Literary Forms of Medieval Philosophy

First published Thu Oct 17, 2002; substantive revision Tue Sep 19, 2023

Medieval philosophical texts are written in a variety of literary forms, many peculiar to the period, like the summa or disputed question; others, like the commentary, dialogue, and axiom, are also found in ancient and modern sources but are substantially different in the medieval period from the classical or modern instantiations of these forms. Many philosophical texts also have a highly polemical style and/or seem deferential to the authoritative sources they cite. Further, medieval philosophical thinkers operated under the threat of censure from political and religious authority, moving them, some have argued, to write esoterically or indirectly to protect themselves from persecution for their true views. All these literary and rhetorical features make medieval philosophical texts considerably more difficult to understand and interpret than modern or even classical philosophical texts. Moreover, the broad range of genres used in medieval philosophy raises questions about the nature of philosophical writing in general when compared to the much more restricted set of accepted forms in modern and contemporary philosophical works.

1. Historical Sources

Medieval philosophical texts have as their formal sources Greek commentaries, Neoplatonic treatises, dialogues, and allegories, as well as Aristotelian treatises, and the works of Augustine. Before the formal development of universities and university curricula that dictated the established forms for writing philosophical/theological texts in the 13th century, medieval philosophical texts were written in a wide variety of forms. From the 10th to the 12th century, writers in the Christian, Jewish, and Arabic traditions composed dialogues, allegories, axiomatic works, disputations, and summae, while the 13th and 14th centuries in the Latin West were dominated by commentaries, principally on Peter Lombard’s Sentences and the works of Aristotle, various forms of the disputed question, and the summa.

The sources and history of these different forms will be discussed under each of the forms considered. After the discussion of the principal literary forms, the role of authoritative authors and influence of concerns about censorship and persecution on the form and rhetoric of medieval philosophical texts, the historical development in these literary forms within the medieval period will be considered.

2. Literary Forms

2.1 Allegory and Allegoresis

The models for allegorical writings and allegorizing of traditional texts (allegoresis) come to the Middle Ages through Neoplatonic sources and, for Jewish and Arabic thinkers, from traditions of biblical commentary and the Qur’an itself (Shatz 2003; Ivry 2000). As Ivry puts it, the Qur’an effects “a significant change in the Biblical legacy, treating individual persons and events as universal types and symbols. This approach turns the Qur’anic presentations of Biblical stories into allegories, the persons involved into emblems of virtue or vice” (Ivry 2000, 155). Jewish philosophers themselves read the Hebrew bible and rabbinic literature philosophically, interpreting its stories as having another, esoteric meaning behind the literal one. The Jewish philosopher Philo is the most important figure in the development of this kind of philosophical allegorization, though his influence is accepted to be greater on Christian than Jewish thinkers, most significantly on Augustine. Nonetheless, Jewish philosophers regularly allegorize scripture and are also influenced by allegorical readings given in rabbinic and midrashic literature (Shatz 2003). Neoplatonic writers developed allegorical readings of both Plato and classical literature, finding in these diverse texts figures of the spiritual journey from this world to the next. They also composed their own allegories on similar themes.

The underlying presupposition of allegory is that things can come to stand for something else. For the Neoplatonists this possibility is based on the relationship of material things to the One from which they have emanated. Because things come from the One, they are fragmentary reflections of the fullness of that goodness. The allegorical interpretation of whole texts rather than particular episodes or images dates from the 3rd century. It is based on the idea that the text as a whole reflects the “Neoplatonic ideology of ‘organic’ order” in which any part of the composition or cosmos is a symbol of the One, from which everything proceeds (Whitman 2000, 36). Aristotle has a role to play as well: his distinction between demonstrative, dialectical, and rhetorical reasoning is used to interpret the Qur’an and to justify different types of writing for different audiences. Moreover, Aristotle’s Poetics is used by Avicenna to justify writing in the form of stories (Whitman 2000, 47–8). For those within the religious traditions of Judaism, Islam, or Christianity, allegory is based on the inspired character of scripture into which God has inserted many layers of meaning. Though Islamic philosophers had an independent religious tradition of allegorical literature from which they could draw, the allegories from medieval Islamic thinkers tend to concern the same Neoplatonic themes of the ascent of the soul and the Neoplatonic structure of the cosmos, allegorizing the stages of emanation from and return to the One. The most common form of Islamic philosophical allegory is on the theme of the heavenly ascent or journey, a philosophical rather than prophetic rewriting of the spiritual journey of the prophet Mohammed. Avicenna wrote two allegories of this type, Risâlat at-tair (Treatise of the Bird) and Hayy ibn Yaqzân. (Heath 1992, has also translated from Persian an allegory of Avicenna’s, Mi’râj Nâma, The Book of the Prophet Muhammad’s Ascent to Heaven.) In the Treatise of the Bird, a group of birds fly on a long journey in search of truth over nine mountain ranges, each a dangerous and a tempting resting place; in the second, the narrator, consulting Hayy, a sage, makes a cosmic journey from west to east, ending in a vision of God (Avicenna 1980). Ibn Tufayl’s Hayy ibn Yaqzân takes its name from Avicenna’s allegory and claims to reveal in it the secrets of Avicenna’s “Oriental philosophy” (Avicenna 1980; Ibn Tufayl 2009). Ibn Tufayl’s version may have been one of the models for Daniel Defoe’s Robinson Crusoe. This story of a boy abandoned on an island and raised by a gazelle recounts the boy’s survival and progress in understanding from what is necessary for survival, to a grasp of the laws of the universe, culminating in a mystical experience. The boy’s progress symbolizes the path and powers of unaided human reason, able to advance from complete ignorance to union with the divine.

In the Latin West, philosophical allegory flourished in the 12th century. Authors like Bernard Silvestris, Thierry of Chartres, William of Conches, and Alan of Lille took up allegoresis and allegory as a way of assimilating works and ideas from classical antiquity, especially the creation myth and cosmology of Plato’s Timaeus. One of the most important, Bernard Silvestris’s Cosmographia, is an allegorical account of the origins of the world, both narrative and structural. Bernard tells the story of Natura asking Noys to bring some order to prime matter. Book I traces the creation of the material world, and book II, the creation of man (Bernard Silvestris 1973). Bernard’s main source for this myth of creation is Plato’s Timaeus but his myth making is combined with philosophical and scientific speculation. Like Alan of Lille’s allegories, De Planctu Naturae and Anticlaudianus, Bernard’s work is both allegorical and encyclopedic, two forms which were also combined in an important classical model for these works, Martianus Capella’s The Marriage of Mercury and Philology. What is remarkable about these works is the combination of allegory with science and philosophy. These writers do not think of the mythic and the scientific as opposing discourses. Rather, the creation of new myths is associated with the work of creation, linking the work of God as artifex with that of the composer of allegory. Science and allegory are also linked by the activity of de-allegorization, the process of extracting the abstract and philosophical message hidden in the allegory. According to Brian Stock, until the middle of the 12th century, it was taken as a given that allegories contained hidden philosophical information (Stock 1972, 31).

The controversial and difficult question is why these medieval thinkers chose the allegorical form, and whether the text can be understood without its allegorical form. Avicenna tells us that what he purports to do by allegory is to convey one message to the “many” in sensible imagery they can understand, while conveying a different message to the philosophically minded few (Heath 1992, 150–153). Neoplatonic and Christian writers, although citing the importance of not ‘casting one’s pearls before swine’, also cite the need to provide access through the senses to a non-sensible reality and the need to use obvious metaphors so that their language will not be taken for a literally true representation of the divine. In the secondary literature, the most common interpretation of the reason for the allegorical form is that the allegory is an heuristic device that makes the difficult and abstract message easier to understand. On this view, the allegorical form can be stripped away without changing the meaning of the text. Others have argued that for some writers, the allegorical form is chosen because the mystical message or account of spiritual union with the good exceeds what can be expressed in the literal language of logic and argument (Sweeney 2006, 38–61, 157–175). Some have argued, further, that the indirection of Maimonides’ Guide, for example, is based both on the inability to represent the divine nature but also, failing that, designed to transform the reader making his/her way to God (Whitman 2000, 51; Harvey 1988, 69–71). On this view, the allegorical form is an essential aspect of the text and, hence, cannot be excised without detriment to the author’s meaning. Lastly, some argue that the motive for allegory is esoteric. On this view, most famously propounded by Leo Strauss and his followers, writers fearing persecution and misinterpretation decided to “hide” their true views behind the façade of allegory, in order to protect both themselves and their message. (For more on esotericism, see section 4 below.)

2.2 Aphorism

This form is not terribly common in the medieval period. Two works worthy of mention are Al-Farabi’s political aphorisms and a text attributed to Hermes Trismegistus, but thought to have been written in the 12th century by a Christian Neoplatonist, called The Book of Twenty-Four Philosophers. This text consists of twenty-four definitions of God, the most famous of which is, “God is an infinite sphere whose center is everywhere and whose circumference is nowhere,” quoted by Alan of Lille, Meister Eckhart, and others (Hudry 1997). Al-Farabi’s work, known as “Selected Aphorisms”, gets this title from its opening lines, in which Al-Farabi says the work consists of selected aphorisms from the ancients (Plato and Aristotle) “concerning that by which cities ought to be governed and made prosperous...” (Butterworth 2001, 5–6). This “primer for politics” contains discussion of the nature of the soul, virtue, the virtuous regime, and happiness. Its disjointed character and the way in which Al-Farabi composes it not from his own views but those of Aristotle and Plato make the form of the work central to its meaning: Is Al-Farabi endorsing views but without saying outright that they are his own because to hold them might be dangerous? What are the principles of selection at work? What is not being said? The aphoristic form seems to raise some of the same questions about possible esoteric motivations as does the allegorical form. In the case of The Book of the Twenty-Four Philosophers the form seems to derive from the inaccessibility of the divine nature to human intellection. Thus, one comes closer to avoiding misrepresentation of the divine nature by using paradoxical or metaphoric formulations rather than literal ones.

Some medieval works fall somewhere between aphorism and axiom in genre, most significantly works connected to the important and influential Liber de causis. The Liber circulated as a work of Aristotle under the title Liber Aristotelis de expositione bonitatis purae until the 13th century, when Thomas Aquinas found its source in Proclus’s Elements of Theology. Like Proclus’s theology, the work seems to present its principles as axioms, but the principles and their explanation/derivation is not really demonstrative and the principles themselves are highly abstract Neoplatonic metaphysical principles that are sometimes as paradoxical as they are self-evident. Boethius’s theological opuscule known as De Hebdomadibus (this work is traditionally the third of five theological tractates) and Alan of Lille’s Regulae Caelestis Iuris are presented as axiomatic but also esoteric, with the express statement of the author that their principles are not accessible to the many. (See section 2.3 below, on axiom, for more discussion of these works.)

2.3 Axiom

There are two different sources for axiomatic works in the Middle Ages: Euclid and Proclus. For Proclus the axiomatic form mirrors the metaphysical structure of emanation. As all being emanates from the One, all propositions are derived from axioms. In his commentary on Euclid, Proclus contends that the scientific structure in which all propositions are proved from first principles is peculiar to the mathematical sciences, as befitting the middle status of mathematics between metaphysics and physics. Two important axiomatic works, Boethius’ De Hebdomadibus and Alan of Lille’s Regulae Caelestis Iuris, seem to follow both Proclus’s Elements of Theology, taking Neoplatonic metaphysical principles as their axioms, and the model of deriving conclusions from those principles, the method Proclus attributes to Euclid and to mathematics alone. The axiomatic form in Euclid is more complex, relying not just on first principles (communis animi conceptio), the only type of principle used by Boethius and Alan, but also on definitions, petitiones, theorems, etc. Euclid is the model for Nicholas of Amiens’s Ars Catholicae Fidei. However, even when thinkers like Nicholas of Amiens use the Euclidean axiomatic model, they are still relying on the justification and principles of Neoplatonic metaphysics, grounding the form in the metaphysics of emanation.

The influence of this form goes beyond 12th-century attempts to compose axiomatic philosophical/theological works in the tradition of Boethius’s De Hebdomadibus (like Alan’s Regulae Caelestis Iuris and Nicholas of Amiens’s Ars Catholicae Fidei). First, the form is taken up by Leibniz in his axiomatic works. Second, early medieval notions of science are indebted to these Neoplatonic models of science, models that continue to be influential even after the reappearance of Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics. Further, the geometric methods of “analysis” and “synthesis” (“resolutio/compositio”), which work to and from first principles or axioms and is linked to axiomatic method in both its Proclusian and Euclidean forms, is important not only for later medieval thinkers like Aquinas, but also for Descartes, Newton, and Galileo (Sweeney 1994).

2.4 Commentary

The ancient tradition of commentary on Aristotle begins with the edition of Aristotle by Andronicus of Rhodes, although not much survives from this period. The study of Aristotle became part of the Neoplatonic school curriculum, which began with the Categories and progressed through the Organon to the Physics and Metaphysics. The curriculum culminated in the study of the Platonic dialogues, ending with the Timaeus and Parmenides. This school context for commentaries became part of the commentary texts themselves in introductory remarks to the Aristotelian corpus and to individual works. Thus, authors covered a certain number of introductory questions about the context for studying Aristotle and the particular Aristotelian work under consideration, responses which assume the Neoplatonic curriculum. (For more on the ancient commentary tradition, see Sorabji 1990.) The greatest influence in the Middle Ages, both Latin and Islamic, is the Neoplatonic tradition of commentary beginning with Porphyry. Porphyry authored a work, no longer extant, showing the ultimate harmony of Plato and Aristotle. In his commentary on the Peri Hermeneias, Boethius repeated the same view and the ambition to prove it through his work of translation and commentary (Boethius Com. in lib. Peri hermeneias, 79–80). Porphyry also originates the view of Aristotle’s Categories as about words not things, and more specifically as about words as they apply to sensible things, thus leaving open the possibility that words might operate in a very different way when they refer to Platonic forms (Marenbon 1999, 107–116). This view of the categories as categories of words is also transmitted by Boethius to the Middle Ages where it becomes standard. The larger view of Aristotle’s teachings enshrined in this interpretive shift is that Aristotle and Plato’s view can both be true, and hence, harmonious, if they are understood as writing about different things, Aristotle about the sublunary world and Plato about the world beyond matter and change. Throughout the Middle Ages, there is some degree of Neoplatonic distortion of Aristotle’s teaching in commentaries on his works. It tends to be less significant in the logical works and in the non-theological portions of the Physics and greater in De Anima and sometimes Metaphysics commentaries.

The placement of Aristotelian works in this kind of context is transmitted to the Latin Middle Ages by Boethius. Boethius thus brings to the medieval tradition of commentary both the obvious and more subtle Neoplatonic distortions of the Aristotelian corpus. First, Boethius’s commentaries are highly indebted to Neoplatonic sources. The thesis that Boethius simply copied his commentaries from a single codex’s collection of Greek commentators’ remarks is too extreme, but it is nevertheless clear that Boethius relied heavily on Neoplatonic sources. We can see this in his commentary on the Categories, where we have all of Boethius’s sources. Here Boethius uses Porphyry as his main source, while supplementing this material with other Neoplatonic sources (Ebbesen 1990, 376–77). Had Boethius managed to get to the Physics or Metaphysics for commentary, we might have seen his own Neoplatonic interpretations of Aristotle emerge more strongly. As it is, such leanings are evident, for example, in his commentary on the Peri Hermeneias. In his discussion of future contingents, Boethius follows the Neoplatonists, arguing for the view that while there is real contingency in the sublunary world, there is also necessity operating at other levels. Though he does not argue for providence until writing his Consolation, he does make room for such a possibility in his Peri Hermeneias commentary. There he argues, following Alexander of Aphrodisias, that some things are necessitated, some subject to human control, and some are matters of chance; Aristotle is right that some things are undetermined, yet the Stoics are also right that some things are necessitated and all things, though not necessitated by it, are subject to the divine will (Boethius 1880, 220–236, Sweeney 2006, 16–20; Chadwick 1981, 159–63). Thus, Boethius follows the Neoplatonic strategy of placing Aristotle’s view into a larger philosophical context where it can be seen as part of but not the whole truth.

Averroes (Ibn Rushd), who comes to be known as “the Commentator” in the Latin West because of his magisterial grasp of Aristotle, is another important influence on the medieval commentary tradition. He declares on numerous occasions that his aim in commenting on Aristotle is to explain the Aristotelian text, a task he adheres to faithfully and with great success even though he lacked any knowledge of Greek. He does not introduce non-Aristotelian material to explain Aristotle; he does not even, for example, make reference to Porphyry’s introduction to the Categories, the Isagoge, to help make sense of the Categories. He does, however, add to the Aristotelian text in two ways. First and most ubiquitously, he divides Aristotle’s text into sections and chapters, some of which follow the divisions we now have, some of which he devises himself. The origin of the modern textual divisions of Aristotle’s work is not known and those divisions are not authoritative. Averroes may have worked with a text that contained no divisions at all; thus he would have had to supply them all (Butterworth 1983, 6–8). Further, Averroes adds explanations of aspects of Aristotle’s text that are especially unclear or terse, and adds references to other works in the Aristotelian corpus to help explain particular texts. Averroes, like other ancient and medieval commentators, assumed that there was no significant change or development in Aristotle’s views over time and therefore that his different works are consistent with each other.

Averroes wrote three different kinds of commentaries, which have come to be known as “short,” “middle,” and “long” commentaries. Scholars have now shown that these terms, though used to describe various kinds of commentary by Averroes or his editors, are often very fluid and do not mark off clear cut genres (Gutas 1993, 31–42). Nonetheless, it is clear that Averroes composes different kinds of commentaries to serve different pedagogical goals. He writes summaries or synopses of Aristotle’s works, as well as full-blown commentaries. Some commentaries work toward an explanation of the letter of the text; in these the source text is first cited and then interpreted virtually word for word. This is done sometimes in the form of a continuous text, other times in the form of marginal notations to the main text. Still other commentaries, the type traditionally known as “middle” commentaries, are explanations of the sense rather than the letter, paraphrasing rather than commenting thoroughly on the source text (Gutas 1993, 33–5).

In the Latin West during the 12th and 13th centuries the goal of commentary was to explain the author’s intention. However, until the end of the 13th century, commentators worked on the assumption that the author intended to express the truth; thus every effort was made to bring an author’s text into harmony with the truth as the author understands it from what he takes to be authoritative sources. This attitude toward texts is generally thought to emerge from the tradition of biblical exegesis, where the biblical text is assumed to be true, to be in accord with the basic articles of faith, and, hence, as needing to be interpreted from within those parameters. Moreover, as interpreters began to collect different interpretations of biblical texts, they tended to deal with conflicts between authorities by attempting to harmonize different opinions rather than simply keeping some and discarding others. So, in an analogous way, for example, Aquinas supports Aristotle’s astronomy even in the face of conflicting mathematical evidence from Ptolemy. He argues that Ptolemy’s account “saves the appearances” but may not in fact be true since the phenomena could be saved in some other way (Aquinas 1964, I, lec. 3; Lohr 1982, 93–94). Also, Aquinas tries to save Aristotle from unambiguously holding the position that the world is eternal, arguing that Aristotle’s argument for the eternity of motion might be merely hypothetical (Aquinas 1964, Bk. I, lec. 29). In general, medieval Latin commentators through the 13th century rarely abandon the principle that the text makes some kind of sense. Thus, even when the Aristotelian text is extremely cryptic, corrupt, or terse, commentators make every effort to give the text a clear and consistent sense, even if it must be almost completely constructed. A very striking example of the commentator’s art in this regard is Aquinas’s commentary on Aristotle’s De Anima, especially his commentary on the very difficult passages on the workings of the intellect (De Anima III, 5; Aquinas 1994, III, lec. 7–10). As Kenny and Pinborg note, Ockham justified a less literal reading of Aristotle by asserting that Aristotle often speaks metaphorically; at the other extreme, Latin Averroists offered views that might be seen as contrary to Church teaching by maintaining that they were only interpreting Aristotle, not developing their own view (Kenny and Pinborg 1982, 29–30). A less dramatic but nonetheless important change introduced by medieval commentators, continuing in commentaries after 1300, is making divisions of the text and adding descriptions of the overall structure and forward progression of its arguments. These divisions and outlines of the text serve to give unity and coherence to a text even if it might lack these features on its own.

Starting in 1255, study in the work of the arts faculty at Paris was officially centered around the works of Aristotle. Further, the commentaries of the masters of arts rather than of theology brought a different hermeneutic to the interpretation of Aristotle. No longer committed to Aristotle as a source for the truth (the truth was possessed by theology), the masters of arts did not try to bring Aristotle into harmony with other authoritative sources and felt free to expose rather than try to save Aristotle from holding what they took to be erroneous positions. Because Aristotle was no longer considered an essentially error-free authoritative source, commentaries shifted to an emphasis on questions arising from the text rather than the exposition of text (Lohr 1982, 95–6). This shift is heralded by most scholars as marking an important development toward modern notions of both science and commentary.

Nonetheless, even with this change in the status of the Aristotelian works, Aristotle remained an authority in the sense that his texts were still the starting point for discussion, and medieval philosophy in general remained centered on authoritative texts and, hence, on their commentaries. This emphasis on the commentary points to two important differences between medieval and much contemporary philosophy. First, medieval philosophical writers understood their own work as emerging out of a tradition of authorities rather than in abstraction from or in opposition to a tradition (see below section 3, “Role of Authorities”). Second, their work emerges out of an encounter with texts rather than in unmediated contact with ideas, problems, or arguments. (On the assumptions and characteristics of a commentary-based notion of philosophy see Smith 1991, 3–7.) These ways of doing philosophy do not mean that medieval philosophers were incapable of originality, only that their original thought comes out of an acknowledged connection with what went before. Nor does it mean that medieval philosophers were not engaged with ideas but only words and texts. For, they would argue, we can only confront ideas through the language in which they are expressed.

The use of the commentary form expanded beyond its use in biblical exegesis and ancient authors (primarily Aristotle) to commentaries on Medieval texts treated as authoritaties to be commented on, for example Peter Lombard’s Sentences and Maimonides Guide for the Perplexed, and in the second scholastic period the Summa theologiae of Thomas Aquinas (See below, section 2.8 on commentaries on Peter Lombard’s Sentences and also recent work on the tradition of commentary on Maimonides Guide, De Souza 2018).

2.5 Dialogue

The classical source for medieval writers of dialogue should have been Plato; but Western writers had no direct access to Plato’s dialogues, with the exception of the first half of the Timaeus. The number and diversity of dialogues from the medieval period is, hence, surprising, with instances among the works of writers from Augustine to Ockham and Nicolas of Cusa, and across different religious traditions. Though it has been argued that dialogue as a philosophical form dies off in late antiquity, especially in the Christian tradition, this is clearly false in the medieval period (Goldhill 2008, 5–8). Not only are philosophical dialogues plentiful but, perhaps because they were not overwhelmed by Plato as a model, medieval dialogue writers came up with many variations on the form. While a good number use real or realistically-described characters, there are also many where the participants are allegorical figures, like Boethius’s Lady Philosophy in the Consolatio or “Reason” in Augustine’s Soliloquies. A number of 12th century writers also imitated more specifically the prosimetrum of Boethius’s Consolation combining prose dialogue with poetry, exploring the hybrid of physical and spiritual in the cosmos and body and soul in human nature (Balint 2009). While some instances of this form, for example Boethius’s commentary in dialogue form on Porphyry’s Isagoge, simply make use of the form as a vehicle for straightforward exposition, others make the dialogue form intrinsic to the argument. And while the standard form of a philosophical dialogue is between a teacher and student figure, a number of medieval dialogues ignore this convention. Abelard’s Dialogue between a Philosopher, a Jew, and a Christian (Collationes), for example, traces a dispute between three equal partners, none of whom is the “teacher” whom the others more or less meekly follow. Abelard’s dialogue is essentially a dispute without a master to resolve it. Even if, as many scholars think, the dialogue is unfinished and Abelard meant to add a resolution of the dialogue in the form of a final adjudication by someone playing the role of master, it is noteworthy that, unlike in most philosophical dialogues, the magisterial point of view is absent until the end rather than being the one that directs the discussion.

Other dialogue writers like Gilbert Crispin, Petrus Alphonsi, Raymund Lull, and Nicolas of Cusa also write dialogues in which the participants are representatives of the major religions: Christian, Jew, Muslim, pagan, or philosopher. While some take care to give the victory to the Christian, even transforming the other participants into converts to Christianity, Gilbert, Petrus, Abelard, and Raymund Lull all opt for subtler conclusions. Abelard’s dialogue sets up a “judge” for the debate who never proffers a judgment. Even if Abelard had added this final judgment, the dialogue would still not indicate a clear winner. Dialogue is a favorite form in the growing Adversos Iudaeos literature of the late 11th and 12th centuries. And insofar as the dialogue form was especially prevalent in this period, it is part of a growing rationalism. Writers composing dialogues between Christian and Jewish (or pagan) spokesmen are at the same time shifting the grounds of those arguments from proof texts from scripture to arguments grounded in the notion that the truths of the faith were self-evident and could be convincing even to those not sharing common beliefs or authoritative texts (Cohen 1999, 167–218; Palmén and Koskinen 2016). There are dialogues by Jewish thinkers in which philosophical and different religious perspectives debate, partially in response to Christian polemical dialogues, most famously Judah Halevi’s dialogue known as the Kuzari. The work is a dialogue between a pagan king, who speaks as a philosopher, and a Jewish sage, and includes the appearance of representatives of Islam and Christianity working to convert the king. Though the dialogue form continues to be used in the Latin West after the 12th century, its place as the form for rational argumentation is overtaken by the more formal and elaborate school form of disputation in the 13th (Novikoff 2012, 341–343, 349).

When the convention of composing a dialogue between a teacher and student is used, usually the author can be identified more or less with the “teacher.” In Ibn Gabirol’s (Avicenbron) dialogue, best known by its Latin title, Fons vitae, the student is mostly restricted to asking the teacher for explanations and demonstrations. Anselm’s dialectical partner in Cur Deus Homo is the student Boso who as a Christian asks the questions that a non-Christian monotheist would ask about the Incarnation. Boethius, however, casts himself as student rather than teacher in the Consolatio. Of those who compose dialogues between teacher and student a good number, such as those of Augustine, Eriugena, Anselm, Boethius, and Nicolas of Cusa expect and trace a conversion or transformation in the “student” figure of the dialogue in a way that Plato’s dialogues do not. Anselm explicitly makes of his interlocutor a partner in the dialogue who is supposed to anticipate conclusions and implications and/or who more truly motivates the entire discussion (Sweeney 1999). Like Anselm, other medieval dialogue writers play with the convention that the teacher takes the lead in the discussion, in effect asking as well as answering questions. In Eriugena’s Periphyseon, it is sometimes the student, sometimes the teacher who moves the discussion forward. In William of Conches’ dialogue, Dragmaticon philosophiae, the ‘Prince’ asks questions of the ‘philosopher’ who represents William’s views. In an interesting variation, William of Ockham’s Dialogus has the student ask the questions while the teacher responds reluctantly and almost objectively without any attempt to transform or convert the student.

The variety of ways in which the dialogue form is taken up in the medieval period alone is enough to make the form as such quite interesting. In addition, as Jacobi points out, because the dialogue, unlike the disputation and commentary, is not a school form, it was always taken up as a choice and with some degree of self-consciousness on the part of the writer (Jacobi 1999, 10). They chose this form over some other for a reason that affects the argument and the position they take. (For bibliographical listings for some 160 dialogues written from the 4th century to the 15th as well as essays on the dialogues of 19 different medieval dialogue writers, see Jacobi 1999.)

Goldhill’s contention that there is something in Christianity inhospitable to dialogue is literally false but gets at a more difficult question about how and whether dissent is tolerated in medieval Christianity, with parallel questions that have and should be asked about medieval Jewish and Muslim culture. (See below, sections 3 and 4.) While neither medieval philosophical dialogues nor the forms of disputation which grew out of them can be reduced to catechism-like question and answer (Goldhill 2009, 5), it is a complex matter to determine whether the rational form of dialogue and disputation foster real open discussion and dissent or control it within strict and non-threatening limits. The same question could, of course, be meaningfully asked about dialogue in antiquity, in non-Christian religious traditions, and in the modern era. In an important sense, it is often too much rather than too little faith in reason in the Latin West, expressed in medieval dialogue and disputation, which leads some to the notion that reason can prove the truth of Christianity over Judaism or Islam, and, then, to condemnation of resistance to Christianity as irrational (Cohen 1999; Sweeney 2012a, 324–5).

2.6 Disputation, Quaestio, Quodlibetal Question

In the Latin West, as the universities developed in the 13th and 14th centuries, two forms for philosophical and theological speculation were incorporated into the curriculum, the disputed question and the Sentences Commentary. The De Fallaciis attributed to Aquinas defines a disputed question as a set of syllogistic arguments on different sides of a question to be resolved (Bazán 1985, 22). Bazán gives a more complete definition as follows: “a disputed question is a regular form of teaching, apprenticeship and research, presided over by a master, characterized by a dialectical method which consists of bringing forward and examining arguments based on reason and authority which oppose one another on a given theoretical or practical problem and which are furnished by participants, and where the master must come to a doctrinal solution by an act of determination which confirms him in his function as master” (Bazán 1985, 40). Disputations took place both privately between a master and his students, and publicly or “solemnly” at an event that replaced regular classes at the university and was attended by the larger university community. The latter practice was eventually codified by university statute, which prescribed that masters would hold a certain number of disputations at various times of the year, sometimes as frequently as once a week. Most scholars agree that the process came to be divided into two sessions. In the first session, supporting and opposing arguments for a given thesis or question were brought forward, and, in a preliminary way, clarified and determined by a student serving as the respondens under the supervision of the master. During the second session, the master himself would make the determination, give his answer and respond to all the opposing arguments. Some disputed questions we have in written form are clearly taken from the different stages in this process, either a reportatio of the first day’s session, some abbreviation of the debate, or one reflecting the master’s answer and response to opposing objections, redacted after the second day’s debate.

Disputation arises out of and is an academic formalization of the philosophical dialogue (Novikoff 2012) and comes into the classroom as an outgrowth of the lectio, the careful reading and commentary on authoritative texts (Kenny and Pinborg 1982, 20–25). This type of reading involved the consultation of authoritative sources on those texts. From the differences among sources came the need to resolve such differences, a process eventually formalized into the posing of a question. A question is tied to a specific textual problem or conflict, but has, like the disputation, arguments on opposing sides and the response or resolution and replies to opposite objections by the master. The disputation is centered around a systematic rather than a textual question, and the supporting and opposing arguments are supplied by students.

A special form of disputation, quodlibetal (quodlibet = any, whatever) questions, differed from ordinary disputations in that they were open to the broader public — other masters, students from other schools, other church and civil authorities — and took place only during Advent and Lent. The questions were not set by the master but could be posed by any member of the audience and without any prior notice to the master who would determine the question. These questions might reflect contemporary controversies or might be designed to pose a question that brought to the fore a difficulty for the particular master of whom it was asked because of his other stated views. The popularity of these public spectacles shows the importance and influence of scholastic disputation on the larger culture. (Novikoff 2012, 2013).

An important function of the master in both quodlibetal and disputed questions is the determinatio, in which the master ordered the various smaller questions into articles of a given question. Like the division of the text that is part of the work of commentary, this strategy involves both making distinctions, for which medieval scholastics are well-known, but also a synthesis, finding the unity of a text and the unity of a set of diverse questions under larger questions in the disputation. The collections that have been made of the quodlibetal literature show how diverse the questions posed were and how much less unified the treatment (Glorieux 1925–35; Schabel 2006–7). We can also see, by contrast, how much more a matter of literary art the more unified and organized disputed questions are that are based on questions set by and organized in sequence by a master.

All of these forms, disputation, quaestio, and quodlibetal question, represent what has been called “the institutionalization of conflict” in medieval intellectual life. Raising questions or objections about anything from basic matters of Christian belief — the existence of God, the coherence of the doctrine of the Trinity — to important contemporary controversies — the power of the papacy or secular princes, ecclesiastical corruption — was not only permitted but encouraged as part of the structure of university life. Thus, there was an important kind of intellectual and academic freedom enshrined in these practices of formal and public debate. On the other hand, those questions were also in some ways controlled exactly because they were brought into an existing institution and structured in a particular way. Thus, the questions, even though asked, were in another way made less dangerous and subversive by being posed and controlled from within the university, which itself operated under the watchful eye of the Church. (For a study of the ways in which medieval philosophical disputation made its way out of the university, affecting the larger culture, see Novikoff 2013.)

The disputation also develops in a different direction within the universities, into forms whose function was training in argumentative techniques in which the goal is besting an opponent. Different forms developed, with different rules for the opponent and respondent. In the better known ars obligatoria, the opponent poses a question and the respondent answers, while in another form, the opponent constructs arguments to refute something held by the respondent, and the respondent must react to the opponent’s claims (Angellelli 1970; Pérez-Ilzarbe 2011, 130–1). (See below, section 2.9.)

2.7 Meditation, Soliloquy

‘Meditation’ as a term for a form of medieval philosophical writings belongs most properly to Anselm and most famously to his Proslogion and Monologion; it is closely related to soliloquy and Augustine’s Confessions, as well as some of the works of Bonaventure. (Anselm calls his Proslogion an “address” instead of a meditation or soliloquy. The Proslogion is addressed to God, but its method for understanding God is similar to the Monologion, which Anselm calls a meditation.) In all these works, the form is that of an introspective search, often in the explicit form of an internal dialogue. While sentence collections and disputed questions make very explicit the different sources and vocabularies that clash with each other and with that of the author of a question, meditation and soliloquy show no particular reliance on authoritative sources.

The source for Anselm’s meditations is the practice of monastic meditation on texts from scripture or on one’s own spiritual condition. Anselm takes these techniques for focusing the mind and uses them as mode of inquiry into problems of speculative theology and philosophy. Anselm’s meditations make no direct reference to outside sources, either scriptural or philosophical, but represent Anselm’s own thought process as he struggles with what he cannot quite understand or prove. In monastic style, he has so thoroughly ‘ruminated’ on his source texts, scripture and Augustine’s De Trinitate, that they are essentially invisible to contemporary readers. This independence from authority and emphasis on internal exploration also characterizes Augustine’s Soliloquies, a ‘dialogue’ between Augustine and ‘Reason’, as well as Abelard’s Soliloquium, a ‘dialogue’ between “Peter” and “Abelard” on the meaning and overlap between the names ‘Christian’, ‘philosopher’ and ‘logician’. In his Itinararium mentis in Deum, Bonaventure draws on a particularly Franciscan form of contemplation, following the path of St. Francis’s mystical ascent to God, based on Francis’s vision of the six-winged seraph. In Bonaventure, as in Anselm, meditation is connected to the mystical project of achieving union with God.

Anselm retains the personal and intimate nature of meditation also characteristic of Augustine’s Confessions. It is worth noting that among the other works that Anselm labels ‘meditations’ are a “meditation on lost virginity” and a “meditation on redemption.” These are highly personal works, concerned with the existential conditions of sin and salvation. The Proslogion and Monologion share with them this personal or existential character. As Anselm Stolz points out, each step of Anselm’s argument in the Proslogion either takes the form of or concludes in prayer (Stolz 1967, 198–201). According to scholars who take the form of the Proslogion as meditation seriously, that form makes it impossible to understand the argument as a “proof” for God’s existence designed to convince an agnostic or atheist on a purely rational level. Rather, they argue, the text is an attempt by Anselm to address and approach God and is thus written by and for a believing Christian trying to understand and achieve union with God. On the other hand, other scholars take as most significant in the form not Anselm’s prayers but his complete reliance on his own reason without apparent recourse to authority, making the form itself an important model for independent and truly philosophical discourse. Both the introspective element and independence from authority are retained in Descartes’ Meditations, about which similar questions have been raised concerning its form. In the Middle Ages, the importance of the form shows the continuation of philosophy or philosophical theology as what Pierre Hadot has called a “way of life.” On this view, until the high scholasticism of the 13th and 14th centuries, philosophy was essentially a spiritual and personal project of self-discipline and self-transformation, rather than an abstract and school-based problem-solving set of techniques (Hadot 1995, 269–70). Christianity before the 13th century, Hadot argues, presented itself as a philosophy, a way of life, and Christian monasticism and its practices of meditations were meant to be a path into this spiritually transformative experience (See Hadot 1995, 126–141, for the links between ancient “spiritual exercises” and “Christian philosophy”.)

2.8 Sentences and Sentences Commentaries

Sentences as a genre is a development of earlier collections of sayings or citations of the church fathers. Such collections, known as florilegia, were collections of citations organized around the order of scripture. The development of the scholastic sentences collection can be attributed jointly to Anselm of Laon, Abelard, and Peter Lombard. Anselm of Laon and his school, so famously criticized by Abelard in his Historia Calamitatum, can be credited with developing a critical approach to the authorities they cited; they sometimes disregarded or criticized opinions rather than always seeking to preserve them all (Colish 1994, 42–46). The next significant development is in the organization of these collections, from an organization following the order of scripture to an organization based on systematic questions of theology. Such a change brings speculative and philosophical questions to the fore, questions concerning the divine nature and metaphysics, and anthropological and ethical problems. Peter Abelard’s Sic et Non opposes authoritative quotations from church fathers on particular questions arranged in an order and on topics that are systematic rather than narrative. What Abelard attempted in the various versions of Theologia but did not ever manage successfully to do was to gather those various questions into a systematic organization and division of theology as a discipline. This was the achievement of Peter Lombard.

Peter Lombard’s Sentences was by far the most successful instance of the form. Commenting on it became an academic requirement for the master of theology in the 13th century, a status it retained until the later 15th century, with new commentaries still appearing in the 18th (Silano 2007, xxx). (The nature of these commentaries varies quite a bit, early commentaries tending to be line by line glosses, and later ones more often a series of quaestiones on more or less selected topics raised by Peter. See Evans 2002 and Rosemann 2009.) Though Peter claims in his prologue merely to have made a collection of the views of Church Fathers and most historians have taken him at his word, his advance lies in the organization of particular questions into a unified plan, based on Augustine’s distinction between things to be enjoyed (God alone) and things to be used (everything else). Secondly, Peter offers his own responses to questions, engages and refutes the opinions of contemporaries when necessary, and in many cases, uses the form to articulate, justify, and create a consensus view. Besides giving theology an organization and making a place for all questions to be considered, Peter often explicitly leaves some questions open. Peter thus invites others to join in the debate and conversation rather than simply accept or reject his views. All of these features made his work especially fruitful for later commentary. Further, Peter Lombard, unlike Abelard, attempted to give substantive and metaphysically based rather than merely verbal solutions to theological problems, a method more in tune with the 13th century curriculum focused on Aristotle, than the 12th, organized around the trivium arts, also positioning Peter’s Sentences for the preeminence it achieved in the 13th century.

The great mystery about the Lombard’s Sentences is how a book so important for centuries has been so greatly neglected by scholars, even by those interested in and sympathetic to medieval scholasticism. One intriguing suggestion is that it is tied to the genre of the work and the different notion of authorship thereby implied. Giulio Silano argues that the work is most analogous to a modern legal casebook, and that Peter, as the casebook author, is governed most directly not by his views but those of the authorities, and the pedagogical goal is not the expression and promulgation of his views, or even the mere learning of the authorities’ views but rather the initiation of the student into a discipline, as in jurisprudence, a way of thinking and applying past authorities to present questions or conflicts (Silano 2007). Thus we discount and misunderstand Peter Lombard’s achievement if we evaluate it in light of modern notions of authorship and originality.

2.9 Sophismata, Insolubilia, Obligationes

As the disputed question as a form began to fade in importance in the theological faculty, it was replaced by variations on the disputation form in the arts faculty, focusing on questions of logic and natural philosophy. Of these three types of literature which become more significant in the 13th and 14th centuries, obligatio is the only one that unambiguously refers to a form of argument. Sophismata and insolubilia can refer either to the propositions that might be discussed in a debate or treatise or other form, or a form of argument for discussing these types of propositions. The literature concerning these kinds of problems ranges from formal disputes on the propositions which attempt to solve or avoid the problem posed by the statements to treatises or rules about how to solve the puzzles the disputes over them reveal. As a type of proposition, sophismata are ambiguous propositions about which arguments might plausibly be given both that they are true and that they are false. They are, as Ashworth puts it, “the medieval ancestor of ‘the morning star is the evening star’,” that is, a proposition epitomizing a larger problem (Ashworth 1992, 518). Insolubilia are propositions that are either very difficult or impossible to hold as true or false. These propositions are usually self-referential paradoxes such as the liar paradox (e.g., ‘everything I say is false’). The influential view of William Heytesbury was that insolubles should be resolved in the context of an obligatio, a specialized form of disputation, and Heytesbury proposes rules for solving insolubilia as well as sophismata in this way (Spade 1982, 252). (For a catalog of insolubilia literature, see Spade 1975).

Sophismata discussed in the form of a disputation usually involve the offering of arguments both for the truth and for the falsity of the proposition, resolved by a master. The resolution might only be a statement about whether the sophism is true or false; then, more elaborate replies to objections to the master’s view might be discussed. This form can be complicated by the addition of a response offered and defended and then further attacked, and then once again defended by responses to the new set of opposing arguments. Oral disputations on sophisms, the origin of much of the sophismata literature, were an important part of the school curriculum (see Courtenay 1987). Students would serve as opponent and then respondent in a series of disputations under the direction of a master. Ashworth notes that some sophismata, such as those by Kilvington and Heytesbury, were original compositions, not edited versions of live debates (Ashworth 1992, 519). (For more about Kilvington’s sophismata, see the edition with translation and commentary by Kretzmann and Kretzmann 1990.) The discussion of sophisms occurs in three different settings in the medieval literature: first, sophisms which are discussed in works on different topics where the sophism raises certain questions germaine to that topic; second, works by a single author which examine a series of sophisms (e.g., the sophismata of Albert of Saxony or John Buridan), and third, collections of sophisms discussed by diverse authors (Read 1993).

In the obligational form of disputation, an opponent puts something forward to a respondent. The respondent then ‘obligates’ himself to take a certain position on the case put forward by the opponent throughout the dispute. There are different types of obligations based on the type of claim the opponent proposes and the stance the respondent adopts towards it. (On the different types, see Stump 1982, 319–323.) The goal of the opponent is to trap the respondent into a contradiction and the goal of the respondent is to avoid the contradiction. The setting of the discussion is crucial since the obligation often involves the evaluation of statements that depend on the disputational context. So, for example, the respondent is often obligated to take a position on propositions which make reference to their granting or denying something within the disputation (e.g., ‘that you are in Rome must be granted [by you]’) (Stump 1982, 327). In other cases, the difficulty is caused by reference to the passage of time within the dispute. So it is posited that something is true at A, but it becomes false and impossible that it be true later in the disputation since the instant A has passed (Stump 1982, 328). Often, the dispute between the opponent and respondent is set up to result in a paradox. In such cases, the solution must happen outside the debate between the two parties, in which there is a further distinction or disqualification of something originally granted in the disputation.

Although it has usually been supposed that medieval interest in sophismata and insolubilia came from medieval scholars’ exposure to ancient sources, like Arisotle’s Sophistical Refutations, rediscovered in the Middle Ages, Angel D’Ors has suggested that their origins might instead be found in earlier medieval sources concerned with the problem of skepticism, like Augustine’s Soliloquia, and Contra Academicos, as well as Anselm’s De Veritate, Proslogion and so forth (D’Ors 1997). Ashworth ties their origin to the 12th c. practice of adducing counter-examples to point out the flaws in reasoning for an apparently plausible thesis (Ashworth 1992, 518). D’Ors further suggests that discussions of sophisms which continue in theological texts show not the interest in sophisms bleeding over into theology, but theological contexts as the impetus for interest in logical sophisms (D’Ors 1997).

2.10 Summa

The aspiration of the summa form is two-fold: first, to completely emancipate the subject matter, whether logical, theological, or philosophical, from the structure dictated either by scripture or authoritative sources; and second, to cover completely an entire discipline, often but not always, in summary form.

The summa form was invented by Peter Helias. His Summa super Priscianum was written around 1150, more than a century before Peter of Spain composed his logical summa and Thomas Aquinas his theological summa. Peter Helias’s summa combines a commentary on Priscian’s text with a systematic consideration of all the aspects of grammar (Reilly 1993, 16).

What Peter Lombard’s Sentences are to the sentences genre, Thomas Aquinas’s two great summae, the Summa Contra Gentiles and Summa Theologiae are to the summa form. As with sentences collections, there are two aspects of the form to be considered: the overall organizing structure and the method of confronting individual problems or questions. In terms of overall structure, the Contra Gentiles is a reflection of Aquinas’s distinction between those things which can be known by reason alone (e.g., that God exists) and those things which cannot be arrived at without revelation (e.g., the Trinity and Incarnation). Hence, the first three books of the Summa Contra Gentiles, dealing with God and creation, use arguments which depend only on reason to reach and support its conclusions. The fourth book is concerned with those things that are known only through revelation, in which revelation offers the principles from which the conclusions are drawn. The form for handling individual issues and problems in the Contra Gentiles is not the quaestio but a more affirmative defense of specific positions and against specific heresies. And though it is unclear whether the title summa is original (Jordan 1986, 182–3), the work fits the summa form in its systematic arrangement of topics and its attempt to include all possible arguments for a given position and against its contrary. It has been argued that the Contra Gentiles is not a polemical but a protreptic work, addressed to Christians, calling on them to deepen their understanding of the faith, specifically about how to persuade others to Christian belief (Jordan 1986, 190, 194). On this view the gentiles in the title are not Muslims and Jews but the “pre- or extra-Christian man, and metaphorically, the human mind under the tutelage of nature” (Jordan 1986, 184).

The Summa Theologiae by contrast, uses an abbreviated form of the disputed question. The questions are, however, artificial, carefully composed imitations of disputations, not tied to any actual oral debate as true disputed questions are. This gives Aquinas the opportunity to arrange the objections and authorities so as to achieve a rhetorical as well as a logical effect. Thus, Aquinas’s Summa Theologiae is different from Peter Lombard’s Sentences in two ways. The gathering of authorities around a given question is for Peter one of the main purposes of his work, to some degree an end in itself, while for Aquinas those citations serve the end of constructing an answer to the question. Further, while Peter dispenses with the question format when he finds an issue uncontroversial or largely settled by consensus, Aquinas always places issues in the format of a question, always finding arguments on both sides of an issue. For Peter, the question format is more a means to an end, and when the authorities he surveys are in agreement, he treats the matter like settled case law. But what Aquinas wants to teach beginning students of theology, for whom he says the work is composed, is that speculation, not fixed answers, is at the heart of the philosophical and theological enterprise. What he passes on to those students is not information so much as training in a certain way of thinking.

At the macro level, the Summa Theologiae is organized into three parts; first, a consideration of God; second, the rational creature’s movement toward God; and third, of Christ as the way to God. (For a recent discussion of and summary of the debates over how to understand this organization, see Johnstone 2000.) In his prologue, Aquinas claims that the main contribution of his work is in its organization of topics and questions, following the order required by the subject instead of a book or a particular disputation. In this sense, both Aquinas’s summae represent a further and almost complete emancipation from a textual order to a logical order. Within that logical structure, Aquinas devotes long passages to scripture, to the Genesis account of creation (Part I, qq. 67–74), Hebrew scripture considered as the “Old Law” (Part II, first part, qq. 98–106) and the life of Christ (Part III, qq. 27–59). Moreover, the work retains its tie to texts in individual questions which, as individual systematic questions are addressed, interpret authorities according to their response, ultimately harmonizing rather than simply discarding discordant voices.

After Aquinas, the summa remains a form for the systematic organization of an entire area of study, though often it becomes a summary, a collection of answers, a manual in which to look up answers to particular questions rather than a series of questions. Ockham’s Summa Logicae shares with the summa genre in theology the attempt to organize an entire discipline systematically. Ockham’s principle of organization is first to divide logic into terms and propositions and then to consider the various types of terms and propositions. Ockham’s form for considering particular types of terms or propositions is generally straightforward exposition occasionally mixed with a presentation of opposing positions and responses to the arguments for that position. John Buridan’s Summulae de Dialectica from the mid-14th century begins as a commentary on Peter of Spain’s Summulae Logicales (written between 1220–1250). While Peter’s immensely popular text (used into the 17th century) was a “summa” in the sense of short summaries of the topics of logic, Buridan’s important and also popular Summulae based on Peter’s text gives much more systematic explanations not just assertations of definitions and propositions; thus it is a “summa” in the sense of a complete set of explanations, given in the author’s own voice (Zupko 2003, 9). Though clearly a teaching text, Buridan reconfigures the discipline of logic using the “new logic” (or logica moderna) to explain the basic concepts in Peter’s text, and, where necessary (e.g., in the account of demonstration) composes both a base text and the explanatory commentary on topics not covered by Peter (Zupko, 2003, 100). As Zupko concludes, Buridan’s “Summulae is essentially a compendium of methods, a ‘how-to’ book for the philosopher” (Zupko, 2003, 135). In form, Ockham’s and Buridan’s works show a progression toward the modern treatise, such as that of Hume or Locke on human nature or understanding, because their exhaustive consideration of their topic and the presentation of the single voice of the author, rather than a dialogue or set of authorities from the tradition.

3. Role of Authorities

If there is one formal characteristic found in medieval philosophical texts of every relevant period and among all the religious affiliations of its practitioners, it is the citation of authoritative texts, whether scripture, Plato, Aristotle, or other revered teachers. To contemporary readers, such references seem to show a slavish deference to authority and lack of autonomy or originality in the writer. The explanation of this phenomenon is, of course, a good deal more complex. The main way of approaching authoritative sources used by medieval writers was to find ways to forge agreements with and among authorities by reinterpreting them. Besides the strategies we might recognize in modern practices of interpretation, there are number of ways in which medieval authors make a greater effort to bring an author’s view into conversation and agreement with contemporary discussions. This sometimes involves placing an author’s claims in a larger context, such as supporting Aristotle’s metaphysical claims but in a limited way, as valid only for the sublunary world. So, for example, Maimonides argues that Aristotle’s account of the eternity of motion makes perfect sense as an inference from the world as we now experience it, but is limited to that context. Just as a boy reared on an island without women would have difficulty imagining how children might be conceived and born, Aristotle, Maimonides argues, might simply have had an experience too limited to allow him to develop any other accounts of the origin of things (Maimonides 1974, 295). Maimonides’ handling of Aristotle in this example is more colorful and explicit than other medieval thinkers, but the principle he uses is common. Alternatively, medieval interpreters often take a given citation out of context and assign it a new context. Hence, for example, Aquinas cites Augustine in support of his claim that theology is a science analogous to an Aristotelian science as described in the Posterior Analytics; however, Aquinas does not note that Augustine uses the term ‘science’ in a much older and less technical way (Aquinas 1981, I, q. 1, a. 2). Alan of Lille supports the Pauline claim that the “invisible things of God are known through the visible things that are made” only after arguing that the kind of knowledge in question is the knowledge of faith (Alan of Lille 1954, 135–6). While Aquinas cites and supports the categorization of sin in terms of Gregory the Great’s scheme of the seven deadly sins, he clearly subordinates Gregory’s classification to his own way of organizing notions of sin (Sweeney 2012b). Though these examples are chosen to show the difference between modern and medieval interpretive practice, we cannot attribute such interpretations to bad faith on the part of writers like Aquinas or Alan of Lille or Maimonides. That is, they are not deliberately misinterpreting their sources. Rather their strategies for harmonizing authorities discordant with each other and with their own views are part of a hermeneutic whose basic assumption is that these authorities are all seeking and attempting to express part of a single truth. It is not a distortion or disservice to an authoritative source to put its views in a new context, making them appropriate to contemporary issues and fitting that source into the picture of the truth as it is presently known. The underlying concordance of all authorities is taken as a given and interpreters work toward showing how it might be operative in particular cases. As Silano notes, many of the tensions and even outright contradictions between authoritative sources would have disappeared had the compilers, commentators, and masters determining a question placed those authoritative claims in their historical/cultural context rather than simply set them against each other. But they would also, thereby, deprive these sources of their normative status, in the same way in which a judicial decision interpreted in terms of its historical/cultural context is no longer binding (Silano 2007, xxv–xxvi). Silano points out that the task of the 12th and 13th centuries in the Latin West is the establishment of authorities which will form the parameters within which discussion and dissention can take place, rather than their dethronement through historical relativization (Silano 2007, xxv–xxvi).

The way in which scripture is cited is somewhat different from the way Aristotle or even church authorities like Augustine are used. First, scripture is a language in which these authors are thoroughly fluent. They cite scripture from memory, almost proverbially. Further, when scripture is cited in argumentative forms like the disputation, most often it does not carry the weight of the argument. Either scripture is cited in opposing arguments on one side or the other, in which case scripture passages seem to articulate a limit or boundary the opposing view seems to transgress. But the positions or arguments articulated pro or con on a given question are not the final word but something the master may accept or reject, which will require an interpretation of the passage from scripture which accepts, rejects, or qualifies its relevance and apparent position on the question. When scripture is cited in the master’s own answer, it functions as a support for something for which independent arguments are given. Scripture is also sometimes used to give a position moral and spiritual weight, to reiterate the moral and spiritual center of a writer’s thought. It thus can act as an almost existential reminder of why these arguments matter and what is at stake in them.

If these are strategies that in general characterize the Latin tradition until the 13th century, there is a different strategy at work in some philosophers in the Arabic and Jewish traditions. While these authors also attempt in many cases to show the deep concordance between, for example, scripture and the philosophers, they also at times use authoritative texts to put forward views which they themselves would like to promulgate even as they leave them in the mouths of those other authors, like Aristotle or Plato.

As is clear from the development of the sentences collection, summa, and commentary, there are significant changes over time in the ways in which authorities were used and cited (see the discussion of these individual forms above). It is possible to see the evolution of the treatment of authoritative sources as growing positively toward a more modern ‘scientific’ attitude towards interpretation and commentary, one which is neutral, critical, and historically informed rather than dedicated to finding the ‘truth’ in a given author no matter how hidden. But while there is considerable development toward modern standards of scholarship in the 13th and 14th centuries, there are also virtues in the earlier types of approach to authoritative sources. These earlier authors are highly sophisticated interpreters of biblical and philosophical texts, finding levels of conflict and concord among different authors that modern interpreters would tend to miss.

4. Esotericism, Censorship, and Polemics

Many late classical and medieval philosophical texts contain esoteric elements. The desire to hide the real message of a text in its earlier forms springs from some form of gnosticism. Gnostic sects, needing to protect their knowledge from dissemination among non-initiates, hid their true message in ways that could only be deciphered by those who possessed the secret knowledge. Leo Strauss makes the additional argument that the motives for esotericism in Jewish and Islamic medieval thinkers are political. Revelation in Judaism and Islam deals fundamentally with law, with the correct social order, whereas in Christianity it is the revelation of a creed or set of dogmas, Strauss argues. Hence, to interpret revelation in Judaism and Islam is always a political act. Interpreting law is much further from the task of philosophy than interpreting dogma, placing philosophy on the periphery of Islamic and Jewish society as opposed to being an integral part of the official training of students as it was in the Christian West. The inherently marginal character of philosophy in these societies makes it politically dangerous to be a philosopher. Further, Strauss argues, for these thinkers human nature is essentially and inevitably divided between “the few” who are capable to doing and understanding philosophy, and “the many” who were not capable of digesting the truths of philosophy and who must be protected from philosophy. Exposure of the many to philosophy tends to undermine the authority of revelation and the religious and political authority given the power to explain and promulgate the revealed law. For Strauss, the difference between Jewish and Islamic thinkers, on the one hand, and Christian thinkers, on the other, is also exemplified in the different literary sources on which they relied. For Christian thinkers, the models are Aristotle and Cicero, for Jewish and Islamic thinkers, the models are the dialogues of Plato, especially the Republic and the Laws. Strauss’s thesis is that these writers hid in their exoteric teaching an esoteric teaching to be discerned by reading between the lines. In practice, this means taking small inconsistencies and other discrepancies in the text as indicative of a deeper or hidden view, looking for the author’s “real” views in the mouths of characters in a dialogue or allegory who are otherwise presented unfavorably, etc. Strauss’s views on how to interpret the literary form of medieval philosophical texts are controversial, but they have made the literary form and hermeneutics applied to these texts a question that must, especially for Islamic and Jewish writers, be confronted. For Maimonides, for example, an esoteric or ‘dualist’ reading would claim that Maimonides holds Aristotelian positions on the eternity of the world, the possibility of miracles and on other matters which would bring him into conflict with Judaism but must hide such views from political and religious authorities, signalling them only obliquely to the few in the Guide for the Perplexed but expressing non-Aristotelian views in his work commenting on Jewish law and scriptures. Daniel Frank (2003, 144–5) argues against this view that Maimonides “may best be understood philosophically as engaged in critical dialogue with Aristotle, almost invariably disagreeing with him, but indebted to Aristotle for his mode of discourse, argument forms, and philosophical vocabulary.” Moreover, Frank points out that the plausibility of extreme esotericism in Islamic and Jewish philosophical texts may be exaggerated by an unhistorical dichotomy between Aristotelianism and Neoplatonism (also discussed above, section 2. 4) (Frank 2003, 142–3). That is, because we see a conflict between and author’s Aristotelian and Neoplatonic views, we speculate that one view is their ‘real’ view, and the other, their ‘cover’ view, while thinkers in this context would have seen Aristotelian and Neoplatonic positions as quite compatible. (On Maimonides and esotericism, see also Ravitsky 2005).

While rejecting the extreme position Strauss takes on medieval philosophical texts, many scholars have noted the esoteric elements present in some medieval texts by Christian as well as Islamic and Jewish writers (see Butterworth 2001). Boethius, for example, presents his theological views not to the many but to his trusted teachers and advisors, writing in a highly dense and technical language in his De Hebdomadibus accessible only to the learned (Boethius 1973, 38–41). As late as the end of the 12th century, Alan of Lille writes in theological texts of the need to protect the sacred truths of theology from the incursions of uneducated students in the liberal arts (Alan of Lille 1981, 119–122), and, in the 11th century, Anselm complains of the work he intended only for his fellow monks in the Cur Deus Homo being disseminated without his consent and in a form he did not approve of (Anselm 1998, 261–2). Like many medieval authors, he expresses great concern that his work will be misunderstood and strives to protect himself from misinterpretation. Just as writers chose certain forms and rhetoric for philosophical texts for learned and elite audiences, so different literary forms were chosen for works intended for a wide and popular audience, using the forms of encyclopedia and instructional manuals, but also poetry, sermons, biblical exegesis and mystical writings to introduce philosophical ideas to a wide audience (See Abram, Harvey, and Muelethaler 2022).

In the Latin, Christian world, though philosophy and speculative theology is accepted as a legitimate endeavor, enshrined by the 13th century in the university curriculum, philosophical writers were sometimes censured by theological authorities, and some views were at various times condemned as false and contrary to the faith, most famously in what is known as the Condemnation of 1277 (Thiessen 1998; Aertsen, Emery, et al. 2001; and Bianchi 2003). This threat, some have argued, influenced some writers to pull their punches, to make concessions or professions of ignorance or humility that were not authentically part of their views. Hence, for example, some have argued that Abelard’s statement in his theology disclaiming any ability or pretense to address the issues necessary for salvation or to give anything more than verisimilitudes about the divine, is a concession to his persecutors more than a sincere statement of his view of his own work (Abelard 1987, 123, 201; Sweeney 2006, 90–3). Christian writers operating before the formation of the universities and the development of acceptable university forms of writing, i.e., commentaries on Aristotle, on the Sentences of Peter Lombard, disputed questions, etc., need to justify their writing, to explain the nature of its audience, to show the author’s submission to the proper authorities. Readers must consider whether these kinds of statements can simply be disregarded as obligatory but not sincere, and whether they affect the presentation of the philosophical and theological arguments in the text. While it might be tempting to see them merely as pro forma, it is clear that complete disregard of such remarks is anachronistic. Such views, for example, contributed to the now thoroughly rejected view of Abelard as pure rationalist and as a rebel against church authority. Nonetheless, concern about avoiding conflict or censure is real among these writers. For example, after the condemnation of many Aristotelian positions in 1277, authors take care to note when they are simply citing or describing a point of view in order to consider it or argue against it, signaling with a phrase like “dico recitative” that they are not subscribing to that position.

Parallel to the highly formalized and structured debate of the disputations in the later Middle Ages, there are also highly formalized ways of engaging in debate with one’s contemporaries that shift to some degree over time. In the 12th and 13th centuries, for example, while it is acceptable to attach names of church teachers and authorities from earlier generations to opposing positions, even to positions opposed by the contemporary writer of a text, one’s contemporaries or from the recent past were never directly named but merely referred to as “someone” or “certain people” who might hold a given position. However, this should not be interpreted as deference to one’s contemporaries or as an attempt to quell controversy, since authors became adept at signaling their opponents without actually naming them, paraphrasing or parodying their views or catchphrases as modes of ridicule or play. In the late 13th century, Duns Scotus begins to give partial references to the contemporary thinkers and texts with which he is in conversation; Peter Aureol in the 14th century gives full and accurate citations. Gregory of Rimini (d. 1358) begins to develop something closer to a “historico-critical approach to theology,” carefully citing authoritative texts.

This development parallels one in some medieval sermons, where the writers find ways of referring (often by puns) to themselves as author of the sermon. The shift is from an interest in the arguments to interest in the individual thinkers. One cause for these changes might be the internationalization of the writers and texts. In a more parochial world, everyone would know who held certain positions; but in a wider context, those at Oxford, for example, might not be known and needed to be named in Paris. These changes might have also been caused by the growing self-consciousness and sense of individuality historians have noticed in other aspects of medieval academic and social life.

5. Development in the Literary form of Medieval Philosophy

The Islamic and Jewish traditions, as well as the Latin tradition until the 13th century, can be characterized by the diversity of literary forms for philosophical texts. A good deal of the philosophical creativity among these writers goes into the form in which they choose to write. The genres that dominate the 13th and 14th century in the Latin West, the Sentences commentary, the disputed question, and the logical developments of these forms in obligationes and sophismata, are academic, highly choreographed forms. In contrast to the earlier period, these forms do not allow an author much creative latitude. It is possible to read the development and waning of various forms and the movement toward standard forms in medieval philosophy in different ways. From one point of view, the variety of forms which flourished from the 10th to the 12th century can be seen as the high point from which the narrowing into the academic forms of the 13th and 14th centuries seems like a loss, not only in variety but from the connection to the larger spiritual and existential concerns treated in, for example, the allegories of Boethius or Avicenna and the meditations of Anselm. Both in the Byzantine world and in the Latin Renaissance, there is a rejection of scholastic forms in preference for the richer rhetorical and literary form of dialogue (see Buron, Guérin, and Lesage 2015; Cameron and Gaul 2017). From another point of view (the more prevalent assumption of the secondary literature), the disputed question and other forms of high scholasticism are that toward which the earlier centuries made somewhat uneven but steady steps. In these forms, some might argue, philosophy finds its center in arguments for and against different positions. (See Kretzmann 1997, 301, where he argues that issues of style and rhetoric are not relevant to Aquinas’ “unadorned, straightforward, pellucid way of expounding, analyzing, and arguing — [which is] ideal for philosophy”.) The assumption, one arguably bequeathed to the Western philosophical tradition through Latin Medieval school forms, is that “straightforward argument” is not itself a style, rhetoric, and/or genre but the pure form of rationality and, hence, philosophy. Arguably, at least in the Latin tradition, this way of seeing philosophy as having only one form, the form of reason, was prompted by the reception of Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics with its model of demonstration as the standard for science. Syllogistic arguments comprised of certain and necessary premises yield certain and necessary conclusions, making demonstration a higher form than dialectic, which yields only probable conclusions, or rhetorical forms and methods, designed to persuade particular audiences. John of Salisbury, making his way through the Posterior Analytics, writes in his Metalogicon (1159) that unlike other dialectical or rhetorical forms of arguments, only demonstration does not concern itself with those to be persuaded and is thus in direct relationship to things. (John of Salisbury 1955, 79) In effect this is the articulation of the standard of objectivity – that which is simply true independent of the time, place, or audience to whom it is addressed, as opposed to that which is designed to persuade in a particular context. Thus, John makes scientific discourse – and the pursuit of truth – the opposite of rhetorical and literary discourse, giving reason (and, hence, philosophy) its ideal form. John notes that Aristotle is called “the Philosopher” because of his development of the science of demonstration. (John of Salisbury 1955, 213) As Aristotle’s ideal of scientific demonstration and the Aristotelian corpus as a whole forms university curriculum, philosophy also becomes the discipline we recognize as ‘philosophy’, an enterprise of reason alone and begins to function autonomously in the arts faculty, which were earlier seen as only preparatory to theology, law, or medicine. We can also see different medieval forms for philosophy as indebted to either Plato or Aristotle as philosophical models. Aristotle’s influence we see in the culture and writings of the university. Even though they lacked access to the Platonic dialogues, the influence of Plato through Neoplatonism is evident in the forms that flourish before the 13th century, in allegory, meditation, and dialogue. These forms emphasize both the spiritual character of the highest truths philosophical/theological discourse strives to discover and reveal, and the difficulty, both intellectual and moral, of achieving insight.

Much more work needs to be done on the literary forms of medieval philosophy. There are so many forms instantiated in so many ways in different periods and from within different religious traditions. Consideration of these forms is especially important for a more complete understanding of medieval philosophical texts because so many of these forms are foreign to contemporary readers. Sometimes the form is important because an author was constrained by practice or academic statute to use it, as with disputations and Sentences commentaries; hence, how an author comes to use or manipulate a given form for his own ends is a significant part of understanding the text. When an author uses a non-standard form, that form is self-consciously chosen and thus in a different way a significant part of an author’s meaning. It would be helpful to have studies of particular authors who have used different forms, and more studies tracing the development of a given genre through different authors and periods (as in Jacobi 1999 on dialogue and Whitman 2000 on allegory, Evans 2002 and Rosemann 2009 on Sentences commentaries). Finally, more historical work needs to be done by individual scholars equipped to look at the different genres across different periods and from within and across works arising out of Christian, Jewish, and Arabic religious traditions. (See Hughes and Robinson 2019 on literary forms in Medieval Jewish Thought.). For Hughes and Robinson philosophy is never without literary form, nor (which comes to the same thing) does it have only one; they work to challenge the narrow conception of philosophy that would divide the study of ‘philosophical’ texts from those that fall into the domain of “Jewish studies” that have more diverse literary forms. In the same way, we have seen those studying the philosophical work of early Modern women make the case that we will miss this work if we restrict ourselves to texts that take the form that is expected in contemporary academic philosophy. Expanding the canon entails interrogating and broadening the sense of what counts as a philosophical work, they argue.


Selected Primary Sources

These are in English translation where available; see individual author entries for complete bibliographical information.

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  • Alan of Lille, Anticlaudianus, or the Good and Perfect Man, James J. Sheridan (trans.), Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 1973.
  • –––, Plaint of Nature (De Planctu Naturae), James J. Sheridan (trans.), Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 1980.
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  • –––, Exposition of Aristotle’s Treatise On the Heavens, Fabian R. Larcher and Pierre H. Conway (trans.), 2 volumes, Columbus, OH: College of St. Mary of the Springs, 1964.
  • –––, Summa contra gentiles, Notre Dame IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 1975, c1955–1957.
  • –––. Summa theologiae, Fathers of the English Dominican Province (trans.), 5 volumes, Westminster, MD: Christian Classics, 1981, c1948.
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  • Averroës, Middle Commentary on Aristotle’s De Anima, Alfred L. Ivry (trans.), Provo, UT: Brigham Young University Press, 2002.
  • –––, Long Commentary on the De Anima of Aristotle, Richard C. Taylor and Therese-Anne Druart (trans.), New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 2009.
  • –––, Averroes’ Middle Commentaries on Aristotle’s Categories and De Interpretatione, Charles E. Butterworth (trans.), Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1983.
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  • –––, Commentarium in librum Peri hermeneias, K. Meiser (ed.), 2 volumes, Leipzig: Tuebner, 1800; reprinted, 1987.
  • –––, Anicii Manlii Severini Boethii In Isagogen Porphyrii commenta, Samuel Brandt (ed.), Vienna: F. Tempsky, 1906.
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  • John of Salisbury, The Metalogicon of John of Salisbury: A Twelfth-Century Defense of the Verbal and Logical Arts of the Trivium, Daniel D. McGarry (trans.). Berkeley: University of California Press, 1955.
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  • Maimonides, The Guide of the Perplexed, S. Pines (trans.), Volume 2, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1974.
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  • –––, Dialogus, John Kilcullen, George Knysh, Volker Leppin, John Scott, and Jan Ballweg (ed. and trans.), The British Academy, 1995, 2002. (See Other Internet Resources, below.)
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  • –––, Ockham’s Theory of Terms: Part I of the Summa Logicae, Michael J. Loux (trans.), South Bend, IN: St. Augustine’s Press, 1998.
  • –––, Summa logicae, Philotheus Boehner, Gedeon Gál, Stephen J. Brown (eds.), St. Bonaventure, NY: Franciscan Institute, 1974.

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