When is political authority legitimate? This is one of the fundamental questions of political philosophy. Depending on how one understands political authority this question may be the same as, when is coercion by the state legitimate? Or, when do we have duties to obey the state? Or, when and who has a right to rule through the state?
This entry is concerned with the philosophical issues that arise in the justification of political authority. First, this entry will examine some of the main conceptual issues that arise relating to political authority. What do we mean by political authority? This entry distinguishes political authority from political power, and the idea of morally legitimate political authority from descriptive ideas of authority. It also distinguishes between authority in the sense of morally justified coercion and authority in the sense of capacity to impose duties on others and finally from authority as right to rule. Further distinctions concern the nature of the duties that political authority imposes on subjects.
The main part of the entry (section 4) concerns the nature and merits of different accounts of the legitimacy of political authority. Under what conditions is political authority legitimate? This entry discusses five different views of the legitimacy of political authority. It discusses the instrumentalist theory according to which authority is legitimate to the extent that it gets people to do what they already have a duty to do. It discusses the consent theory of authority according to which authority is legitimate only if the subjects have consented to it. It discusses the theory advanced by John Rawls that authority is legitimate if and only if it acts in accord with principles the subjects agree to. It discusses Ronald Dworkin's view according to which legitimate political authority is akin to the basis of obligations to friendships, families and other associations. Finally it discusses the democratic conception of authority according to which the democratic assembly has legitimate political authority within certains limits because it treats every citizen as an equal in the process of making law.
- 1. Legitimate Authority, de facto Authority and Political Power
- 2. Conceptions of the Legitimacy of Political Authority
- 3. The Puzzle of Political Authority: Philosophical Anarchism
- 4. A Second Form of Philosophical Anarchism
- 4.1 The Consent Theory of Political Authority: The Natural Right to Freedom Argument
- 4.2 The Instrumentalist Critique of the Natural Right Argument
- 4.3 The Consent Theory: The Options Argument
- 4.4 The Instrumentalist Critique of the Option and Natural Right Arguments
- 4.5 The Consent Theory of Political Authority: The Argument from Personal Reasons
- 4.6 Consent Theory: The Argument from Disagreement
- 4.7 The Problems of Irrational, Immoral Failures of Consent
- 4.8 Tacit Consent
- 4.9 The Humean Attack on Tacit Consent
- 4.10 How Can Tacit Consent Be A Basis of Political Authority?
- 4.11 The Basic Objection of Consent Theorists to Tacit Consent
- 4.12 Normative Consent
- 5. Reasonable Consensus Conceptions of Legitimate Political Authority
- 6. Political Authority as Grounded in Associative Obligations
- 7. A Democratic Conception of Legitimate Political Authority
- 8. Legitimate Political Authority in International Institutions
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Legitimate Authority, de facto Authority and Political Power
Let us start with the distinctions between political authority as a normative notion (or morally legitimate authority) and political authority as a non-normative notion (or de facto authority) and between political authority in either of these senses and political power. To say that a state has authority in the normative sense is to say something normative about the relationship between the state and its subjects. This is the relationship that we will concentrate on in what follows.
For most contemporary theorists to say that the state has authority in the descriptive sense is to say that the state maintains public order and that it issues commands and makes rules that are generally obeyed by subjects because many of them (or some important subset of them such as the officials of the state) think of it as having authority in the normative sense (Hart 1961) (Some thinkers have understood the idea of legitimate authority in this descriptive sense as well (Weber 1970); in what follows, we will use the term “legitimate authority” in a normative sense only.) We should note here that the attitudinal component of de facto authority is not accepted by everyone. For both Thomas Hobbes and John Austin, political authority in the de facto sense simply amounts to the capacity of a person or group of persons to maintain public order and secure the obedience of most people by issuing commands backed by sanctions. Subjects need not think of the authority as a legitimate authority, on this account.
Also, the distinction between de facto and morally legitimate authority is not universally accepted or at least it is not accepted that the distinction makes a difference. Hobbes insists that any entity capable of performing the function of de facto authority is necessarily justified and deserves the obedience of the de facto subjects (Hobbes 1668). But most have argued that there is an important distinction between de facto authority and legitimate authority. We will explore in what follows the conceptions political and legal philosophers have had of legitimate political authority.
De facto authority, on anyone's account, is distinct from political power. The latter is concerned with the state's or any agent's ability to get others to act in ways that they desire even when the subject does not want to do what the agent wants him to do. Political power does not require any kind of pro attitude toward the agent on the part of the subject, nor does it require that the state is actually successful at securing public order. It operates completely in the realm of threats and offers. No doubt for the state to have de facto authority or legitimate authority requires that the state have the power to compel those subjects who do not wish to go along. This is necessary for the state's ability to maintain public order and to assure those who do see it as an authority that it will be able to do what it is supposed to do.
1.1 Legitimate Political Authority: Some Conceptual Distinctions
The rubric under which the normative notion of political authority is normally known is the idea of legitimate political authority. In this section, we will review a number of different ideas that have been understood to come under this idea of legitimate political authority.
It is important here to note the distinction between theoretical and practical authority. A theoretical authority in some area of intellectual inquiry is one that is an expert in that area. Theoretical authorities operate primarily by giving advice to the layman, which advice the layman is free to take or not. The judgments of theoretical authorities give people reasons for belief while the judgments of political authorities are normally thought to give people reasons for action. Theoretical authorities do not normally impose duties on others, although they might give advice on what a person's duty is.
Most theorists of political authority view it as a species of practical authority rather than theoretical authority, though this view is not held by all . Those who hold that political authority is a species of practical authority maintain that political authorities issue directives that give people reasons for action and not reason for belief. The thought is that political authorities impose duties on their subjects and thereby give them reasons for action. These theorists argue that it is the function of political authorities to get people to act in certain ways so as to solve various collective action problems such as a variety of different types of coordination problems, assurance problems and free rider problems. There have been some dissenting views on this of late. Some have argued that the account of practical reason required by the idea that political authority is a practical authority is incoherent and so they have opted for the idea that political authorities, when legitimate, are theoretical authorities regarding the existence and nature of the duties and reasons for action that people have (Hurd 2001). Since this view is unusual this entry will concentrate on conceptions of political authority that treat it as a species of practical authority.
The rest of this section will discuss a number of different analyses of political authority. There are three basic types of conceptual account of legitimate political authority: legitimate political authority as justified coercion, legitimate political authority as the capacity to impose duties, and legitimate political authority as the right to rule. First, many people have understood legitimate political authority as a political authority that is justified in coercing the subjects of its authority. The notion of justification here is a moral one. The thought is that a political authority might have moral justification in coercing those who come under its authority. This is a particularly thin conception of legitimate authority. For instance, a state can have this kind of authority when it legitimately occupies a territory as a result of a just war. It is morally justified in coercing the inhabitants of the occupied territory.
The moral justification of a group of people in coercing others may be more or less systematic. For instance, a group of people may be morally justified in engaging in just a few actions of coercing others. Or a group may be morally justified in engaging in coercion more generally as in the case of a morally justified military occupation.
This notion of authority need not involve duties on the part of the population that is being coerced. Indeed, they may be justified in trying to escape coercion. This could be the case in a military occupation of a country that is justified on the grounds that it is necessary to stop a third country from engaging in morally indefensible aggression. This conception of morally justified coercion therefore involves no conception of a moral community among persons. In this first conception of authority as justified coercion, the authority may not even issue commands let alone make laws. It may simply justifiably issue threats and offers. The difference between legitimate and illegitimate political authority on this account is that the actions of the illegitimate political authority are not morally justified while the coercive actions of the legitimate authority are justified.
A second conceptual account of legitimate political authority implies that those over whom authority is exercised have some kind of duty with regard to the authority. Or the authority has the moral power to impose duties on the subjects. This duty can be merely a duty not to interfere with the activities of the political authority. Or it can involve the more significant duty to obey the authority. This conception of authority involves the authority and the subjects in a weak kind of moral relationship. The authority is justified in issuing the commands and attempting to force people to comply with the commands while the subjects have some kind of duty not to interfere with these activities or comply with the commands.
The duty of the subjects need not be owed to the authority. It may merely be that the subjects have a duty to obey where that duty is not owed to anyone in particular or where that duty is owed ultimately to people who are not the authority. For instance, if one thinks that one is likely better to respect others' rights by complying with the authority's directives, the action is ultimately owed to those others.
Some have stressed the idea that the holding of justified political authority may only involve a duty on the part of others not to interfere with the political authority and they argue that the duty of non-interference is much weaker than a duty to obey (Morris 1998). It is not clear how great the difference between these two duties is in practice at least as far as citizens are concerned. For many cases of failing to obey an authority are cases of interference with the authority. An analogy may be helpful here. If one is playing a game of baseball with an umpire and one refuses to comply with the directives of the umpire, one is in effect interfering with the umpire's carrying out of his duties by not complying with the directives of the umpire.
While a duty to obey seems to imply a duty not to interfere, there are cases of duties of non-interference that are not duties to obey, such as the duties of foreign powers not to interfere in the activities of a legitimate state. Furthermore, the duty to obey is clearly the more contentious issue in the question of authority since it requires that one make one's actions conform to the specific directives of the authority.
A third conceptual account of authority or set of conceptions of legitimate authority involves the idea that the authority has a right to rule. Strictly speaking, an authority can have a right to rule without the subjects having a duty to comply. The authority may have a “justification” right to rule (Ladenson 1980). This means that the authority has a permission to issue commands and make rules and coerce others to comply and its possession of this right is justified on moral grounds. This “justification right” is not much more than the first notion we discussed above.
A more robust right to rule includes a duty owed to the authority on the part of the subjects not to interfere with the activities of the authority. The subjects owe it to the authority not to interfere with it. This is connected with the right of the authority to rule. Finally, an authority can have a right to rule in the sense that it may issue commands and make rules and require subjects to comply with these rules and commands and the subjects have duties, which they owe to the authority, to comply with the rules and commands.
The distinction between a right to rule that is correlated with a duty not to interfere and one that is correlated with a duty to comply comes in handy when we consider the difference between the duties owed to a legitimate political authority by the subjects of that authority and the duties owed to it by other states and persons who are not subject to that authority. A state with a right to rule in the strongest sense may be owed obedience by its subjects but it is usually owed only a duty of non-interference by those who are not a part of the state such as other states and persons in other states. It is worthwhile drawing a distinction here between internal legitimacy and external legitimacy (Buchanan 2004).
It is not a useful aim of philosophers or political thinkers to determine which one of these conceptual accounts of political authority is the right one. Each one of them grasps a kind of legitimacy of political authority that is worth taking into account and distinguishing from the others. The idea of legitimate authority as justified coercive power is a suitable way of getting at the authority of hostile but justified occupation powers. And the idea of legitimate authority as an authority that has a right to rule over subjects who owe obedience to the authority and that has a right not to be interfered with by foreigners is surely an importantly distinct and perhaps ideal type of authority, which is rarely implemented. The kind of legitimacy that is merely correlated with duties to obey or not to interfere is a useful intermediate category between those two.
What is worth noting is that the idea of legitimate authority as a right to rule in the strong sense described above does describe a kind of ideal of political community. The idea of legitimate authority as a right to rule to which citizens owe obedience gives each citizen a moral duty to obey, which it owes to the authority. So this form of legitimacy is grounded in a moral relationship between the parties that goes beyond the fact that they are fellow human beings. The establishment of a robust right to rule depends on the fact that each citizen rightly takes as a reason for obedience that it has a moral duty owed to the authority. Since a legitimate political authority with a right to rule is predicated on the fact that citizens have moral reasons grounded in the right to rule to obey it, the right to rule engages citizens at a deep moral level. The exercise of political power is founded in a moral relationship between moral persons that recognizes and affirms the moral personality of each citizen.
By contrast, a society in which it is merely the case that coercion is justified is one in which the subjects are permissibly treated as means to morally defensible purposes. The subjects do not owe anything to the authority or have any duties to obey it. So, in the case of an authority as merely justified coercion, the subjects' reasons for obedience are merely their desires to avoid punishment. And that is the level at which the authority deals with them. Such a society does not engage the subjects as moral persons, it merely attempts to administer the activities of persons so as to bring about in a morally justified way a desirable outcome. At the extreme, a prisoner of war camp or even a hostile but justified military occupation gives the authorities justification for coercion. The people who are subjected to that treatment often have no duties to obey and they do not regard each other or the authorities as members of a unified political community. They are merely fellow human beings. To the extent that a political society is best when it involves the mutual recognition and affirmation of the moral status of each person, the kind of society that involves merely justified coercion of some by others is a pale shadow.
And the intermediate form of political authority is incomplete in the respect in which the exercise of political power involves the mutual recognition and affirmation of the status of each person. It is the case that subjects have duties but those duties are not essentially connected to anything in the authority. The subjects instead act more in accordance with reasons that are independent of the authority when they obey the authority. So to the extent that a society ruled by an authority that has the right to rule is an ideal of a moral community, the other types of authority are lesser forms of a morally ideal political community.
1.2 Political Authority and Different Kinds of Duties of Obedience
To the extent that a duty of obedience is included in the concept of political authority, there can be different forms of obedience on the part of subjects. This implies a very distinct dimension of political authority. When a political authority issues a command and the subject has a duty to obey, what is the nature of this duty? One might have a duty to obey a command merely because it commands the subject to do something that is just and any alternative action would be unjust. Here the duty to obey would depend on the content of the command. Commands that are unjust or perhaps even commands that require actions that are not exclusively just may not involve duties at all.
The commands of a legitimate political authority are usually thought to involve something more than this. The duty of the subject is grounded not in the content of the command itself but in the nature of the source issuing the command. The duty to obey is then automatically generated when the command is issued by the appropriate authority and when it has the right form and provenance. In this respect, the duty to obey is content independent or independent of the content of the particular command. One must obey because one has been commanded and not because of the particular content of the command. One must do it because one has been told to do it. This kind of duty seems to be the most central kind of duty involved in the duty to obey. It is the idea that one must obey the authority because it is the authority. It does not imply of itself that one owes the duty of obedience to the authority so it does not imply that there is a right to rule on the part of the authority.
Here we must distinguish a duty that is owed to the authority and a duty that is merely the result of the authoritative command. The duty that is owed to the authority is grounded in the fact that the authority possesses a feature that gives it a right to command and that it is in virtue of that right that one owes obedience. The idea is that there is something just in itself that the authority be obeyed.
One other distinction that is worth making in this connection is the distinction between a preemptive duty to obey and a duty that is not preemptive. A preemptive duty is one that replaces other duties. It puts other duties out of play when it comes into play. A preemptive duty is not weighed against other duties that might relate to what one is thinking of doing. Of course, a preemptive duty may not preempt all other considerations, its preemption may operate only with a limited scope and thus preempt only some limited set of considerations.
An example of a preemptive duty is the case of a promissory obligation. If I have agreed to do something for you and I suddenly see some pleasurable alternative to fulfilling my obligation, most people would think that I ought to exclude the consideration of pleasure altogether from my deliberations even though the pleasure would be a consideration had I made no promise. It is simply not something that I can legitimately weigh in the balance against the promissory obligation. So if an authority issues a command and the duty to obey is a preemptive duty, then the subject does not weigh the other duties that might otherwise apply to him in the balance with the preemptive duty. The preemptive duty simply excludes the other duties. By contrast, if a duty is not preemptive, then when it comes time to comply with it, one must balance it with other duties that weigh for and against acting in accord with the duty.
Most think that the duties associated with authority are content independent in the sense that one must do what one is told even if one is skeptical about the merits of the command. There is some skepticism, however, about the claim that legitimate political authorities impose preemptive duties on subjects. These people have questioned the rationality of preemptive duties or reasons for action. Surely, there are times when what appear to be preempted considerations all add up to a consideration that outweighs the preempting consideration. How can this be understood on the preemption model? Some have argued that authoritative commands simply give especially weighty content independent duties, which can be balanced against other duties (Shapiro 2002). The discussion of instrumentalism will say a bit more about these criticisms below.
The most demanding notion of authority is the idea of a political authority that has a right to rule that correlates with a duty to obey that is owed to the authority and that is a content independent and preemptive duty.
1.3 Political Authority without Duties of Obedience
Most who think of legitimate authority as a kind of moral power to change the moral situation of others think of it as creating duties in others. And this is certainly the most prominent and striking exercise of authority. But political authorities do not only create duties in others in and some cases do not purport to create such duties at all. The most prominent instances of this can be found in international institutions. The Security Council of the United Nations exercises authority in a variety of ways: sometimes acting as a kind of legislative body and sometimes acting as a kind of executive body. Its executive authority is its traditional role in international law. But this executive authority is quite distinct from the kind of executive authority we see in the state. The Security Council exercises its executive authority primarily by authorizing actions and not by carrying them out by itself or by requiring them. One way to describe the moral power of the Security Council is that it gives a liberty to states to prosecute wars. It does this against a background of a general prohibition of all war except in the case of self-defense. It suspends that prohibition for certain states. It does not require them to act, it only permits them to act in a warlike way. This is because the agent of enforcement in the international system is a decentralized one.
Furthermore the Dispute Settlement Mechanism of the World Trade Organization functions in very much the same way. The dispute settlement system first determines whether a state has in fact violated its agreements on trade and tariffs with another state. And when it determines this, it permits the plaintiff state to act in a way that would normally be in violation of its agreements. It permits retaliation through the system of tariffs and non-tariff barriers. It cannot require this retaliation.
Hence the two most effective and authoritative institutions in the international system do not impose duties at all in many cases, they exercise a moral power to alter the moral situation of states but the alteration is from duty to permission in many cases. To be sure, they do this against the background of treaties and agreements that have a kind of legislative force and that do purport to impose genuine duties. And there are duties not to interfere with the authorized activity, but the point remains that the primary exercise is one of changing duties to permissions. This may confirm Applebaum's idea that authority need not impose duties.
1.4 The Diversity of Holders of Political Authority
One reason for keeping our minds open to different accounts of political authority is that there are different kinds of political authority. Different accounts may be suitable to different kinds of authority. Indeed, different principles grounding authority may be suitable to different kinds of authority. One thing that is not often enough discussed in treatments of political authority is the fact that there are very different kinds of political authority. Within the state alone there is legislative authority, executive authority, judicial authority, and administrative authority; these different kinds of authority can have distinct sub-branches of authority. And there are political authorities outside of the modern state, namely international institutions. These have a very distinct kind of authority at least in the contemporary world and the authority of these different agencies is grounded in different principles.
As an illustration of different forms of authority for different political entities consider the different parts of the modern state. We might think that a democratic legislative assembly has a genuine right to rule in the sense that citizens owe obedience to it. They might owe this obedience because the assembly pools all the democratic rights of all the citizens and so citizens treat each other as equals by complying with the assembly's directives. But citizens do not owe it to courts to respect their judgments about the law. The courts may create duties but the duties are not owed to them. The same presumably goes for policemen and adminstrators as well. They seem to have moral powers to create duties but these duties are not owed to them. Furthermore, the grounds of authority might be distinct for these two kinds of entities. The democratic conception might provide the basis of the authority of the assembly while the authority of courts and administrators may be more instrumentally grounded.
2. Conceptions of the Legitimacy of Political Authority
Few theorists after Thomas Hobbes and David Hume have argued that there is a general duty to obey the law or that political authority is generally legitimate (Hobbes 1668; Hume 1965). Most theorists have argued that the legitimacy of political authority is one that holds only when the political authority satisfies certain normatively important conditions. What we will review here are some of the main theories that attempt to explain when a political authority has legitimacy.
General theories are theories that identify general properties that virtually any kind of political regime can have that gives them legitimacy. Special theories are ones that mark off particular classes of regimes that have legitimacy or that have a particularly high level of legitimacy. There are really four types of general theory of political authority and then there are a variety of special theories of political authority. The four types of general theory of legitimacy are consent theories, reasonable consensus theories, associative obligation theories and instrumentalist theories. The two historically important forms of special theory in the West have been the Divine Right of Kings theories and democratic theories.
3. The Puzzle of Political Authority: Philosophical Anarchism
At the root of all contemporary discussions of the legitimacy of authority is the problem posed by Robert Paul Wolff concerning the incompatibility of moral autonomy and political authority. The problem is really only connected with the kinds of political authority that imply content independent duties to comply with authoritative commands. The basic idea is that it is incompatible for a subject to comply with the commands of an authority merely because it is the command of the authority and for the subject to be acting morally autonomously. Wolff thinks that each person has a duty to act on the basis of his own moral assessment of right and wrong and has the duty to reflect on what is right and wrong in each particular instance of action. Such a person would be violating his duty to act autonomously if he complies with authoritative commands on grounds that are independent of the content of the commands. So the duty of autonomy is incompatible with the duty of obeying political authority. This is the challenge of philosophical anarchism (Wolff 1970).
The worry is that authority is never legitimate because the kind of obedience associated with authority is inconsistent with the autonomy of the subject. We can see, however, that this worry applies only to certain accounts of authority, which imply duties to obey on the part of the subjects. The account of authority as justified coercion is not affected by this argument nor is the account of legitimate authority consisting of a justification right affected by this worry. Still, most accounts of the nature of authority do imply content independent duties on the part of the subjects. We can see that any content independent duty, whether it is a duty not to interfere with the authority's command or it is a duty to obey the authority, is called into question by this argument.
3.1 Instrumentalism about Legitimate Political Authority
One can see different accounts of the legitimacy of political authority as responses to the anarchist challenge. Let us start with the instrumentalist account of legitimacy. The canonical statement of this notion of legitimate authority is provided by Joseph Raz. He calls it the Normal Justification Thesis. It asserts that “the normal way to establish that a person has authority over another person involves showing that the alleged subject is likely better to comply with reasons which apply to him (other than the alleged authoritative directives) if he accepts the directives of the alleged authority as authoritatively binding and tries to follow them, rather than by trying to follow the reasons which apply to him directly.” (Raz 1986)
This conception of the legitimacy of authority flows from the idea that “authoritative directives should be based on reasons which already independently apply to the subjects of the directives and are relevant to their action in the circumstances covered by the directive” (Raz 1986.) According to Raz, what should guide government decisions about what commands to give subjects is what the subjects already have reason to do. For instance, subjects already have reason to give a fair share of resources for the common good. Authorities merely help them comply with these reasons by establishing an efficient and fair system of taxation. Subjects have reason to defend their fellow countrymen and authorities help them do this by establishing an army in an efficient and fair way. Authorities do these things by issuing commands to subjects that are meant to replace the reasons that already apply to the subjects. Instead of the subject trying to figure out exactly how much he owes and who to give it to by coordinating it with many other people, the authority simply takes over these tasks, determines what the subject has reason to do and expects the subject to take its authoritative command as a reason instead of the reasons that directly apply to the action. An authority does its job well and is therefore legitimate when it enables subjects to act better on the reasons that apply to them when they take the commands as giving them preemptive reasons.
An instrumentalist attempts to meet Wolff's challenge by saying that an authority is legitimate when one complies better with one's duty overall by submission to authority than by trying to act on the basis of one's own assessments of what is right and wrong in each instance. This amounts to a rejection of the duty of autonomy that is central to the anarchist idea. Or at least it is a rejection of the idea that the duty of autonomy is the most fundamental duty. But it does get at something important. Wolff's challenge states in a rather general way the worry that there is something immoral about failing to critically reflect about what one ought to do in each instance of action. And he states that submitting to the commands of the state is precisely a case of failing to act on one's critical assessment of a situation. The instrumentalist suggests a way in which it is not immoral to fail to critically reflect on one's prospective actions in each instance. Indeed, the instrumentalist can argue that it is sometimes immoral to insist on critically reflecting and acting autonomously when one may actually act worse as a result of consistently critically reflecting. We frequently act on the basis of rules of action, without considering all the details of the circumstances in which we act on the grounds that trying to take all the details of each situation into account for each action would produce bad decisions. The instrumentalist argues that we ought to take this kind of attitude to the commands of the state when we will better act in accordance with our duty overall by doing so than by attempting to make independent assessments of the worth of our actions in every case (see Raz 1986, ch. 3.)
This response to the philosophical anarchist challenge establishes only a piecemeal duty to obey the state. The instrumentalist argues that some states some of the time issue commands that we (or at least some individuals) ought to submit to without critical reflection on each command. It does not imply that the duty to obey the state extends to all commands of the state and to all subjects. It only applies when the subject would likely better comply with duties overall by treating the commands as authoritative (i.e. establishing content independent and preemptive duties to obey the commands) than by acting on the basis of an independent assessment of the rightness of each action. Whether the commands impose duties or not depends on features of the subject such as his or her knowledge of the issues related to the commands and so forth.
Of course, it is important to note that not every act of obedience will ensure better compliance with reason, there will be cases when the commands of the state do not accord with the best reasons. Raz's conception of authority depends for its cogency on the thought that as long as the subject does better by reason overall by obeying certain classes of commands, the subject has a duty to obey every one of the commands: the correct as well as the incorrect. In some sense, the obedience to the commands has a greater likelihood of ensuring conformity with reason. Finally, this particular account of the duty to obey does not assert that the discharging of the duties is owed to the state. This account does not establish any fundamental right to rule on the part of the state.
3.2 A Worry about the Instrumentalist Account of Practical Reason
The power of this account of political authority and the duty to obey depends essentially on the account of practical reasoning that lies at its base. Many have argued that this conception of practical reasoning is flawed. They have worried that the indirect form of practical reasoning that it requires is not legitimate. The worry can be stated fairly easily. The form of practical reasoning this account of authority includes requires that we ignore the reasons that apply directly to the action we are about to undertake even though sometimes those reasons will count against the action. The question arises, when are the reasons that directly apply to the action so strongly opposed to the action that we must override the preemptive reason?
In the case of rule following, we sometimes encounter particular instances in which following the rule is counterproductive. How do we determine when we ought to follow the rule and when we ought not to follow the rule? Does such determination involve the very deliberation about particular instances that was meant to be excluded by the rule? Some have argued that rule following cannot be rational since it cannot be rational to ignore the particular facts of each case (Hurd 2001).
Raz's main response to this criticism has been to say that we look for clear cases in which the rule is to be overridden and ignore the other cases and that only by doing this do we best comply with reason. Limiting exceptions to the rule to clear cases obviates the need for deliberation in every case.
4. A Second Form of Philosophical Anarchism
Another version of the philosophical anarchist challenge may seem to avoid the critical edge of the above approach. This approach, defended by A. John Simmons (Simmons 2001) and Leslie Green (Green 1989) asserts that each person has a right not to be bound by the state's commands. This thesis is quite different from the kind of anarchism defended by Wolff. The latter asserts that each individual has a duty to be autonomous. The present theory asserts merely that a person has a right not be subjected to another's imposition of duties. The philosophical anarchist then argues that only if a person consents to being bound to the political authority can the person actually be bound. The final premise in the philosophical anarchist argument is that it is either practically impossible or at least actually untrue that states can be set up in such a way that they can demand the obedience of all and only those who have consented to their authority. So, the anarchist concludes, no state is legitimate and perhaps no state can ever be legitimate.
It is important to note that this view does not imply that one must never obey the state. It merely implies that one does not have content independent duties to obey the state and that the state does not have a right to rule. A reasonably just state will command one to do things that are reasonably just and in many cases one must obey those commands because they are just. What one is not required to do on the philosophical anarchist view is obey any state just because it has commanded one to do certain things.
To discuss this view, we will first discuss the arguments people have given for the consent theory of political authority. We will also discuss some counterarguments. Then we will discuss a popular modification of the consent theory that is designed to avoid philosophical anarchism.
4.1 The Consent Theory of Political Authority: The Natural Right to Freedom Argument
The consent theory of political authority states only a necessary condition of the legitimacy of political authority. It states that a political authority is legitimate only if it has the consent of those who are subject to its commands. Many have argued that in addition to consent, a state must be minimally just for it to be legitimate (Locke 1990).
A number of arguments have been presented in favor of this view. Locke's argument is that each person has an equal natural right to freedom and that this implies that at the age of maturity no one may be subordinated to anyone else's commands by nature (Locke 1990). Let us call this the natural right argument. Such subordination would violate the equal freedom of the subordinated person. To the extent that political authority involves issuing commands and requiring others to follow the commands, it seems to involve subordinating one person to the commands of another and thus violates the natural right to freedom of the subordinated person.
4.2 The Instrumentalist Critique of the Natural Right Argument
A natural objection to this line of reasoning is to state that political authority is actually necessary to protecting each person's equal freedom. Locke himself argued that the state of nature would be quite threatening to each person's ability to live freely because there are likely to be many disagreements about what rights each person has and so people are likely to trespass on each other's rights. Furthermore he argued that when there is such disagreement, we need an impartial judge to determine when rights have been violated. And against criminals we need a police power to enforce the rights that people have. Locke argues that only by establishing political society with a legislature that makes known and settled laws and establishing a judiciary that resolves remaining controversies between people and having an executive power that enforces the laws can people's rights and freedoms be protected.
Once we have the above argument in mind, it is hard to see the force of the natural right argument for no political authority without consent. We might think that the very liberty that is being invoked to support the case for the necessity of consent is better protected by a reasonably just political authority. The instrumentalist can then argue that one protects the liberty of each and every person better by instituting political authority and by treating its commands as authoritative. And so the instrumentalist could argue that insofar as liberty is a fundamental value, it would be immoral not to support a reasonably just political authority and treat its commands as authoritative.
The natural right theorist might argue in response that the above argument seems to involve a kind of utilitarianism of rights. Such a view says that it is justified to violate one person's right in order to protect the rights of others. But, such a theorist might say, the natural rights of persons are side constraints against actions; they are not to be violated even if others' rights are better protected as a consequence. This entry will not go into the many issues that arise in the discussion of deontology and consequentialism here. We will return to the issue of side constraints after the discussion of the next argument.
4.3 The Consent Theory: The Options Argument
Some have proposed what this entry will call the options argument against the kind of considerations the instrumentalist adduces. The instrumentalist argues that I have natural duties of justice to promote just institutions and that these duties are best satisfied by complying with the authority of a reasonably just state. But the philosophical anarchist could argue that though I may have a duty of justice, it does not entail that I must obey any particular institution for promoting justice. The idea here is that just as Amnesty International may not require me to pay dues to it regardless of my membership even though these dues would clearly advance the protection of human rights throughout the world, so the state may not require me to comply with its commands even though such compliance would advance the purposes of justice in the world. Let us suppose that the reasons clearly favor my support of Amnesty International. Intuitively, it still may not require me to lend it support. Only if I have voluntarily joined and voluntarily remain in Amnesty do I have a duty to do what the conditions of membership require. And I am under no obligation to join Amnesty; I may join other organizations to fulfill whatever duties of aid that I have. So whether I ought to join Amnesty and be subject to membership dues is up to me. The consent theorist seems to think that, in the same way, only if I voluntarily transact to obligate myself to comply with the state's commands can I be said to have a duty to comply with the state. I must somehow enlist myself in the project of promoting the good causes that the state promotes (Simmons 2001).
4.4 The Instrumentalist Critique of the Option and Natural Right Arguments
This argument may miss a central idea in the instrumentalist account of authority. The instrumentalist account is premised on the view that not only does the state help one discharge one's duties of justice; it asserts that compliance with the state is necessary to the discharge of one's duties. Hence, one acts unjustly if one fails to comply with the state's commands.
To understand this, we need to introduce another concept. The idea is that the state does not only promote justice, it establishes justice. What does this mean? It means that for a particular community, the state determines what justice requires in the relations between individuals. It does this by defining the relations of property and exchange as well as the institutions of the criminal law and tort law. To say that the state's legislative activity establishes justice is not the same as saying that the state's activity constitutes justice. Justice is still an independent standard of assessment on this account.
The reason for saying that the state establishes justice is that, in Joseph Raz's words, justice and morality more generally, underdetermine the legislation necessary to bring about justice in a community. This means that one can implement the same principles of justice by means of many different sets of rules. But one can treat others justly only if one is on the same page as the others. So what is just in a particular circumstance will depend in part on the set of rules that the others are acting on. To the extent that the state determines the basic framework of rules, it determines which actions are just and which are not. One does not act justly, on this account, by deciding not to comply with the state one lives in and sending money to another state or association. If one fails to comply with the rules of property or the rules of exchange, one treats others unjustly. The options argument suggests that somehow there is a way that one can discharge one's duty to others by doing something other than obeying the law. Instead of obeying the law of property of the society in which I live, I may simply decide to send money to another part of the world where property rights are enforced. But this argument fails to appreciate the central importance of law to defining justice among persons. Though not all laws are just, justice among persons in any even moderately complex society requires law and obedience to law.
4.5 The Consent Theory of Political Authority: The Argument from Personal Reasons
One argument for consent theory essayed by Simmons asserts that a person ought to be free to act on the basis of personal reasons as opposed to impersonal reasons. So even if the state does help each person act more on the basis of impersonal reasons that apply to them independent of the state, a person may refuse, on the basis of personal reasons, to accept the directives of the state. And so, it is argued, the state's imposition of duties on the individual may occur only if the individual has consented to the state's authority (Simmons 2001).
The idea that one can have personal reasons not to obey the commands of a reasonably just state is unclear. It might be referring to the idea that each person has a kind of personal prerogative that permits him to avoid the demands of morality generally. This idea was proposed by critics of utilitarianism as a way to avoid the excessive demandingness of utilitarianism while keeping most of the view intact. Utilitarianism supplies exclusively impersonal reasons for action to individuals. These seem to undermine the personal projects and interests of individuals. Some have proposed that utilitarianism be modified to accommodate the projects of individuals by including a personal prerogative to act on the basis of personal reasons. Others have argued that there ought to be a personal prerogative to ignore the impersonal reasons of any set of moral requirements.
But this role for personal reasons does not seem to provide much in the way of defense of the consent theory. One reason for this is that these are reasons to avoid some of the demands of morality. But the issue at stake in the justification of authority is whether morality demands obedience or not. If we think of these personal reasons as part of the structure of morality, on the other hand, then it would seem that these personal reasons are best protected by a reasonably just state that protects individual freedom. So the response to the claim that individuals have personal reasons to evade the commands of the state seems to fall prey to the same argument that undermines the natural right approach.
4.6 Consent Theory: The Argument from Disagreement
There is another way to think of this personal reasons criticism of instrumentalist approaches to political authority. The instrumentalist approach seems to be committed to the idea that an authority can be legitimate even if most of the members of the society do not agree with what it is doing. As long as the state is requiring people to act as they should act, the subjects have a duty to obey, even if they do not see that they have this duty. Now one can see how this may be true in some circumstances, where the members are deeply immoral or irrational. But it seems perverse to think that whether the state has legitimate authority is completely independent of the considered opinions of its subjects. Here is the reason behind the appearance. The state, being a group of people, owes the subjects some kind of duty of respect for the judgments of those members. This duty of respect requires at least some degree of responsiveness on the part of the state in making decisions. Furthermore the state, in part, is an institution that is grounded in the need for decisions against a background of disagreement about what ought to be done. For the state to make decisions against this background that completely ignores the views of the many dissenters seems a particularly egregious violation of the duty to accord some respect to the opinions of reasonable adult human beings.
Consent theories, reasonable consensus theories, associative obligation theories and democratic theories make these observations part of the foundation of their accounts of the legitimacy of authority. The consent theory of political authority requires that for the state to have authority over any person, the state must have the consent of the person to that authority. Consent, on this account, is a necessary condition of the legitimacy of authority though it need not be a sufficient condition. The consent theory clearly makes an attempt to make political authority compatible with a due respect for the opinions of subjects.
4.7 The Problems of Irrational, Immoral Failures of Consent
But we might wonder if it doesn't go too far. For if consent is a genuinely necessary condition of political authority, then it appears that individuals may have the option of not obeying a perfectly just state that has jurisdiction over the area in which they live. And they may do this on perverse grounds or they may simply wish to free ride on the benefits that the state confers without having to undertake any of the burdens. How can this be legitimate and how can it undermine the authority of a just state? It seems that in the effort to express respect for the reasonable opinions of people, consent theory seems to have gone too far in giving respect to immoral, irrational and unprincipled failures of consent (Raz 1986).
The consent theorist could respond to this difficulty with the claim that it is only the state's claim to authority that is being held hostage, not the state's just activities. For if it is the case that the person is merely free riding on desirable activities and that this is unjust then the person is acting wrongly. Hence, the justice of the actions of the state may be sufficient to condemn the actions of the free rider and this can be done without attributing the right to rule to the state.
But now the instrumentalist could argue that obedience to the authoritative commands of the state may be necessary to acting justly in many instances. The thought is that only if people treat the commands of the state as providing content independent reasons for obedience can a reasonably just state actually perform the tasks that make it just. If people are constantly second guessing the state's decisions, the central roles of coordination, collective action and assurance in the establishment of justice by the state will be undermined. These are collective effects of second guessing. But the instrumentalist will also argue that individuals will often act less in accordance with the reasons that apply to them if they fail to take the commands of a reasonably just state as offering content independent reasons because only the state's commands can clue them in to what the rules that establish justice are in their particular community. The instrumentalist may then argue that it is therefore wrong for the person not to take the commands of the state as authoritative, at least in many circumstances.
4.8 Tacit Consent
Locke, in part desiring to avoid these obvious difficulties or irrational and immoral failures of consent, introduced the notion of tacit consent (Locke 1990). The possibility of tacit consent allows that one may consent without having to go through the usual motions associated with expression of consent. For example, at a board meeting, one consents tacitly to the chairman's scheduling a meeting if one says nothing when the chair asks for objections to the proposal. And that tacit consent is valid to the extent that the failure to object is understood as a kind of consent and is voluntary.
The main problem with tacit consent is the problem of interpretation. How does one interpret the actions of another so as to think of them as consenting though they did not explicitly do so? Theorists differ on the constraints that must be placed on the interpretation of the behaviors of others. Simmons argues that for behavior to count as tacit consent it the behavior must be explicitly understood by all to be a kind of consent, it must be clear how when to perform the act or omission that constitutes tacit consent, it is not difficult to consent and the costs of dissent are not prohibitive. But it is not obvious that Locke had this in mind. Locke thought that the mere residing in a territory and voluntarily benefiting from the actions of a minimally just state were sufficient conditions of tacit consent. One might think that Locke thought the following. If a person voluntarily resides in a territory over which the state has jurisdiction and that person benefits from the establishment of the rule of law and all the other amenities the state provides then that person must know or ought to know that the state's provision of these benefits depends on the obedience of the members of the society. But if the person now continues to reside voluntarily in the state, that person must know that others expect obedience from him unless he is under some special exemption. He must know or ought to know, in other words, that others can reasonably interpret his voluntary residence as committing him to obedience to the laws of the state. So, we have adequate reason to interpret a person's continued voluntary residence as a form of consenting to abide by the laws of the state.
4.9 The Humean Attack on Tacit Consent
David Hume criticized this interpretive move (Hume 1965). He argued that given the extraordinary costs to most people of moving out of the country of their birth, no one can sensibly interpret the voluntary continued residence of a person in a state as a case of tacit consent. He draws an analogy with a person who has been carried involuntarily onto a ship by others and who now finds himself on the ship subject to the commands of the captain and whose only alternative is to throw himself into a stormy sea. Hume argues that such a person's remaining on the ship can not be interpreted to be consenting to the authority of the captain. The person is merely attempting to avoid the terrible cost of getting off the ship.
But it is not clear why Hume's argument is supposed to work. It sounds like the argument challenges the voluntariness of the consent. But this cannot be a conclusive argument here. After all, many people consent to things in order to avoid the terrible costs of not consenting. People consent to pay their insurance premiums in order not to end up without health care when the time comes that they need it. Promises made on the battlefield to lay down arms on the condition that the opponent will not harm one are also made under severe duress. But we do not think that these promises are invalid or that they fail to obligate. So the fact that the alternative would be terrible is not a reason to think that those who choose to remain in a state are not thereby bound.
Of course, Hume's example includes the fact that the person was carried forcibly onto the ship. This may be doing more work that it should be. For few people would say that the state has necessarily done something wrong by imposing its jurisdiction over a territory on which a person is born. We need, then, to change Hume's example so that the person who is on the boat is on it through no fault of anyone on the boat, though he may have ended up there involuntarily.
One possibility is that Hume thinks that we cannot interpret the continuing residence of a person in a state as a case of consent to the authority of the state because we have no reason to think that the continuing residence was chosen as a result of reflection on whether it constituted consent. The impoverished person who remains in the state in which he finds himself gave no thought whatsoever to any consideration other than that to move would be highly costly or otherwise unpleasant. We have no reason to think that he gave any thought to the question of consent and so it is illegitimate to interpret his behavior in that way.
But it is not obvious that this reasoning succeeds. If a person benefits by residing in a territory and everyone knows that the benefit only arises because of the obedience to law of the members, shouldn't it be clear to this person that his compliance is expected of him if he remains in the territory? And does his remaining in the territory thereby imply that he consents to the authority of the territory?
Of course it is true of any particular person that his compliance is not necessary to the maintenance of the benefits of public order. But at the same time it is clear that unless there is some special reason for this person not to be subject to the rules everyone else is subject to, elementary norms of fairness will suggest to him and everyone else that compliance is expected of him just as it is of everyone else.
This would seem to be a basis for interpreting the person's behavior as a case of consent. Anyone can see that the compliance of each person is expected of those who reside in a territory as long as the law is reasonably just. If someone has not considered these facts, perhaps he should be held responsible for consenting anyway. After all, if we look at Simmons's central board room case we might have the same reaction to someone who, having been told that failure to object implies consent to a policy, fails to object but only because he doesn't want to anger his girlfriend in the group and really gives no thought to the question of consent. Surely he has tacitly consented, despite his irresponsible attitude. So why not think that the person who continues to reside voluntarily in a reasonably just state?
4.10 How Can Tacit Consent Be A Basis of Political Authority?
An important objection to the idea of tacit consent is that it begs the question about how a state gets its authority. Some argue that a group of persons that has no authority to issue commands in the first place cannot require people submit to their commands or leave a piece of territory they are falsely claim as under their jurisdiction (Brilmayer 1989; Wellman 2001). In a variation on the boardroom example described above, Brilmayer imagines that instead of the chairman proposing a date for a meeting, a window washer swings in and makes the same proposal and asks for objections. Clearly in that case, failure to register objections would not constitute consent to the proposed schedule. The reason for this is that only a duly constituted authority can have the right to make such a proposal. But, the claim to authority is precisely what tacit consent is supposed to support. So as an account of authority the tacit consent view seems to beg the question.
This criticism is right as far as it goes. But there are four points to note about it. First, it applies to explicit consent as well as tacit consent. My consent to a person's doing something does not legitimate that person's doing it nor does it obligate me to respect his doing it unless he already has a right to make the proposal. In the case of political authorities, my consent to someone's issuing commands over a piece of territory that she has no right to rule over does not legitimate her commands nor does it obligate me.
Second, it is not a criticism of Locke since he clearly thinks that tacit consent only legitimates and obligates under conditions where there is a duly constituted authority. Locke thinks that the right to rule of an authority must be traced back to an original act of consent in the state of nature (where there is no prior political authority) to form a political body. That political body then confers, by the consent of all the members, authority on a particular institutional arrangement (as long as it is minimally just). The function of tacit consent as well as the consent of new members is simply to renew this already created authority.
Third, if Locke is right and consent can create authority out of the state of nature, it may be possible for tacit consent to do the same. We can imagine a state of nature scenario where a highly persuasive person gets up amid the chaos and makes a proposal to create the initial political body from the state of nature and then states very clearly that if there are objections, they should be raised without fear. And we can imagine the very same person making a proposal to create the particular structure of authority over the political body and calling for objections in the same way as before. There is no obvious reason why this could not work. Locke did not suggest this but it does not seem impossible.
These last two points defeat the argument that tacit consent requires a prior duly constituted authority. What Locke's picture suggests is that valid consent or tacit consent do not require that the consented to proposal be made by someone already in authority; they can be valid as long as the proposal is made when there is no authority already in place. The proposals can be drawn up by someone who has the right to make the proposal. In the state of nature, anyone presumably has this right.
Fourth, even if tacit consent cannot establish authority it may still be a necessary condition on the legitimacy of authority. For if a political authority is duly constituted in the way Locke describes but fails to offer its citizens a right of exit or imposes severe burdens on people who wish to exit, it will become illegitimate over time, according to Locke.
Still, this criticism is quite important because it shows that neither consent nor tacit consent can stand alone as bases of political legitimacy. An exclusively consent based theory of political authority seems to require that the original consent take place in a state of nature prior to political authority. And this further requirement seems to weaken the plausibility of the view.
4.11 The Basic Objection of Consent Theorists to Tacit Consent
What is worrisome about this kind of approach from the standpoint of consent theory is that it seems to ignore all the particular reasons that people may have for not consenting. Indeed, it seems to rely on the premise that anyone should see that if they reside within the territory of a reasonably just state, they are properly expected to comply with the law, at least insofar as it is reasonably just. Consent theory, by contrast, seems to rely on the thought that individuals may properly reject these kinds of obligations for purely personal reasons.
We can see a dilemma that arises from the above considerations. If tacit consent genuinely arises from voluntary residence in a reasonably just state, then it appears that the interpretation of the person's residence does not take account of what many consent theorists have thought was essential to consent theory, namely the personal reasons of the subject in deciding whether to consent or not. On the other hand, if those personal reasons are ones that the subject may properly take into account in deciding whether to consent, then the interpretive move required for voluntary residence to generate obligations in all subjects of a reasonably just state cannot work. It cannot work because subjects may have personal reasons for not consenting, which voluntary residence does not rule out.
Hence, it appears that tacit consent theory cannot conform to what many have taken to be the highly individualistic spirit of consent theory. So fans of consent theory are not likely to agree to the idea that people generally tacitly consent to the state's authority when they voluntarily reside in its territory. Critics of consent theory are likely, however, to question that highly individualistic approach in the manner sketched above.
4.12 Normative Consent
David Estlund has tentatively advanced a new and intriguing suggestion for shoring up an essentially voluntarist account of authority. Estlund argues that even in the absence of explicit or tacit consent in some cases persons may be said to have consented to political authority. He describes this as “normative consent”. The idea is motivated in the following way. Estlund notes that actual explicit cases of consenting can fail to produce obligations if what is consented to is seriously immoral. The consent is nullified (in its obligation producing effect) by the evident immorality of its content. Estlund then enquires as to whether the lack of consent under certain circumstances mightn't similarly be nullified in cases where it is plainly wrong not to consent. Why aren't these symmetrical he asks? Estlund envisions a case in which a passenger airplane has crashed and in which there is still a significant chance of saving many passengers through a very well coordinated effort. As it happens an airline attendant stands up and “takes control” by giving commands to various people thus organizing the relief effort. Let us suppose that this is evidently reasonably successful but that it really does require the cooperation of (nearly) everyone to whom the airline attendant chooses to give directives. And let us suppose that the attendant is not giving any clearly immoral commands. Estlund notes that it would be clearly immoral for someone in a position to give essential help not to agree to go along with the attendant's commands. Now suppose that someone in such a situation refuses to consent to the arrangement. Estlund asks whether their non-consent isn't nullified in the light of the fact that it is immoral not to consent. And if the non-consent is nullified, then its normal effect in preserving the liberty of the agent is not produced. In this case the person is no longer free to act independent of the purported authority. Since his non-consent is nullified, he has, in effect, consented and he is therefore under an obligation to the authority. This is normative consent.
Estlund is anxious to distinguish this idea from hypothetical consent or what you would have consented to had you been a better person. Yet he does want to say that this normative consent has a genuine connection to the will.
One might wonder here if there is any genuine connection to the will of the normative consenter and so whether this really does shore up the voluntarist view. But a further issue that might be raised here is whether Estlund has genuinely identified the fallback point of invalidated consent and non-consent. Perhaps the proper description of the fall back point is neither consent nor non-consent. A person who has consented to something deeply immoral doesn't thereby refuse consent to that action, the person simply has failed to do anything morally productive. Perhaps the idea in the case of the seriously immoral non-consent is that the person has simply not done anything morally productive. What happens in both cases is that the previous moral situation of the agent remains in place. In the nullified consent case you still have an obligation not to do what you consented to do and in the nullified non-consent case you still have an obligation to do what you refuse to consent to do. This would suggest that the decision between consent and non-consent has here no normative effect: whatever the agent decides, the previous moral situation remains in place. Hence there is a kind of symmetry that holds here between the two cases. It is just that the default position is neither consent nor non-consent. The one implication this might have is that one may ask the person again until he agrees, whereas normally if a person refuses to consent to something you must leave them alone.
5. Reasonable Consensus Conceptions of Legitimate Political Authority
Reasonable consensus views of political authority attempt to find a kind of mean between the extreme individualism of consent theory and the lack of respect for people's opinions of the instrumentalist views. John Rawls argues that the liberal principle of political legitimacy requires that coercive institutions be so structured that they accord with the reasonable views of the members of the society. As long as they do so they have the right to impose duties on their members. The members may not demur on the basis of unreasonable views. Furthermore, it is not necessary on this view that the persons over whom authority is wielded have voluntarily acted or given any sign of agreement. All that need be the case is that the basic principles that regulate the coercive institutions be ones that the reasonable members can agree to (Rawls 1996).
This view seems to be a kind of middle position between consent theory and the instrumentalist views. It does not allow individuals to divest themselves of obligations on spurious or merely self-interested bases because it specifies what is and is not a reasonable basis for agreement to the basic principles of the society. At the same time it evinces a respect for the opinions of the members of society since it requires that the basic principles that regulate the society accord with the reasonable views of the members.
This account of legitimacy is based on an adherence to a principle of reasonableness. The basic principle asserts that reasonable persons will propose fair terms of cooperation with other reasonable persons only on condition that the terms can be justified to those others on the basis of premises that they can reasonably accept. There has been much discussion of this principle and its underpinnings but this entry will focus on a central worry concerning this idea.
5.1 Problems of Reasonableness and Consensus
A number of criticisms have been made against this kind of view. Many have argued that the relevant notion of reasonableness is likely to be very difficult to specify in a way that is both plausible and compatible with possible consensus. The key difficulty with reasonable consensus theories is that they rely on the possibility of consensus on at least a sufficient number of basic norms to say that there is consensus on the basic principles that regulate a society. So if one attempts to come up with a notion of reasonableness that is sufficiently robust to generate agreement of this sort, then one is likely to have a notion that is quite controversial. And then the view does not seem to take a sufficiently respectful view of the opinions of the members of society since so many are likely to disagree with the conception of the reasonable. On the other hand, if one elaborates a conception of the reasonable that is sufficiently weak for most persons in the society to satisfy it, then one is not likely to generate agreement on the basic principles of the society.
The main worry is that the idea demands a level of consensus among members of society that is incompatible with the ordinary conditions of political societies (Christiano 1996; Waldron 1999). The principle demands that there be a kind of consensus among citizens on the basic principles that underpin the operation of political society.
This consensus seems to be unattainable under the conditions of modern society. One way, however, in which Rawls has argued in favor of the attainability of the consensus is to say that it need only be an overlapping consensus. The idea here is that citizens do not have to agree on everything but only on those principles that apply to the basic structure of society. And even here, when citizens disagree on some issue of social justice, the opposing views are taken off the table. So citizens can disagree on what the nature of the good life is and on religious questions and even different issues relating to social justice. As long as there are certain principles that everyone agrees to, which apply to the basic structure of society, full consensus is not necessary. Hence, the consensus need only be an overlapping one.
Though this idea goes some way towards alleviating the worry that too much consensus is required by Rawls's theory, it does not go nearly far enough. There is one main way in which the overlapping consensus fails to provide the kind of consensus that Rawls requires. If a group of citizens agrees on a set of principles for regulating society and some of the citizens also think that some other principles apply, the overlapping consensus idea is that the citizens who hold the idiosyncratic views must take those particular demands off the table and must argue only on the basis of the shared principles. The idea is that everyone appeals only to those principles that lie in the overlap and not to those that do not lie in the overlap. A legitimate exercise of political power is one that is grounded only in those principles that lie in the overlap. This seems to diminish the amount of agreement necessary to make a society legitimate.
But this appearance is an illusion. To see this we need only think of those people who hold idiosyncratic views. If the society they live in is exclusively grounded in principles that lie in the overlap of principles, then these people will have reason to complain that the society is unjust to the extent that the idiosyncratic principles are ignored. For instance, if someone holds the idiosyncratic view that people ought to receive in accordance with their desert then a society that does not act to make sure that this principle is respected is one that will be considered unjust by that person. They will live in a society that is unacceptable to them in a certain important respect relevant to justice.
Of course, if the desert principle is used to ground the basic institutions of society even though it does not lie in the overlap then those who think that desert is not a proper principle of justice will likely think that they are living in a society that they regard as unjust. The principle of legitimacy will imply in this context that the basic institutions of society are illegitimate because they are not based on principles everyone accepts. But surely the same can be said of those who hold the idiosyncratic principles. They can complain that they are required to go along with institutions that are unjust by their lights. The imposition on them implied by the basic institutions that fail to distribute in accordance with desert is as great as would be the imposition on the others implied by institutions that do distribute goods in accordance with desert. There is a complete symmetry here. Indeed, one way to put this point is to say that those who hold that desert is not a genuine principle of justice are themselves holding an idiosyncratic view when we take into account the fact that many think that desert is a genuine principle of justice.
As a consequence of these considerations, only a complete consensus of political principles will satisfy the principle of legitimacy that Rawls defends. But complete consensus on political principles is impossible to achieve given the conditions of ordinary political societies. And so to the extent that this principle of legitimacy is unsatisfiable in ordinary political societies, it appears to be an unacceptably utopian principle. In particular, it seems to be an unacceptable principle of political legitimacy because a principle of political legitimacy is partly framed for the purpose of according moral credentials to a society in the circumstances of political disagreement.
6. Political Authority as Grounded in Associative Obligations
One classical account of political authority has modeled political authority and the attendant obligations on the obligations of family and the authority of the parents. Plato gives this account of authority and obligation among others in the Crito (Plato 1948). A recent attempt to ground the legitimacy of political authority in this way is Ronald Dworkin's (Dworkin 1986). This view is meant to capture the idea that a political society can have legitimate authority even if it is not a voluntary association and even if there is disagreement on many political principles.
If we take the family as a model here, we can see that children acquire obligations to obey their parents and to love and support their parents and siblings without having voluntarily entered into the relationships. And there may be some relation of authority between parents and children at least till the latter reach the age of maturity. Another model Dworkin invokes is that of friendship. He argues that though friendship does have an important voluntary component, it is not the case that people voluntarily agree to the terms of a friendship. They find themselves acquiring obligations of friendship as the friendship grows. Of course there is little in the way of authority in friendship and even in the family there is little authority once the children reach maturity.
The analogy between obligations of family, friendship and political society is grounded in the idea that in all three of these, individuals are obligated to abide by the rules or norms of the community. Dworkin argues that legitimate political authority arises as a consequence of the acquisition on the part of members of a political society of obligations to obey the rules of a genuine associative community. This gives the putative authority justification for coercing the members into obedience of the rules, which is the key element of authority on Dworkin's account.
Dworkin attempts to discern the basis of obligation in friendships and families by the process of interpretation of these social practices. His thesis is that communities that satisfy four conditions for being genuine communities thereby generate obligations to go along with the terms of the association. The four conditions are: one, each member of the community sees herself as having special obligations to the other members; two, they see the obligations as owed to each of the others personally; three, these obligations are understood to flow from a concern for the well being of each of the members; and four, the obligations are understood as flowing from a plausible version of equal concern for all the members. Any community that satisfies these four conditions is a genuine community and thereby generates obligations in each of the members to comply with the terms of the association.
Dworkin thinks that families and friendships satisfy these constraints in many cases and that only when they satisfy them do they generate obligations. He also thinks that a certain kind of political society can satisfy these conditions, which he calls a community of principle, i.e., a community wherein each member sees himself or herself as bound by common principles to all the others.
One might worry that a political society cannot be expected to generate the kinds of emotional bonds people have towards one another in families or friendships (Simmons 2001). And one might think that in the absence of such bonds, the four conditions will not be satisfied. Dworkin denies this. He agrees that political societies do not generate these kinds of emotional bonds, but he asserts that emotional bonds are not necessary either causally or conceptually to the satisfaction of the four conditions.
Dworkin argues that the attribution of the four conditions to a relationship occurs through an interpretation of that relationship so it need not be the case that each person is aware of satisfying any of the four conditions when they do. Consider a person who appeals to his fellow citizens on the basis of a principle of freedom of speech on the grounds that it is part of their constitution. This person is committed to legal principles that he shares with other citizens. He will be committed to the principles underlying the other elements of the constitution and the legal history of his country. He will be committed to a principle of equality to the extent that it is part of the constitution. We can interpret this person's behavior and the similar behavior of others as committed to special obligations to their fellow countrymen to the extent that it is the shared constitution they are appealing to. We can interpret this person as expressing a kind of equal concern for his fellow countrymen to the extent that he is appealing to legal principles that protect all. And we can interpret him in this way even if he himself would not have asserted it. And to the extent that people conform to this kind of practice more generally, we can interpret their behavior generally as satisfying the four conditions of associative obligation.
The community of principle satisfies the four conditions. Dworkin attempts to show how a political community can generate special obligations of citizens to each other. A community of principle is regulated by principles that have been elaborated in a distinctive way in the particular community. Citizens see themselves as obligated to abide by those principles only in relation to the others who have participated in elaborating them. The principles do require that everyone be included and that everyone's well being counts and counts equally.
The idea of a community of principle is meant to accommodate significant disagreement in the society in two ways. First, people may not think that the principles in the society are the best ones. They may simply be the best interpretation of their shared legal culture and history. So people may try to advance their own conceptions of the best principles. Second, people will disagree about the best interpretations of the shared legal culture and thus may think that the society is grounded in different principles.
6.1 Do Communities of Principle Satisfy the Four Conditions of Genuine Association?
But surely, the satisfaction of some of the conditions must depend on exactly what principles are in the community. Principles that are focused on liberty and that avoid any reference to well being, such as Kant would require of political principles, presumably would not satisfy the last two conditions. Principles that are not egalitarian, such as those that governed the United States during the first century of its existence and probably longer, would not satisfy the last condition. So it is not clear that being a community of principle is a sufficient condition for satisfying the four conditions.
It is also not obvious that it is necessary that a community be a community of principle in order for it to satisfy the four conditions in Dworkin's sense. For one can imagine a community in which individuals are committed to democratic resolution of the disagreements on justice that arise and thereby are committed to the equal importance of the well being of each member. They attempt to advance opposing principles of justice and conceptions of the common good and make compromises when they cannot secure sufficient majorities for these. Indeed, this seems much closer to the character of modern democracies than Dworkin's view. Such a society would satisfy the four conditions but it is not clear that it is a community of principle.
Dworkin's idea that modern political societies can be seen as communities of principle is grounded in his emphasis on judicial institutions as the core institutions of modern political societies and his account of legal interpretation. His view is that judges interpret the law by creating a coherent account of as much of the black letter law as possible and by interpreting that black letter law in terms of principles that make the law be the best that it can be. Hence, judges aim at producing a coherent account of the law overall by grounding it in the best basic moral principles that it can be grounded in. From this he thinks of modern societies as being concerned to elaborate common principles by which the society can be guided.
But his emphasis on judicial decision making seems excessive. In the democratic legislative process, citizens often do not see themselves as being guided by common principles. They see themselves as disagreeing with each other about what principles the society ought to be guided by. They also often see themselves as disagreeing with and trying to change the principles they see embodied in the law. They may look at the legislation in their community as negotiated compromises between different principles and not as deriving from a common set of principles. And yet they do see themselves as members of a common democratic community. This aspect of democratic rivalry does not seem to be very well accommodated by Dworkin's view of modern societies as communities of principle.
7. A Democratic Conception of Legitimate Political Authority
The basic idea behind the democratic conception of legitimate authority is that when there are disagreements among persons about how to structure their shared world together and it is important to structure that world together, the way to choose the shared aspects of society is by means of a decision making process that is fair to the interests and opinions of each of the members. When there is disagreement about how to organize the shared system of law, property, public education and the provision of public goods, no one can have his way entirely in this context without someone else not getting her way. Each person thinks that the ideas about justice and the common good with which the others wish to organize their shared world are mistaken in some way. Yet there is a need for collective action. The only way to do this that is reasonably fair to all the members is to make the decision democratically.
The thought is that when an outcome is democratically chosen and some people disagree with the outcome, as some inevitably will, they still have a duty to go along with the decision because otherwise they would be treating the others unfairly. If they refuse to go along and disrupt the democratically chosen arrangements, they are assuming for themselves a right to determine how things should go that overrides the equal rights of all the others. They are, in Peter Singer's words, assuming the positions of dictators in relation to the others. For if they turned out to be in the majority, they would demand the compliance of the others.
The idea of fairness that underpins the democratic process is grounded in different ways in different theories. The basic idea of equality is shared by most democratic theorists. Some argue that there is a fundamental duty of equal respect for the opinions of others that grounds democratic decision making in the context of pervasive disagreement (Singer 1974; Waldron 1999). Others wish to ground this duty of respect for the opinions of others in a deeper principle of equal concern for the interests of each member of society (Christiano 1996).
On this kind of view the democratic assembly has a right to rule and to the obedience of its members. This right of the democratic assembly is grounded in the right of each member of the assembly to be accorded equal respect. The duty of equal respect requires that the collective decision process gives each a vote in a broadly majoritarian process and a robustly equal opportunity to participate in the deliberations and negotiations leading to decisions. The equal rights of each of the members are in effect pooled in the democratic assembly so that because one owes each person equal respect, and the democratic way of making decisions embodies this equal respect, one owes the democratic assembly respect.
The democratic assembly can be understood as the assembly of all adult citizens or better as the assembly of all the democratically chosen representatives of citizens. A conception of a democratic assembly requires, on this view, an account of the appropriate form of democratic representation (Christiano 1996). In addition, the democratic assembly is only one part of the complete system of government. It is concerned with legislation only. In addition to this a government requires executive and judicial functions whose legitimacy may depend in part on other factors better grasped by the instrumentalist view.
The duties that are owed the democratic assembly are content independent and preemptive duties. They are content independent duties because each member has the duty, with a class of exceptions we will review in a moment, just because the assembly has made a decision. The duties are preemptive because the citizen must put aside the considerations she initially planned on acting on in order to treat the rest of her fellow citizens with proper respect. The idea of equal respect requires, on this account, deference to the decision of the majority and not acting on one's own judgment when the majority disagrees. So the decision of the majority gives a reason to obey that preempts or replaces the considerations one might act on were there no majority decision.
It is important to note that this conception of authority is what was described as a special conception above. The fact that democratic assemblies have authority does not imply that all other forms of regime never have authority. One might go along with a regime on the basis of the instrumentalist conception of authority or even the consent approach even if it is not democratic. It is clear nevertheless that democratic assemblies have a special kind of authority.
7.1 How Can Democracy Make Unjust Laws Legitimate?
Democratic decision making on this account can be evaluated from two very different angles. On the one hand, one can evaluate a democratic decision in terms of the justice or efficiency of the outcome of the decision. One can ask whether the legislation is just or for the common good. This is the standpoint of the citizen who argues in favor of legislation and against others and tries to put together a coalition of like minded people to advance the legislation. On the other hand, democratic decision making can be evaluated in terms of the way in which the decision was made. Did the process of decision making treat all of its members fairly or with equal respect? Are the institutions of legislative representation and of campaign finance, among others, fair?
But why should the equality embodied in the democratic assembly trump other considerations of justice? The democratic conception of authority requires each person to submit issues to a democratic vote. So if they advocate some policy on the grounds that it conforms with what they take to be the correct principle of justice J, and the majority chooses a different policy on the grounds of an incompatible principle L, the democratic theory says that they ought to accept the policy that is grounded in L because only in this way do they accord the proper equal respect to their fellow citizens.
But someone might ask, why should the principle of equal respect take precedence over the principle J? They are both principles of justice so we need some reason for favoring the equal respect principle in general over the others.
One answer to this is to say that social justice demands that principles of justice be public in the sense that they involve principles that can be shown to be implemented to everyone who is reasonably conscientious and aware of some basic facts of political life (such as disagreement, fallibility and cognitive bias). This is a version of the basic maxim of justice that justice must not only be done, it must be seen to be done. The thought then is that to the extent that there is significant disagreement about the substantive principles of justice in play when policy is being decided, a just society requires some way in which publicly to embody the equal treatment of all the individuals in society. The controversial principles guiding the formulation of policy do not generally satisfy this constraint of publicity. Indeed, given the controversies over justice, individuals will think that the policies do not accord with their favored conception of equality. The democratic process does seem publicly to embody the equal standing of all citizens and the equal worth of their interests against the background of disagreement and fallibility and all the facts that attend these phenomena. So the democratic process seems uniquely capable of publicly embodying the principle of the equal importance of each person and the equal importance of the advancement of their interests (Christiano 2004).
Critics of this view might still take issue with the thesis that social justice requires that principles be public and that this gives priority to the principles that underpin democracy over those that underpin substantive policy proposals. The question must be, why is publicity, in the sense sketched above, so important?
7.2 Limits to Democratic Authority
The question that arises for a democratic theory of authority is, when do the considerations of the justice or injustice of the outcome override the considerations connected with the fairness of the process of decision making?
The claim that a democratic assembly has a right to rule is not incompatible with the idea that there are limits to that right. Indeed, theorists have argued that the very same principle that grounds democratic authority also ground limits to that authority (Christiano 2004.) The principle of public equality on which the argument for democracy is founded also grounds a set of liberal rights (freedom of conscience, association, speech and private pursuits). The reason for this is that democratic assembly that fundamentally denied these liberal rights to individuals would publicly violate the duty of equal respect to those individuals. Those who violate the basic liberal rights of others are publicly treating them as inferiors. To the extent that the democratic assembly's claim of authority is grounded in the public realization of the principle of equal respect, the authority would run out when the democratic assembly makes law that undermines equal respect. This establishes, at least for one conception of democratic authority, a substantive set of limits to that authority.
8. Legitimate Political Authority in International Institutions
International Institutions have acquired political authority over the last half century or so. They are quite diverse in character. For some, their authority has a somewhat different form than the authority associated with the organs of the state. And the grounds of the authority of international institutions may be distinct as well. Overall, these are complex institutions with a number of parts and so different principles may apply to the different parts. For example, with regard to the World Trade Organization, some principle of state consent may be the ultimate basis of the legitimacy of its law making function, while a very different kind of standard would be relevant to judging the legitimacy of the dispute settlement mechanism.
Because global institutions operate in the context of a lack of overarching and centralized political power, the form and grounds of authority are likely often to be distinct. As I noted above, some of the most powerful global institutions have powers to create permissions rather than duties as in Security Council of the United Nations authorizations of the use of force. Another example is when the World Trade Organization's dispute settlement mechanism rules that a state may restrict trade with another state in what would normally be a violation of their agreements in order to retaliate against a state that has violated the trade agreements.
Another interesting feature of international institutions is that state consent appears to be a possible basis for the legitimacy of international institutions. To be sure many would argue that international institutions ought to be evaluated solely on an instrumental basis and others would argue that only democratic international institutions can be legitimate. But state consent does have a fighting chance of playing a large role in underpinning these institutions. The international system is highly decentralized and states are by far the most important instruments for making power accountable to persons that we know of.
To be sure, the state consent doctrine raises many questions. For one thing, we must ask whether the consent of states that do not represent their peoples is a genuinely legitimating act. Second, we must ask about the fairness of the conditions under which consent is given. If the conditions are unfair and more powerful states take advantage of the vulnerabilities of the weaker state, what impact does this have on the legitimacy of the state? Third, what normative weight, if any, attaches to a state's refusal of consent when it's cooperation is necessary to the achievement of morally mandatory aims such as the prevention or mitigation of global warming?
- Applebaum, Arthur Isak, 2010, “Legitimacy without the Duty to Obey,” Philosophy and Public Affairs, 38: 215–239.
- Austin, John, 1832, The Province of Jurisprudence Determined, H. L. A. Hart (ed.), London: Weidenfeld & Nickolson, 1955.
- Beran, Harry, 1987, The Consent Theory of Political Obligation, London: Croon Helm.
- Brilmayer, Lea, 1989, Justifying International Acts, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
- Buchanan, Allen, 2004, Justice, Legitimacy and Self-Determination, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Buchanan, Allen and Robert O. Keohane, 2006, “The Legitimacy of Global Governance Institutions,” Ethics and International Affairs, 20 (4): 405–437.
- Christiano, Thomas, 2004, “The Authority of Democracy,” Journal of Political Philosophy, 12(3): 245–270.
- Christiano, Thomas, 2011, “Democratic Legitimacy and International Institutions,” in The Philosophy of International Law, Samantha Besson and John Tasiolas (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Christiano, Thomas, 1996, The Rule of the Many, Boulder, CO: Westview Press.
- Dworkin, Ronald, 1986, Law's Empire, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
- Estlund, David, 2007, Democratic Authority, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Edmundson, William, 1998, Three Anarchical Fallacies, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Green, Leslie, 1989, The Authority of the State, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Hart, H.L.A., 1961, The Concept of Law, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Hobbes, Thomas, 1668, Leviathan, Edwin Curley (ed.), Indianapolis: Hackett Publishers, 1992.
- Hume, David, 1748, “Of the Original Contract,” in Hume's Ethical Writings, Alasdair MacIntyre (ed.), London: University of Notre Dame Press, 1965.
- Hurd, Heidi, 2001, Moral Combat, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Ladenson, Robert, 1980, “In Defense of a Hobbesian Conception of Law,” Philosophy and Public Affairs, 9: 134–159.
- Locke, John, 1690, Second Treatise on Civil Government, C. B MacPherson (ed.), Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 1990.
- Morris, Christopher, 1998, An Essay on the Modern State, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Plato, Euthyphro, Apology and Crito, F. J. Church (trans.), New York: Macmillan, 1948.
- Rawls, John, 1996, Political Liberalism, New York: Columbia University Press.
- Raz, Joseph, 1986, The Morality of Freedom, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Raz, Joseph (ed.), 1990, Authority, New York: New York University Press.
- Shapiro, Scott, 2002, “Authority,” in The Oxford Handbook of Jurisprudence and Philosophy of Law, Jules Coleman and Scott Shapiro (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Simmons, A. John, 2001, Justification and Legitimacy: Essays on Rights and Obligations, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Singer, Peter, 1974, Democracy and Disobedience, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Waldron, Jeremy, 1999, Law and Disagreement, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Weber, Max, 1918, “Politics as a Vocation,” in From Max Weber: Essays in Sociology, H. H. Gerth and C. Wright Mills (eds.), London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1970.
- Wellman, Christopher, 2001, “Toward a Liberal Theory of Political Obligation,” Ethics, 111 (4): 735–759.
- Wolff, Robert Paul, 1970, In Defense of Anarchism, New York: Harper & Row.
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- The Popular Basis of Political Authority, from The Founders Constitution, edited by Philip B. Kurland and Ralph Lerner, The University of Chicago.