Notes to John Buridan

1. Michael (1985, 79–238 399–404).

2. However, the significance of such details is beginning to be understood more fully by historians through recent prosopographical research. See Courtenay (1999; 2004a).

3. For a discussion and careful debunking of each of these stories, see Faral (1950, 9–33).

4. Buridan writes that unlike metaphysics and sciences subordinate to it, “theology has for its principles articles [of faith], which are believed quite apart from their evidentness, and considers further whatever can be deduced from such articles” [Theologia vero habet pro principiis articulos creditos absque evidentia et considerat ultra quamcumque ex huiusmodi articulis possunt deduci] (QM I.2: 4ra-rb). For discussion, see Zupko (2003, Chapter 10). See also Courtenay (2001; 2004), who prefers to leave such questions open. Some of the most interesting research currently being done on Buridan concerns the teaching and scholarly careers of Arts Masters in mid-fourteenth century Paris.

5. It is easy for modern readers to misunderstand the relationship of medieval philosophers to theologians as deferential, thereby confirming our own long-held prejudices about the so-called “Dark Ages”. But Hans Thijssen offers a fine corrective here, based on his extensive study of the primary sources: “At first sight the medieval academic condemnations seem to exemplify the facile generalization of older textbooks that the Middle Ages were ‘a millenium in which reason was enchained, thought was enslaved’. Although probably no one any longer upholds this unbalanced view, the medieval academic condemnations do appear to the modern reader as striking manifestations of the limitations exerted by Christian faith on the thought and teaching of university scholars. Medieval scholars, however, perceived censure from a different point of view, namely, as the exercise of teaching authority, rather than as a restraint on academic freedom” (Thijssen 1998: xii).

6. There is also a commentary on Aristotle’s Politics that has been mistakenly attributed to Buridan, though it is actually the work of Nicholas of Vaudemont, a late fourteenth-century Parisian Arts Master who was much influenced by Buridan. See Flüeler (1992, vol. 1, 132–68) and Courtenay (2004b).

7. For discussion of Peter of Spain and the teachings of the Summulae logicales, see the entry on Peter of Spain (Petrus Hispanus) in this Encyclopedia.

8. By the beginning of the fourteenth century, arts masters were no longer teaching grammar at the University of Paris. The last arts master to compose a treatise on grammar was Radulphus Brito (d. 1320). What appears to have happened is that the teaching of grammar was gradually taken over by quasi-independent colleges and other schools that grew up on the periphery of the university.

9. See John Trentman, “Ockham on Mental,” Mind N.S. 79 (1970): 586–90, and Claude Panaccio, “Semantics and Mental Language,” in The Cambridge Companion to Ockham, ed. Paul Vincent Spade, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999): 53. See also Ockham, Summa logicae I.1–3 (OPh I: 7–14).

10. Summa logicae III.3 (OPh: 46). As Paul Spade puts it, “[for Ockham,] self-reference is to be allowed except where it would lead to paradox—in short, it is licit except where it is illicit” (“Ockham on Self-Reference,” Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic 15 (1974, 299)).

11. I owe this insight to Joël Biard (1989, 196).

12. For Buridan’s treatment of the concept of infinity, see Thijssen (1991). For his conception of points, see Zupko (1993).

13. For discussion of some 14th-century views on this distinction, see Sten Ebbesen, “Is Logic Theoretical or Practical Knowledge?,” in Itinéraires d’Albert de Saxe: Paris-Vienne au XIVe siècle, ed. Joël Biard (Paris: Vrin, 1991): 267–283.

14. Hubert Hubien, “Editorial Introduction,” in Read (tr.) 2015: 61.

15. For discussion, see Paul Vincent Spade, “The Semantics of Terms,” in The Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy, ed. Norman Kretzmann, Anthony Kenny, and Jan Pinborg (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1982): 192–3, and E. J. Ashworth, “Logic, Medieval,” in The Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, vol. 5, ed. Edward Craig (London: Routledge, 1999): 753–4.

16. Thus, Peter of Spain: “Simple supposition is the taking [acceptio] of a common term for the universal thing signified by it” (Peter of Spain: Tractatus (called afterwards ‘Summulae logicales’), ed. L. M. de Rijk (Assen: van Gorcum, 1972): 81). Early terminist logicians, it should be mentioned, did not all agree about the divisions of supposition. Peter, for example, does not mention material supposition, though William of Sherwood includes it in his Introductiones in logicam, 5.2 (Norman Kretzmann, William of Sherwood’s ‘Introduction to Logic’ (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1966): 107). See also the entry on Peter of Spain (Petrus Hispanus) in this Encyclopedia.

17. William of Ockham, Summa logicae I.68; OPh I: 207. For nominalists such as Ockham, personal supposition offers a guide to ontology, since a term can supposit personally only for what exists per se.

18. Notice also that this severs the traditional connection between personal and material supposition as varieties of proper supposition. For Buridan, the only proper supposition is personal supposition; all of the others are strictly speaking improper. Stephen Read has linked Buridan’s position on material supposition as improper with the breakthrough doctrine—first fully realized in the work of Buridan’s student, Marsilius of Inghen—that material supposition is possible only if materially suppositing terms are significative, or stand for what they signify. See Read, “How is Material Supposition Possible?” in Medieval Philosophy and Theology 8 (1999): 18 and S 7.3.4: 522, where Buridan considers ‘Homo est species’ as an instance of the fallacy of equivocation.

19. The qualification, ‘at least in the first instance’, is intended to cover the conventionality of signification beyond these primary acts of imposition, which are in Buridan’s view naturally determined. He conveys this idea by saying that such concepts are acquired ‘immediately [statim]’, i.e., without deliberation: “from the singular visual cognition there immediately arises the universal intellectual cognition, and so when we see this man, we immediately think of [a] man” (S 4.5.3: 296). Nevertheless, it is clear that even the signification commonly and principally given to the term ‘man’ could be changed after the fact if everyone agreed to use it in a different way. The case is somewhat more complicated at the conceptual level, since it does not seem open to any individual language-user to change the significance of his/her concepts at will. But even these can be changed indirectly, as a result of the dialectical relationship Buridan takes to hold between concepts and spoken or written languages. Thus, someone who learns from a book that kangaroos are marsupials does not acquire a new concept, but augments or modifies the concept he already has.

20. Not surprisingly, terms in the propositions of logic are said to occur in material supposition, since logic concerns the conventional classification of significant utterances and patterns of reasoning and persuasion. Its objects are the immediate, rather than the ultimate, significates of terms. See S 4.3.2: 257–8.

21. See Paul Vincent Spade, “Why Don’t Mediaeval Logicians Ever Tell Us What They’re Doing? Or, What Is This, A Conspiracy?”, available online at

22. Hughes (1989, 97). See also the entry on medieval theories of modality in this Encyclopedia.

23. See Knuuttila (1991, 487); Lagerlund (2000, 162–4). See also Knuuttila, “Modal Logic,” in the Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy: 355–7, and medieval theories of modality, in this Encyclopedia.

24. See the entry on literary forms of medieval philosophy, in this Encyclopedia.

25. A typical list of positions can be found, e.g., in the Insolubilia of Thomas Bradwardine, which was written in the 1320s. See the entry on insolubles in this Encyclopedia.

26. Another solution, which concedes that Socrates’s proposition “is true and false at the same time”, is rejected as sacrificing too much. The problem with this theory is that it makes it impossible to give the contradictory of Socrates’s proposition, which means that it has no proper coordinates in Aristotelian logical space.

27. This is effectively Thomas Bradwardine’s solution to the Liar (see the entry on insolubles in this Encyclopedia). But it was not without precedent. Among the others who defended Buridan’s solution would have been Bonaventure, who, in the course of discussing one of Augustine’s arguments for the existence of God (Soliloquies I.15)—i.e., that if no truth exists, then some truth exists; and if some truth exists, a First Truth exists—records the objection that the first inference fails because no proposition can entail its own contradictory. Bonaventure agrees, but adds the following qualification: “one must understand that an affirmative proposition makes a two-fold assertion, one which asserts the predicate of the subject, and the other which asserts that the proposition is true … Contradiction is concerned with the first type of assertion, not the second. So when it is said that no truth exists [nulla veritas est], this proposition, insofar as it denies the predicate of the subject, does not imply its opposite, which is that some truth exists. But insofar as it asserts itself to be true, it implies that some truth exists [infert aliquam veritatem esse]” (Quaestiones disputatae de mysterio Trinitatis, q. 1, a. 1, ad 5; Latin text excerpted in Spade (1975, 53)). For other advocates of this solution, see Paul Vincent Spade, “Insolubilia” in the Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy: 249.

28. Cf. Buridan’s earlier claim that contradiction requires not only the logical form of contradiction, but the speaker’s intention (S 9.7, 2nd sophism: 943).

29. Pironet (1993, 294–5). Cf. Hughes (1982, 167–9).

30. Buridan’s presentation of this alternative is complicated somewhat by the doctrinal claim that the ‘nothing’ signified by ‘A man is a donkey’ is not any kind of proposition, but ‘that a man is a donkey [hominem esse asinum]’, which is the dictum or sentential nominalization of that proposition (expressed in Latin by the accusative + infinitive construction). In Buridanian semantics, such a construction supposits for whatever both the subject and predicate terms of its corresponding proposition supposit for, provided the proposition is true; otherwise it supposits for nothing. Gyula Klima remarks that this is how “Buridan manages to assign some credible semantic function to such sentential nominalizations without having to subscribe to a dubious ontology of eternal or quasi-eternal enuntiabilia, or complexe significabilia, distinct from ordinary substances and accidents” (Klima 2001, 844 n. 28); for Buridan’s reaction to those who did seem to subscribe to such an ontology, see section 3. Buridan’s sensitivity to the ontological dimensions of the problem emerges when he says that “‘that a man is a donkey’ is nothing, because a man cannot be a donkey [hominem esse asinum nihil est, eo quod homo non potest esse asinus]”—which also suffices for its falsity.

31. A further problem has been drawn to my attention by Paul Spade, in his comments on an earlier draft of this article: “if every proposition signifies se esse veram, and we’re construing the infinitival expression personally, we’ve got a problem. For it the proposition is false, the infinitival expression has nothing it can signify, so that the proposition really doesn’t have any additional signification at all, contrary to the whole point of the theory”. If Buridan was aware of this as an additional problem for the first solution, he does not mention it.

32. As Hughes (1982, 169) has suggested, the force of ‘virtually’ in ‘virtually implies’ is that the second proposition would be implied by the first only if the first is actually formulated. This emerges in a closing comment on the sophism in which Buridan remarks, “perfecting this solution, we have to say that every proposition, adding that it exists, implies that it is true” (S 9.8, 7th sophism: 970).

33. Of course, this holds only for affirmative propositions. Negative propositions are true if their subject and predicate terms do not stand for the same thing or things.

34. For a helpful overview, see Thijssen (1998, 2): “In many official documents and other texts, philosophers and theologians were exhorted not to cross the boundaries of their own fields—a reference to Proverbs 22:28—and not to become theologizing philosophers and philosophizing theologians”.

35. Precedents for reading ‘theology’ as ‘metaphysics’ in this context—which is somewhat obscured by the fact that the incunabular edition of Buridan’s Metaphysics commentary erroneously gives ‘metaphysica totalis’ for ‘mathematica totalis’ and ‘metaphysicus’ for ‘mathematicus’ in the 23rd and 25th lines of folio 34ra—can be found in Robert Kilwardby, De Ortu Scientiarum LXVI.655 and Thomas Aquinas, In De trin. V, a. 4, as well as in Albert the Great.

36. Thomas puts this same distinction in terms of the ratio or concept under which the subject is considered: “although philosophy considers all existing things according to concepts [rationes] taken from creatures, there must be another science, which considers existing things according to concepts [rationes] taken from the inspiration of the divine light” (In I Sent., Prol., q.1, a.1, ad 1; cf. In De trin., q.5, a.1–4).

37. For this reason as well, Buridan never tries to compare the methods of philosophy and theology, let alone to suggest how the former might be subsumed by the latter. He is aware of the possibility of rapprochement between the two sides, if only by its absence from the Parisian scene: “it seems to me that this question [about whether it is possible for demonstration to cross disciplinary lines] is difficult first because there has been exceedingly little discussion between the philosophers and the doctors [of theology], and second because it touches on the means of distinguishing the sciences, and it is even more difficult to assign whence, and in what way, the sciences originally received their distinction” (QAnPo I.23).

38. See the entry on the medieval problems of universals in this Encyclopedia, especially sections 8–10.

39. Buridan’s allusions to Plato on universals are fairly typical: see, e.g., QM VII.15: 50va-vb, and de Rijk (1992). On other topics, however, he is sometimes suspicious about whether a position handed down as Plato’s is in fact Plato’s. For example, after disposing of an argument introduced “on the authority of Plato” for the role of separate substances in the generation of living things, he concludes, “and so in this way Plato’s opinion is destroyed—if he in fact had an opinion of the sort we have ascribed to him” (QM VII.9: 47ra). For discussion of Buridan and Plato, see Schönberger (1994, 292–95).

40. For the meaning of twelfth-century nominalism, see the special issue of Vivarium (30.1, May 1992) devoted to this topic.

41. See Peter King, “John Buridan’s Solution to the Problem of Universals” in Thijssen and Zupko (2001, 1–27). King argues that Buridan’s nominalism has three interrelated aspects: (1) the ontological thesis that there are no non-individual entities in the world; (2) the psychological thesis that some concepts, though metaphysically particular, can represent more than one individual thing; and (3) the semantic thesis that such concepts also function as common names in Mental Language.

42. Cf. QIP 4: 138, ll. 565–566. Buridan’s treatment of transcendental terms is similar: “the subject of metaphysics is being, that is, the term ‘being’” (QIP 3: 135, ll. 449–450).

43. Buridan even regards it as conventional that we treat universals as second-intentional names (TDUI: 145–146). Universals are substances in the second mode of substance only, i.e., “they are terms in the category of substance” (QIP 4: 140, ll. 635–636); likewise, “‘universal’ is a transcendent name”, and such names occur on one level only (TDUI: 147); and as a form, a universal is a second intention (TDUI: 148)

44. Note also that the differences in universal names do not correspond to any real diversity in the things signified by those names, “but in the medium through which we arrive at the concepts by which those names are imposed” (QIP 11: 173, ll. 1853–1854). The “medium” is the more common or general concept, e.g., of sensing, from which the common concept of everything sensitive is formed, and names such as ‘animal’ are imposed (QIP 11: 173, ll. 1847–1850).

45. That the object of knowledge is a complexum, or proposition, rather than an incomplexum, or a term, follows from the fact that we can believe or know only what can be true or false, and only propositions can be true or false.

46. For discussion, see Klima (2009: 89–103).

47. For discussion, see Normore (1985).

48. For discussion, see Maier (1955, 214–15), McCord Adams (1987, 184–5), and Sylla (“Guide to the Text” in Streijger & Bakker 2015, c-cviii).

49. See Duhem (1906–13) and Maier (1955). For discussion, see Grant (1977).

50. Thus, for Aristotle, the thrown javelin does not continue to move because of any force inside the javelin (which is, after all, an inanimate object), but because its movement through the air creates a vacuum behind it which the surrounding air rushes in to fill, thereby pushing the javelin forward.

51. We do not know precisely where Buridan got the idea of impetus, but a less sophisticated notion of impressed forced can be found in Avicenna’s doctrine of mayl (inclination). In this he was possibly influenced by Philoponus, who was developing the Stoic notion of hormé (impulse). For discussion, see Zupko (1997).

52. We can also see this in his defense of the sufficiency of efficient causality in explanations of natural phenomena, which eventually led to the eclipse of final causality several centuries later. For discussion, see Des Chene (1996, 186–7).

53. It would not be like Buridan to rule out theological considerations completely. Indeed, he sometimes confronts theological issues with what can only be described as intellectual playfulness. Edith Sylla nicely describes his method here: “Buridan does not exclude theology from physics, along the lines of Boethius of Dacia, nor does he overwhelm physics with theology, along the lines of today’s Creationists. Rather, in a moderate way, Buridan introduces theological truths into the body of Aristotelian physics and then shows, plausibly, that to draw inferences from physics plus theology, it is necessary to add other hypotheses [e.g., to assume a reference frame for extra-cosmic motion, or a ‘time’ to measure duration before creation]—to beg the human intellect” (Sylla, “Ideo quasi mendicare oportet intellectum humanum: The Role of Theology in John Buridan’s Natural Philosophy,” in Thijssen and Zupko (2000, 244–5)).

54. For further discussion, see Krieger (1986) and Walsh (1986).

55. The page number is mistakenly given as “lxiiii” in the Paris 1513 edition.

56. For further discussion, see Zupko (1995) and Fabienne Pironet, “The Notion of ‘Non Velle’ in Buridan’s Ethics,” in Thijssen and Zupko (2001, 199–219).

57. The example is associated with Buridan by Spinoza, Ethica (completed 1676) II, scholium to Proposition 49. But by that time, it was already a philosophical commonplace. We find a similar use of Buridan’s Ass eighty years earlier, in the Logicae Assertiones (1597) of Johann Vitus Schönlin, Fiacrius Carpentarius, Georg Gutbrott, and Friedrich Faust, section 43: “What arises from fear arises freely; nor is any freedom taken away by the passions of the soul, though they threaten it and strengthen the will <to resist>. But whoever attributes freedom to a brute animal is mistaken, whether in the case where it is not inclined to walk to one place more than another, or of the kind raised by Buridan’s ass, where a hungry animal is placed between two equally good sources of food” [“Quae ex metu fiunt, libere fiunt, nec passiones animae ullae libertatem tollunt, licet eam imminuant , et voluntarium augeant. Errat vero quisquis bruto libertatem tribuit, vel eo casu, quando non allicitur ad ambulandum magis hac loci quam alia parte, aut cum famelicum inter duo aeque bona constituitur pabula, cuiusmodi fertur fuisse asinus Buridani”]. I am grateful to Miroslav Hanke for bringing this source to my attention.

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Jack Zupko <>

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