables it to detect, among other things, what is appropriate or harmful to its constitution, and a capacity for impulse, which enables it to pursue or avoid objects accordingly (Hierocles, 57C). So, to use Seneca’s example, a turtle that has fallen on its back perceives that this situation is unfavorable to its constitution and forms an impulse to right itself. Moreover, the turtle does all this by nature, without having been trained to do so, showing that non-rational creatures are set-up by providential nature to perceive what is needed for their own teleological success and to act appropriately in pursuit of this goal. Newborn infants and children are no exception: as we saw above (2.9), humans are not born with reason but rather acquire it later in life, so that prior to maturing into adults we employ a non-rational soul and pursue the objects appropriate for a constitution of this kind. The transition into adulthood comes when “reason supervenes as the craftsman of impulse” (Diogenes Laertius, 57A), i.e., when we acquire a rational nature and begin to form “rational impulses” (Stobaeus, 53Q). The Stoics maintain that the rational constitution of a mature adult differs from that of a non-rational child (Seneca, 57B), and so too the things favorable to it. Furthermore, adding a social dimension to the theory of oikeiôsis, the Stoics observe that humans, like members of certain animal species (bees, ants, etc.), naturally cooperate with one another, and, in general, “it could not be consistent for nature both to desire the production of offspring and not to be concerned that offspring should be loved” (Cicero, 57F). However, it is not exactly clear how these various observations are supposed to offer support for the Stoics’ ethical commitments. Scholarly debate has focused on three main issues. First, how, if at all, are these apparently descriptive claims able to provide any normative guidance? Second, how could a natural disposition toward self-preservation underwrite the other-regarding demands of cosmopolitan justice? Third, in what ways, if any, is a non-rational creature’s pursuit of food, shelter, and other things favorable to their non-rational constitution analogous to the Sage’s attachment to virtue as the sole good? It is worth noting that one of our main sources on oikeiôsis concludes with an account of the ideal agent’s development, culminating in her appreciation that consistency [or agreement, homologia] and harmony of conduct is the only true source of benefit in a human life (Cicero, 59D). Magrin 2018 and Klein 2016 take up these issues with admirable clarity and should be consulted for further details; they also provide an up-to-date bibliography on this wide-ranging topic.
The Stoics famously argue that the virtuous agent feels no passions (pathê) and, so, that the happy life is entirely passion-free (apathês). To better understand this striking and notorious claim, let us examine how they define the passions:
They [the Stoics] say that passion is impulse which is excessive and disobedient to the dictates of reason, or a movement of soul which is irrational and contrary to nature; and that all passions belong to the soul’s commanding-faculty. (Stobaeus, 65A)
Notice that all passions are impulses (hormai) of a certain kind, i.e. psychological events directly prefiguring action, which “belong to the soul’s commanding-faculty”. This implies that all passions are “rational impulses”, in the Stoic scheme (Stobaeus, 53Q), insofar as they are created through the exercise of the agent’s rational mind (his “commanding-faculty”), specifically, through an act of assent (see 2.9 above). Passions are therefore “irrational” and “disobedient to the dictates of reason” not because they arise in some part of the mind that lacks reason (like Plato’s spirit or appetite), for the Stoics deny that the human mind has any non-rational parts. In what sense, then, do the passions disobey the dictates of reason and count as irrational?
One answer is that, in undergoing a passion, the agent disobeys right reason, i.e. the rationality of the cosmos or the universal law of Zeus. To suffer a passion is to be in conflict with nature – to experience “fluttering” rather than the “good flow” of the happy person (Stobaeus, 65A; cf. Stobaeus, 63A) – and is therefore a vicious action par excellence, one that frustrates the agent’s progress towards the telos. To see why, we need to introduce further aspects of the Stoic account of passions.
Insofar as each passion follows upon the agent’s act of assent, it is amenable to a cognitivist analysis. According to the Stoics, each passion can be described as an opinion or judgment or weak supposition (65B-D), whose content includes two elements, both of which (in the standard case) are false: (i) an ascription of value to an object that is present or in prospect and (ii) an assessment that a particular course of action is appropriate to perform in response (Graver 2007, ch. 2; Brennan 2005, ch. 7; Inwood 1985, ch. 5). In standard cases, (i) is false because the passionate agent mistakes something he currently possesses or expects to possess as either good or bad, when really it is indifferent. So, for instance, the distress I feel in learning that I have heart disease involves my mind’s assent to the proposition that illness is both present and something bad – where “bad” carries the eudaimonist connotation of being deleterious to my happiness (Cooper 1999b). This thought is false, of course: disease is dis-preferred, but not bad, and its presence makes no difference to my happiness. My case of distress, then, involves a cognitive failure, according to the Stoics: in suffering this passion, I have incorrectly evaluated illness and misjudged its connection to my own personal flourishing. As part of my distress, I may also experience anxious internal constricting and start to weep, as a result of my mind’s assessment that such actions are appropriate responses to my present illness (element (ii) above). On the Stoic view, this assessment is also false, for these are not objectively appropriate reactions to the presence of something bad (cf. the more complicated Alcibiades case, discussed by Graver 2007, ch. 9).
Distress is one of four main types or genera of passion recognized by the Stoics. Each type is distinguished by the character of its intentional object: distress, a present perceived bad; fear, a future perceived bad; appetite, a future perceived good; delight (or pleasure), a present perceived good. Appetite and fear are primary, with distress and delight secondary (Stobaeus, 65A). What is common in all four genera, however, is a cognitive mistake on the part of the agent concerning the value of the intentional object or concerning the appropriate behavioral response – an epistemic failure that is incompatible with living in agreement with nature. This is one important upshot of Chrysippus’ runner analogy (in Galen, 65J). Just as a runner moves in such a way that he is “carried away” and cannot immediately come to a halt, so the passionate agent acts on impulses “going beyond the rational proportion”, i.e. contrary to the right reason of Zeus (Inwood 1985). However, some commentators see the runner analogy as gesturing at a sense in which, for Chrysippus, the passionate agent disobeys her own reason as well (Graver 2007, ch. 3). If so, then perhaps the Chrysippean theory can recognize some form of occurrent mental conflict after all, although the details of such an interpretation have not yet been worked out.
Scholars are divided on how exactly to understand Posidonius’ reaction to the Chrysippean account of the passions. From the verbatim remarks and paraphrases in Galen (65K, M, P, Q), it seems clear that Posidonius considered some elements of the Chrysippean account inadequate, but whether Posidonius chose merely to emphasize different aspects of that account, without substantially revising it, or instead intended to modify some of its tenets, remains the subject of debate: see Lorenz 2011 and Cooper 1999b.
In characterizing the ideal human agent as passion-free, what exactly are the Stoics denying to her? One might suppose that this ideal implies the eradication of all emotional feelings whatsoever, but the Stoic account of the virtuous person’s “good feelings” (eupatheiai) belies the caricature of the Sage as an unfeeling robot (Diogenes Laertius, 65F). Whereas passions are typically directed at indifferents incorrectly judged to be good or bad, the Sage’s good feelings are emotional responses to genuine goods, i.e. to virtue, virtuous actions, and virtuous friends (see Graver 2007, ch. 2, and Cooper 2005). Moreover, at some point in the school’s history, the Stoics introduced a category of feelings called “pre-emotions” (propatheiai), emotional reactions that occur without the intervention of assent and so able to be experienced by the Sage without compromising the knowledge in which her virtue consists (Gellius, 65Y; for discussion, see Graver 2007, ch. 4).
5.1 On Grammatical Writers
Whether “grammar” was properly speaking a subdiscipline of Stoic philosophy is debated, but it is generally agreed that Stoic philosophy of language heavily influenced the works of Ancient Grammarians. There had long been interest in the study of language, but the Stoics, and Chrysippus chief among them, with their systematic study of language, are considered by many to have laid the foundations for what became the independent discipline of technical grammar. The Stoic influence can be traced in various works, and Stoic views (sometimes attributed to “the philosophers”) are explicitly discussed in Scholia, especially to Dionysius Thrax’s Art of Grammar. More notably, a debt to the Stoics is acknowledged by Apollonius Dyscolus, a highly influential second century CE Greek grammarian, one of the earliest grammarians for whom we have extant works. Stoic influences can similarly be found in Priscian, a Latin grammarian of the 6th century CE living in Constantinople, whose Institutiones Grammaticae, in part based on Apollonius Dyscolus’ work, provided much of the foundation for medieval grammar. The extent and exact nature of this Stoic influence on the grammatical tradition has, however, been the subject of considerable debate. On the interactions of grammar and philosophy, see Lallot 1988, Sluiter 1990, Ildefonse 1997, Swiggers and Wouters 2002, Atherton and Blank 2013; on the Stoics specifically, see Frede 1977, Atherton and Blank 2003; on Apollonius Dyscolus, Blank 1982, 2000; and on Latin grammar and Priscian, Baratin 1989, Luhtala 2005, Baratin et al. 2009, Ebbesen 2009.
5.2 On Christian Writers
Christian writers were receptive to some elements of Stoicism. There exists an inauthentic correspondence between St Paul and Seneca included in the Apocrypha. This forgery is a very ancient one, since it was referred to in both Jerome (De Viris Illustribus 12) and Augustine (Epistle 153.4). But the fact that the letters were not written by Paul or by Seneca does not mean that Paul was unaware of Stoic philosophy, nor that his own thought may not be understood in relation to Stoic theory, cf. Engberg-Pedersen 2000. The tradition of theories of natural law in ethics seems to stem directly from Stoicism. (Compare Cicero, De Legibus 1.18 with later writers like Aquinas in Summa Theologica II, 2, q. 94.) Augustine chose to follow the Stoics rather than the Platonists (his usual allies among the philosophers) on a number of points, including on the question of animals’ membership in the moral community (City of God 1.20) and in his philosophy of language. Sorabji 2000, part IV, argues that the Stoic idea of freedom from the passions was adapted and transmuted into the idea of seven deadly sins by Evagrius. In general, see Colish 1985 for the presence of Stoicism in Latin writers through the sixth century.
The influence of Stoicism on Medieval thought has been considered by Verbeke 1983. In general, the handling of Stoic ideas in the context of Christian orthodoxy required a certain delicacy. While it was agreed by nearly all that God was not a material being, the state of the human soul was a more controversial matter. In general, ancient Christian orthodoxy evolved away from materialist anthropology of the sort found in Tertullian to the immaterialist notion of the soul that present-day Christians take for granted. Medieval Christians felt it necessary to reject what they called Stoic fatalism, but notions of conscience and natural law had clear connections with Stoic thought.
5.3 On Renaissance and Early Modern Philosophy
The late 16th and early 17th centuries saw efforts to form a systematic synthesis of Christianity and Stoicism. The most important figure in the Neo-Stoic movement was Justus Lipsius. The influence of the Hellenistic schools generally on early modern philosophy is the theme of the essays collected in Miller and Inwood 2003. See also Osler 1991 and Strange and Zupko 2004.
5.4 On Contemporary Philosophy
While Stoic texts were not widely read or readily accessible in the 19th and early 20th centuries, some of their views were presented in anthologies and historical surveys, such as Prantl’s 1855 History of Western Logic, the first volume of which contains a lengthy chapter on Stoic logic. A recent study by S. Bobzien (2021) has suggested that the latter might have found its way to Gottlob Frege, the 20th century philosopher credited by many with founding analytic philosophy. In this work, Bobzien produces evidence that some of Frege’s own work is derived from, and heavily indebted to, these Stoic texts.
A note on citations in this entry: where possible, we refer to primary texts using the author’s name, followed by the notation given in Long and Sedley 1987. For example, “Aetius, 26A” refers to chapter 26 of Long and Sedley’s collection, text A, whose author is Aetius. We use Long and Sedley’s translation unless otherwise noted.
Collections of primary texts
- von Arnim, H., 1903–5 Stoicorum Veterum Fragmenta Leipzig: Teubner. [SVF]
- Dufour, R, 2004, Chrysippe. Oeuvre philosophique, 2 vols. Paris: Les Belles Lettres.
- Hülser, K., 1987–88. Die Fragmente zur Dialektik der Stoiker, Stuttgart: Frommann-Holzboog Verlag. [FDS]
- Inwood, B., 2022. Later Stoicism, 155 BC to AD 200: An Introduction and Collection of Sources in Translation, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Inwood, B. and L. P. Gerson, 1997, Hellenistic Philosophy 2nd ed. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing. [IG]
- Long, A. A. and D. N. Sedley, 1987, The Hellenistic Philosophers, 2 vols. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press [LS]
- Nickel, R., 2009, Stoa und Stoiker. Auswahl der Fragmente und Zeugnisse, 2 vols. Dusseldorf: Artemis und Winkler
Primary texts by specific authors
- Bowen, A. and R. Todd, 2004, Cleomedes’ Lectures on Astronomy, Berkeley: University of California Press. [A translation of the Stoic Cleomedes’ work on astronomy, together with introduction and commentary.]
- Boys-Stones, G., 2018, L. Annaeus Cornutus: Greek Theology, Fragments and Testimonia, Atlanta: Society of Biblical Literature. [Greek text with facing page translation, with introduction and notes]
- Edelstein, L. and I. G. Kidd, 1972, Posidonius, 2 vols. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. [Greek and Latin texts; introduction in English]
- Graver, M., 2002, Cicero on the Emotions: Tusculan Disputations 3 and 4. Chicago: University of Chicageo Press. [English translation and notes]
- Graver, M. and A. A. Long, 2015, Seneca: Letters on Ethics to Lucilius, Chicago: University of Chicago Press. [English translation of all 124 extant letters]
- Inwood, B., 2007, Seneca: Selected Philosophical Letters, Translated with Introduction and Commentary, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Pomeroy, A., 1999, Arius Didymus: Epitome of Stoic Ethics, Atlanta: Society of Biblical Literature. [Greek text with facing page translation and notes].
- Ramelli, I., 2009, Hierocles the Stoic: Elements of Ethics, Fragments and Excerpts, Atlanta: Society of Biblical Literature. [Greek text with facing page translation. Extensive notes.]
- Van Staaten, M., 1962, Panaetii Rhodii Fragmenta, Leiden: Brill.
Useful Reference Works
- Algra, K., and J. Barnes, J. Mansfeld and M. Schofield (eds.), 1999, The Cambridge History of Hellenistic Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Arenson, K. (ed.), 2020, The Routledge Handbook of Hellenistic Philosophy, New York: Routledge.
- Inwood, B. (ed.), 2003, The Cambridge Companion to the Stoics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Sellars, J. (ed.), 2016, The Routledge Companion to the Stoic Tradition, New York: Routledge.
Introductions to Stoicism
- Brennan, T., 2005, The Stoic Life, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Cooper, J. M., 2012, Pursuits of Wisdom: Six Ways of Life in Ancient Philosophy, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
- Inwood, B., 2018, Stoicism: A Very Short Introduction, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Long, A. A., 2002, Epictetus: A Stoic and Socratic Guide to Life, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 1986, Hellenistic Philosophy: Stoics, Epicureans, Skeptics, 2nd edition, London: Duckworth.
- Nussbaum, M., 1994, The Therapy of Desire, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
- Rist, J. M., 1969, Stoic Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
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A few collections, monographs, and some individual articles referred to above
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- Barney, R., 2003, ‘A Puzzle in Stoic Ethics’, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 24: 303–40.
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- Brennan, T., 1996, ‘Reasonable Impressions’, Phronesis, 41(3): 318–334.
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- Brittain, C., 2002, ‘Non-Rational Perception in the Stoics and Augustine,’ Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 22: 253–308.
- Bronowski, A., 2019, The Stoics on Lekta. All There Is to Say, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
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- Castagnoli, L., 2010, ‘How Dialectical Was Stoic Dialectic?’, in A. Nightingale and D. Sedley (eds.), Ancient Models of Mind: Studies in Human and Divine Rationality, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 153–179.
- Caston, V., 1999, ‘Something or Nothing: The Stoics on Concepts and Universals’, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 17: 145–213.
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- Cavini, W., 1993, ‘Chrysippus on Speaking Truly and the Liar’, in K. Döring and T. Ebert (eds.), Dialektiker und Stoiker: Zur Logik der Stoa und ihrer Vorläufer, Stuttgart: Franz Steiner Verlag, 85–109.
- Christensen, J., 1962, An Essay on the Unity of Stoic Philosophy, Copenhagen: Munksgaard.
- Colish, M., 1985, The Stoic Tradition from Antiquity to the Early Middle Ages, 2 volumes, Leiden: E.J. Brill.
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- –––, 1999b, ‘Posidonius on Emotions’, in his Reason and Emotion, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 449–484.
- –––, 2004, ‘Justus Lipsius and the Revival of Stoicism in Late-Sixteenth-Century Europe’, in N. Brender and L. Krasnoff (eds.), New Essays on the History of Autonomy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 7–29.
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- Durand, M., 2019, ‘What Does “This” Mean? Deixis and the Semantics of Demonstratives in Stoic Propositions’, Methodos 19. doi:10.4000/methodos.6023
- Ebbesen, S., 2009, ‘Priscian and the Philosophers’ in M. Baratin, C. Colombat, L. Holtz (eds.). Priscien: transmission et refondation de la grammaire, de l’Antiquité aux Modernes, Turnhout: Brepols, 85–108.
- Engberg-Pedersen, T., 2000, Paul and the Stoics, Westminster: John Knox Press. [Specifically on the alleged correspondence between Paul and Seneca, see J. B. Lightfoot, The Letters of Paul and Seneca, London: Macmillan, 1890, and Aldo Moda, ‘Seneca e il Cristianesimo’, Henoch, 5 (1983): 93–109.]
- Engstrom S., and J. Whiting (eds.), 1996, Aristotle, Kant and the Stoics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Frede, M., 1977, ‘The Origins of Traditional Grammar’, reprinted in his 1987 Essays in Ancient Philosophy, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 338–359.
- –––, 1983, ‘Stoics and Skeptics on Clear and Distinct Impressions’, reprinted in his 1987 Essays in Ancient Philosophy, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 151–76.
- –––, 1994a, ‘The Stoic Notion of a Grammatical Case’, Bulletin of the Institute of Classical Studies, 39: 13–24.
- –––, 1994b, ‘The Stoic Notion of a Lekton’, in S. Everson (ed.), Language: Cambridge Companions to Ancient Thought 3, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 109–128.
- –––, 1994c, ‘The Stoic Conception of Reason’, in K. Boudouris (ed.), Hellenistic Philosophy, Athens: International Society for Greek Philosophy and Culture, 50–63.
- –––, 1999, ‘Stoic Epistemology’, in K. Algra, et al. (eds.), The Cambridge History of Hellenistic Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 295–322.
- –––, 2011, A Free Will: Origins of the Notion in Ancient Thought, Berkeley: University of California Press.
- Gaskin, R., 1995, The Sea Battle and the Master Argument: Aristotle and Diodorus Cronus on the Metaphysics of the Future, Berlin: De Gruyter.
- –––, 1997, ‘The Stoics on Cases, Predicates and the Unity of the Proposition’, Bulletin of the Institute of Classical Studies (Supplement), 68: 91–108.
- Gill, C., 2006, The Structured Self in Hellenistic and Roman Thought, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Goldschmidt, V., 1972, ‘῾Υπάρχειν et ὑφιστάναι dans la philosophie stoïcienne’, Revue Des Études Grecques, 85(406): 331–344.
- Gourinat, J-B., 2000, La Dialectique des Stoïciens, Paris: Vrin.
- Graver, M., 2007, Stoicism and Emotion, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
- Greene, B., 2018. The Imperfect Present: Stoic Physics of Time, University of California/San Diego Doctoral Dissertation.
- Hahm, D.E., 1977, The Origins of Stoic Cosmology, Columbus: Ohio State University Press.
- de Harven, V., 2015, ‘How Nothing Can Be Something. The Stoic Theory of Void’, Ancient Philosophy, 35(2): 405–429.
- –––, 2016, ‘Necessity, Possibility and Determinism in Stoic Thought’, in M. Cresswel, E. Mares and A. Rini (eds.), Logical Modalities from Aristotle to Carnap: The Story of Necessity, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 70–90.
- Helle, R., 2018, ‘Hierocles and the Stoic Theory of Blending’, Phronesis, 63(1): 87–116.
- –––, 2021, ‘Self-Causation and Unity in Stoicism’, Phronesis, 66(2): 178–213.
- –––, 2022, ‘Colocation and the Stoic Definition of Blending’, Phronesis, 67(4): 462–497.
- Hensley, I., 2018, ‘On the Separability and Inseparability of the Stoic Principles’, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 56(2): 187–214.
- –––, 2020, ‘The Physics of Pneuma in Early Stoicism’, in S.M.P. Coughlin, D. Leith, and O. Lewis (eds.), The Concept of Pneuma after Aristotle, Berlin: Edition Topoi, 171–201.
- –––, 2021, ‘The Physics of Stoic Cosmogony’, Apeiron, 54(2): 161–187.
- Hudson, H., 1990, ‘A Response to A. A. Long’s “The Stoics on World-Conflagration and Everlasting Recurrence”’, The Southern Journal of Philosophy, 28: 149–58.
- Ierodiakonou, K., 1993, ‘The Stoic Division of Philosophy’, Phronesis, 38(1): 57–74.
- Ildefonse, F., 1997, La naissance de la grammaire dans l’antiquité grecque, Paris: Vrin.
- Inwood, B., 1985, Ethics and Human Action in Early Stoicism, Oxford: Clarendon.
- –––, 1999, ‘Rules and Reasoning in Stoic Ethics’, in K. Ierodiakonou (ed.), Topics in Stoic Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 95–127.
- –––, 2012, ‘How Unified is Stoicism Anyway?’, in R. Kamtekar (ed.), Virtue and Happiness: Essays in Honour of Julia Annas, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 223–244.
- Ju, A. E., 2009, ‘The Stoic Ontology of Geometrical Limits’, Phronesis, 54 (4–5): 371–389.
- Klein, J., 2015, ‘Making Sense of Stoic Indifferents’, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 49: 227–281.
- –––, 2016, ‘The Stoic Argument from Oikeiо̄sis’, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 50: 143–200.
- Lallot, J., 1988, ‘Origines et développement de la théorie des parties du discours en Grèce’, Langages, 92: 11–23.
- Lewis, E., 1995, ‘The Stoics on Identity and Individuation’, Phronesis, 40: 89–108.
- Long, A. A., 1971, ‘Language and Thought in Stoicism’, in his Problems in Stoicism, London: Athlone, 75–113.
- –––, 1985, ‘The Stoics on World-Conflagration and Everlasting Recurrence’, The Southern Journal of Philosophy, 23: 13–17.
- –––, 2002, ‘Zeno’s Epistemology and Plato’s Theaetetus’, in T. Scaltsas and A. S. Mason (eds.), Zeno of Citium and His Legacy: The Philosophy of Zeno, Larnaca: Municipality of Larnaca, 115–30.
- –––, 2008, ‘Philo on Stoic Physics’, in F. Alesse (ed.), Philo of Alexandria and Post-Aristotelian Philosophy, Leiden: Brill, 121–140.
- Lorenz, H., 2011, ‘Posidonius on the Nature and Treatment of the Emotions’, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 40: 189–211.
- Luhtala, A., 2005, Grammar and Philosophy in Late Antiquity: A Study of Priscian’s Sources, Amsterdam: John Benjamins Publishing Company.
- Magrin, S., 2018, ‘Nature and Utopia in Epictetus’ Theory of Oikeiōsis’, Phronesis, 63(3): 293–350.
- Meinwald, C., 2005, ‘Ignorance and Opinion in Stoic Epistemology’, Phronesis, 50(3): 215–231.
- Menn, S., 1995, ‘Physics as a Virtue’, Proceedings of the Boston Area Colloquium of Ancient Philosophy, 11(1): 1–34.
- –––, 1999, ‘The Stoic Theory of Categories’, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 17: 215–247.
- Mignucci, M., 1999, ‘The Liar Paradox and the Stoics’, in K. Ierodiakonou (ed.), Topics in Stoic Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 54–70.
- Miller, F. and B. Inwood (eds.), 2003, Hellenistic and Early Modern Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
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- –––, 2017, ‘The Stoics on Identity, Identification, and Peculiar Qualities’, Proceedings of the Boston Area Colloquium of Ancient Philosophy, 32(1): 113–159.
- –––, 2020, ‘The Stoic Theory of the Soul’, in K. Arenson (ed.), The Routledge Handbook of Hellenistic Philosophy, New York: Routledge, 148–159.
- –––, 2022, ‘Clear and Distinct Perception in the Stoics, Augustine, and William of Ockham’, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society (Supplementary Volume), 96(1): 185–207.
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- Reydams-Schils, G., 1999, Demiurge and Providence: Stoic and Platonist Readings of Plato’s Timaeus, Turnhout: Brepols.
- Salles, R., 2005, The Stoics on Determinism and Compatibilism, Burlington VT: Ashgate.
- –––, 2009, God and Cosmos in Stoicism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 2015, ‘Two Early Stoic Theories of Cosmogony’, in A. Marmodoro and B. D. Prince (eds.), Causation and Creation in Late Antiquity, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 11–30.
- –––, 2018, ‘Two Classic Problems in the Stoic Theory of Time’, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 55: 133–184.
- Schofield, M., 1984, ‘Ariston of Chios and the Unity of Virtue’, Ancient Philosophy, 4(1): 83–96.
- –––, 1991, The Stoic Idea of the City, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Schwab, W., forthcoming, ‘Non-Perceptual Kataleptic Impressions in Stoicism’, Journal of the History of Philosophy.
- Sedley, D. N., 1982, ‘The Criterion of Stoic Identity’, Phronesis, 27: 255–75.
- –––, 1984, ‘The Stoic Theory of Universals’, The Southern Journal of Philosophy, 23: 87–92.
- –––, 1999, ‘Hellenistic Physics and Metaphysics’, in K. Algra, et al. (eds.), The Cambridge History of Hellenistic Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 355–411.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- von Arnim’s SVF is digitally archived at archive.org:
- Hicks’ translation of Diogenes Laertius’ account of Stoic philosophy, in the Perseus Digital Library
- Translations of some of the works of the Roman Stoics are also
- Marcus Aurelius, Meditations
- Epictetus, Discourses and Enchiridion
- Seneca, Moral Letters
- Baltzly, Dirk, “Stoicism”, Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2022 Edition), Edward N. Zalta & Uri Nodelman (eds.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/win2022/entries/stoicism/>. [This was the previous entry on this topic in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy – see the version history.]
As of January 2023, this entry has been rewritten by Marion Durand and Simon Shogry. However, some material from the previous version by Dirk Baltzly has been retained (with permission) and so he is credited as a co-author.