Arcesilaus (315/4–241/40 BCE) was a member and later leader of Plato’s Academy. He initiated the skeptical phase of the Platonic school (‘Academic skepticism’) and was an influential critic of the Stoics, especially of their epistemology.
The ancient evidence about Arcesilaus’ philosophy is difficult to evaluate and, in some respects, inconsistent. As a result, scholars interpret his skepticism in several ways. Some see his philosophical activity as entirely negative or destructive of all views. Others take him to have held positive views, but not on any philosophical topic, including the possibility of knowledge. Some regard him as having supposed on the basis of arguments that nothing could be known, while still others view him as someone who refused to accept any philosophical theory or proposition as rationally warranted, insisting that further examination is always required.
- 1. Life and work
- 2. Skepticism: method or doctrine
- 3. Criticism of Stoic epistemology
- 4. Inapprehensibility and universal suspension of assent
- 5. The practical criterion
- 6. Priority of method
- 7. Conclusion
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1. Life and work
After an early education in geometry and astronomy in his native Pitanê (in Aeolis, the northwest Aegean coast of modern Turkey), Arcesilaus escaped to Athens against his guardian’s wishes. There he is said to have studied rhetoric in association with Theophrastus (Aristotle’s successor) until c. 295–290 BCE, when he abandoned it to study philosophy in Plato’s Academy with Crantor (d. 276/5) and its leaders Polemo (d. 270/69) and Crates (d.268/7). He became the head of the Academy (‘scholarch’) after Crates’ death and led the school for more than 25 years until his own death in 241/40 BCE.
Like Socrates, his philosophical model, and Carneades, who carried forward his skepticism in the 2nd c. BCE, Arcesilaus did not write any philosophical works. His arguments were initially preserved by his students—including Pythodorus, who wrote up some of them, and Lakydes, his successor as scholarch—and in the work of his opponents, most notably, the Stoic Chrysippus, whose reformulation of Stoicism was prompted by Arcesilaus’ criticisms of the views of the first generation of Stoics. But Arcesilaus’ arguments were later overlaid by Carneadean elaborations and subsumed into the general Academic and anti-Academic traditions; so it is only through those later traditions that we know about them. Our knowledge of his work depends on scraps from the biographical tradition (preserved in Diogenes Laertius and Philodemus) and brief general reports from later skeptical writers—Cicero and Sextus Empiricus and Plutarch—and their opponents—Antiochus and Numenius (preserved in Cicero and Eusebius respectively). But since these offer incompatible interpretations of Arcesilaus’ philosophical position, reflecting the writers’ distinctive views about later developments in the skeptical Academy, the precise nature of his skepticism remains controversial.
2. Skepticism: method or doctrine
The central question presented by the inconsistent evidence for Arcesilaus’ skepticism is how to reconcile his Socratic method with the ‘doctrines’ he is reported to have accepted:
- that nothing can be known (inapprehensibility, or ‘akatalêpsia’ in Greek);
- that one should suspend assent universally and so form no beliefs (universal suspension of assent, or ‘epochê peri pantôn’); and
- that one who universally suspends assent still has a ‘practical criterion’ of action.
Our sources agree that Arcesilaus’ dialectical method constituted the core of his philosophical activity (see e.g., Diogenes Laertius 4.28). This method presents two basic difficulties for any attempt to reconcile it with these doctrines.
First, his method was dialectical, such that rather than arguing in favor of any doctrine or set of doctrines, Arcesilaus restricted himself to arguing against the views proposed by his opponents or interlocutors. At first sight, this method may not look incompatible with affirming inapprehensibility and universal suspension of assent if the repeated result of practicing it was that the views argued against did not stand up to criticism. Such repeated failures could suggest that in fact nothing can be known and that one should form no beliefs at all.
We can see why Arcesilaus’ dialectical method cautions against accepting this suggestion by looking at the model he claimed to be following: Socrates’ practice in the dialogues of Plato (see Cicero, Academica 1.44–5, De oratore 3.67, De finibus 2.2, On the Nature of the Gods 1.11). In Plato’s Socratic dialogues, at least, Socrates challenges the pretensions of his interlocutors to knowledge by showing, through premises they accept, that they are committed to inconsistent beliefs. To achieve this result, it is crucial that the arguments—the premises, the inferences, and the conclusions—depend entirely on the beliefs of the interlocutors. If they do, the result of a successful Socratic encounter will be that the interlocutor is at a loss: the interlocutors now recognize that they have inconsistent beliefs, since they have both their initial reasons for the thesis or knowledge-claim they made and their newly-discerned reasons against it. If they also hold some generally accepted views about knowledge (for example, that one can’t know something about which one holds inconsistent beliefs), the interlocutors will be rationally constrained to aver that they don’t know whether their thesis is true or false, and hence to suspend assent on the thesis while awaiting further investigation and argument. But no such result holds for Socrates. For, although he represents himself as being in the same aporetic boat—and may in fact be perplexed for exactly the same reasons—his method does not commit him to the premises, inferences or conclusions of the arguments, or even to the regulating ideas about knowledge. His views (if he has any) are not at issue in the argument.
There is good evidence that Arcesilaus followed the Socratic model consistently. It is clear that he went to some lengths not to make positive affirmations of any sort in his own right in his arguments (see Diogenes Laertius 4.36, Philodemus Index Academicorum 20.1–4, cf. 18.40–19.9). Our sources also confirm that Arcesilaus took his method to entail that he did not reveal his own view on the matter in question in any case, if he had one, including, for instance, the view that the claim argued against is false (see e.g., Cicero De oratore 3.67). Further, our most detailed sources actually identify the radical change of position in the Platonic school he introduced—the transition from the Old Academy to the skeptical Academy—in terms of his adoption of this method (see Diogenes Laertius 4.28, Philodemus Index Academicorum 18.7–16 & 21.36–42 and Sextus Outlines of Pyrrhonism 1.220–35, esp. 232). And this explains his reputation as a ‘dialectician’ (or, more negatively, as a ‘sophist’ or ‘eristic’ or ‘magician’), as well as why the skeptical Academy came to be defined primarily by its critical stance towards the doctrines of other schools (and particularly towards the energetic philosophical programs of the new movements initiated by Epicurus and Zeno during his lifetime). But if Arcesilaus followed this model consistently by arguing against every philosophical position that came to his notice and refraining from making any positive arguments or affirmations on any philosophical question, it is hard to see why we should think that he accepted any doctrines, including inapprehensibility and universal suspension of assent. Thus, the first difficulty is that Arcesilaus’ method in principle obscures any views he may have held.
The second difficulty involved in reconciling Arcesilaus’ dialectical method with doctrines [i]–[iii] is more straightforward: they are conclusions of some of his best known arguments, but since these are clearly dialectical anti-Stoic arguments, they depend crucially on Stoic premises. In epistemology, he argued that, despite the Stoics’ commitment to readily accessible knowledge, certain premises accepted by the Stoics entail that nothing is known and that we should suspend assent universally (see below, sect. 3.). Likewise, the theory of action Arcesilaus defended is parasitic on the Stoics’ and relies on their ethical premises (see below, sect. 5). Given his Socratic method, we only have reason to ascribe these doctrines to Arcesilaus himself if we have independent evidence that he accepted those premises shared by Stoics. But there is reason to think that Arcesilaus did not accept anything of Stoic epistemology or ethics. The second difficulty, then, is that the evidence does not give a consistent picture of which, if any, conclusions of his dialectical arguments Arcesilaus may have accepted in his own right.
The first question about Arcesilaus’ skepticism is thus whether it involved any commitment to doctrines at all. A negative answer to this question—based on something like the two difficulties given above—yields what is called a dialectical interpretation of Arcesilaus (adopted by e.g., Couissin 1929 and Striker 1980; see Castagnoli 2018 on the senses of ‘dialectical’). The primary drawback to this interpretation is that it involves the rejection of a central claim about him in all of our major sources except Philodemus: Cicero, Numenius, Sextus, Diogenes and Plutarch ascribe some degree of commitment to at least one of these doctrines—that of universal suspension ([ii] above). Rejecting this evidence might be justified by the lateness of these sources and their associations with later Academic developments; but this seems hard to maintain when we learn that Arcesilaus’ contemporary opponents, including Chrysippus, also ascribed universal suspension to him (see Plutarch On Stoic Self-Contradictions 1036a with 1037a, and Against Colotes 1122a). A dialectical interpretation also risks failing as an interpretation: it cannot explain why Arcesilaus argued as he did, whether because it denies him any commitments or because it claims they are entirely opaque to us (see Perin 2013).
If we accept that these considerations constrain us to look for a positive answer to the first question, at least as regards the recommendation of suspending assent about everything, the second question is which of the three candidate doctrines—viz., [i] inapprehensibility, [ii] universal suspension, and [iii] a theory of action without assent—was Arcesilaus committed to. Since, as numerous sources suggest, universal suspension is the prescriptive claim that one ought not to form any beliefs, then Arcesilaus cannot follow it and at the same time believe it, or anything else, to be true. If we do not wish to saddle Arcesilaus with a self-defeating skepticism, we are then faced with a third question: what was the nature of Arcesilaus’ commitment to his doctrines? The answers to these two questions remain open. But the dominant solutions on offer fall roughly into three groups, each identifying a different kind of commitment compatible with universal suspension, and so a different answer to the third question. If the sort of commitment prohibited by universal suspension is rational belief, then three weaker kinds of commitment seem to have been open to Arcesilaus:
- Non-Rational Non-Belief (‘NRNB’): a commitment to p, which neither is a belief that p nor is based on reasons.
- Rational Non-Belief (‘RNB’): a commitment to p, which is not a belief that p but is based on reasons.
- Non-Rational Belief (‘NRB’): a commitment to p, which is a belief that p but is not based on reasons.
NRNB supposes that the skeptic universally suspends assent as a natural, psychological reaction to equally convincing (or equipollent) and opposing arguments. Universal suspension, on this view, is not a prescription justified through the argument that one ought to suspend assent about everything because knowledge is impossible. Rather, since the skeptic’s belief-forming faculties are paralyzed in the face of opposing reasons, she acts by impulse, pursuing what appears appropriate (see sect. 5.1). On an NRNB interpretation Arcesilaus’ commitments to [ii] universal suspension and [iii] a practical criterion were founded neither on belief nor on a prior consideration of reasons (see e.g., Ioppolo 1986; 2009; 2018).
RNB allows the skeptic to accept doctrines on rational grounds, by distinguishing beliefs from other attitudes that can take the place of beliefs in chains of inference: in particular, belief-like suppositions that function as hypotheses (see Striker 1980, Bett 1990, and Reinhardt 2018). On the RNB view Arcesilaus accepted [i]–[iii] hypothetically (see Schofield 1999, Perin 2010, and Thorsrud 2018).
NRB denies the skeptic accepts doctrines on the basis of any premises that purport to warrant them. On this view, [i] inapprehensibility and [ii] universal suspension were the residual and rationally unwarranted beliefs Arcesilaus was left with as a result of his philosophical activity (see Frede 1979 & 1984, Cooper 2004, Brittain 2005 , and Thorsrud 2009).
As we will see in sects. 4–5, these three accounts of Arcesilaus’ skepticism privilege the evidence for his arguments in competing ways. To understand and evaluate their interpretive strategies, we first need to examine Arcesilaus’ principal arguments against Stoic epistemology.
3. Criticism of Stoic epistemology
Arcesilaus’ best known arguments, and the only ones that survive in any detail, are his criticisms of Stoic epistemology (Sextus Against the Logicians [‘M.’] 7.150–9, Cicero Academica 2 passim, esp. 2.66–7 & 2.77).
The Stoic theory of knowledge represented a radical shift in epistemology, since it offered an empirically-based route to the kind of wisdom Socrates had sought (see Frede 1999). Its basis was three novel claims made by Zeno, the founder of the Stoa (see Cicero Academica 1.40–2). First, Zeno proposed a new psychological theory: to form a belief of any kind is to give one’s assent to one’s ‘impression’ (or ‘appearance’: ‘phantasia’ in Greek) about the matter. Secondly, he claimed that some of our perceptual impressions are ‘cognitive’ or self-warranting, so that assenting to them constitutes a cognition or apprehension (‘katalêpsis’) of their objects. And, thirdly, he argued that we ought to restrict our assent to just cognitive impressions, since it is contrary to reason to form ‘opinions’—that is, mere beliefs whether true or false—by assenting to inadequately warranted, non-cognitive impressions. But, given that there are cognitive impressions, we can attain infallible knowledge or wisdom by restricting our assent to them, since our thoughts will then be constituted entirely by cognitions derived from perception or from concepts warranted by perceptual cognitions.
The focus of Arcesilaus’ attack on Zeno’s theory was its centerpiece, the theory of cognitive impressions. Zeno defined a cognitive impression as one that comes from what is, is stamped and impressed exactly in accordance with it, and is such that it could not be false (Sextus M. 7.248, Cicero Academica 2.77). This means, roughly, that an impression is cognitive if and only if [a] its propositional content is true, [b] it is caused in the appropriate way for correctly representing its object, and [c] its truth is thus warranted by the inimitable richness and detail of the representational character guaranteed by its causal history—such that [a] is entailed by [b]. Arcesilaus’ tactic was to grant that conditions [a] and [b] are often met, as Zeno claimed, but to argue that condition [c] never obtained (M. 7.154, Academica 2.77). Although his detailed arguments for this have not survived, it is fairly clear from later Academic and Stoic arguments that he followed two main lines of attack. One line depended on the existence of indistinguishable—or, at any rate, indiscernibly distinct—objects, such as twins, or pairs of eggs, manufactured items (statues or impressions on wax of the same letter-seal), and grains of sand (Academica 2.54–8 & 2.84–6, M. 7.408–10). Any of these could be mistaken for another no matter how good one’s impression of it was. The second depended on abnormal states of mind, such as dreams, illusions, and fits of madness (Academica 2.47–53 & 2.88–90, M. 7.402–8). In either case, Arcesilaus argued that, whether the nature of the objects or of our minds is at fault, it is always possible to have a false impression with exactly the same propositional content and representational character as a true one that meets condition [b]. But if so, no impression can be self-warranting in virtue of the way in which its content is represented. So condition [c] never obtains. Hence, on the Stoic view of the requirements for cognition, there is no cognition. And if knowledge is derived entirely from perceptual cognition and concepts warranted by it, as Zeno supposed, it follows that nothing can be known. (Intricate Stoic-Academic debates on these issues lasted for another 150 years; they can best be traced through the arguments of Chrysippus and Carneades, preserved in some detail in Cicero’s Academica and Sextus M. 7.)
The argument is standardly summarized as follows:
- Some impressions are true (a Stoic view).
- False impressions are non-cognitive (Zeno’s condition [a]).
- If the content of a true impression is potentially indistinguishable or indiscernible from that of a false impression, it is non-cognitive (Zeno’s condition [c]).
- The content of all true impressions is potentially indistinguishable or indiscernible from that of false impressions (Arcesilaus’ counterexamples).
- So, there are no cognitive impressions. (See Academica 2.40 & 2.83.)
And, since for Zeno knowledge itself depends on assent to cognitive impressions, this argument leads to the further conclusion that nothing can be known (inapprehensibility).
Arcesilaus followed up this argument against the cognitive impression with a briefer argument against Zeno’s ideal of wisdom:
- there are no cognitive impressions (as Arcesilaus has argued), &
- it is irrational to hold ‘opinions’, i.e., to assent to non-cognitive impressions (as the Stoics held); therefore,
- it is irrational to assent to any impressions at all. (See M. 7.155–7 & Academica 2.66–7.)
That is, Arcesilaus pointed out to the Stoics that if his argument – against the cognitive impression is successful, they are also committed to the conclusion that it is irrational to assent to anything (universal suspension).
These arguments are presented in two very different ways in our two sources. In Sextus’ account (followed above), they are presented as explicitly dialectical arguments, relying on clearly marked Stoic views, and leading to the conclusion that the Stoic sage will have no beliefs. In the report of Cicero in Academica 2, however, we are informed that Arcesilaus was in some way committed to premises and conclusions of both arguments: that is, he agreed that condition [c] of the Stoic definition of the cognitive impression could never be met, and hence that nothing can be known; and he maintained premises  and  of the second argument, and hence concluded that assent to any impression was irrational (Academica 2.66–7 & 2.77). This historical interpretation of Arcesilaus’ skepticism is supported elsewhere in Cicero’s dialogues, where we find histories of philosophy that have Arcesilaus following Socrates and Plato (and Presocratic philosophers such as Democritus, Parmenides and Empedocles) in concluding that nothing can be known by perception or reason, and hence adopting a method of argument that would lead others to refrain from all assent (De oratore 3.67 & Academica 1.43–6; see also Plutarch Against Colotes 1121f).
Cicero’s interpretation in Academica 2.66–7 & 2.77 faces two problems. The first is that the argument against the existence of cognitive impressions depends on many facets of the epistemological framework of the Stoics. For the conclusion doesn’t follow unless it is true that there are impressions, that some are true, that there are no other routes to cognition, that the Stoic definition of cognition gives necessary and sufficient conditions for knowledge, etc. And there is reason to doubt Cicero’s testimony that Arcesilaus subscribed to these Stoic views, since we have some evidence that he argued against every aspect of Stoic epistemology and psychology. Plutarch, for instance, mentions an objection to the Stoic theory of the soul’s interaction with the body, which implies that Arcesilaus argued against the fundamental mechanism of impression in Zeno’s account (On Common Conceptions 1078c). Another fragment from Plutarch suggests that Arcesilaus argued against Zeno’s causal theory of perception (Fragment 215a). And Sextus reports that Arcesilaus also objected to Zeno’s conception of belief as assent to an impression, on the ground that assent is a matter of reason or thought, rather than the acceptance of a physiological item, the impression (M. 7.154).
In these cases, as with his argument against the satisfiability of condition [c] of the Stoic definition of the cognitive impression, it seems possible to trace a definite strategy behind Arcesilaus’ arguments: he argued against Zeno’s empiricist presuppositions by deploying Platonic objections and theories (see Schofield 1999, Trabattoni 2005, Vezzoli 2016, and von Staden 1978). One might conclude, as some did in antiquity, that Arcesilaus therefore had a hidden objective of undermining Stoic or Epicurean empiricism in favor of Platonic doctrine (see Sextus Outlines of Pyrrhonism 1.234). But Arcesilaus’ method implies that he would argue against Platonic doctrines as well, if anyone proposed them. So if he did hold the view that nothing can be known, it seems more plausible to think that he held it due to the success of his arguments against all conceptions of knowledge, rather than solely as the conclusion of an argument relying on a particular epistemological theory. Cicero’s account, then, may give only a partial story of the grounds of Arcesilaus’ skeptical views.
The second problem with the interpretation of Arcesilaus’ skepticism in Academica 2.66–7 & 2.77 is that it risks self-defeat. The problem lies not in knowing that nothing can be known, since, on one account (Cicero Academica 1.45), Arcesilaus, unlike Socrates, explicitly disclaimed such second-order knowledge. It lies rather in believing that nothing can be known in conjunction with the belief that it is irrational to hold opinions in the absence of knowledge. If the former is true, it is irrational (and so one ought not) to believe the premises of the arguments that support both inapprehensibility and universal suspension.
4. Inapprehensibility and Universal Suspension of Assent
There are two approaches to resolving this second problem, that accepting inapprehensibility and universal suspension may be self-defeating. The NRNB view takes a negative route, denying that Arcesilaus was committed to inapprehensibility and universal suspension, at least as a prescriptive claim about the irrationality of assent (see  in sect. 3). By contrast, the RNB and NRB views positively ascribe inapprehensibility and universal suspension to Arcesilaus, but they maintain that his acceptance of them is not explained in terms of rational belief of the sort which would lead a Stoic convinced by Arcesilaus to a self-defeating position (see sect. 2).
4.1 The Non-Rational Non-Belief interpretation
The NRNB view of Arcesilaus argues that he was not committed to inapprehensibility and universal suspension, as a prescriptive claim about the irrationality of assent (see  in sect. 3). On this view, the two sources for the anti-Stoic arguments still imply that Arcesilaus was ‘committed’ to universal suspension, but this is understood as the descriptive claim that the skeptic does not assent to anything due to the balance of opposing arguments; and he was committed to it only in the sense that he acted in accordance with his unreflective impressions (see sect. 5.1 below). Thus, there is no conflict between the anti-Stoic sources, Sextus and Cicero, and those that report that Arcesilaus’ universal suspension is caused by the equipollence of arguments without mentioning his criticism of Stoic epistemology (viz., Diogenes Laertius 4.28, Cicero Academica 1.45, & Sextus Outlines of Pyrrhonism 1.232).
This interpretation takes Sextus to imply that Arcesilaus’ commitment to a descriptive version of universal suspension is prior to his anti-Stoic argument (M. 7.156–7), outlined above in sect. 3 (see e.g., Ioppolo 2002; 2009). In this argument he holds that the Stoic who concedes the non-existence of cognitive impressions is forced to conclude that it is rational to ‘withhold assent’ (‘asugkatathetein’) about everything (see  below). This conclusion is sufficient to oppose the Stoic thesis that some assents are rational. The full version of the argument outlined in sect. 3 is:
- There are no cognitive impressions, as Arcesilaus has argued.
- The wise person does not hold ‘opinions’, i.e., assent to non-cognitive impressions, as the Stoics held.
- Therefore, the wise person does not assent to anything.
- If one does not to assent to anything, one withholds assent (‘asugkatathetein’) about everything.
- To withhold assent is to suspend judgment (‘epechein’).
- Therefore, the wise person suspends judgment about everything.
That Arcesilaus used premise  to move from withholding assent to the suspension of judgment (‘epochê’) indicates, on this account, a commitment to epochê that is independent of Stoic notions like assent and the irrationality of holding opinions, because it is reached only through the equipollence of arguments.
The NRNB view also interprets Cicero as confirming that Arcesilaus was committed to the descriptive version of universal suspension, even though Cicero Academica 2.66–7 & 77 reports that Arcesilaus was committed to various components of his anti-Stoic arguments (see sect. 3): that there are no cognitive impressions, that nothing can be known, that it is irrational to hold opinions, and that it is rational to suspend assent. Cicero may be unreliable here, because he is biased by his own, later conception of radical skepticism, and in his text one may yet find an alternative view (see Ioppolo 2008): at Academica 2.32, Cicero’s pro-Stoic character Lucullus refers to skeptical Academics who concede that everything is uncertain (‘adêla’) without preferring any views; and these Academics appear to be followers of Arcesilaus (cf. Academica 2.16 & 59). Since these Academics’ suspension of judgment is based on the notion of uncertainty, which is not necessarily Stoic, their skeptical views do not depend on an anti-Stoic critique.
However, there are strong reasons not to read Sextus and Cicero as confirming that Arcesilaus’ commitment to a descriptive version of universal suspension is independent of his anti-Stoic arguments. Even if Arcesilaus developed a notion of suspension (‘epochê’) before his criticisms of the Stoa, premise  above conceptualizes it in Stoic terms. It is true that Arcesilaus in Sextus M. 7.156–7 goes beyond the point sufficient to oppose the Stoic—viz., that the wise person does not assent to anything (see  above). But he continued the argument because there is a conceptual difference between not assenting and withholding assent (see e.g., Friedman 2013), and because epochê refers to the latter. Withholding assent presupposes a prior examination of evidence and the recognition of an equipollence among the reasons for competing beliefs. (See also Maconi 1988 and Bénatouïl 2011.) As for the evidence of Cicero, even if Lucullus thinks Arcesilaus himself belongs to the group of Academics who say that everything is non-evident, he also accuses Arcesilaus of appealing to the authority of Presocratics to promote his view of inapprehensibility, which crucially presupposes Stoic conditions on knowledge (Academica 2.15). So even Lucullus thinks Arcesilaus’ skepticism is related to his anti-Stoic arguments.
There are further problems with the NRNB view, separate from the issues of interpretation mentioned above. For one, it narrowly restricts the skeptic to a life of unreflective reaction (see sect. 5.1), and therefore does not seem compatible with the patterns of rationality and inquiry that Arcesilaus engaged with. Its narrow restriction on the scope of skeptical action is also overly dogmatic: were the NRNB view true, it seems implausible Arcesilaus would see the need for a theory of skeptical action, let alone use the Stoic model of non-rational animals.
4.2 The Rational Non-Belief interpretation
The RNB view of Arcesilaus denies that his acceptance of inapprehensibility and universal suspension is explained in terms of belief in the premises and hence in the conclusions of his arguments. Rather, on this account Arcesilaus guides his rational activity by something like a supposition or hypothesis—a set of notions deployed variously in Plato’s dialogues, Theophrastus’ dialectic, and geometrical theory (see Schofield 1999 and Thorsrud 2018; cf. Bénatouïl & El Murr 2010). Even the Stoics distinguished hypotheticals from assertions and arguments, such that one can accept hypotheses and what follows from them without asserting them (see Barnes 1997). Arcesilaus could have adapted this kind of theory to account for the rational activities of the skeptic. Accounts of impression and assent also afford a distinction between beliefs and belief-like imaginings such as suppositions, which may then take the place of beliefs in chains of inference. This distinction allows for a reasoned commitment that falls short of assent (see Striker 1980, Bett 1990, and Reinhardt 2018). Arcesilaus, on this view, supposes that we ought to live without realist commitments that fix our view of the world. His supposition may have been based on premises—some of which he shared with Zeno—as well as on a generalization from his philosophical experience, after repeatedly finding that rational inquiry does not justify assent.
However, this proposal must address several problems. For instance, it seems doubtful that a rational life can be based on hypotheticals without a large web of background beliefs (see Frede 1979 and Bett 1989). Without them, the skeptic seems unable to decide which hypotheses to suppose and when to suppose them. And even if such a life is possible, it is not clear how it would be practically distinguishable from, and so preferable to, a life based wholly on belief. If the skeptic regards as hypothetical the very same things we ordinarily believe, then skepticism seems unmotivated. (See Thorsrud 2010 and Perin 2013 for other objections.) Perhaps one could defend the possibility of a radically skeptical life of this kind by saying that, while its development requires starting with beliefs, over time an increasing number of background beliefs may be substituted with hypotheses, and that the benefits of the skeptical life are of a second-order, affecting the ease with which the skeptic can change the guiding assumptions of her life.
4.3 The Non-Rational Belief interpretation
The NRB view instead argues that universal suspension isn’t opposed to beliefs per se, but only to beliefs justified through philosophical theory or reasons generally. The Stoics maintain that the mind is essentially rational, so that its assent is necessarily reason-responsive (see Coope 2016). Arcesilaus’ skepticism, on this view, challenges the rationalist presupposition that belief is necessarily and explicitly grounded in reason. This doesn’t preclude that Arcesilaus found himself—as a result of the inadequacy of the arguments for any position, and of the equally convincing arguments against it—with the belief that nothing can be known. Thus, inapprehensibility is neither the conclusion of a deductive argument relying on a theory of knowledge or of our cognitive faculties, nor an inductive inference from prior investigations; it is not a theoretical or even rationally warranted belief, but just the way things strike him (see Cooper 2004 and Thorsrud 2009).
But in the case of universal suspension, it seems that the view that it is irrational to hold unwarranted beliefs is held—at least in part—on the basis of a theoretical belief that knowledge is very important to acquire and that mere belief is to be avoided. Cicero, for instance, stresses that Arcesilaus agreed with Zeno that it is irrational to hold opinions, i.e., inadequately warranted assents (premise  in sect. 3, above); and Sextus suggests that he thought that individual cases of suspended belief—presumably in the light of inconclusive arguments—were good (Outlines of Pyrrhonism 1.233). And the view that it is irrational to hold mere beliefs (that is, opinions) depends on a further set of epistemological beliefs about the nature of belief and knowledge. If Arcesilaus was not rationally committed to any set of assumptions about the nature and requirements of rationality or about belief and knowledge—which he ought not to be, given that he had argued against the various views on offer, and hence, ex hypothesi, suspended belief about them—it doesn’t look like he can believe that one ought not to take beliefs to be justified.
The NRB view thus takes universal suspension to be a belief that is not rationally warranted, as well as the views on which it causally depends. That is, Arcesilaus began inquiry motivated by a pre-theoretical belief, that philosophical knowledge is important and mere belief inadequate. And his repeated and extensive investigations left him with the realization that even these regulating assumptions of his philosophical practice have failed to be warranted and that no beliefs are justified.
On this view, the radical skeptic has beliefs but doesn’t take them to be justified. This proposal raises problems, too (see Burnyeat 1983). It seems that a large part of being a rational agent is to exercise some control over one’s beliefs. Since this control takes the form of a responsiveness to reasons, it does not seem possible for rational agents to give up practices of justification. A related objection is to maintain that even having beliefs, which involves the use of concepts, is necessarily responsive to reasons (see Williams 2004). To have a belief, according to this view, requires making a conscious inference about the proper use of concepts, and conscious inferences are made in virtue of reasons. One may respond that the skeptic isn’t precluding herself from a responsiveness to reasons but rather lacks confidence in them, and that such rationalist theories of agency and belief are stricter even than the Stoics’, against which Arcesilaus argued (see sect. 5 below).
5. The practical criterion
The third doctrine we might ascribe to Arcesilaus on the basis of his sources is a so-called practical criterion, i.e., a theory that makes action without assent possible (see [iii] in sect. 2). Arcesilaus’ argument for a ‘practical criterion’ responds to two Stoic objections of ‘inaction’ (apraxia). The first, found in Plutarch, is that action is impossible without assent, since action is caused by assent to an impression of something suited to the agent’s nature, i.e., ‘oikeion’ (Against Colotes 1122a–d; cf. Cicero Academica 2.37–8). The second objection, reported by Sextus, is that a good or successful life is impossible without assent, since a good life requires action based on knowledge of what is good and bad, and hence assent (M. 7.158; cf. Cicero Academica 2.39). Arcesilaus’ reported replies to these objections are brief, and accordingly difficult to interpret (see Bett 1989). His counter to the first objection is the suggestion that action is possible without assent, since even on the Stoic account animal action is triggered directly by their impressions of something oikeion: the addition of assent, and so a belief that the object is in fact naturally suited to the agent, is redundant and liable to be a cause of error. In response to the second objection, Arcesilaus argued that the person who suspends assent universally will successfully guide their actions in light of their sense of what is ‘reasonable’ (‘eulogon’).
The three doctrinal interpretations of Arcesilaus’ skepticism under consideration take these arguments in Plutarch and Sextus to support, in different ways, their distinct views of his commitment to inapprehensibility and/or universal suspension.
5.1 The Non-Rational Non-Belief interpretation
Proponents of the NRNB view take the argument of Plutarch to give a general theory of action that supports universal suspension of judgment as a natural reaction to equally balanced arguments. On this theory all actions are merely impulsive, i.e., caused just by impressions of what appears suitable (‘oikeion’). Since the skeptic doesn’t make judgments, the only sense in which she is committed to her impressions is that she acts on them. It is unclear how this is compatible with the evidence of Sextus on ‘the reasonable’, where the skeptic considers reasonable justifications in deciding what to do. But some advocates of NRNB combine the two so that a class of impulsive actions count as voluntary if, after their performance, one can reasonably justify them as successful (e.g., Ioppolo 1981; 1986; 2000).
Even allowing for this attenuated sense of the voluntary, it is unclear why Arcesilaus would come to accept this impulsivist theory of action, if it were true: since—as the theory maintains—theory doesn’t inform action, it is difficult to explain theoretical commitments solely in terms of what appears suited to an agent (see Maconi 1988, Trabattoni 2005, and Vezzoli 2016). An NRNB reading of ‘the reasonable’ therefore concedes that Sextus may have elided important details (see Ioppolo 2018).
5.2 The Rational Non-Belief interpretation
The RNB view opens up a more promising way to read the brief counter-arguments in Plutarch and Sextus as a positive theory of Arcesilaus. His counter in Plutarch is that action isn’t always caused by occurrent beliefs—we sometimes act through habit, or by instinct. By itself, this doesn’t go very far, however, since the Stoics will have objected that, even if this were possible, this account couldn’t describe the voluntary and responsible actions of a rational agent. (The Stoics defined responsible or voluntary action in terms of assent, since this was the mechanism through which our rationality acts on the world.) But one can read the counter-argument in Sextus as supplementing that response: there is space for rationality and responsibility, on this view, in the production of the impressions or thoughts motivating us when we act. We can act in accordance with what strikes us as the reasonable thing to do upon reflection, but still refrain from assent, i.e., refrain from forming the belief that this is the right thing to do.
There are two problems facing this interpretation of ‘the reasonable’. The first is that it does not look to be supported by the evidence to which it appeals. Sextus, the source for the notion of ‘the reasonable’ as the criterion, says that Arcesilaus and his followers did not define a criterion and that, when they seemed to, they did so “a counterblast to that of the Stoics” (M. 7.150, Bury trans.). (Sextus’ later account of Arcesilaus in another work is also incompatible with his hypothesizing such a theory; see Outlines of Pyrrhonism 1.232–3.) And Cicero and Numenius, our other sources for the view that Arcesilas was committed to inapprehensibility and universal suspension, do not mention his adoption of a practical criterion—in fact, in both authors it is suggested that Arcesilaus did not offer a position on how one might live without assent, and that Carneades significantly revised the Academic position in this respect (Academica 2.32; Numenius fr. 27.14–32, cf. Numenius fr. 26.107–11).
The second problem is that even if the context does not explicitly demand that Arcesilaus’ practical criterion was a dialectical ploy, the argument Arcesilaus used to support it makes the most sense if it is construed dialectically. The argument he gives is something like this (Sextus M. 7.158):
- a good life depends on practical wisdom;
- practical wisdom consists in a disposition causing right or successful actions;
- right or successful actions are those that have a reasonable defense (or justification);
- the wise person will be guided by what is reasonable;
- hence, the wise person will go right or be successful.
Two difficulties face this non-dialectical reading. One is that there is no other evidence that Arcesilaus was committed to premises  through , and they are also ones that Arcesilaus may have argued against, since it is reported that he argued not just against the Stoic theory but against all ethical views (Philodemus Index Academicorum 18.40–19.9, Diogenes Laertius 7.171, Numenius fr. 25.154–61, cf. fr. 25.41–5).
The second, more pressing difficulty is that, although these premises are adapted to the Arcesilean context in which nothing can be known and the wise person does not assent to anything, they are manifestly variants of the Stoic theory. The Stoics claimed that a good life is the result of performing ‘appropriate actions’—defined as “those that, once done, have a reasonable defense”—from a disposition of wisdom, i.e., knowledge of what is good, bad and neither. But if nothing can be known, as Arcesilaus has already argued (– in sect. 3, above), the wisdom of the sage consists in not having any beliefs. This disposition will still allow the sage to perform appropriate actions, however, if, as the Stoics claim, they are defined by reasonable defenses or justifications. The connection between performing such actions through a wise disposition and success is, Arcesilaus suggests, something that the Stoics can’t deny, because they agree that opinion is the cause of error (this is the justification for premise  in sect. 3, above). Hence, the perfect exercise of our rationality—reflection without assent, as Arcesilaus has argued—will lead us to find the action that is appropriate to us as rational animals, i.e., the reasonable thing to do, and this guarantees success. Arcesilaus therefore employs the Stoic definition of appropriate action to defend acting on views that are reasonably justified. But, for the Stoics, what is reasonably justified is what conforms with the sage’s knowledge of what is good, bad, and neither. Arcesilaus, it seems, cannot borrow his opponents’ theory without also accepting the possibility of knowledge.
5.3 The Non-Rational Belief interpretation
The NRB view can instead deny that Arcesilaus was personally committed to defending the life of universal suspension against Stoic counterattack. The Stoics pointed out that Arcesilaus’ subversive argument for the rationality of universally suspending assent cannot be true, because it makes action, or at least rational and virtuous action, impossible—but these are plainly possible (cf. Cicero Academica 2.37–39). But even if this objection did not target his own skeptical view, Arcesilaus was bound by his method to counter it. Hence it is unreasonable to think that he was invested in rationalizing the life of the skeptic with a theory of action (see Stopper 1983; for a different view of the polemic, see, e.g., Ioppolo 1986, Maconi 1988, and Thorsrud 2009).
6. Priority of Method
Section 2 noted that the central question for the interpretation of Arcesilaus’ skepticism is how to reconcile his method with his skeptical commitments, and sections 4–5 set out three accounts of how his commitments are compatible with his method. A further question relates to the purpose of Arcesilaus’ philosophical activity. Competing histories of Arcesilaus’ intentions in Cicero’s Academica offer different answers (see Allen 2018): at one point Cicero suggests that Arcesilaus adopted a Socratic method after he accepted inapprehensibility and universal suspension, in order to facilitate suspension of assent (Academica 1.44–45; cf. Sextus Outlines of Pyrrhonism 1.232); but elsewhere he says that Arcesilaus’ aim in questioning Zeno was to discover the truth (Academica 2.76; cf. Cicero On the Nature of the Gods 1.11). So in question is whether Arcesilaus’ method was in the service of inquiry—independently of his commitments to inapprehensibility or universal suspension—or a revival of a Socratic methodology that only reflected skeptical conclusions he already reached.
An argument in favor of the latter is as follows (see Görler 1994): if Arcesilaus indeed shared the views that knowledge is impossible and that holding opinions is irrational—as both the RNB and NRB interpretations say—then he could not have genuinely been in the business of inquiry, which aims at knowledge of the truth; hence the only motivation for dialectical argument Arcesilaus might be left with is the promotion of universal suspension. But this argument ignores the context from which Arcesilaus’ skeptical views emerged and the effects they could reasonably be expected to have had on his philosophical practice.
On the RNB view, the Academic skeptic, at the start of her philosophical career, inherits a rational method of inquiry, as well as guiding views about belief and knowledge. But her inheritance is so far untested (at least by her). As she goes about putting it to work, she might at first believe that her method and its norms help her to get at the truth. But she then finds that by arguing in accordance with those norms she is wildly successful at combatting any and all positions. She therefore comes to suppose on rational grounds—which may include particular arguments against Stoic cognition, the inadequacy of all non-skeptical theories of knowledge, and her experiences in argument generally—that the norms cannot successfully guide her to truths. But she doesn’t quit her life of inquiry because her skeptical view of the inadequacy of her method depends on that very method; it makes little sense for her to act on a view that rejects its own grounds. Instead she continues to inquire, now treating her inherited norms and guiding views about belief and knowledge only as hypotheses rather than as given. On the RNB view, therefore, Arcesilaus’ skepticism was self-defeating only insofar as it could not justify abandoning reason.
A similar story can be told with the NRB view. The skeptic looks for the truth, on the assumption that obtaining it is of crucial importance for her life. But since she consistently fails to find it, it begins to strike her that perhaps she never will. Perhaps, it was not, after all, so important for her life to have it: maybe mere belief is all we need. But it doesn’t follow that she should give up (as false) her belief that it is irrational to hold opinions, since it would only be correct to give it up if it actually is true that mere belief is all she needs—but this is something that her arguments don’t warrant, any more than they warrant the opposite conclusion. An NRB view, then, suggests that Arcesilaus’ beliefs in the importance of knowledge and the inadequacy of opinion were explicitly non-rational, in the sense that he was not persuaded that they were warranted by a rational argument or theory, or even by the extensive arguments he devoted his life to. He believed that he hadn’t found knowledge and that it is irrational to assent to anything without knowledge, but realized, as a result of the unrestricted application of his Socratic method, that there were strong reasons against these beliefs. He was thus not in a position to give his rational assent to the belief that it is irrational to hold opinions—he just found that that was how things striked him, i.e., that’s what he believed. The Academic skeptic, on this view, is someone whose sustained but pre-theoretical commitment to rational investigation undermines her confidence in rationality. The result is not a negative theory—e.g., the theory that we can’t acquire knowledge owing to the limitations of our cognitive or rational capacities—but a pervasive lack of theory sustained by a dialectical method.
If either of these stories is correct, we don’t need to deny Arcesilaus seached for the truth, and the basic philosophical puzzle about his radical skepticism is not whether it is possible to live without rational beliefs, but whether it is possible to be committed to rationality and yet sufficiently detached from it to recognise that, whatever it is, it may not work.
It is clear that any interpretation of Arcesilaus must take into account both his reputation as a master dialectician who deployed Socrates’ method ruthlessly against his philosophical contemporaries, and his notorious advocacy of inapprehensibility and universal suspension. Given the contradictory nature and scarcity of the evidence, it is perhaps not surprising that modern critics do not agree about the success of the ‘dialectical’ or various ‘doctrinal’ interpretations of Arcesilaus or about the consistency of the very different kinds of skepticism the latter propose. But further progress is not ruled out, since it is open to us to offer more sophisticated philosophical elaborations of those forms of skepticism and to test their historical plausibility by appealing to the diverse, but better attested traditions in the later Academy.
Collections of Arcesilaus’ sources
- Inwood, Brad and Lloyd Gerson (eds.), 1997, Hellenistic
Philosophy: Introductory Readings, second edition, Indianapolis,
[English translation of several of the sources for Arcesilaus.]
- Mette, Hans Joachim, 1984, “Zwei Akademiker heute: Krantor
von Soloi und Arkesilaos von Pitane,” Lustrum 26:
[The evidence on Arcesilaus in Greek and Latin, with German translations.]
- Long, A. A. and D. N. Sedley (eds.), 1987, The Hellenistic
Philosophers, vol. 1, Cambridge: Cambridge University
[English translation of several of the sources for Arcesilaus.]
- Vezzoli, Simone, 2016, Arcesilao di Pitane: l’origine
del Platonismo neoaccademico, Turnhout: Brepols, pp.
[The evidence on Arcesilaus in Greek and Latin, with Italian translations.]
- Cicero, On Academic Scepticism, Charles Brittain
(trans.), Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 2006.
[English translation of Academica.]
- –––, On the Ideal Orator, James May and
Jakob Wisse (trans.), Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press,
[English translation of De oratore.]
- –––, On the Nature of the Gods,
Academica (Loeb Classical Library 268/Cicero XIX), H. Rackham
(trans.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1933.
[Loeb edition with English translation.]
- –––, De finibus bonorum et malorum (Loeb
Classical Library 40/Cicero XVII), H. Rackham (trans.), Cambridge, MA:
Harvard University Press, 1914.
[Loeb edition with English translation.]
- –––, De Oratore Book III, in On the
Orator: Book 3. On Fate. Stoic Paradoxes.
Divisions of Oratory (Loeb Classical Library 349/Cicero IV),
H. Rackham (trans.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press,
[Loeb edition with English translation.]
- –––, On Moral Ends, Raphael Woolf
(trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002.
[English translation of De finibus.]
- Diogenes Laertius, Lives of the Eminent Philosophers,
Tiziano Dorandi (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2013.
[Greek text of Diogenes Laertius.]
- –––, Lives of Eminent Philosophers I
& II (Loeb Classical Library 184/5), R. Hicks (trans.), Cambridge,
MA: Harvard University Press, 1925.
[Loeb edition with English translation.]
- –––, Lives of the Eminent Philosophers,
Pamela Mensch (trans.), Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press,
[English translation of Dorandi’s edition.]
- Numenius, Platonist Philosophy 80 BC to AD 250: An Introduction
and Collection of Sources in Translation, George Boys-Stones (ed.),
Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2018, pp. 40–45.
[1F = English translation of Numenius frs. 24–25 Des Places.]
- –––, Fragments, E. Des Places (ed.),
Paris: Belles Lettres, 1973.
[Greek text with French translation.]
- –––, 1903, Eusebii Pamphili
Evangelicae Praeparationis Libri XV, 4 vols., E. H.
Gifford (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1903.
[Greek text with English translation of Eusebius; book 14.4–9 contains Numenius’ fragments.]
- Philodemus, Storia dei filosofi [.] Platone e
l’Academia, Tiziano Dorandi (ed.), Naples: Bibliopolis, 1991.
[Greek text with Italian translation of Philodemus’ Index Academicorum.]
- –––, “Philodemus’ History of the
Philosophers: Plato and the Academy (PHerc. 1021 and 164),”
Paul Kalligas and Voula Tsouna (trans.), in Paul Kalligas, Chloe Balla, Effie
Baziotopoulou-Valavani, and Vassilis Karasmanis (eds.),
Plato’s Academy: Its Workings and Its History,
Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2020, pp. 276–383.
[Greek text, adapted from Dorandi’s edition, with English translation of Philodemus’ Index Academicorum.]
- Plutarch, Moralia XIII Part 2: Stoic
Essays (Loeb Classical Library 470), Harold
Cherniss (trans.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press,
[Loeb edition with English translation of Plutarch’s On Stoic Self-Contraditions and Common Conceptions.]
- –––, Moralia XIV (Loeb Classical Library
428), Benedict Einarson and Phillip De Lacy (eds.), Cambridge, MA:
Harvard University Press, 1967.
[Loeb edition with English translation of Plutarch’s Against Colotes.]
- –––, Moralia XV: Fragments (Loeb
Classical Library 429), F. H. Sandbach (trans.), Cambridge,
MA: Harvard University Press, 1969.
[Loeb edition with English translation of some of the testimonia for Arcesilaus.]
- Sextus Empiricus, Outlines of Scepticism, Julia Annas and
Jonathan Barnes (trans.), New York: Cambridge University Press, 1994,
second edition 2000.
[English translation of Outlines of Pyrrhonism.]
- –––, [M] Against the Logicians [Adversus Mathematicos 7–8], Richard Bett (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
- –––, Outlines of Pyrrhonism (Loeb
Classical Library 273/Sextus Empiricus I), R. G. Bury (trans.),
Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1933.
[Loeb edition with English translation.]
- –––, Against Logicians (Loeb Classical
Library 291/Sextus Empiricus II), R. G. Bury (trans.), Cambridge, MA:
Harvard University Press, 1935.
[Loeb edition with English translation.]
Arcesilaus’ life and philosophical activity
- Beghini, Andrea, 2016, “Arcesilao e Numenio: Note a Fr. 25 Des Places (= Eus. Praep. Ev. XIV, 5, 12–13 Des Places),” Studi Classici e Orientali 62: 297–314.
- Dorandi, Tiziano, 1989, “Arcesilas de Pitane,” in Dictionnaire des philosophes antiques, vol. 1, Richard Goulet (ed.), Paris: Centre National de la Recherche Scientifique, pp. 326–30 (no. 302).
- Görler, Woldemar, 1994, “Älterer Pyrrhonismus – Jüngere Akademie, Antiochos aus Askalon, § 47 Arkesilaos,” in Die Philosophie der Antike 4: Die Hellenistische Philosophie, Helmut Flashar (ed.), Basel: Schwabe & Co., pp. 786–96.
- Habicht, Christian, 1994, “Hellenistic Athens and her philosophers,” in Athen in Hellenistischer Zeit, Christian Habicht, Munich: C.H. Beck, pp. 231–47.
- Long, A. A., 1986, “Diogenes Laertius, the Life of Arcesilaus,” Elenchos 7: 429–49.
- Lurie, Michael, 2014, “Der schiffbrüchige Odysseus oder: Wie Arkesilaos zum Skeptiker wurde,” Philologus 58: 183–6.
- Savalli-Lestrade, Ivana, 2017, “Le monde d’Arcésilas de Pitanè,” Revue des études anciennes 119: 521–50.
- von Arnim, Hans, 1895, “Arkesilaos von Pitane,” RE 2: 1164–68.
Arcesilaus’ skeptical position
- Allen, James, 2018, “Aporia and the New Academy,” in The Aporetic Tradition in Ancient Philosophy, George Karamanolis and Vasilis Politis (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 172–91.
- Annas, Julia, 1988, “The Heirs of Socrates,” Phronesis 33: 100–112.
- Bénatouïl, Thomas, 2011, “Anna Maria Ioppolo, La testimonianza di Sesto Empirico sull’ Accademia scettica,” Philosophie antique 11: 229–36.
- Bett, Richard, 1989, “Carneades’ Pithanon: A Reappraisal of its Role and Status,” Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 7: 59–94.
- Brittain, Charles, 2005 , “Arcesilaus,” The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2008 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/fall2008/entries/arcesilaus/>.
- Cooper, John, 2004, “Arcesilaus: Socratic and Sceptic,” in Knowledge, Nature, and the Good, John Cooper, Princeton: Princeton University Press, pp. 81–103.
- Couissin, Pierre, 1929, “Le Stoicisme de la Nouvelle Adadémie,” Revue d’histoire de la philosophie 3: 241–76 [= “The Stoicism of the New Academy,” trans. Jonathan Barnes and Myles Burnyeat, in Myles Burnyeat (ed.), 1983, The Skeptical Tradition, London: University of California Press, pp. 31–63].
- Frede, Michael, 1979, “Des Skeptikers Meinungen,” Neue Hefte für Philosophie, Aktualität der Antike 15/16: 102–29. Translated as “The Skeptic’s Beliefs,” in his, 1987, Essays in Ancient Philosophy, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, pp. 179–200; reprinted as “The Sceptic’s Beliefs” in Myles Burnyeat and Michael Frede (eds.), 1997, The Original Sceptics, Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, pp. 1–24.]
- –––, 1984, “The Sceptic’s Two Kinds of Assent and the Question of the Possibility of Knowledge,” in Philosophy in History, Richard Rorty, Jerome Schneewind and Quentin Skinner (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 255–278; reprinted as “The Skeptic’s Two Kinds of Assent and the Question of the Possibility of Knowledge,” in his, 1987, Essays in Ancient Philosophy, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, pp. 201–22; reprinted in Myles Burnyeat and Michael Frede (eds.), 1997, The Original Sceptics, Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, pp. 127–51.
- Friedman, Jane, 2013, “Suspended Judgment,” Philosophical Studies 162: 165–81.
- Görler, Woldemar, 1994, “Älterer Pyrrhonismus – Jüngere Akademie, Antiochos aus Askalon, § 47 Arkesilaos,” in Die Philosophie der Antike 4: Die Hellenistische Philosophie, Helmut Flashar (ed.), Basel: Schwabe & Co., pp. 796–824.
- Gourinat, Jean-Baptiste, 2014, “Comment se détermine le kathekon? Remarques sur la conformité à la nature et le raisonnable,” Philosophie antique 14: 13–39.
- Ioppolo, Anna-Maria, 1981, “Il concetto di ‘eulogon’ nella filosofia di Arcesilao,” in Lo scetticismo antico, Gabriele Giannantoni (ed.), vol. 1, Naples: Bibliopolis, pp. 143–61.
- –––, 1986, Opinione e scienza, Naples: Bibliopolis.
- –––, 2000, “Su alcune recenti interpretazioni dello scetticismo dell’Accademia,” Elenchos 21: 334–60.
- –––, 2008, “Arcésilas dans le Lucullus de Cicéron,” Revue de métaphysique et de morale 57: 21–44.
- –––, 2009, La testimonianza di Sesto Empirico sull’Accademia scettica, Naples: Bibliopolis.
- –––, 2011, “L’epochê chez Arcésilas: réponse à Thomas Bénatouïl,” Philosophie antique 11: 237–45.
- –––, 2018, “Arcesilaus,” in Skepticism: From Antiquity to the Present, Diego Machuca and Baron Reed (eds.), London: Bloomsbury, pp. 36–50.
- Lévy, Carlos, 1978, “Scepticisme et dogmatisme dans l’Académie: l’ésotérisme d’Arcésilas,” Revue des études latines 56: 335–348.
- Maconi, Henry, 1988, “Nova non philosophandi philosophia,” Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 6: 231–53.
- Perin, Casey, 2010, “Scepticism and belief,” in The Cambridge Companion to Ancient Scepticism, Richard Bett (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 145–64.
- –––, 2013, “Making Sense of Arcesilaus,” Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 45: 313–40.
- Schofield, Malcolm, 1999, “Academic epistemology,” in The Cambridge History of Hellenistic Philosophy, Keimpe Algra, Jonathan Barnes, Jaap Mansfeld and Malcolm Schofield (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 323–51.
- Sedley, David, 1983, “The Motivation of Greek Skepticism,” in The Skeptical Tradition, Myles Burnyeat (ed.), London: University of California Press, pp. 9–29.
- Snyder, Charles, 2014, “The Socratic Benevolence of Arcesilaus’ Dialectic,” Ancient Philosophy 34: 341–63.
- Striker, Gisela, 1980, “Skeptical Strategies,” in Doubt and Dogmatism, Malcolm Schofield, Myles Burnyeat and Jonathan Barnes (eds.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 54–83; reprinted in Striker, Gisela, 1996, Essays on Hellenistic Epistemology and Ethics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 92–115.
- Stopper, M. R., 1983, “Schizzi Pirroniani,” Phronesis 28: 265–97, pp. 275–78.
- Thorsrud, Harold, 2009, Ancient Scepticism, Stocksfield: Acumen, pp. 36–58.
- –––, 2010, “Arcesilaus and Carneades,” in The Cambridge Companion to Ancient Scepticism, Richard Bett (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 58–70.
- –––, 2018, “Arcesilaus: Socratic Skepticism in Plato’s Academy,” Lexicon Philosophicum 6: 195–220.
- Vezzoli, Simone, 2016, Arcesilao di Pitane: l’origine del Platonismo neoaccademico, Turnhout: Brepols, pp. 17–78.
Arcesilaus’ relation to other philosophers
- Annas, Julia, 1992, “Plato the Sceptic,” Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, suppl. vol.: 43–72.
- Barnes, Jonathan, 1997, Logic and the Imperial Stoa, Leiden: Brill.
- Beghini, Andrea, 2019, “Il caso ‘Crantore’: Contributo alla storia dell’Academia ellenistica,” Antiquorum Philosophia 13: 101–25.
- Bénatouïl, Thomas and Dimitri El Murr, 2010, “L’Académie et les géomètres: usages et limites de la géométrie de Platon à Carnéade,” Philosophie antique 10: 151–62.
- Bett, Richard, 1990, “Carneades’ Distinction between Assent and Approval,” The Monist 73.1: 3–20.
- Brennan, Tad, 1996, “Reasonable Impressions in Stoicism,” Phronesis 41: 318–34.
- Brittain, Charles, 2001, Philo of Larissa, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- –––, and John Palmer, 2001, “The New Academy’s Appeals to the Presocratics,” Phronesis 46: 38–72.
- Burnyeat, Myles, 1980, “Can the Sceptic Live His Scepticism?”, in Doubt and Dogmatism, Malcolm Schofield, Myles Burnyeat and Jonathan Barnes (eds.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 20–53; reprinted in Myles Burnyeat (ed.), 1983, The Skeptical Tradition, Berkeley, CA: University of California Press, pp. 117–48; reprinted in Myles Burnyeat and Michael Frede (eds.), 1997, The Original Sceptics, Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, pp. 25–57.
- Castagnoli, Luca, 2018, “Dialectic in the Hellenistic Academy,” in Dialectic after Plato and Aristotle, Thomas Bénatouïl and Katerina Ierodiakonou (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 168–217.
- Coope, Ursula, 2016, “Rational Assent and Self-Reversion: A Neoplatonist Response to the Stoics,” Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 50: 237–88.
- Couissin, Pierre, 1929, “L’origine et l’évolution de l’epoche,” Revue des études grecs 42: 373–97.
- Decleva Caizzi, Fernanda, 1986, “Pirroniani ed Accademici nel III secolo a.c.,” in Aspects de la philosophie Hellénistique, Helmut Flashar and Olof Gigon (eds.), Entretiens sur l’antiquité classique 32, Geneva: Fondation Hardt, pp. 147–83.
- Frede, Michael, 1983, “Stoics and Skeptics on Clear and Distinct Impressions,” in The Skeptical Tradition, Myles Burnyeat (ed.), London: University of California Press, pp. 65–93; reprinted in his, 1987, Essays in Ancient Philosophy, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, pp. 151–76.
- –––, 1999, “Stoic Epistemology,” in The Cambridge History of Hellenistic Philosophy, Keimpe Algra, Jonathan Barnes, Jaap Mansfeld and Malcolm Schofield (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 295–322.
- Ioppolo, Anna-Maria, 1990, “Presentation and Assent: A Physical and Cognitive Problem in Early Stoicism,” Classical Quarterly 40: 433–49.
- –––, 2002, “Gli Accademici “neôteroi” nel secondo secolo d.C.,” Méthexis 15: 45–70.
- –––, 2013, “Elenchos socratico e genesi della strategia argomentativa dell’Accademia scettica”, in Argument und literarische Form in antiker Philosophie, Michael Erler and Jan Hessler (eds.), Berlin: De Gruyter, pp. 355–69.
- Lévy, Carlos, 2007, “The New Academy and its Rivals,” in A Companion to Ancient Philosophy, Mary Louise Gill and Pierre Pellegrin (eds.), Oxford: Blackwell, pp. 448–64.
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