Aristotle’s Biology

First published Wed Feb 15, 2006; substantive revision Fri Jul 16, 2021

Aristotle is properly recognized as the originator of the scientific study of life. This is true despite the fact that many earlier Greek natural philosophers occasionally speculated on the origins of living things and much of the Hippocratic medical corpus, which was written before or during Aristotle’s lifetime, displays a serious interest in human anatomy, physiology and pathology. And Plato has Timaeus, in the eponymous dialogue, devote a considerable part of his speech to the human body and its functions (and malfunctions). Nevertheless, before Aristotle, only a few of the Hippocratic treatises are both systematic and empirical, and their focus is almost exclusively on human health and disease.

By contrast, Aristotle considered the investigation of living things, and especially animals, central to the theoretical study of nature. Constituting roughly 25% of the extant corpus, his zoological writings provide a theoretical defense of the proper method for biological investigation; and they provide a record of the first systematic and comprehensive study of animals. There was nothing of similar scope and sophistication again until the 16th century. In the nineteenth century the great anatomist Richard Owen introduced a two lecture survey of Aristotle’s zoological studies by declaring that “Zoological Science sprang from his [Aristotle’s] labours, we may almost say, like Minerva from the Head of Jove, in a state of noble and splendid maturity” (Owen 1992, 91). Before examining this remarkable achievement, a few words about its creator are in order.[1].

1. Life and Work

Aristotle was born in Stagira on the northern Aegean coast in 384BCE. His father Nicomachus was physician to King Amyntas III of Macedon, and his mother was of a wealthy family from the island of Euboea. He was sent at the age of 17 to Athens, where he studied in Plato’s Academy for 20 years, until Plato’s death in 347. By then he had developed his own distinctive philosophical ideas, including his passion for the study of nature. He joined a philosophical circle in Assos on the coast of Asia Minor, but soon moved to the nearby island of Lesbos where he met Theophrastus, a young man with similar interests in natural science. Between the two of them they originated the science of biology, Aristotle carrying out a systematic investigation of animals, Theophrastus doing the same for plants.

In 343 Aristotle was asked by Philip II of Macedon to tutor his son Alexander. By 335 he had returned to Athens, now under the control of his former student Alexander. With Theophrastus he founded a ‘school’ in a public sanctuary known as the Lyceum. He headed the Lyceum until the death of Alexander the Great in 323. With anti-Macedonian feelings running high in Athens, Aristotle retired to his mother’s birthplace. He died there in 322BCE.

The surviving corpus of Aristotle derives from medieval manuscripts based on a 1st century BCE edition. There were no commentaries on the biological works written until they were collectively translated into Arabic. The first appearance of Aristotle’s biological writings in the West are Latin translations, by Michael Scot, of an Arabic edition, which forms the basis of Albertus Magnus’ De animalibus. In the 13th century, William of Moerbeke produced a Latin translation directly from the Greek. The first printed editions and translations date to the late 15th century, the most widely circulated being that of Theodorus Gaza. In addition to the three works traditionally referred to as History of Animals (HA), Parts of Animals (PA) and Generation of Animals (GA), there are a number of briefer ‘essays’ on more specialized topics: On animal motion, On animal locomotion, On respiration, On life and death, On youth and old age, On length and shortness of life, On sleeping and waking, On the senses and their objects (the last six being included in the so-called Parva naturalia). Whether one should consider De Anima (On the soul) part of this project or not is a difficult question. What is certainly clear, however, is that there are important connections between the theoretical approach to the relationship between body and soul defended in that work and the distinctive way that Aristotle approaches the investigation of animals.

In order to understand Aristotle’s distinctive approach to the study of living things, it is imperative to situate it within his natural philosophy and his philosophy of science. The first book of Aristotle’s Parts of Animals is, in fact, largely devoted to doing just that, and after a brief discussion of Aristotle’s general views about scientific inquiry and explanation, we will turn to it.

2. Aristotle’s Philosophy of Science

In sections 4, 5 and 6, we will explore the ways in which Aristotle systematically organizes and explains an extraordinary body of information about animal anatomy, physiology and development. But Aristotle was able to accomplish what he did in zoology because he had given a great deal of thought to the nature of scientific inquiry. How does one progress from the superficial and unorganized state of everyday experience toward organized scientific knowledge? To answer this question, you need a concept of the goal to be achieved, and Aristotle developed such a concept in his Prior and Posterior Analytics (henceforth abbreviated as APr. and APo., respectively). The goal of scientific inquiry, he argued, was a system of concepts and propositions organized hierarchically, ultimately resting on knowledge of the essential natures of the objects of study and certain other necessary first principles. These definitions and principles form the basis of causal explanations of all the other universal truths within the domain of study. Those other universal truths should identify attributes belonging to a subject per se, in virtue of that subject’s nature. The example he uses when he introduces his account of scientific demonstration to illustrate such propositions is from geometry: having interior angles equal to two right angles belongs to all and only triangles in virtue of their being triangles (APo. I 4, 5). This attribute belongs to all equilateral triangles as well—not, however, because they are equilateral, but because they are triangles. Thus scientific knowledge of such a proposition, knowledge that displays the reason why any triangle has this property, must explain why this property belongs to triangles as such. The explanation, of course, will appeal to the essential character of three-sided rectilinear plane figures, i.e. to what it is to be a triangle.

The second book of the Posterior Analytics discusses how to achieve this goal of scientific knowledge, one central concern being how knowledge of essences, expressed in definitions, is related to explanations expressed in the form of causal demonstrations. Plato had formulated a famous paradox of inquiry in his dialogue Meno: either you know the object of your inquiry, in which case inquiry is unnecessary; or you don’t know the object of your inquiry, in which case inquiry is impossible (Meno 80d5-e5). Aristotle reminds us of this paradox in the first chapter of the Posterior Analytics, but his full solution only emerges in book II. There, he argues that perceptual experience gives us a grasp of the target of inquiry that, though it does not count as scientific knowledge, does serve to direct further inquiry. He begins the discussion by presenting us with a claim about how objects of inquiry are linked to objects of scientific knowledge.

The things about which we inquire are equal in number to the things we know scientifically. We inquire about four things: the fact, the reason why, if something is, what something is. (APo. II 1, 89b23–25)

Aristotle conceives of these four inquiries as paired, and there is a natural sequence in each pair. Knowing that some state of affairs is the case, we can inquire into the reason why it is the case.

When we know the fact we inquire about the reason why (e.g., knowing that it is eclipsed or that the earth moves, we inquire into the reason why it is eclipsed or why the earth moves). (APo. II 1, 89b29–31)

Similarly, if we conclude an inquiry into whether something exists, we can go on to investigate its nature, what it is.

And having come to know that it is, we inquire what it is (e.g.: Then what is a god? Or what is a man?). (APo. II 1, 89b34–35)

The examples reveal a distinction that structures much of the discussion for the next ten chapters. For it looks as if ‘factual’ inquiries concern whether some attribute belongs to some subject (movement to the earth, eclipse to the moon), and the search for the reason why will be a search for the causal explanation of the attribute belonging to that subject. By contrast, it looks like the move from ‘if’ to ‘what’ is a move from establishing the existence of some subject (‘god’, ‘man’) to establishing what it is.

However, the distinction is not, it turns out, so clear-cut. Having begun to illustrate the distinction between inquiry if or whether something is and what it is with the question ‘whether there is or is not a centaur or a god’, he then characterizes the knowledge achieved as ‘knowing that it is’. And in the second chapter, he begins to link the two sequences of inquiry by means of his syllogistic concept of “middle term,” the term that is common to the two premises in a syllogistic proof.

Thus it results that in all our research we seek either if there is a middle term or what the middle term is. For the middle term is the cause, and this is in every case what is sought. (APo. II 2, 90a7–9)

That is, in any valid syllogistic inference, the middle term shared by the premises is the warrant for the conclusion. In scientific explanation, however, the middle term must also identify the cause of the fact given in the conclusion—what that term identifies is the causal link between the subject and attribute. To use another of his common examples, if we seek to explain the periodic sound of noise in the clouds, the middle term must identify the cause of the connection between that noise and those clouds. Moreover, on Aristotle’s account of the relationship between causal demonstration and scientific definition, knowing the cause of thunder is at the same time knowing the essence of thunder, what thunder really is.

There is a difference between saying why it thunders and what thunder is. In the one case you will say: Because the fire is extinguished in the clouds. But: What is thunder?—A noise of fire being extinguished in the clouds. Hence the same account is given in different ways: in one way it is a continuous demonstration, in the other a definition. (APo. II 10, 94a4–8)

In the APo., Aristotle returns regularly to such standard examples of natural phenomena as thunder and eclipses—but he also, and importantly, provides an extended biological example, the seasonal loss of leaves in broad-leafed plants.[2] In ch. 16, Aristotle imagines an inquiry that begins with questions such as ‘Why do fig trees and grape vines lose their leaves?’. The model answer is ‘Because they are both broad-leafed.’ That is, the inquiry seeks some other feature, common to both kinds, related to the target of inquiry, the seasonal loss of leaves. The ‘because’ is, however, preliminary—it is best to see being broad-leafed as a step toward causal explanation. Chapter 17 picks up the example, in the context of arguing that basic scientific inquiry seeks, wherever possible, co-extensive predications, which those between leaf loss and fig trees, or leaf loss and grape vines, are not. The candidate major premise, however—‘Whatever is broad-leafed loses its leaves’—does identify a co-extensive relationship between subject and predicate. It may thus serve as a proper scientific explanandum, and ‘broad-leafed’ can serve to identify a kind, all and only the members of which lose their leaves.[3] Thus, the middle term of the preliminary explanation becomes the subject of a more basic, co-extensive predication. The cause of broad-leafed trees losing their leaves will, then, be something more fundamental about broad-leafed trees, here identified as the solidification of moisture at the leaf juncture, which can thus serve as the middle term in a causal explanation of this fact. But it will also serve as part of a definition of leaf loss.

The middle is the account of the first major term [i.e. the predicate in the conclusion], for which reason all the sciences come about through definition. (APo. II 17, 99a22–23)

That is, we will have, if our research goes well, an account of what loss of leaves is. Along the way a process of identifying the kind, all and only the members of which will lose their leaves due to sap coagulation, is assumed. Yet the Analytics provides no systematic discussion about whether there are general criteria for identifying these basic scientific kinds. As we will see, this is the topic of one of the most interesting sections of On the Parts of Animals, book I.

There are two quite different questions we need to ask about how these ideas about inquiry and explanation in the Analytics are related to Aristotle’s investigations of animals: first, how is the philosophy of biology presented in PA I related to the general account of explanation, definition and inquiry in the Posterior Analytics[4]; and second, to what extent do the treatises reporting his actual investigations of animals conform either to his general account of scientific knowledge and inquiry in APo., or to the norms regarding the study of animals laid down in PA I. The remainder of this entry will be organized around these two questions.

3. Caveat lector

First some preliminary remarks are in order about what we are—and are not—discussing. It seems obvious, once stated, that the actual activity of studying animals is different from the activity of writing or teaching about animals based on that study. We have access to a number of Aristotle’s systematically organized writings on animals; we do not have direct access to his actual investigations. Some authors studied by historians of science discuss, in their written work, the methods they used to gather the information and work out their theoretical ideas and even provide ‘diaries’ describing their day-to-day studies—Aristotle is not one of them. Nor did anyone else report observing Aristotle carrying out his studies. There are reasonable inferences we can make from his writings; for example that he consulted with bee-keepers, fishermen and sponge divers, that he (or someone under his guidance) performed a great many dissections on a wide variety of animals, that there were at least some diagrams produced based on these dissections, and so on. Moreover, on the question of how he reasoned to specific explanations we can make some reasonable inferences from things he says about proper methods of biological inquiry. But it is important to keep in mind that we are studying texts that present, in a highly structured and theoretical manner, the results of an actual investigation, the details of which we know very little.

It is also unclear what is the intent of the texts we do have that report on these investigations. It is sometimes said they are ‘lecture notes’. That seems pretty clearly wrong; they are too carefully written and structured. But it does seem clear, from cross-references, that some of them were to be studied in a certain order, and this order may conform to a course of study in the Lyceum. Interestingly, while all of the other biological treatises refer for further information to ‘the animal inquiries’,that is to something like the History of Animals that has come down to us, often in conjunction with ‘the dissections’, our History of Animals has no references to the other, explanatory studies. This suggests that the ‘inquiries and dissections’ had a different function in such a course of study, perhaps something akin to ‘reference works’.

Finally, it is also worth recalling that the series of treatises we have was likely compiled hundreds of years after Aristotle’s death from whatever he left. It seems unlikely we will ever be able to determine the exact relationship between the so-called ‘Andronican’ edition, the likely source of our texts, and what was produced during Aristotle’s lifetime.

These three caveats place constraints on what I can reasonably claim to be doing. I will be discussing the treatises that report the results of Aristotle’s investigations of animals. I will assume that the texts that have been passed down to us reflect what he wrote on this subject, and that the cross-references in those texts are his and reflect his own views about how these various studies are related to each other.

4. Philosophy of Biology

On the Parts of Animals, book I (PA I) begins by outlining its purpose, which is to establish a set of standards for judging natural investigations (639a15). Its five chapters pursue this purpose, discussing the appropriate level of generality for such studies, the modes of causality and of necessity to be used in biological explanations, the relation of form to matter in living things, the proper method of logical division for this subject matter, the means of identifying kinds and their activities at the proper level of abstraction, and much more. Two sorts of evidence support the conclusion that this book is intended to deal with problems and questions that arise in the application of Aristotle’s general philosophy of science, found in the Posterior Analytics, to his theoretical investigation of living nature.

The first kind of evidence consists of passages introducing his biological investigations that appear to make explicit reference to the account of scientific knowledge in APo. The following passage from the History of Animals (a better though less familiar translation would be Animal Inquiries), for example, suggests that the entire biological project is organized in accordance with the theory of inquiry developed in APo. II. This passage comes near the end of chapter six in the first book of HA. After five chapters in which Aristotle lays out the kinds of similarities and differences among animals to be studied and sketches the ways in which they are to be investigated, he makes the following programmatic statement about the investigation to come, and where it fits in the entire scientific study of animals.

These things, then, have now been said by way of outline to provide a taste of what things need to be studied, and what it is about them that needs to be studied, in order that we may first grasp the differences and the attributes belonging to all animals. After we do this, we must attempt to discover the causes. For it is natural to carry out the investigation in this way, beginning with the inquiry into each thing; for from these inquiries it becomes clear both about which things (peri hôn) the demonstration (tên apodeixin) should be and from which things (ex hôn) it should proceed. (HA I 6, 491a7–14)

The natural way to proceed, then, is to begin with inquiry (historia), with the aim of grasping the differences between, and attributes of, all the animals; and then to attempt to discover their causes. This is natural because, given that our goal is demonstrative understanding, we want to end up with a clear distinction between the facts to be explained (the peri hôn) and their explanation (the ex hôn). This statement echoes the summary, in APo. I 10, of the components of demonstrative knowledge:

Nevertheless there are by nature these three [components of demonstrative knowledge]: that about which (peri ho) it proves, what it proves, and those things from which (ex hôn) it proves. (76b21–22)

The History of Animals characterizes itself as establishing the attributes and the differences that belong to all animals, and claims that by carrying out this inquiry we are prepared to go on to search for the causes. Indeed, he appears to suggest that a successful historia or factual inquiry will prepare us to grasp the difference between those facts that need to be explained and those that will be invoked in our explanations. In the language of the Posterior Analytics: HA establishes the fact, e.g. that all animals with lungs have windpipes, or that all cetacea have lungs and are viviparous, typically seeking to identify groups by means of discovering co-extensive differentiae with the aid of the method of division.[5] The proper use of division, moreover, will give clear indications of which predications are basic and which derivative. Works such as Parts of Animals or Generation of Animals, on the other hand, seek to establish the reason why—the cause—of the fact. If Aristotle is following the method described in the Analytics, these causal explanations should at the same time point us to essential definitions of what it is to be a windpipe or to be viviparous. It is a question currently much debated whether definition was, in fact, an explicit goal of HA or simply a consequence of the explanatory goal clearly identified in the above passage from HA I 6; and if so, whether definitions of animal kinds were sought, or only definitions of their attributes. As we will see, there are a number of chapter summaries in the explanatory treatises that make a point of claiming that both an explanation of why a part is found in those animals that have it, and an account of what that part is, have been provided; but one must work very hard to reconstruct any definitions of animal kinds in those treatises. [6]

A number of texts in Aristotle’s causal investigations reinforce the message of HA I 6, stressing that the preliminary work of inquiries that establish and organize the facts at various levels of generality has been accomplished; and they regularly refer to something like what is reported in our HA as the place to look for the results of this preliminary work. Two explicit statements to that effect follow, one from the beginning of his study of the causes of the differences in animal locomotion, one from the beginning of his study of the causes of the differences among the parts of animals.

Clearly there needs to be a study of all of these questions about animal locomotion and any others of the same kind; for that (hoti) these things are thus is clear from our inquiries into nature (tês historias tês phusikês); the reason why (dioti) must now be investigated. (IA 1, 704b7–10)
From which parts and from how many parts each of the animals is constituted has been exhibited more clearly in the inquiries about them (en tais historiais tais peri autôn); it is the causes owing to which each animal has this character that must now be examined, on their own and apart (chorisantas kath’hauta) from what was said in the inquiries. (PA II 1, 646a8–12)

Each of these passages explicitly describes the study of animals with which Aristotle is engaged in the language of Aristotle’s theory of research in APo. II 1. Indeed, the passage from HA I 6 does so by insisting that the natural method to use is to first get clear on the differences and attributes to be demonstrated (‘establish the fact that…’) before going on to find the causes (‘the reason why, i.e. the cause’) to be appealed to in these demonstrations. Animal inquiries (historiai) are a kind of hoti inquiry—that is, the History of Animals presents the facts to be explained, organized so as to be prepared for causal demonstration.[7]

The IA and PA, on the other hand, refer to themselves as pursuing a causal inquiry into the reason why the various kinds of animals are differentiated as they are, and they acknowledge that they are able to do this precisely because the factual investigation into the locomotion and parts of animals has been accomplished. In both cases Aristotle emphasizes the distinction on which we are focused, perhaps in order to remind his readers of his philosophy of scientific research.

There is a second line of evidence, quite independent of these programmatic statements, which leads to the same conclusion. The topics covered in PA I take the form of specifications of the central topics of the Posterior Analytics. These specifications are required because animals are [a] complex unities of matter (body) and form (soul); [b] arise by a complex process of development; [c] the end—that for the sake of which the development occurs— is both causally and definitionally prior to that process; [d] a distinctive kind of necessity, conditional necessity, is operative; and [e] a special method of multi-differentiae division is required. Such a discussion is required by the fact that although the Posterior Analytics intends its epistemic standards to be applicable to natural science – as is clear from the many examples drawn from natural science in book II – it provides no details as to how this application is to be accomplished.

What, then, does PA I tell us about the proper way to investigate animals? Aristotle begins by posing a problem about how to identify the proper objects of investigation. Should we begin by studying the features of groups close to the level of perception, such as human beings, horses, dogs and such, or should we look for attributes that ‘belong in common according to kind, and then later study their distinctive attributes’ (639b4–5). He notes that since there are many attributes that are common to many of these more concrete kinds, focusing our study on them will have the result of our repeating ourselves—much as if, to use an example from APo II discussed in Section 2, we were to remain at the level of ‘olive trees lose their leaves’, ‘grape vines lose their leaves’. Among these common attributes, Aristotle distinguishes those that seem not to differ across the kinds that have them (he cites respiration and death) from those that are ‘ distinctive in form ’ such as locomotion. As he puts it: “it is apparent that locomotion is not one in form, because flying, swimming, walking, and crawling differ” (639b1–2). Aristotle deals with this question, so reminiscent of APo. I 4–5, in PA I 4, but only after he has introduced a new way of thinking about differentiae and division appropriate for investigating animals. After discussing his recommendations regarding the use of logical division in biology, we will return to look at his answer.

Animals are complex structures organized so as to be able to perform an integrated set of functions and activities; yet the Posterior Analytics provides one with very little guidance as to how to apply its norms to such things. Again PA I, and especially chapters 1 and 5, appears designed to provide that guidance. It seeks to establish [a] the priority of goal-causation to motive-causation, [b] the priority of the study of an animal’s form (which, he argues, should be identified with its soul) to the study of its material constituents (i.e. its body), and [c] the presence of a special kind of necessity operative where goals and form take priority, namely hypothetical or conditional necessity (cf. PA I 1, 640a10–641a32, 642a1–31).

The argument is complicated in virtue of its manner of presentation. First, it is a narrative in which Aristotle gradually develops his own views by exposing the errors of those who investigated nature before him; it is structured as presenting an alternative to views expressed by Empedocles and Democritus, and as in the spirit of Socrates (642a24–31). Second, as is so typical of him, what initially may appear to be three separate narratives turn out to be a single, complex case for emphasizing the study of form, teleological explanation, and conditional necessity when studying living things. Form, in the case of living things, turns out to be the capacity to perform living functions such as nutrition, perception, or locomotion, i.e. soul; and thus the form of a living thing is causally prior to the matter, because it is the goal for the sake of which the parts of the animal—its matter—come to be and exist. This, in turn, provides us with the appropriate way to understand ‘conditional necessity’—parts and the processes that produce them do not necessitate the outcome; on the contrary, the outcome necessitates that the developmental processes bring about the parts that are necessary for the organism to live its life, and do so in a temporally and spatially coordinated manner (cf. GA II 4, 740b19–34; II 6, 743a16–36).

Chapters 2 and 3 have a similar narrative structure. Gradually, a positive theory of biological division emerges from the ashes of a detailed critical analysis of those (Plato and certain of his students) who “attempt to grasp the particular by dividing the kind into two differences” (642b5), a practice he finds in “the written divisions” (642b11), perhaps a reference to divisions we find in some of Plato’s later dialogues, or perhaps to lost works by other members of Plato’s Academy. The method he is criticizing combines two basic techniques that lead to things being grouped together that are fundamentally different and things being grouped separately that are fundamentally similar: dichotomy and division by non-essentials. Dichotomy is the method of dividing the more general differentia into two exhaustive alternatives, which often entails that one of the alternatives is simply the privation of the other (winged, wingless). Division by non-essentials involves dividing a prior differentia-class by means of an unrelated difference. For example, you might first divide animals into winged and wingless, and then winged animals into wild and tame.

I mean the sort of thing that results by dividing animals into the wingless and the winged, and winged into tame and wild, or pale and dark. Neither tame nor pale is a difference of winged; rather each is the origin of another difference, while here it is incidental. (643b19–22)

To avoid the problems created by this dichotomous and arbitrary method, Aristotle recommends a method that divides each wider differentia by more and more determinate forms of that differentia (wings into forms of wing, beaks into forms of beak), and does so simultaneously on as many differentiae as are correlated at a given level of universality.

Rather, one should try to take animals by kinds, following the lead of the many in demarcating a bird kind and a fish kind. Each of these has been defined by many differences, not according to dichotomy. (643b9–12)

Thus, if all birds have beaks, feathers, wings of a sort, are bipedal, etc. , the biologist needs to perform the proper sort of division on all of these in order to grasp the various sub-kinds of bird. This will not, of course, give us demonstrative knowledge; but it will help us to grasp the co-extensively correlated features, at each level of specificity, that are the proper things about which to seek demonstrative knowledge.

An interesting feature of this extended criticism of dichotomous, arbitrary division and the development of a systematic, multi-differentiae alternative is that it takes for granted the ‘naturalness’ of certain kinds that ‘the many’ have identified. As he says above, ‘these [birds and fish] have been defined by many differences’; earlier he had said that the terms ‘bird’ and ‘fish’ name a ‘similarity’, a group of animals that are ‘alike in kind’ that dichotomous division inappropriately tears apart (642b13–19). During the discussion of division there is very little clarification of what underlies this notion of similarity or likeness in kind. However, armed with a method of division suited to the study of animals, the discussion quickly turns to the question of what it is that makes it appropriate to treat all birds or all fish as a single kind, and to the specification of rules for identifying other such kinds. What ‘bird’ and ‘fish’ name are, he claims, kinds with “common natures, and forms not very far apart” (644b2–3). Prior to understanding these kinds through a scientific account of this common nature, we can—as the Posterior Analytics argues—grasp these kinds, i.e. grasp that all birds have a common nature.[8] We do this by noting that they have many general differences that vary in measurable ways—by the more and less, as he puts it.

…[these kinds] are correctly defined in this way. For those animals that differ by degree and the more and the less have been brought together under one kind, while those that are analogous have been kept apart. I mean, for example, that bird differs from bird by the more or by degree (for one has long feathers, another short feathers), while fish differs from bird by analogy (for what is feather in the one is scale in the other). (644a16–22)

It is with this very topic of different degrees of similarity and difference of parts that the Historia Animalium begins, extending this way of characterizing similarity and difference immediately to differences in activities, ways of life and traits of character. (HA I 1, 486a5–487a13) This is, then, clearly a discussion of how one achieves ‘knowledge of the fact’, rather than ‘knowledge of the reason why’.

The closing section of PA I (treated since the Renaissance as its fifth chapter) is often thought of as having two, essentially unrelated parts. And there is some justification for this; if one were to remove the first half of the chapter, one would be left with an argument the flows quite naturally out of the conclusion of chapter 4. At that point, Aristotle states that once one has made an initial division of the attributes that belong to all the animals per se, the next step is to attempt “to divide their causes,” after which he applies the analysis of sameness and difference from the previous discussion of parts to the activities performed by these parts. He then closes the discussion by arguing that the differences we find in animal parts are to be explained by reference to differences found among their activities. Thus a proper division of activities is a division of the causes of the parts of animals.

Nevertheless, a good case can be made that this ‘chapter’ forms a coherent whole, a sort of culmination of the book. It begins with perhaps the best known passage in Aristotle’s biological works, a stirring and beautifully crafted encomium to the joys of studying animals, even the most lowly. An elegant introduction divides natural beings into those that are eternal and those that partake of generation and perishing, noting that there are attractions to studying both: though access to information about the former is limited, he likens it to “…a chance, brief glimpse of the ones we love”; on the other hand the latter, perishable things “take the prize in respect of understanding because we know more of them and know them more fully” and they are “more of our own nature” (644b23–645a3). He then elaborates on the value of the study of the living things around us. It is a passage worth quoting in full.

Since we have completed stating the way things appear to us about the divine things, it remains to speak about animal nature, omitting nothing in our power, whether of less or greater esteem. For even in the study of animals disagreeable to perception, the nature that crafted them likewise provides extraordinary pleasures to those able to know their causes and who are by nature philosophers. Surely it would be unreasonable, even absurd, for us to enjoy studying likenesses of animals—on the ground that we are at the same time studying the art, such as painting and sculpture, that made them—while not prizing even more the study of things constituted by nature, at least when we can behold their causes.

For this reason we should not be childishly disgusted at the examination of the less valuable animals. For in all natural things there is something marvelous. Even as Heraclitus is said to have spoken to those strangers who wished to meet him but stopped as they were approaching when they saw him warming himself at the oven—he bade them to enter without fear, ‘For there are gods here too’—so too one should approach research about each of the animals without disgust, since in every one there is something natural and good. For what is not haphazard but rather for the sake of something is in fact present most of all in the works of nature; the end for the sake of which takes the place of the good. If someone considered the study of the other animals to lack value, he ought to think the same thing about himself as well; for it is impossible to look at that from which mankind has been constituted—blood, flesh, bones, blood vessels, and other such parts—without considerable disgust. Just as one who discusses the parts or equipment of anything should not be thought of as doing so in order to draw attention to the matter, nor for the sake of the matter, but rather in order to draw attention to the overall shape (e.g. to a house rather than bricks, mortar, and timbers); likewise one should consider the discussion of nature to be referring to the composite and the overall substantial being rather than to those things which do not exist when separated from their substantial being. (PA I 5, 645a4–36)

Readers, often carried away by the rhetoric of this passage, might fail to notice that there is a compelling argument here, with two key conclusions. The first is that, while studying the Sun, Moon, starts and planets may be a noble pursuit, if scientific understanding is your goal, you are much more likely to achieve it in the study of animals and plants: “…anyone wishing to labor sufficiently can grasp many things about each kind…we know more of them and we know them more fully…they are nearer to us and more of our own nature…” (excerpted from 644b29–645a3). The second is that if one has the proper philosophical focus, then one realizes that the somewhat unpleasant task of dissecting blood vessels and the like, is a means to understanding that for the sake of which and soul, those objects of inquiry argued to be primary in chapter 1. For the lesson of chapter 1 is that understanding living matter is achieved primarily by means of an understanding of the functional goals served by an animal’s parts, discovering what each of its parts is for, what it contributes to the life of the animal. This is the philosophical way to investigate animals, and by doing so you learn the value of an animal’s parts and activities to its life.

The remainder of the chapter, therefore, recommends approaching the activities associated with animals and their parts in a manner exactly analogous to the approach to the study of parts recommended in chapter 4 (645b1–14); and it concludes with a schematic discussion of the variety of teleological relationships that hold among parts, between parts and their activities, and among activities. Aristotle encourages us to conceive of these relationships in a yet more unified way, as a single complex relationship between a single complex activity (living, I suppose) and a single complex instrument, the animal’s body. (645b15–36)

In the first book of On the Parts of Animals, then, we have a systematic philosophy of biology, which in many respects seems to provide what is missing in the Analytics regarding the application of its program to the study of living nature. But does Aristotle’s biological practice carry through on this program? It is worthwhile keeping that question in mind as we survey those books that report the results of Aristotle’s animal studies. To those books we now turn.

5. Aristotle’s Biological Practice

5.1 The History of Animals as a Report of the Results of a Hoti-Investigation

As we saw earlier, Aristotle introduces his systematic study of the differences and attributes of animals as a hoti-investigation, a factual investigation preliminary to the search for causal demonstrations. By studying it, then, we ought to be able to develop a rich picture of what this theoretically motivated, preliminary stage of investigation aims to achieve, and perhaps a glimpse of what such an investigation entails.

As many studies, following up on the pioneering work of David Balme (1961, 1987b) have now established, the History of Animals (HA) is a work that from first to last displays and builds upon multi-differentiae division of animal differences (see Gotthelf 1988, 1997b; Lennox 2001b, chs. 1, 2; Pellegrin 1986). It is organized as a study of four kinds of animal differences first mentioned in HA’s first chapter as the principal objects of study (at 486b22–487a14)—differences in parts (the topic of Books I–IV), in modes of activity and ways of life (those related to generation in Books V-VI--and human generation in IX--others in Book VII) and in characters (Book VIII). These in turn are sub-divided; for example, discussion of the non-uniform parts (organs, as we say) of animals with blood (I 7-III 1) is followed by that of their uniform parts (tissues, III 2–22). A discussion of the parts of animals without blood then concludes the discussion of differences in parts (IV 1–8). Book IV concludes with a discussion of differences in sensory faculties, voice, and differences related to sex.[9]

It is only once Aristotle begins to distinguish differences among, say, uniform parts that various groupings of animals play an important role in organizing the discussion. And in so far as there are relatively stable general groupings of animals, these are identified by noting their possession of stable correlations among differentiae—for example, there are a large number of different animals all of which have wings, feathers, beaks, and two fleshless legs, and this group of animals has been given the designation ‘bird’.[10] In other cases, such groups have not been generally recognized, and Aristotle simply refers to them by means of some of their most important correlated differences—the four-legged and live-bearing animals, for example, corresponding to our land mammals (with one important exception).

What is clear from the practice of the History of Animals is both the value of division and its limitations. Division by itself does not provide you with the axes of division; rather they are presupposed. Division does not give you animal kinds; as we saw in the previous section, one needs to turn to PA I 4 and HA I 6 for Aristotle’s thoughts on how those kinds are established. Something besides division is needed in order for a researcher to recognize theoretically significant kinds, such as cephalopods or cetaceans. Why group animals together based on their possession of four legs and the ability to give birth to living offspring (rather than eggs)? Certainly each of these traits is the product of a division, one of modes of locomotion and one of modes of reproduction. But those divisions do not tell you that animals with four legs that bear living young constitute a scientifically significant group.

A second limitation of division is its indifference to the distinction between causally fundamental characteristics and proper attributes, to use the language of the Analytics. Yet, being able to distinguish these is absolutely fundamental to Aristotelian science. A careful comparative study of the History of Animals, on the one hand, and works such as On the Parts or On the Generation of Animals, on the other, provides insight into how Aristotle understands and deploys this distinction in his actual scientific practice. And as we have seen above, Aristotle draws explicit attention to its importance for his biological investigations in a number of key texts within those investigations themselves. To study in detail the interplay between definition, causal demonstration and division in the biology is to see Aristotle working through just those problems which form the central question of Posterior Analytics II—how precisely are definition, causal demonstration and division related to one another in the quest for, and achievement of, scientific understanding?

It is impossible to present even a hint of the richness of the empirical content of the Historia Animalium here. Before going on to a discussion of the works that report the results of Aristotle’s causal investigations of animal parts and animal generation, however, two examples of reports from HA are provided for comparison with corresponding discussions in PA and GA. The first example discusses the organs of respiration in blooded animals; these are the first internal organs discussed after Aristotle has concluded his review of their external parts. Here is how he introduces that discussion.

So, then, the number and character of the external parts of the blooded animals and how they differ from one another has been stated. We must now discuss how the internal parts are situated, first in the blooded animals.

As many as (hosa) are four legged and live-bearing all (panta) have an esophagus and windpipe, arranged just as in human beings; it is also arranged similarly in as many of the four legged animals as lay eggs, and in the birds; but they differ in the forms (tois eidesi) of these parts. Generally, all and only (panta hosa) those receiving air by inhaling and exhaling in every case (panta) have a lung, windpipe and esophagus; and the position of the esophagus and windpipe is alike in all, but the organs are not, while the lung is neither alike in all nor is it positioned in a like manner. And again as many as (hosa) have blood all (panta) have a heart… . But not all [blooded animals] have a lung, for instance fish do not, nor any other animal there might be that has gills. (505b23–506a12, excerpts)

There are a number of features in this passage that are common throughout the Historia Animalium and provide insight into its methods and aims. First is the syntactically redundant linguistic pattern hosa…panta (“as many as...all”), variants of which are common in this treatise. Aristotle appears to use the sentence form “As many as are X, all have Y” for a quite specific reason. It is not just to note a universal correlation; it is to do so while leaving the extension of the correlation open—a brilliant methodological innovation. New animals with the correlation can be discovered, but the generalization will not change, since it is about the universal correlation among differentiae—in this case internal organs—not about the kinds that exemplify it. It appears that when Aristotle intensifies the expression by writing panta hosa, as he does once here, he means to signal a convertible universal, an ‘entailment’ as we would say. Aristotle first lists a number of distinct groups, all the members of which have the three organs being discussed, windpipe, lung and esophagus. Then, using the term ‘generally’ to signal what he is about to do, he identifies a differentia that all these groups have in common, and which is coextensive with these three organs—inhaling and exhaling air. The inductive pattern has the following form:

‘As many as are P all have Y; As many as are Q all have Y… .

Generally, all and only those that are X (a feature common to P, Q…) have Y’.

By going on to note that as many as have blood have a heart, he implicitly is warning the reader about a potential false inference one might draw from the examples so far: that all blooded animals have a lung. He mentions fish as an example of blooded animals without a lung, but immediately identifies the relevant differentia: ‘those blooded animals that have gills do not have these organs [the lung and its associated parts]’. He is careful not to restrict the universal to a kind—the relevant correlation is with gills, in whichever animals they might be found.

While the inductive strategy of this work, directing us to high-level, convertible universals is, I hope, now clear, it is also important to note what is absent from this passage. Aristotle rarely in this work claims any of these correlations is necessary, or that others are impossible. He does not distinguish features that are part of the essence of a kind from others that are mere attributes; and he typically avoids any hint of causal explanation. All of this is to be expected, given the methodological guidelines for historia that we discussed earlier—historia is preliminary to causal investigation and prepares us for it. In the passage we are currently considering, for example, it is striking that he notes the convertible correlation between lung, windpipe and esophagus, on the one hand, and inhaling and exhaling of air, on the other, but does not claim that two of the organs are present for the sake of breathing. (In fact, the word for ‘breathing’ is never used!) Though he uses the term ‘nature’ regularly in HA, he does not, as he does so often in his causal investigations, claim that nature does nothing in vain, or that it always does what is best for each organism. Nor does he talk about the parts of an animal as its material nature, nor about its living capacities as aspects of its formal nature. Indeed there is virtually no mention of the matter-form distinction in HA. It is only when we turn to the various biological treatises devoted to causal investigation that this language associated with the search for definitions and demonstrations comes to the fore.

The aim of this brief analysis of one small passage is to convey a taste of the methodological depth and complexity of this great scientific treatise, so often misunderstood as a poorly organized compendium of nature lore. I’ll conclude this section with one more example, from the books dealing with generation, so that we may compare it with a corresponding discussion in De Generatione Animalium.

HA V-VI discuss all aspects of animal generation, moving from consideration of differences in modes and timing of copulation and reproduction to the actual process of generation (or ‘development’, as we more often say). As in his discussion of parts, he moves through the various blooded kinds and then discusses generation in bloodless kinds and from identifying the universals common to all members of a group to identifying the peculiarities of more specific kinds. At HA VI 3, having previously described the common and peculiar characteristics of copulation in birds, he turns to recording his observations of the development of the chick at the critical fourth day after the egg has been laid.

Generation from the egg occurs in an identical manner in all birds, though the time taken to termination varies, as we have said. In the case of the hen, the first signs of the embryo are seen after three days and nights; in larger birds it takes more time, in smaller birds less. During this time the yolk travels upwards to the point of the egg—that is where the starting point of the egg is and where it opens up, and the heart is no bigger than just a small blood-spot in the white. This spot beats and moves as though it were alive; and from it, as it grows, two vein-like vessels with blood in them lead on a twisted course to each of the two surrounding membranes. A membrane with bloody fibers already surrounds the white of the egg, at this time coming from the vessel-like channels. A bit later the body can also be distinguished, at first very small and pale. The head is apparent, and its eyes, very swollen; and this continues for a long time, for it is later that they contract and become smaller. (561a4–21)

He begins with a wide generalization about all birds, followed by a ‘more and less’ correlation between the size of the bird and the rate of development. This device allows Aristotle to use the careful description of the chick egg opened on day four as a universal description of development; the reader is licensed to infer that the same stage of development will occur in all birds, but may occur either earlier or later, depending on whether they are larger or smaller than the domestic chicken. Aristotle’s description of this classic experiment led to its being repeated many times in the Renaissance.[11] Anyone who has seen modern films of the chick at this stage of differentiation can appreciate the accuracy of Aristotle’s description, especially when one takes into account the size of the chick embryo at this stage of growth.

5.2 From Inquiry to Understanding; from hoti to dioti.

For Aristotle, ‘historia’, the scientific organization of information about animals—serves the goal of causal explanation; and, as I discussed in section 4., explanation by reference to goals and functions is the primary form of causal explanation in biology.

On the Parts of Animals II-IV presents Aristotle’s attempt to provide causal explanations for the sort of information one finds organized in HA I-IV, information about the uniform and non-uniform parts of animals. (PA I, it will be recalled, is a discussion of the norms that are needed to guide the scientific investigation of animals; see section 4, above.) Here, I will be narrowly focused on just a couple of passages in PA II-IV, but will begin with a very brief sketch of its overall structure. It begins (PA II 1–2) with a careful and complex discussion of the causal relationships between uniform and non-uniform parts (roughly, this distinction corresponds to our distinction between bodily fluids and tissues and organs), stressing the teleological priority of the whole organism to the parts, and among parts the priority of the non-uniform to the uniform. PA II 3–10 then discusses the uniform parts, beginning with that out of which all the others are nourished, blood, and ending with flesh, bone, and analogous materials (nail, horn, hoof). From II 10 to III 3, Aristotle discusses the external parts of blooded animals associated with the head such as eyes, ears, nose and mouth. But when he gets to the neck, he turns to the internal parts, and from III 3 to IV 4 he discusses the ‘innards’ of the blooded animals, parts such as heart, lung, liver, kidneys, and so on. From IV 5 to 9 he discusses the parts, both internal and external, of the ‘bloodless’ animals, i.e. the crustaceans, testaceous mollusks, cephalopods and insects. Finally, at IV 10, he returns to the external parts associated with the torso and limbs of the live bearing and egg laying quadrupeds (10–11), birds (12), and fish (13); and ends by discussing a number of animals that ‘dualize’ between being land-dwellers and water dwellers or flyers.

In order to compare the methods of this treatise with the discussion of the parts in HA, it will be useful to look briefly at PA III 3, a discussion of the lung, windpipe and esophagus, the part discussed in the passage from HA II quoted in section 5.1, above.

The first twenty lines of that discussion read as follows:

Not all animals have a neck, but only those with the parts for the sake of which the neck is naturally present—these are the windpipe and the part known as the esophagus. Now the larynx is present by nature for the sake of breathing; for it is through this part that animals draw in and expel air when they inhale and exhale. This is why those without a lung have no neck, e.g. the kind consisting of the fish. The esophagus is the part through which nourishment proceeds to the gut; so that animals without necks manifestly do not have an esophagus. But it is not necessary to have the esophagus for the sake of nutrition; for it concocts nothing. And further, it is possible for the gut to be placed right next to the position of the mouth, while for the lung this is impossible. For there needs first to be something common like a conduit, which then divides in two and through which the air is separated into passages—in this way the lung may best accomplish inhalation and exhalation.

So, then, the organ connected with breathing from necessity has length; therefore it is necessary for there to be an esophagus between the mouth and the stomach. The esophagus is fleshy, with a sinuous elasticity—sinuous so that it may dilate when food is ingested, yet fleshy so that it is soft and yielding and is not damaged when it is scraped by the food going down. (664a14–34)

I have highlighted the language of nature, necessity, possibility (and impossibility), and being for the sake of in this passage in order to highlight the contrast with the discussion of the same organic correlations in the corresponding HA passage. Here the goal is explanation—parts are present and have the character they do primarily due to the conditional necessity imposed by the organism’s functional requirements. One sees here the Aristotle that so impressed the great French naturalist Georges Cuvier: Aristotle is not only systematically discussing the adaptive functions of each of these organs; he is also displaying the complex way in which the internal parts of animals constitute an organic system.

The lack of names for animal kinds is also noteworthy; as in the corresponding passage from HA II, fish are mentioned once as an instance of blooded animals that lack the organs in question; but the stress throughout is on this particular system of organs in whichever blooded animals have them. Aristotle’s goal is to explain why it is that certain animals have these organs, and why it is that, if they have one of these organs, they must have the others. Some, but not all, of the explanations specify the function for the sake of which the parts are present; and even the material nature of the tissues, whether fleshy or sinuous, may be explained in functional terms. This discussion also displays a hierarchy of teleological connections of the sort described at the close of PA I 5, 645b28–33—one activity is present for the sake of another more basic one; a part that performs a subordinate activity is present for the sake of a part that performs a more important activity. Inhaling and exhaling are for the sake of respiration (which is for the sake of cooling the blood); a windpipe is present for the sake of transporting air to and from the lung; a neck is present to protect the windpipe.

For reasons that will become clear, the relationship between the books of the Historia Animalium dealing with generation and On the Generation of Animals (GA) is somewhat more complex. GA has a reasonably clear organization of its own; but its central (though not only) project of explaining the causal roles of the male and female in sexual generation and the causality of embryological development raises a host of topics and problems well beyond the scope of HA. But a study of how the two works are related is nonetheless illuminating. This discussion of Aristotle’s biological practice will thus close by considering the causal explanation of embryological development and in particular the explanation for the early appearance of the heart, with a final look at the application of this explanation to the case of embryonic birds.

As I noted earlier, taken on its own terms, GA has a reasonably clear structure. Here again, as with PA II-IV, I will begin with a brief sketch of its overall structure, before focusing narrowly on its method as applied to one problem. It begins (715a1–18) by noting that it will explain two sets of facts left unexplained in PA: the differences among the parts related to generation; and the generation of the parts generally. Though he acknowledges that some animals do not have males and females, he treats sexual generation as his central topic. Initially he provides a theoretically ‘neutral’ account of the distinction: the male is what generates in another, the female what generates in itself (716a14–15). It is not until late in book I that he begins to develop his own detailed theory of their distinctive contributions to generation.

The first 13 chapters characterize the reproductive organs in the males and females of blooded animals, while 14–16 do the same for the bloodless animals that have males and females. Beginning in chapter 17, the discussion turns to the relevant uniform parts related to generation, sperma (roughly ‘seed’) and milk, but the discussion of milk is postponed until book IV. This immediately raises the contentious issue of whether both male and female contribute sperma, and if both, then what the nature of their respective contributions is. This is a large part of the discussion from I 17-II 5, one of the most difficult stretches of text in the Aristotelian corpus, and the one on which our attention will be focused. But to continue our overview: the remainder of book II (from chapter 5 on) discusses the causes of the embryological development of live-bearing animals, while the egg-laying animals are the primary focus in book III, which closes with a discussion of animals that are not sexually generated, including those that arise ‘spontaneously.’ GA IV turns to the development of inherited differences within kinds, beginning with the most important intra-specific difference for his theory of generation, the difference between male and female. From there it moves on to family resemblance, differences in the number of offspring produced and to the causes of deformities. GA V aims to explain ‘more and less’ variations within kinds that appear late in development and that may be fully accounted for by identifying material level causal interactions—differences within a kind in the color, texture or density of a part, for example.

The remainder of this discussion will focus on the general causal theory of animal generation developed in the first half of GA II.[12] In the closing chapters of book I, Aristotle argues that both the male and female contributions are formed from a ‘useful residue’ of blood by a concocting process, the male’s being more fully concocted than the female’s. From this point on the male’s contribution is typically termed gonê (semen), and the female’s katamenia (menses). Aristotle is not entirely consistent, however: occasionally he uses the generic term sperma for the male contribution and explicitly contrasts it with katamenia (727a27–30); while at other times he refers to katamenia as a sort of sperma (728a26–29).

The two contributions are variously described. The male contributes a source of movement or dunamis (‘power’ or ‘potential’), which, as the argument unfolds, turns out to be a special sort of capacity to heat present in the semen’s pneuma or air, which is part of its nature. (This gets fully worked out in GA II 2–3) The semen itself is mere a vehicle for delivering this heating capacity; the male makes no material contribution to the offspring. The female contributes what might be called ‘prepared matter’; all it needs is the presence within it of the heating capacity from the male and it begins a more or less lengthy and complicated developmental process, which Aristotle analogizes to a sort of automaton performing a complex set of coordinated movements once it is set in motion.

He relies at several points in the argument on an analogy with crafts, such as house building:

In animals that emit semen the nature in the male uses the semen as an instrument possessing active movement, just as the tools are moved in things that come to be by craft; for the movement of the craft is somehow in these tools. (730b20–23)

This obscure analogy gradually gets unpacked in the first four chapters of GA II. The general principle common to art and nature is this:

As many things as come to be by nature or by art come to be by means of a being in actuality from that which is potentially such as that being. (734b22–23)

It is the prepared portion of the female’s katamenia that is potentially such as the contributor of semen is actually. And the semen conveys to it a movement or power, such that “when the movement ceases each of the parts comes to be and is ensouled (734b24–25).” That is, in embryological development, each part emerges within a system of parts that is organized to provide nutrition for its growth, and that is guided by a complex ‘program’ for its development. Notice that as each part comes to be it already has the functional capacity associated with it—it comes to be and is ensouled.

Aristotle characterizes the process as follows:
As for hardness, softness, toughness and fragility and all the other such affections present in these ensouled parts, these affections might be produced by heat and cold, but not the defining character (logos) in virtue of which the one part is flesh and the other bone; that is the result of the movement derived from the generator, being in actuality what that out of which it comes to be is potentially, just as in things that come to be by craftsmanship. (734b31–35)

This passage comes immediately after Aristotle has stressed two related points: that the uniform parts and the instrumental parts arise simultaneously; and that even flesh and bone have a function to perform. These points are tightly connected. The defining features of tissues are not merely their affective qualities such as being hard or soft, but their biological functions as well; and their biological functions are intimately connected to their roles in constituting—and being able to play functional roles in—instrumental parts; many, if not all, of a part’s affective qualities are a consequence of its biological role.

In the process of making this argument, Aristotle also stresses a crucial and problematic dis-analogy: Natural things, once their generation begins, ‘grow by means of themselves’ (735a13–14). This is the most fundamental difference between art and nature for Aristotle; a nature is a source of change within the thing itself (Physics II. 1). Natural development, then, though initiated by the warmth contributed by the male parent, continues by means of a source of change within the developing embryo. The carpenter may not mix any of his own material in his buildings; but he must be continuously, physically involved in the movements that create those buildings. Not so with the male parent in natural generation. So how does a complex process that has its origins in an external generator become a natural process of development?

For Aristotle, the heart (or its analogue in bloodless animals) is crucial. It is the first part created by the heat derived from the semen of the male parent, and henceforth it is the primary internal source of that heat and thus of further development (735a16–26). The following explanation begins to bring us into contact with our passage on generation from the History of Animals.

…in the embryo (kuema), while in a way all the parts are present potentially, the source [of development] is most along the path to actuality. This is why the heart is first to be differentiated in actuality. And this is not only clear to perception (as it happens), but is also clear to reason. When the developing thing is distinct from both the male and female contributions, it must manage itself, as when a son sets up a home away from his father. So in animals there must be a source of generation from which the later organizing of the body comes about. … Wherefore the heart appears differentiated first in all blooded animals; for it is the source of both the uniform and the non-uniform parts. … And the prepared blood or its analogue is nutrient for the animal, and the blood vessels are its repository; for this reason the heart is their source. This is clear from a study of ‘the histories’ and ‘the dissections’. (740a2–23, excerpted; compare 735a12–26, 738b17–18 740a27–36, 742b34–743a1, 743b26)

Having developed this general explanation during his discussion of his central case, viviparous development, in GA II, Aristotle moves on to egg-laying animals in book III. GA III 1 carries over to them whatever is common to the two cases, with discussion of the development of birds in their eggs beginning in GA III 2. A recurring aspect of his argument, here as in PA, is to refer us for descriptive details to the histories (presumably the basis of our HA) and to a collection of representations of dissections (tragically not preserved, but cited repeatedly in Aristotle’s biological writings and in ancient catalogues of his writings).

The most general differences among egg-layers relate to the ‘completeness’ of the egg when laid. Because birds lay eggs that become hard as soon as they are exposed to the air (752a30-b2), they are taken to be better prepared when laid than the eggs of other egg-laying animals. Ignoring much interesting and important detail, we will take up the discussion of development within the eggs of birds as they incubate. Aristotle distinguishes the ‘white’ and the ‘yolk’, not descriptively as he did in HA, but functionally (752b18–28).

…it is the white out of which the animal is constituted, while the yolk becomes nutrient, and growth for the constitution of the parts is from it. This is also why the yolk and the white, having distinct natures, have been kept distinct by membranes. For precise details concerning how these parts are situated in relation to each other in virtue of the sources of generation and the constitution of animals, as well as the membranes and umbilical cords, one should study what has been outlined in the histories. The following appears to be sufficient for the present investigation: the heart is the first thing constituted; after this the great blood vessel is marked off, and two umbilical cords extend from this blood vessel, one to the membrane around the yolk, the other to the membrane surrounding the animal itself. This latter is thus next to the membrane of the shell. (753b11–23)

In this case (though not always) one does get far more detail in HA. These references to histories and dissections can be misleading unless one takes into account the differences in the aims, and thus in the organization, of these treatises. In this case, for example, nothing is said in GA about the heart ‘beating and moving as though it were alive’. As we saw, however, GA II stresses that in the development of live-bearing animals, the heart is first to be formed, is ensouled from the start, and is the source of development for all the other parts—a much more ‘theory-laden’ characterization that stresses the heart’s causal role in development. And because of the organizational structure of GA, much of what is said in his discussion of the live-bearing animals (those that are ‘more complete’ when they are born) is assumed to apply to animals that lay eggs (that are ‘less complete’ when born).

Recall the stunningly accurate discussion of the head and eyes of the four day old chick embryo in HA (in section 5.1, above). This is not discussed in GA III 2; however in GA II 6, in a long discussion of early organ formation in live-bearing animals, Aristotle has a good deal to say on the subject:

What happens concerning the eyes of animals presents a problem. For from the beginning, whether in land animals, swimmers or flyers, they appear very large and yet they are among the last of the parts to be completed and in the mean time contract in size. This is because the sense organs of the eyes are, as with the other sense organs, on channels; but while those for touch and taste are simply bodily, or some part of the body of animals, and those for smell and hearing are channels connected to the air outside and are full of connate pneuma…the eyes alone have a proper sensory body. (743b33–744a6)

The full explanation goes on much longer, but we need not follow it out for the purposes of making two important points about the relationship of GA to HA. The first is that the organization of GA dictates that for the explanation of facts of wide generality such as this one, we must look in book II—notice that he claims that this explanation for the large size of eyes early in development and for their subsequent contraction applies to all land, air and water animals. The second point to be stressed is the relentlessly causal/explanatory focus of the GA discussion, a feature (properly) completely absent in the corresponding discussions in HA. As impressive as the descriptive accuracy of the embryological passage cited earlier from HA is, we again need to remember what is absent from that discussion. For the equally impressive embryological theory, the reader of Aristotle’s biology must turn to the Generation of Animals.

6. A Concluding Puzzle

This entry on Aristotle’s biology and its philosophy closes with a puzzle about the organization of his biological works when compared with the remainder of the Aristotelian corpus. I began by noting that it is a fundamental aspect of Aristotle’s theory of science that investigation proceeds from a stage where one establishes the existence of the things being studied and the facts about them to a stage where the focus is on causal explanations by reference to the natures and essences of those things. It seems clear that the biological works honor this distinction, and do so self-consciously. Yet Aristotle never suggests, in the Posterior Analytics or anywhere else, that these stages should be represented by distinct treatises devoted to the same subject. Indeed, in no other domain does Aristotle do this: whether we look to meteorology, cosmology, psychology, ethics, drama or rhetoric, we find single treatises presenting both the facts and their explanation. Nor can this puzzle be easily dismissed as an artifact of later editing—as I have pointed out a number of times, these treatises have a most interesting and consistent pattern of cross-referencing. The treatises that report the results of causal investigations regularly refer to HA (and the dissections) for more detail regarding the facts being explained; the HA, in contrast, never refers to the causal treatises. Moreover, the striking avoidance in the Historia Animalium of all of the concepts associated with definition and explanation cannot reasonably be laid at the feet of some imagined later editor. We are left, then, to ponder what it was about the investigation of animals that led Aristotle to take a methodological distinction regarding stages of investigation and reify it in methodologically distinct treatises devoted to these different stages.


Selected Texts, Translations, Commentaries

  • Balme, D. M., 1991, Aristotle. History of Animals, Books VII–X, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 1992, Aristotle. De Partibus Animalium I and De Generatione Animalium I (with passages from II. 1–3) With a Report on Recent Work and an Additional Bibliography by A. Gotthelf, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2002, Aristotle: Historia Animalium, Volume I, Books I-X Text (prepared for publication by A. Gotthelf), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Carbone, A., 2002, Aristotele: Le Parti degli Animali, Milano: Biblioteca Universale Rizzoli.
  • Drossaart Lulofs, H. J., 1965, Aristotelis De Generatione Animalium, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Düring, I., 1943/1980 repr., Aristotle’s De Partibus Animalium: Critical and Literary Commentaries, New York: Garland Publishing.
  • Epstein, K., 2019, Aristoteles: Historia Animalium Buch VIII und IX, Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • Kullmann, W., 2007, Aristoteles: Über die Teile der Lebewesen, Berlin: Akademie Verlag.
  • Lanza, D., Vegetti, M., 1971, Aristotele, Opere Biologiche, Torino: UTET.
  • Le Blond, J. M., 1945, Aristote, philosophe de la vie: Le livre premier du traité sur les Parties des Animaux. Paris: Aubier.
  • Lennox, J. G., 2001a, Aristotle: On the Parts of Animals, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Louis, P., 1956, Les parties des animaux, Paris: Budé.
  • –––, 1961, De la génération des animaux, Paris: Budé.
  • Ogle, W., 1882/1987, Aristotle on the Parts of Animals. New York: Garland.
  • Peck. A. L., 1961, Aristotle: Parts of Animals (introduction, text, translation), Loeb Classical Library. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 1963, Aristotle: Generation of Animals (introduction, text, translation), Loeb Classical Library. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 1965, Aristotle: Historia Animalium, Books I-III (introduction, text, translation), Loeb Classical Library, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 1970, Aristotle: Historia Animalium, Books IV-VI (introduction, text, translation), Loeb Classical Library, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Pellegrin, P., 2011, Aristote: Les Parties des Animaux, Paris: GF Flammarion.
  • –––, 2017, Aristote: Histoire des Animaux, Paris: GF Flammarion.
  • Primavesi, O. and K. Corcilius eds., 2018, Aristoteles De motu animalium: Über die Bewegung der Lebenwesen (Greek Text and German Translation), Hamburg: Felix Meiner Verlag.
  • Rapp, C. and O. Primavesi eds., 2020, Aristotle’s De Motu Animalium (Symposium Aristotelicum, with Greek Text and English Translation), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Ross, W. D., 1949, Aristotle’s Prior and Posterior Analytics: A Revised Text with Introduction and Commentary, Oxford: The Clarendon Press.
  • Schneiders, S., 2019, Aristoteles: Historia Animalium Buch VIII und IX, Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • Whitteridge, G., 1981, William Harvey: Disputations touching The Generation of Animals, Oxford: Blackwell Scientific Publications.

Secondary Sources on Aristotle’s Biology

  • Anagnostopoulos, G. (ed.), 2009, A Companion to Aristotle, Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell.
  • Balme, D. M., 1961, “Aristotle’s Use of Differentiae in Zoology,” in S. Mansion (ed.), Aristote e les problèmes de méthode, Louvain: Publications Universitaires de Louvain, pp. 195–212.
  • –––, 1987a, “The Place of Biology in Aristotle’s Philosophy,” in Gotthelf & Lennox 1987, pp. 9–20.
  • –––, 1987b, “Aristotle’s Use of Division and Differentiae,” in Gotthelf & Lennox 1987, pp. 69–89.
  • –––, 1987c, “Aristotle’s biology was not essentialist,” in Gotthelf & Lennox 1987, pp. 291–312.
  • –––, 1990, “Matter in definition: a reply to G. E. R. Lloyd,” in Devereux & Pellegrin 1990, pp. 49–54.
  • Bartos, H. and C. G. King (eds.), 2020, Heat, Pneuma, and Soul in Ancient Philosophy and Science, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Bolton, R., 1987, “Definition and Scientific Method in Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics and Generation of Animals,” in Gotthelf & Lennox 1987, pp. 120–66.
  • –––, 2010, “Biology and metaphysics in Aristotle”, in Lennox and Bolton, pp. 30–55.
  • Bowen, A. (ed.), 1991, Science and Philosophy in Classical Greece, New York: Garland Press.
  • Bronstein, D., 2016, Aristotle on Knowledge and Learning: The Posterior Analytics, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Charles, D., 1988, “Aristotle on Hypothetical Necessity and Irreducibility,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 69: 1–45.
  • –––, 1990, “Meaning, natural kinds and natural history,” in Devereux & Pellegrin 1990, pp. 145–67.
  • –––, 2000, Aristotle on Meaning and Essence, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • ––– (ed.), 2010, Definition in Greek Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2012, “Teleological Causation,” in Shields 2012, pp. 226–266.
  • Code, A., 1986, “Soul as Efficient Cause in Aristotle’s Embryology,” Philosophical Topics, 15: 51–60.
  • –––, 1997, “The Priority of Final Causes over Efficient Causes in Aristotle’s Parts of Animals,” in Kullmann und Föllinger 1997, pp. 127–144.
  • Connell, S. M., 2016, Aristotle on Female Animals: A Study of the Generation of Animals, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • ––– (ed.), 2021, The Cambridge Companion to Aristotle’s Biology, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Cooper, J. M., 1988, “Metaphysics in Aristotle’s Embryology,” Proceedings of the Cambridge Philological Society, 214: 14–41.
  • Depew, D., 2008, “Consequence Etiology and Biological Teleology in Aristotle and Darwin,” Studies in the History and Philosophy of Biological and Biomedical Sciences, 39: 379–390.
  • Detel, W., 1999, “Aristotle on Zoological Explanation,” Philosophical Topics, 25: 43–68.
  • Devereux, D. & Pellegrin, P. (eds.), 1990, Biologie, Logique et Métaphysique chez Aristote, Paris: Éditions du CNRS.
  • Ebrey, D., 2015, Theory and Practice in Aristotle’s Natural Science, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Falcon, A. and D. Lefebvre eds., 2018, Aristotle’s Generation of Animals: A Critical Guide, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Föllinger. S. (ed.), 2010, Was ist ‘Leben’? Aristoteles’ Anschauungen zur Entstehung und Funktionsweise von Leben, Stuttgart: Franz Steiner Verlag.
  • –––, 2010, “Das Problem des Leben in Aristoteles’ Embryologie,” in Föllinger 2010, pp. 225–236.
  • Fortenbaugh, W. W., & Sharples, R. W. (eds.), 1988, Theophrastean Studies, New Brunswick: Rutgers University Press.
  • Furth, M., 1988, Substance, Form and Psyche: An Aristotelean Metaphysics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Gelber, J., 2010, “Form and Inheritance in Aristotle’s Embryology,” Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy XXXIX (Winter): 183–212.
  • –––, 2015, “Are Facts about Matter Primitive?,” in Ebrey 2015, pp. 46–60.
  • –––, 2015, “Aristotle on Essence and Habitat,” Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 48: 267–293.
  • –––, 2018, “Two Ways of Being for an End”, Phronesis, 63: 64–86.
  • Gill, M. L., 1989, “Aristotle on Matters of Life and Death,” Proceedings of the Boston Area Colloquium in Ancient Philosophy, 4: 187–205.
  • –––, 1997, “Material Necessity and Meteorology IV 12,” in Kullmann and Föllinger 1997, pp. 145–162.
  • Gotthelf, A. (ed.), 1985a, Aristotle on Nature and Living Things: philosophical and historical studies presented to David M. Balme on his seventieth birthday, Pittsburgh: Mathesis.
  • –––, 1985b, “Notes towards a study of substance and essence in Aristotle’s Parts of Animals II-IV,” in Gotthelf 1985a, pp. 27–54.
  • –––, 1987a, “First principles in Aristotle’s Parts of Animals,” in Gotthelf & Lennox 1987, pp. 167–98.
  • –––, 1987b, “Aristotle’s Conception of Final Causality,” in Gotthelf & Lennox 1987, pp. 204–242.
  • –––, 1988, “Historiae I: Plantarum e Animalium,” in Fortenbaugh & Sharples 1988, pp. 100–135.
  • –––, 1997a, “The elephant’s nose: further reflections on the axiomatic structure of biological explanation in Aristotle,” in Kullmann & Föllinger 1997, pp. 85–96.
  • –––, 1997b, “Division and Explanation in Aristotle’s Parts of Animals,” in Günther & Rengakos 1997, pp. 215–230.
  • –––, 2012, Teleology, First Principles, and Scientific Method in Aristotle’s Biology, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Gotthelf, A. & Lennox, J. G. (eds.), 1987, Philosophical Issues in Aristotle’s Biology, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Günther, H.-C. & Rengakos, A. (eds.) 1997, Beiträge zur antiken Philosophie: Festschrift für Wolfgang Kullmann, Stuttgart: Franz Steiner.
  • Henry, D., 2003, “Themistius and Spontaneous Generation in Aristotle’s Metaphysics,” Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 24: 183–208.
  • –––, 2006a, “Understanding Aristotle’s Reproductive Hylomorphism,” Apeiron, 39: 269–300.
  • –––, 2006b, “Aristotle on the Mechanisms of Inheritance,” Journal of the History of Biology, 39: 425–455.
  • –––, 2008, “Organismal Natures,” Apeiron: A Journal for Ancient philosophy and science, 41: 47–74.
  • –––, 2011, “Aristotle’s Pluralistic Realism,” The Monist, 94(2): 198–222.
  • –––, 2013,“Optimality and Teleology in Aristotle’s Natural Science,” Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, XLV (Winter): 225–263.
  • –––, 2019, Aristotle on Matter, Form, and Moving Causes: The Hylomorphic Theory of Substantial Generation, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2021, “Essence and Definition in Aristotle’s Parts of Animals,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, first online 02 Mar 2021 doi:10.1080/09608788.2021.1881442
  • Johnson, M., 2005, Aristotle on Teleology, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Keil, G. and N. Kreft (eds.), 2019, Aristotle’s Anthropology, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Korobili, G. and R. Lo Presti (eds.), 2021, Nutrition and Nutritive Soul in Aristotle and Aristotelianism, Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • Kullmann, W., 1974, Wissenschaft und Methode, Berlin: Walter de Gruyter.
  • Kullmann, W. and Föllinger, S. (eds.), 1997, Aristotelische Biologie, Stuttgart: Franz Steiner.
  • Labbarrière, J-L., 2004, Language, vie politiques et mouvement des animaux: Études aristotéliciennes, Paris: Librairie Philosophique J. Vrin.
  • Lennox, J., 1990, “Notes on David Charles on HA,” in Devereux & Pellegrin 1990, pp. 169–183.
  • –––, 2001b, Aristotle’s Philosophy of Biology: Studies in the Origins of Life Science, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2001c, “Aristotle on the Unity and Disunity of Science,” International Studies in Philosophy of Science, 15 (2): 133–144.
  • –––, 2005, “Getting a Science Going: Aristotle on Entry Level Kinds,” in Wolters & Carrier 2005, pp. 87–100.
  • –––, 2009, “Form, Essence, and Explanation in Aristotle’s Biology,” in Anagnostopoulos 2009, pp. 348–367.
  • –––, 2010a, “Bios and Explanatory Unity in Aristotle’s Biology,” in Charles 2010, pp. 329–355.
  • –––, 2010b, “The unity and purpose of On the Parts of Animals I,” in Lennox and Bolton 2010, pp. 56–77.
  • –––, 2011, “Aristotle on Norms of Inquiry,” HOPOS: The Journal of the International Society for the History of Philosophy of Science, 1: 23–46.
  • –––, 2012, “The Complexity of Aristotle’s Study of Animals,” in Shields 2012, pp. 287–305.
  • –––, 2017, “An Aristotelian Philosophy of Biology: Form, Function, and Development”, Acta Philosophica, I: 33–51.
  • –––, 2018, “Aristotle on the Origins of Zoology”, in Cambridge History of Science, Vol. 1, A. Jones and L. Taub (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 215–237.
  • –––, 2020, “Aristotle on the Unity of the Nutritive and Reproductive Functions”, Phronesis, 65(4): 414–466. (Co–authored with Cameron Coates)
  • –––, 2021, “Biology and Cosmology in Aristotle”, in Cosmology and Biology in Ancient Philosophy: From Thales to Avicenna, R. Salles (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 109–130.
  • –––, 2021, Aristotle on Inquiry: Erotetic Frameworks and Domain Specific Norms, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Lennox, J. and Bolton, R. (eds.), 2010, Being, Nature, and Life in Aristotle, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Leroi, A. M., 2014, The Lagoon: How Aristotle Invented Science, London: Bloomsbury Circus.
  • Lesher, J. (ed.), 2010, From Inquiry to Demonstrative Knowledge: New Essays on Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics, Kelowna BC: Academic Printing and Publishing.
  • Leunissen, M., 2010a, Explanation and Teleology in Aristotle’s Science of Nature, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2010b, “Aristotle’s Syllogistic Model of Knowledge and the Biological Sciences: Demonstrating Natural Processes,” in Lesher 2010, pp. 31–60.
  • –––, 2010c, “Nature as a good House-keeper: Secondary Teleology and Material Necessity in Aristotle’s Biology”, Apeiron, 43(4): 117–142.
  • –––, 2017, From Natural Character to Moral Virtue in Aristotle, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Leunissen, M. and Gotthelf, A., 2010, “What’s Teleology Got to Do with It: A Reinterpretation of Aristotle’s Generation of Animals V,” Phronesis, 55: 325–356.
  • Lloyd, G. E. R., 1987, “Empirical research in Aristotle’s biology,” in Gotthelf & Lennox 1987, pp. 53–64.
  • –––, 1990, “Aristotle’s zoology and his metaphysics. The status quaestionis. A critical review of some recent theories,” in Devereux & Pellegrin 1990, pp. 7–36.
  • –––, 1996, Aristotelian Explorations, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Marcos, A., 1996, Aristóteles y Otros Animales, Barcelona: Promociones y Publicaciones Universitarias.
  • Mayhew, R., 2004, The Female in Aristotle’s Biology, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Mingucci, G. 2015, La fisiologia del pensiero in Aristotele, Bologna: Il Mulino.
  • Morel, P-M., 2007, De la matiére á l’action aristote et le problème du vivant, Paris: Librairie Philosophique J. Vrin.
  • Owen, R., 1992, The Hunterian Lectures in Comparative Anatomy (May and June 1837), Phillip Reid Sloan (ed.), Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Pellegrin, P., 1986, Aristotle’s Classification of Animals: Biology and the Conceptual Unity of the Aristotelian Corpus, trans. by Anthony Preus, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Quarantotto, D., 2005, Causa Finale, Sostanza, Essenza in Aristotele, Napoli: Bibliopolis.
  • Shields, C., 2012, The Oxford Handbook of Aristotle, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Stavrianeas, S., 2009, “Spontaneous Generation in Aristotle’s Biology,” Rhizai: A Journal of Ancient Philosophy and Science, 5: 303–338.
  • Tipton, J.A., 2014, Philosophical Biology in Aristotle’s Parts of Animals, Heidelberg: Springer.
  • Wolters, G. & Carrier, M. (eds.), 2005, Homo Sapiens und Homo Faber: epistemische und technische Rationalität in Antike und Gegenwart, Festschrift für Jürgen Mittelstrass, Berlin: De Gruyter.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Copyright © 2021 by
James Lennox

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free