Notes to Aristotle’s Biology

1. For an inspiring introduction to Aristotle the biologist written from the perspective of a practicing evolutionary developmental biologist, see Leroi 2014.

2. There are a number of other examples from natural science, including biological examples, in chapters 13–18 of book II especially. Most of these are discussed in the first three essays in Lennox 2001b; cf. 11–14, 30–32, 47–52, 82–90. See as well Bolton 1987, Charles 2000, Leunissen 2010b and Lennox 2021, ch.2.

3. This becomes clear in the closing lines of chapter 16: “Hence in these cases the middle term and what it is explanatory of must be equal and must convert. For example, why do trees shed their leaves? If it is because of solidification of the moisture, then if a tree sheds it leaves solidification must hold, and if solidification holds—not of anything whatever but of a tree—then the tree must shed its leaves (98b35–39).” Since the whole point of the example is that not all trees shed their leaves but only those with broad leaves, ‘tree’ here must stand in for ‘trees with broad leaves’.

4. For a penetrating analysis of the relationship between definition and demonstration in the Posterior Analytics and a somewhat different account of its relation to the biological works, see Charles 2000. On the issue of the 'fit' between the norms of his general philosophy of science and his biological theory and practice, a good recent discussion can be found in Leunissen 2010a and Lennox 2021.

5. Compare HA I 6, 490b7–491a6, II 15, 505b26–506a10, and IV 8, 534b12–15.

6. Compare Balme 1987b; Lennox 1990, 2005; Gotthelf 1985b, 1987a, 1988 and Charles 1990, 2000.

7. For a similar use of historia that generalizes this point to ‘any craft or science’, see APr. I 30, 46a27–27. For further discussion see Lennox 2001b 43–46 and Lennox 2021, ch. 3.

8. For quite distinct interpretations of this chapter in relation to the Posterior Analytics II, compare Charles 2000, 312–316 with Lennox 2001c and Lennox 2005, 90–100.

9. This is a highly schematic overview. For a more detailed account, look at Gotthelf 1988; Lennox 2001b, ch. 2. Aristotle's distinction between blooded and bloodless animals corresponds closely to our distinction between vertebrate and invertebrate animals. I am referring to the books of HA according to the numbering found in the manuscripts, rather than the reordering of Theodorus Gaza in 1476, who moved book IX, on human generation, to follow books V and VI on generation in other animals. The Gaza numbering was adopted by all modern editions before Balme 1991, 2002. The defense of returning to the manuscript ordering can be found in the introductions to those editions.

10. For work on this subject, each reaching somewhat different results, compare Bolton, 1987; Charles, 2000, ch. 12; Gotthelf, 1997b; Kullmann, 1974; Lennox 2001b, ch. 1; 2005.

11. Compare William Harvey in his Exercitationes de Generatione Animalium: “At that time, the foetus in the egg passes from the life of a plant to that of an animal. Then already the limbus or hem of the colliquament begins to turn purple and is outlined with a tiny line of blood, and almost in its centre there leaps a capering bloody point which is yet so exceedingly small that in its diastole it flashes like the smallest spark of fire, and immediately upon its systole it quite escapes the eye and disappears.” (Harvey 1981, 96)

Harvey, in fact, disagrees with Aristotle's interpretation of the observations: “I cannot agree with Aristotle either when he maintains that the heart is this first genital and animate particle. For the truth is, I am persuaded, that this prerogative is due only to the blood, for the blood it is which is first seen in generation. And that not only in an egg, but in every foetus and animal conception whatsoever, as shall soon plainly appear.” (Harvey 1981, 241)

12. For valuable, philosophically oriented, discussions of the argument of GA II, see Bolton 1987, Charles 1988, Code 1986, Gotthelf 1987b, Henry 2003, 2006a, 2008, Gelber 2010, and a number of the essays in Falcon and Lefebvre 2018.

Copyright © 2021 by
James Lennox

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