Cusanus, Nicolaus [Nicolas of Cusa]

First published Fri Jul 10, 2009; substantive revision Tue Nov 9, 2021

Arguably the most important German thinker of fifteenth century, Nicholas of Cusa (1401–1464) was also an ecclesiastical reformer, administrator and cardinal. His life-long effort was to reform and unite the universal and Roman Church, whether as canon law expert at the Council of Basel and after, as legate to Constantinople and later to German dioceses and houses of religion, as bishop in his own diocese of Brixen, and as advisor in the papal curia. His active life as a Church administrator and bishop found written expression in several hundred Latin sermons and more theoretical background in his writings on ecclesiology, ecumenism, mathematics, philosophy and theology. Cusanus had an open and curious mind. He was learned and steeped in the Neoplatonic tradition, well aware of both humanist and scholastic learning, yet mostly self-taught in philosophy and theology. Nicholas anticipated many later ideas in mathematics, cosmology, astronomy and experimental science while constructing his own original version of systematic Neoplatonism. A whole range of earlier medieval writers, such as Thierry of Chartre, Ramon Llull and Albert the Great, influenced Nicholas, but his important intellectual roots are in Proclus and Dionysius the Areopagite. In spite of his significance few later thinkers, apart from Giordano Bruno, understood or were influenced by him until the late nineteenth century.

1. Biography

Nicholas of Cusa (Nikolaus Cryfftz or Krebs in German, then Nicolaus Cusanus in Latin) was born in 1401 in Kues (now Bernkastel-Kues) on the Moselle River between Koblenz and Trier. He was one of four children in a bourgeois family. His father, Johan Cryfftz, was a prosperous merchant who became one of the landed gentry in Trier. The first record we have of Nicholas’ early education comes from his study of the liberal arts at University of Heidelburg in 1416–17. He then moved to the University of Padua where he studied canon law, receiving his Doctor of Canon Law in 1423. In Padua he met the physician and mathematician Paolo Toscanelli, the canonist Giuliano Caesarini, and the humanists Guarino da Verona and Vittorino da Feltre.

In 1425 he entered the service of the archbishop of Trier and, as his secretary, received income from several benefices. By 1426 he was in Cologne where he may have lectured on canon law, studied philosophy and theology, and began researches into original source material and into the annals of German law. There he was able to prove that the Donation of Constantine was an eighth-century forgery, and he found manuscripts of Pliny’s Natural History and of Plautus’ comedies. In Cologne he met Heimerich of Campo, who introduced him to the writings of Ramon Llull, Albert the Great and his commentary on Dionysius, and Proclus’ commentary on Plato’s Parmenides. In 1428 and 1435 Nicholas was offered positions teaching canon law at the University of Louvain, but he turned them down to remain in church administration.

Ordained a priest sometime during the 1430s, Nicholas first gained wider notice for his work as a conciliarist at the Council of Basel. There he wrote De concordantia catholica (1433), arguing for the authority of the council over that of the pope and stressing the notions of consent and representation. After the turmoil at Basel split the council, Nicholas ultimately sided with the papal party and left the conciliarists. In 1437 he was part of an embassy sent to Constantinople to seek reconciliation of the Greek Church with Rome. He reported that, during the voyage home, the insights of De docta ignorantia (1440) came to him as a kind of divine revelation. He continued as a papal legate to Germany from 1438–48. Named cardinal in 1446 by Eugenius IV, Cusanus was elevated to that position in 1448 by Nicholas V and was sent to Germany in 1451 as papal legate to reform the church.

Nicholas’ most important philosophical works were written in the twenty-four years between the appearance of De docta ignorantia and his death. De coniecturis (1442–43), De dato patris luminum (1445), Apologia doctae ignorantiae (1449), Idiota de sapientia, Idiota de mente, Idiota de staticis experimentis (all 1450) were among important works of the decade from 1440–1450, as were many sermons and works on mathematics. The final fourteen years of his life saw the appearance of De visione Dei (1453), De beryllo (1458), De possest (1460), De li non aliud (1461), De ludo globi (1462–63), De venatione sapientiae (1462), Compendium (1464) and De apice theoriae (1464), more works on mathematics and many more sermons. Of particular note are two works he wrote during these years that reached out to other religions, especially Islam, De Pace Fidei (1453) and Cribatio Alchorani (1461).

In 1450 he was named bishop of Brixen in the Tirol. In 1452 he began active administration in Brixen, but his attempts at reform led to threats and clashes with Sigismund, the count of Tirol. Many of his over two hundred sermons date from this time in Brixen, though his reform efforts there and earlier in Germany mostly failed. Nicholas finally retreated from the conflict in Brixen to Rome, where he remained in the papal curia advising Pius II. He died in 1464 in Todi on his way from Rome to Ancona. His remains were buried in his titular Church, St Peter in Chains, at Rome; his heart was sent to Kues and buried in the chapel of the hospice for elderly men there that he endowed in his will. The hospice survives and his remarkable library is housed there today.

2. Nicholas’ Thought

Nicholas of Cusa may arguably be best understood as employing a Christian Neoplatonic framework to construct his own synthesis of inherited ideas. His thought witnesses to his own reading in a variety of predecessors, while side-stepping the methods of the medieval scholastic summae and their typical controversies and arguments. Trained as a canon lawyer, Nicholas is mostly self-taught in theology and philosophy; both his ideas and his language may present some difficulties to contemporary readers. His thought has to be viewed as a whole, for it works more by correspondences and parallels between the domains he is interested in expounding than in a linear fashion or by direct argument. What is noteworthy are the flexible metaphors he uses as he moves across what we designate today as ontology, philosophy of mind and epistemology, and philosophical theology. His metaphors provide some methodological clue to understanding how Nicholas proposes that we should think God and creatures together. It is not just that God exceeds our conceptual reach and grasp as well as our literal language. The asymmetry between God and creatures also provides a measure or norm for the appropriateness of any metaphor exploring or attempting to explain their relationship.

2.1 Metaphysics and ontology

Nicholas of Cusa’s most complete set of proposals about what is real occurs in his best-known work of 1440, De docta ignorantia: On Learned Ignorance. Here Cusanus addresses the four categorical realities traditionally found in Christian thought: God, the natural universe, Christ and human beings. On Learned Ignorance devotes its first book to God, the second to the universe and a third to the God-man, Jesus Christ. While its order mirrors the outflow from God and return to him, this book does not distinguish philosophy and theology as contemporary thinkers might, but unites them in a single overview of Neoplatonic Christian reality.

Nicholas begins with a single trope or symbol to lay out the parallels between his teachings in the three books, that of the “maximum.” God is the absolute Maximum; the universe is a created image of God, the “contracted” or restricted maximum. Christ unites the first two as the Maximum at once absolute-and-contracted. “Contraction” is a metaphor for the finite status of creatures, all of whom are limited images of God. “Absolute” is used in its etymological sense of “free from” (ab-solutus) to characterize God’s infinity. As absolute maximum God is both unlimited and transcendent, unreachable by human conceptions that measure the limited or contracted realm of more and less. Once Cusanus conceptualizes human knowing as measuring, he proposes that our knowledge also cannot measure exactly the essence of any limited thing. A fortiori, when it comes to the unlimited God, Nicholas asserts that “there is no proportion between finite and infinite.” The infinite God remains beyond our ken. Human efforts to understand the depth and implications of this assertion are what will render our ignorance “learn-ed.”

As so often in Christian thinking, this sort of apophatic preamble does not prevent Cusanus from spending a whole book proposing how we might comprehend the incomprehensible God “incomprehensibly.” His first proposal is that God is the “coincidence of opposites.” This turns out to be a way both of recalling the negative theology to be found in Dionysius the Areopagite and his other predecessors and at the same time of going beyond it. Put in the language of the “maximum,” in God both maximum and minimum coincide in the divine infinite Oneness, for both take the mind beyond the measurable created domain of more and less and end up meaning just the “superlative” or transcendent. The implication, in other words, is that God’s reality lies beyond any familiar domain where the principle of contradiction holds sway.

At the same time this “coincidence” underlines the divine Oneness that comprehends all else in undifferentiated and unlimited unity. It is not that creatures coincide with God or God with creatures, but that in God all else coincides as nothing else than God. As so often in negative and apophatic “theology,” we are not only told what God is not but led to reflect explicitly on what God must be, even if we have no conceptual clarity about what we assert. The result is a kind of second-order language about the ways in which we are forced to think and talk about divinity.

Nicholas then proposes some geometrical “exercises” to provide his readers some object lessons designed to teach how we might reach for the unlimited even while we are aware that we cannot grasp what the infinite God may be. For instance, we are to imagine a circle and a straight line or tangent that meets the circle. From a certain perspective, as the diameter or circumference of the circle increases, its circumference approaches the straight line and appears less and less curved. If we then imagine and extrapolate the circumference to the infinite, we can almost “see” that both straight tangent and curved circumference should coincide—a kind of “coincidence of opposites” that is a figure of how we may think beyond limited things toward the transcendent One. All this is mathematically impossible, of course, but it demonstrates some metaphorical steps for moving beyond the finite toward the infinite that might be transferred from geometrical figures to created beings and their Creator.

In Book II of On Learned Ignorance Cusanus deals with the created universe. The natural universe counts as the limited or contracted maximum that is the image of the absolute Maximum. Here Nicholas introduces another central metaphor to capture the relationship between God and creatures, the metaphor of enfolding and unfolding (complicatio/explicatio). He expands the “folding” metaphor he inherited from the twelfth-century school of Chartres. While all beings are “enfolded” in the undifferentiated oneness of their Divine Source, they are at the same time an “unfolding” of God in time and space. “Insofar as He is the unfolding,” Nicholas writes, “in all things He is that which they are, just as in an image the reality itself [veritas] is present” (II.3, Hopkins translation). In Neoplatonic terms, one must think the unfolded universe we experience and all that is real in it as at once enfolded in the Creator on whom it depends. God encompasses every thing created in a dialectical outflow and return to God without any creatures ever being identified with the God on whom they depend, that One who remains both present to them yet ever absent and beyond. What the “unfolding/enfolding” couple captures is the dynamic relationship between divine Original and created image.

The natural universe, then, is the whole or contracted maximum collectively constituted by the many beings in space and time. Nicholas proposes the quasi-Anaxagorean slogan that “each thing is in each thing: quodlibet in quolibet” to emphasize that the individual beings or parts are no less “contracted” images of the whole created universe. Just as God is present to each creature that stands as a contracted image of the divine, so the universe as a macrocosm is present to each creature or constitutive part as microcosm. In that way, each natural thing is an image of the collective whole. But since this collectivity is made up of interrelated parts, each thing is also the totality of its connections with everything else. “Each thing is in each thing” because each is an image reflecting the oneness of the whole and thus of all other individuals that are the interrelated parts of that whole.

Nicholas also recognizes in Book Two that the natural universe is characterized by change or motion; it is not static in time and space. But finite change and motion, ontologically speaking, are also matters of more and less and have no fixed maximum or minimum. This “ontological relativity” leads Cusanus to some remarkable conclusions about the earth and the physical universe, based not on empirical observation but on metaphysical grounds. The earth is not fixed in place at some given point because nothing is utterly at rest; nor can it be the exact physical center of the natural universe, even if it seems nearer the center than “the fixed stars.” Because the universe is in motion without fixed center or boundaries, none of the spheres of the Aristotelian and Ptolemaic world picture are exactly spherical. None of them has an exact center, and the “outermost sphere” is not a boundary. The universe is therefore “infinite,” in the sense of physically unbounded. Cusanus thus shifts the typical medieval picture of the created universe toward later views, but on ontological grounds.

For Nicholas, the exact center and circumference of the created universe are to be found only in God. What we take to be center and outer limits depends on our viewpoint. If we change perspectives, say to that from another planet (which might indeed be inhabited) and take it to be center, then earth might be zenith. In this way we come to realize that what is taken as fixed or central can be altered to be moving and at the zenith, depending on the location of the standpoint we pick in the unbounded universe. The reason, Cusanus writes, is that there is no exactness outside of God, and only “God, who is everywhere and nowhere, is its [the universe’s] circumference and center” (II.12, Hopkins translation).

In this way learned ignorance recognizes that the natural universe itself, as a contracted image of God, has a physical center that can be anywhere and a circumference that is nowhere. That is why Nicholas characterized the natural universe as a contracted maximum or “privative” infinite while God remains the “negative” infinite or absolute maximum. This means that the universe merely lacks set physical bounds or limits, while God has no ontological limits in being all that can possibly be. This enables the “infinite” universe, as the whole constituted by all creatures, to be an image of the divine oneness, but only in a contracted or attenuated fashion.

Nowhere is the Christian bearing of On Learned Ignorance more obvious than in Book III, where Nicholas treats of the God-man, Jesus Christ, as a third “maximum,” the Maximum at once absolute-and-contracted. Once again, however, Cusanus uses the orthodox teaching of early Christian councils such as Chalcedon more as a background guide than as providing a straightforward Christology or text for exposition. He returns to the contrast between absolute God and contracted creatures that he used throughout Books I and II to interpret and contrast the relation between infinite God and finite creatures, even though there is no real proportion between them.

God was construed as the absolute maximum and divine infinite Oneness, while Nicholas viewed the natural universe as a contracted maximum whose unity-in-multiplicity and lack of physical limits “reflected” God’s positively unlimited oneness. Nicholas now entertains a third possibility, an anomalous joining of absolute and contracted in the God-man. He reviews, borrowing from Aristotle, the ordered universe of things belonging to natural types (genera and species), then modifies it by extending to individuals his idea of contraction or limitation. Individual specimens are all that exist, but not only are they contracted images of God’s oneness, but also contracted images of their types insofar as each more or less fulfills the possibilities of its nature.

Cusanus thereupon asks a hypothetical question. What would happen were a perfect specimen, an individual fulfillment of its type, to actually exist? In his language of maximality, it would be another maximum contracted to a unique individual of a given kind. But what would make such a maximum individual possible in a universe of more or less? Only its unique union with God, the absolute divine Maximum that is the source of every contracted reality, a union signaled in the traditional “hypostatic union.” The whole of this maximal yet finite human nature is created and united with the absolute God so that God remains transcendent, yet inseparable from this one human creature. In terms of enfolding and unfolding, this unique unfolding in a human being is at the same time to reveal the God enfolding Jesus Christ. Jesus is an image of God so utterly transparent as to remain opaque except to the eyes of faith.

Cusanus relies on the traditional microcosm/macrocosm trope to explain why human nature would be the contracted nature best suited for union with the divine Absolute. Human nature is the created nature “more common to the totality of beings” (III.3, Hopkins translation) because the intermediate status of human beings between angels and all other bodily creatures provides common ties to the whole range of created things. These ties are based on its capacities as “what is highest of the lower and what is lowest of the higher” natures (ibid.), so that it stands as representative microcosm of the created macrocosm. The upshot is that the historical Jesus Christ is human in such a way as to be divine and divine in such a way as to be human, the Maximum at once contracted and absolute, the human image who is simultaneously the divine Original. Because the divine Word is one with Jesus’ human nature, that nature is perfect of its kind, at the same time contracted and maximal. Learned ignorance may thus press the Cusan metaphors and ideas to the limit in dealing with Jesus Christ, because the hypostatic oneness of the incarnate God will always elude full human understanding.

This third book realigns the order of Christian metaphysics so that the God-man stands between God and the rest of creation, for it is through the mediation of the Incarnate Word that creatures are made and creatures return to their source. In Book I, Nicholas proposed that there is no proportion or measure between the infinite and the finite that will enable us to grasp the Infinite God or even God’s contracted image in the natural universe. This is what learned ignorance establishes for and contributes to human wisdom. Yet the historic reality of Jesus Christ has a theoretical role to play in interpreting Nicholas’ metaphysical vision. The Cusan Christ stands as a more adequate norm and measure for theory and practice. Jesus Christ is the historical human image of the Absolute One beyond our ken and thus the paradigm that reveals our creaturely connection with the infinite God. Christ is the disclosure in time of what God is. In this way learned ignorance points to Jesus Christ as the medium, the measure and mediator between finite and infinite, and, as well, the concrete norm for what human beings may become.

The three books of On Learned Ignorance thus represent a series of powerful proposals for reinterpreting Christian reality. Throughout Nicholas uses metaphors such as the coincidence of opposites, absolute/contracted and enfolding/unfolding to relate God and creation. His proposals are established by seeking out parallels between the infinite divine Original and limited created images and by drawing out the implications of these parallels. This book is neither medieval Aristotelian scholastic disputation nor later Cartesian rationalism, but its own kind of Christian Neoplatonic speculation that teases the philosophical imagination as much as it may frustrate any contemporary philosophical search for arguments or proofs. It is the coherence of the parallels or correspondences within the overall view of reality that gives Cusan metaphysics and Cusan metaphors their persuasive power.

2.2 The Mind and Human Knowing

Nicholas of Cusa does not neatly divide ontology from epistemology any more than he separates faith and reason, so it seems fitting that his ideas on human knowing emphasize the metaphor of mind as measure (mens/mensura) already mentioned in On Learned Ignorance. This becomes the significant way that human minds are images of the divine mind. In his 1450 dialogue, Idiota de mente: The Layman: About Mind, the first “definition” proposed for mind may fit the divine mind better than the human: “Mind is the limit and measure of all things” (c.1). Cusanus proceeds to employ the quasi-technical metaphor from On Learned Ignorance, “enfolding/unfolding—complicatio/explicatio,” to spell out just how our minds are images of God’s mind. These moves already separate his ideas about human knowing from those of both his scholastic predecessors and his post-Renaissance successors. He writes:

You know how the divine Simplicity enfolds all things. Mind is the image of this enfolding Simplicity. If, then, you called this divine Simplicity infinite Mind, it will be the exemplar of our mind. If you called the divine mind the totality of the truth of things, you will call our mind the totality of the assimilation of things, so that it may be a totality of ideas. In the divine Mind conception is the production of things; in our mind conception is the knowledge of things. If the divine Mind is absolute Being, then its conception is the creation of beings; and conception in the human mind is the assimilation of beings. (c.3)

This extension of the metaphor used in metaphysics to capture how things simultaneously proceed from and return to God spells out where human knowledge stands. God’s utterly simple divine mind enfolds the true natures of all the actual things “unfolded” from it in the created universe. The human mind is a parallel though limited oneness that can enfold or encompass the concepts of all it knows while unfolding them in a conceptual universe. While divine knowing amounts to the creating of beings, human knowing amounts to the creating of concepts that are “the assimilation of beings.” The idiota/layman continues:

What suits the divine Mind as infinite Truth suits our mind as its close image. If all things are in the divine Mind as in their exact and proper Truth, all things are in our mind as in the image or likeness of their proper Truth, that is, as known; for knowledge takes place by likeness. All things are in God, but there as exemplars of things. All things are in our mind, but there as likenesses of things. (c.3)

Two points here are essential. First, the conceptual content of our knowledge is tied to the things God created as to their epistemic likenesses. Nicholas thus stands in the tradition of Christian realism. Second, the correspondences between divine mind and human mind are severely modified by the fact that God’s purported “concepts,” the “exemplars” of things, are really nothing else in God but God’s undifferentiated oneness. Oneness is primary in God’s knowledge, “manyness” and “otherness” characterize our conceptual domain. At best we humans are unitary sources of our own knowledge and can give our ideas an overall oneness as a more or less organized whole—a quite imperfect and faint mirroring of God’s mind.

2.2.1 Human Knowing is Conjecturing

Nicholas’ second major treatise (1442–43) that again explains his vision of all there is in Neoplatonic Christian terms is entitled De coniecturis: On Conjectures. Here he employs the contrasting terms of unitas/alteritas: oneness/otherness, as well as enfolding/unfolding to propose how we might understand from a somewhat different viewpoint God, the universe and human beings. Oneness is characteristic of God, while otherness stands for the contingent plurality and variety of limited created things. In this work Nicholas also introduces an explicit contrast between the human capacities of ratio and intellectus. Ratio or discursive reason is our capacity for thinking, using concepts and judgments. Intellectus, by contrast, is a direct intellectual vision. Nicholas parallels the way our plural capacities for reason, imagination and sensation are founded in “intellectus” as their single source to the simultaneous outflow and return of the plurality of creatures to their single divine Source. (Ratio and intellectus may recall in some ways dianoia and noesis in Plato’s famous image of the divided line.)

The title, On Conjectures, is also intriguing because here Cusanus makes explicit the limits of human knowing only hinted at in On Learned Ignorance and in his later The Layman: On Mind. As his Prologue puts it, “You have seen that the exactness of truth cannot be attained. The consequence is that every positive human assertion of the truth is a conjecture…. And so the unattainable Oneness of truth is known in conjectural otherness and the conjecture of otherness is itself known in the most simple Oneness of truth.” Here the Neoplatonic dialectical principle that insists we never think anything apart from the First is applied even to human knowing. And such knowing is conjecturing.

Cusan “conjecture” is not to be taken as what we normally mean by the word in contemporary English where it covers the range from a guess or hunch to a typical surmise to a provisional proposal to be investigated or checked against usually empirical evidence. Nicholas only considers “true” conjectures and believes that our conceptual and judgmental knowledge is conjectural or provisional because human reason never grasps the essence of anything precisely as it is. This does not mean we cannot improve our understanding or that we are simply making things up; rather, it follows from the fact that our knowledge is a likeness of actual things and real characteristics whose complete and “true” natures are only known to their Creator. To quote the Prologue again, “while our actual knowledge is incommensurable with the greatest knowledge, something humanly unattainable, the unsure falling away of our weak apprehension from the purity of truth makes our assertions of what is true conjecture.”

Nicholas composed On Conjectures as a letter treatise addressed to Cardinal Cesarini. In chapter 11 of Book One he proposes a scenario where the cardinal views the pope. This scenario leads into his sole explicit description of coniectura. This example of visual perception lets us recognize that we readily make perceptual assertions about what we see or hear. And when we reflect on these perceptual judgments we realize that we go beyond what sensation alone delivers, for we use reason to interpret and make sense of what we see. Reason and sense operate inseparably in our perceptual experience. Reason discriminates, recognizes and may explicitly formulate in language or thought what the experience comes to, for instance, “There’s the pope.”

Further reflection enables us to realize that what visual perception delivers is limited, that is, partial and perspectival, because our perceptual judgments reflect at least the constraints of the perceiver’s bodiliness. These constraints include what physical eyes can see, as well as one’s physical location and viewpoint. Nicholas terms this a twofold “otherness” that conditions and limits all sensory perception, limitations that we are implicitly aware of in making perceptual judgments. So Nicholas’ description of coniectura reflects the “otherness” of our finite human estate. As he writes, “A conjecture, then, is a positive assertion that participates in truth as it is, but in otherness.” (Bk. I, c. 11) “Truth as it is” refers, of course, to what is enfolded in the divine Mind. What is unfolded in our concepts and assertions shares that truth but only approximately, “in otherness.”

Two other sources of “otherness” besides bodiliness underlie the limitations on perceptual knowledge. One is the fact that the objects of perception are themselves limited. The cardinal’s sight of the pope has to be conjectural because anything extended can show, as it were, but one side of itself to another embodied viewer. A second “otherness” in perception is due to the “otherness” of the mental and linguistic signs, images, and symbols we use to think and talk about what we perceive. These differ from both our mental capacities and what we are looking at or listening to. This means the terms in which perceptual judgments are expressed reflect the broader historical background and interests of the perceiver as well as his or her linguistic community.

Given all these constraints we may wonder why Nicholas believes that conjectural knowledge “participates in the truth as it is.” Fundamentally, he is convinced that our status as images of God’s mind and its oneness secures the cognitive validity of what we know. Our knowledge is “conjectural” in contrast to God’s knowledge, for divine knowledge is complete and exact, both aperspectival and omniperspectival, where knower and known coincide in infinite Oneness. Our recognition of the limits in our own knowing and its contents can keep us in touch, at least implicitly, with what is beyond our ken in that ideal oneness of knower and known. The separation of the human mind from the universe of knowable things is at the same time a connection that results in conjectural knowledge. Just so, conjectural knowledge is also an outcome of the separation and connection of the human mind and the divine Mind, of image and Original.

2.2.2 Knowing as Assimilative Measuring

Recall once more the Cusan “definition” of mind already alluded to in The Layman: About Mind: Mind is “that from which comes the limit and measure of all things.” (c.1) If we set this beside the comment quoted above that “conception in the human mind is the assimilation of beings,” it is clear that “assimilating” and “measuring” are the dominant metaphors Nicholas uses to understand what we do as knowers. As knowers we measure the things we know and we also are assimilated or likened in some way to the objects of knowledge. Along with the “horizontal” notion of our concepts being images of things as well as of the mind’s own oneness, assimilatio also has a “vertical” dimension because in knowing we liken ourselves to our divine Original.

What is at issue is the connection and tension between the two metaphors. Supposedly complementary, assimilatio and mensura give no obvious answer to what provides the measure for the content and validity of our knowledge—is it the things known or our knowing minds? Nicholas never questioned that the varied things we discover in the natural universe and fashion ourselves in the social and cultural milieu exist independently of our minds (if not of God’s). But the question here is whether our knowledge is derived from what is independent of mind or is in whole or part the result of the linguistic and conceptual measures we learn, construct and employ in dealing with reality. If knowing is creative or productive, solely a matter of our “measuring,” it is easy to see how it is an image of God’s creating, but not how it is a likening to extra-mental things. If things outside measure and cause what we know, we can see why human knowledge is a likening to things, but not how it is an image of God’s creative mind. The two metaphors may well run counter to each other.

Because Nicholas himself does not frame the question in this way, he provides ample evidence for both answers. Some interpreters, such as J. Hopkins (1996), see his use of medieval scholastic language for the powers and activities of the mind as placing him mainly in the medieval Aristotelian-Thomist tradition of critical realism, while emphasizing anew the active character of knowing at all levels and thus stressing that the mind is an active power. Those interpreters whose proclivities are more Kantian, for instance, K. Flasch (1998) and K. Kremer (1978, 2000), find in his texts gestures towards what would in Kant become “the transcendental unity of apperception” and “a priori” concepts of the understanding, not to mention the stress on active judgment. The view of the present author is that both of these interpretations may miss the Neoplatonic context in which Nicholas discusses human knowledge and may underestimate how important philosophical theology is to the Cusan exposition of knowing.

What are the clues we need to connect the metaphors of likening and measuring in a complementary way? We must return to Nicholas’ underlying conviction that our minds are images of God’s mind and that this connection between them is constant and thoroughgoing and thus should never be overlooked. Then we may begin to understand that just as God’s creative measuring sets the ontological limits of everything God creates, so our corresponding measuring can at best be assimilative of the mind-independent things we wish to know but do not create or place in reality, and yet be creative in measuring and adjudicating the conceptual domain that results from our knowing them.

Both of these strands can seen to be operative in chapter 7 of The Layman: About Mind. There Cusanus gives a somewhat more detailed account of how he sees the mind’s cognitive functions operating at the levels of sensation, imagination, reasoning and intellectual vision or intuition. Here, as in his later work entitled Compendium, we find that Nicholas inherited a technical vocabulary and conceptual framework for human knowing that embodies the medieval Aristotelian view that natural things are the causes and measures of perceptual and conceptual human knowledge. On that view, what we understand is to correspond to the intelligible aspects of things that are mind-independent so that an identity in intelligibility between mind and thing results—the mind is measured by things. While Nicholas insists that the active, self-moving mind directs and integrates the joint operation of our knowing capacities, he also agrees that the mind has no innate ideas and that mental life has to be awakened or stimulated by direct contact with the perceptible world. He never questions that the perceptible world (“the plurality of things”) exists and is independent of our minds and our knowledge.

It is the mind’s power to discriminate and make sense of what we perceive, imagine or remember that Cusanus emphasizes. He writes, speaking of imagination, “When sensible things are not present, it [imagination] conforms itself to things in a confused way and without discriminating one condition from another. But [when] functioning with thinking imagination conforms itself to things while discriminating one condition from another.” (Idiota de mente, c.7)

To help us understand the mind’s engagement in perceptual “assimilation,” Nicholas turns to the work of sculptors and craftsmen who use wax or clay to make an impression of some shape so they can work from that likeness. When it is a matter of planning something to do or make, it is easy to see our minds as active. What about perceptual experiences where what we encounter is not up to us? Nicholas returns to the wax, asking us to imagine wax informed by mind in the way mind informs our capacities for sensing and proposing that mind so imagined could “form the wax to every shape presented to it.” (c.7) Nicholas is saying, in effect, that “assimilation” in perception is indeed a matter of reason’s active selecting and managing the deliverances of sense and imagination that result from our encounters with perceptible things. We are not mere passive recipients of colors, sounds, textures and so on, but our minds differentiate and connect perceptions and images in order to form concepts based on the discriminations of reason.

Nicholas avers that our knowledge of the natural and cultural world embodied in and made systematic in the technical and mechanical and liberal arts will remain “conjectural.” The reason is that we are not dealing with the true reality of mind-independent things whose true forms are one with God. We only encounter the physically located temporal realities that are images of the really real. As he remarks, “the notions that are attained through the assimilations of reason are uncertain, because they are in accord with the images of forms rather than with their true [forms].” (ibid., c.7) Only the concepts of mathematics are not conjectural because we fashion or construct these ideas ourselves. Consequently our conceptions of them can be precise and certain, for as conceptual entities they escape the sorts of change and bodily limits characteristic of the physical world.

2.2.3 The Measure of Knowledge

But this sketch of our knowing powers as assimilative does not settle what is normative for human knowing or what it means to take the mind as a measure. Nicholas takes up this explicitly a bit later in chapter 9 of The Layman: About Mind. When he is questioned how the mind can be a measure adequate to such a variety of things, the layman responds somewhat cryptically:

In the way an “absolute” face would make itself the measure of all faces. For when you attend to the fact that mind is a certain absolute measure that cannot be greater or smaller since it is not restricted to quantity, and when you attend to the fact that this measure is alive so that it measures by itself (as if a living compass were to measure by itself), then you grasp how it makes itself into a concept, measure, or exemplar so that it attains itself in everything. (c.9)

Earlier the layman had described the human mind as a measure that sets limits, conceptual and linguistic boundaries, to all that it knows. What this presupposes are the requirements of any measuring, quantitative or qualitative: (1) something measurable to be ascertained, (2) a measure, that is a criterion or norm embodying standard units, (3) the actual measuring that employs the norm, (4) the results of the process, the measure taken.

All these requirements can be found in the passage above. What we want to know counts as the cognitively measurable (“such a variety of things”). These knowables span items in the natural world and the cultural sphere and their features, as well as concepts in the realm of thought itself. The “concept, measure, or exemplar” is the qualitative norm the mind employs and of which it is the source. The mind does the actual measuring (“measures by itself”) and “makes itself a measure” or norm in judging and taking the measure of each item across the range of things it knows. What results is the knowledge we obtain when the mind becomes “equal to such a variety of things” and “attains itself in everything.” Our knowledge includes what we gain from everyday experience in society, from the natural and human sciences, and from literature and the other arts.

What does the reference to “absolute face” in the passage quoted come to? “Absolute” is a term Cusanus usually reserved for God as the infinite One free from every limitation and restriction. Here it is transferred to our minds as images of God. Our minds are not limited to quantitative measures and thus can determine the conceptual measures or “units” that best fit or are adequate to the different sorts of things we want to know. We can answer questions of “what sort,” not just of “how much.” Our concepts and judgments are assimilative or actively likened to what we know because we construct the conceptual measures appropriate, if never wholly adequate, to what we are investigating or thinking about. As thus relatively unrestricted or “absolute,” our minds can be conformed to whatever is knowable in whatever way we can grasp it. Just as the absolute divine “face” or mind is the infinite measure of all the creaturely minds that are its images, so the human mind measures the determinate conceptual realities that reflect its own finite unity or oneness.

Human concepts are measures insofar they involve choice and construction, application and interpretation, whether quantitative or qualitative. The use of a given group of concepts or a particular scheme of ideas or interpretative framework is a matter of human creating. If we recognize some mind-independent phenomena we want to explore and come to know, whether in nature or in culture, we should also recognize that it is up to us to construct and employ the appropriate cognitive measures in order to “take the measure” of the state of affairs in question. Being introduced to some cognitive domain or area of practice we are unfamiliar with involves learning “a new vocabulary” and set of ideas already utilized and standard in that area. Unless and until we can understand the concepts and language in question, we cannot make sense out of what we perceive and continue to understand in our previous terms.

That Nicholas is using “measuring” in this sense is brought home to us by the metaphor he employs in the passage quoted above from chapter 9 where he says the mind is “a living compass that measures by itself.” In contrast with a fixed or non-adjustable straight ruler, a compass or caliper can be adjusted to fit a range of sizes and shapes. Cusanus’ fanciful “living” compass reminds us that as knowers we can actively accommodate our ideas to what we want to know. As a compass can be adjusted to find the quantitative measure of a variety of sizes and shapes, so our minds are able to fashion, adopt, modify and utilize both the literal and the symbolic ideas and concepts available to us for exploring and understanding the natural, social and conceptual worlds we inherit and extend.

This may help us understand why Nicholas’ sketch of mens involves both the mind-independent things and the mind itself as normative measures of the assimilation that is human cognition. We become like the knowable features of the things we know and we fashion the conceptual and judgmental measures whereby we take them into ourselves as known. The full determinate intelligibility of mind-independent things and states of affairs provides a kind of ideal limit that we acknowledge in recognizing the inadequacy and shortcomings of what we do know about them. That is why Nicholas deems our knowledge “conjectural.”

Along with providing this ideal limit to what we know, things outside the mind also stand as referents that themselves measure our cognitive assimilating. Recognizing that they exist, we also acknowledge that they are what our knowledge is about. And we constantly return to what we seek to understand to assess the adequacy of our conceptions and to correct any mistakes or misinterpretations in our interpretations. Deprived of these independent measures, our knowledge has no reference outside the mind and no standard for revising or improving our conceptual measures as more or less adequate to what we are trying to understand.

The Cusan answer, then, to the question of whether mind or the mind-independent realities are the “measures” of what we know may thus be seen as an attempt to have it both ways. We are both measured by the things we know and we construct the concepts and conceptual frameworks whereby we measure them, however “conjecturally.” There are situations and realities we want to understand that challenge us to adjust to what we perceive, examine, and experience. So, too, there are situations and realities that require us to modify our ideas and concepts and symbols so that they will be consistent one with another and with the rest of our beliefs.

Nicholas of Cusa thus combines the metaphors of assimilatio and mensuratio in his account of what provides the cognitive norms or criteria for human knowing. We cannot resolve the tension between the two that we find in what he says, but must hold onto it. The reason is that, as God’s images, we do not create but must recognize what God has created as independent of human knowledge. We may fashion the interpretative measures whereby we know created things, but we do this while acknowledging that the full intelligibility of each determinate reality is ultimately identical with God’s unknowable Oneness. We may aspire to full intelligibility but can reach it only in mathematics. That is why our best knowledge, even of the mind itself, remains conjectural, sharing God’s truth but limited to human ways of knowing.

2.3 Symbols and Philosophical Theology

The relationship between On Learned Ignorance and On Conjectures sets a pattern for the many shorter theoretical works Nicholas was to write in the two decades that followed. The basic insights and the framework laid out in On Learned Ignorance is never discarded and never substantively modified. Instead Nicholas’ dialogues and briefer treatises can be read as proposing many different metaphors or symbols for understanding his teaching about the relationship between God and creatures. Three examples of these metaphors may give some idea of the power and freshness of his speculative imagining. The first is his use of the icon and the wall in The Vision of God (1453); the second his attempt to capture the God-creature connection by describing God as “Not Other” in the dialogue by that name (On the Not Other, 1461); the third his fascination with mathematics and its symbolic potential. While Cusanus never surrenders his initial insight that there is no proportion between infinite and finite, thinking through these later symbols and neologisms lets us see how these indirect means enable some movement of mind and heart towards the divine Mystery with whom we are ever connected.

2.3.1 The Icon and the Wall

Cusanus wrote The Vision of God in the form of a prayer, responding to the request of the Benedictines of Tegernsee for a treatise on mystical theology. With it he sent them an “all-seeing” icon and proposed an exercise for its use to give them some understanding of God’s seeing their attempts to see God. The icon was probably a “Veronica” or image of the face of the suffering Jesus in which the eyes were portrayed as looking out of the picture plane. As a result, from whatever standpoint one looked at the painting, it seemed the eyes of Jesus looked directly into the viewer’s own eyes. Thus it could symbolize at once both God’s vision of us and our vision of God (the combined objective and subjective senses of visio Dei).

Nicholas begins by warning that “Whatever is apparent with regard to the icon of God’s sight is truer with regard to God’s true sight.”(c. 1) And what does appear when we place ourselves with the monks viewing the painting and reflect? Since it is a painting we see, what we seem to experience as we look into the eyes of Jesus is not really taking place. The face portrayed neither looks at nor sees anyone; in fact, the viewer’s gaze is the norm for this experience of a face-to-face encounter. Yet because of the spatial and temporal simultaneity the apparent gaze of the icon invites the viewer to enter into the world of the painting and tends to privilege what is portrayed, namely Jesus gazing at me. I move back and forth from my customary reactions when eyes are looking into my eyes to the realization that this eye contact is illusory.

But the illusory image in this case is of Christ suffering and looking at me. If this painting is to mediate between my reality and what it portrays, it obviously invites me to look beyond, since this is an image of the One who is the image of the Father. Twice removed from the actual divine seeing and being seen it is supposed to symbolize, Nicholas’ use of this icon lets us understand how far we stand from God’s own seeing. Yet Nicholas’ initial warning also reminds us that what is symbolized here by the painting is all the more so in reality. We are in truth preceded and embraced by Christ’s seeing us.

In seeing we are seen—this mutual relatedness is at least what the icon symbolizes. But Nicholas goes further, proposing that God’s seeing and God’s being seen are identical:

O Lord, when you look upon me with an eye of graciousness, what is your seeing, other than your being seen by me? In seeing me, you who are deus absconditus [hidden God] give yourself to be seen by me. No one can see You except insofar as you grant that you be seen. To see you is not other than that you see the one who sees you. (c.5, Hopkins translation)

In this way God seen is identically God seeing. The reason is that for God to be seen by any creature is nothing else than for God to “see” that creature gazing. But the icon also reminds us of our distance from seeing God. I can see the depicted eyes of Jesus even though no real eyes are present. But I cannot see the divine face or its vision even though God’s reality is present and “sees” me. The dialectic of divine presence and absence, of human seeing and not seeing that I experience with the icon is thus turned inside out. When I look at the icon of Christ, what seems present, its seeing, is really absent, yet God’s seeing is really present though it seems absent.

What the icon thus symbolizes is the experienced simultaneous connection of different levels of reality. Indeed, I have separate reality as a contracted image of God only through my relation to my divine Source. What is telling about Nicholas’ version of seeing God is neither what vision discerns nor what practices one must follow in order to gain the correct standpoint for such seeing. Rather he revises the meaning of “seeing God” so that God is both subject and object of our purported vision of God.

Yet this vision of God is merely purported. Cusanus leads us through a series of reflections on seeing and on the face of God only to let us realize that, whatever ratio or discursive reason comes to realize, God is located beyond both imaginative exercise and conceptual understanding. Nicholas symbolizes our approach to this beyond by encouraging us to enter “into a certain secret and hidden silence wherein there is no knowledge or concept of a face,” characterizing it as an “obscuring mist, haze, darkness or ignorance.” (c.6) He invokes the coincidence of opposites from On Learned Ignorance and, in chapter 9 of The Vision of God, proposes his second central metaphor: the wall of paradise. God dwells inside this wall, and the wall also symbolizes the coincidence of opposites and thus the defeat of discursive reason and the principle of contradiction.

Just how are we to think through the coincidence of opposites and attempt to move beyond the wall to some sort of “seeing” God? Nicholas proposes that three locations in relation to the wall map three stages in the mystical quest, using the metaphorical couple of “enfolding/unfolding” from On Learned Ignorance. Reason can understand things enfolded in or identical with God as different from the same things unfolded in the created universe. At this first stage we are outside the wall. The second stage is at the wall itself, where Nicholas places us with Christ at the door or threshold of an entrance in the wall. Here enfolding and unfolding coincide and we encounter the barrier of the coincidence of opposites. At best we acknowledge that creating and being created are one and the same in God. A third stage is beyond the entrance and inside the wall where enfolding/unfolding fall away and Cusanus points to God’s silent presence and utter transcendence, “free from whatever can be spoken of or thought of” (c.11) The third stage involves recognition that God’s infinity remains unknowable to us in conceptual terms.

Cusanus proposes some possible indirect routes that will give us no positive insight or conceptual grasp of the divine Essence. For instance, if we look to the very oppositions and contradictions that plague our normal thinking about God, we may do more justice to the unique relation between God and creatures. In his words, “the oppositeness of opposites is oppositeness without oppositeness.” (c.13) He identifies the infinite God with this “oppositeness of opposites.” Now the “opposites” in question are the ordinary things of our experience that are separate and distinct and that may have opposed or mutually exclusive properties.

Designating God as the Oppositeness of such opposites can take us from the distinctions and oppositions with which we are familiar to the One who is responsible for there being such oppositions. God is distinct from these oppositions and differences but only in a way that establishes their reality. Yet God’s oppositeness is “without oppositeness” since God’s distinctiveness is unlimited and beyond familiar oppositions. In fact, God’s oppositeness encompasses or enfolds all opposites in God as identically God and encompasses or unfolds all opposites in creation by constituting them as what they are in all their determinate, finite differences. We are to think together both the way finite things are opposed and God’s transcendent oppositeness that is “opposed” to those opposites, not as they are to one another, but so as to be ontologically responsible for the oppositions with which we are familiar.

2.3.2 God is the Not Other

In De li Non Aliud/On the Not Other (1462) Nicholas returns to the ancient Platonic categories of the One and the Other in order to re-construe in novel language what Christians believe about the dependence of creatures on their Creator. Several of Cusanus’ later works use verbal coinages or Latin neologisms as “names” or characterizations of God that are original with him, though they have earlier echoes in Christian Neoplatonism. In this dialogue he uses the expression “the not other” as a substantive for God as the divine Not-Other, even though we are more familiar with the phrase in comparative expressions that are negative ways of stating self-identity. For instance, “the tree is not other than (= the same as, identical with) the tree.”

When we use reason to recognize differences and to make distinctions, we are attempting to do justice to the plurality and variety of the natural and cultural realms with which we are most familiar. Even things of the same kind are different numerically, and speaking and thinking clearly about things and their features requires our differentiating what is determinate about them. We expect them to stay the same as they are and to remain different from other things and we reflect this in our language of identity and difference when we describe and define what we perceive and understand.

Nicholas is attempting to capitalize on the way we differentiate created things to signal and symbolize their divine Creator. While each created thing is not other than itself, so to speak, it certainly is other or different from other things. And created things are different from God as well. But Nicholas is proposing a way of “naming” God that will underline how God’s difference from God’s creatures is not even close to one creature’s difference from another creature. God’s difference is categorially different, so to speak, from one creature’s otherness from a second creature. Cusanus can thus paradoxically assert that God is “not other” than anything God has created and is sustaining in being. Indeed, we do well to think of God as “the Not-Other.”

Here is what Nicholas writes:

Not Other is not an other, nor is it other than any other, nor is it an other in an other—for no other reason than that it is Not Other, which can in no way be other, as if it something were lacking to it, as to an other. For an other which is other than something lacks that than which it is other. But Not Other, because it is not other than anything, does not lack anything nor can anything be outside it. (c.6)

We may paraphrase this rather cryptic passage as follows. The divine Not-Other is simply not one of the things we are familiar with in the world we inhabit, where all is multiplicity and difference, where each thing or state of affairs is other than or different from every other existent thing or situation that obtains. Nicholas terms the multiple things we deal with “others” because each one of them, each “other,” is distinct from every other thing. Nicholas also proposes that such finite things possess and lack what things different from them possess—to be other or distinct is precisely not to be one or any of the finite others. Our language and thought busy themselves in finding and making further distinctions and divisions between things and parts of things, between one condition and another, between one state of affairs and another. So we come to know that one thing is other than or separate from another thing or that we find it in another that is related to, yet different from, something else.

Nicholas’ central point is that the divine Not-Other is nothing like all the finite, limited others of our experience. Nicholas writes, “Not Other does not lack anything.” Even in common sense terms, any given thing is “plenty lacking,” to speak colloquially. No matter what it has, it arguably is lacking some of what it should have as a specimen of its type, and it certainly lacks what other things not of its kind possess. One way to think of the finite things with which we are familiar is to consider that their being limited means that they are just so much and not more. But this is exactly how we should not think of God, who “does not lack anything” and outside of whom nothing can exist. As Nicholas says, “But God is Not-Other because God is not other than other, even though ‘not other’ and ‘other’ seem opposed. But other is not opposed to God from whom it has that it is other.” (c.6)

The opposition in this case is entirely different because, though creatures are dependent functions of God and may be interdependent functions of one another, God is not a dependent function of creatures. God is precisely not any of the others and so is not other or different in the way creatures are. We thus have two sorts of differentiation or otherness, the opposition between distinct creatures and the opposition between creatures and God. The “Not” in “Not-Other” differentiates God from creatures but does not exclude the divine Not-Other since the Not-Other ontologically determines creatures. Thinking God as Not-Other requires a characteristic Cusan dialectical thinking, not simply affirming or denying difference. We are to recognize and acknowledge that the divine Not-Other is both not one of the others and at once not other than any or all of them.

To put this more formally, the difference or opposition between created things is both symmetrical and transitive. The basis for their distinction is their identity: their symmetrical otherness is the result of their substantial not-otherness, so to speak. But created things’ difference from God is asymmetrical and intransitive. True, the divine Not-Other is not one of the creatures, but in a different way than they are different from one another. Cusanus gives expression to this important difference between finite and Infinite when he asserts that the divine Not-Other is not other than any created other. Negatively, the Not-Other is not finite as the others are; positively, the reflexivity characteristic of a limited thing’s self-identity also characterizes the Not-Other’s relation with it.

Just as any creature is not other than itself so it is not other than the divine Not-Other. The divine Not-Other both is and is not every finite other. The reason is that distinct created things possess their very status as beings, and thus their otherness, from and through God. God, the divine Not-Other, is causally responsible for things’ existing as separate and self-identical others. For Nicholas, nothing can have being outside of God.

2.3.3 Mathematics and God

Recent publications, and in particular, D.Albertson’s Mathematical Theologies(2014), have highlighted another key theme and its attendant metaphors in Nicholas’ works: mathematics and number. Cusanus believes that no knowledge we have is more certain than mathematics, given that it is the construction of our own minds. Mathematical ideas are the paradigm of how the human mind unfolds a conceptual universe that parallels and forms an image of God’s unfolding of the created world. Number here refers primarily to arithmetic and geometry, to the whole numbers and to plane and solid figures. The latter are often imagined as in movement or constructing other figures. Nicholas joins enfolding/unfolding and the certainty of mathematics to the Christian tradition that everything is created in the divine word or Logos.

Geometrical figures are used early in Book 1 of On Learned Ignorance to illustrate how our knowledge of created things is only approximative. A bit later we are led to extrapolate straight and curved lines as an aid to understanding the coincidence of opposites and to moving human thought towards the God who is unknowable by reason. Book 2 uses number to illustrate enfolding and unfolding—as the number series unfolds what is enfolded in the unit, so God unfolds all created things. Nicholas later introduces the geometrical image of the sphere whose center is everywhere and whose circumference is nowhere to explain how the physical universe’s lack of boundaries is an image of God’s infinity. Book 2 also opens and closes with reflection on the quadrivium: arithmetic, geometry, music and astronomy. Book 3 returns to the image of the infinite sphere for the combination of absolute and contracted reality in the God-man.

On Conjectures moves directly into arithmetic and geometry with its conjectural reflections on the decade’s embracing all number and with its ordering of reality’s oneness and otherness using the spatial diagrams P and U that employ cones and spheres. Just as the number series unfolds the unit, so the created universe unfolds God’s creating, and human concepts (such as numbers and geometric figures) unfold the oneness of the human mind. In this way a human being is truly a “second God.”

Nicholas’ later works of the 1450s extend the notion of number and of enfolding/unfolding that he inherited from Boethius and the twelfth-century school of Chartres. Number and size (multitudo et magnitudo) are central to The Layman: On Mind where measuring is proposed as the layman’s definition of the human mind. Measuring is then used directly in The Layman: Experiments with Weights. Nicholas proposes that the Divine Word in whom all things are created or unfolded in time is to be thought together with human measuring as the closest sign or image of the Divine Oneness. In the background stands the saying from the Book of Wisdom11.21 that in creating God ordered “all things in measure, number and weight.” This way number and mathematical ideas take on more than their usual employment for human ends and become a way to the Creator always present to creaturely unfoldings in human thought.

The Vision of God (1453) proposes an exercise for the monks based on the center and circumference of circle wherein seeing from the circumference and being seen from the center collapse into a figure of mystical oneness: being seen seeing. In the same year Nicholas composes Complementary Theological Considerations (De theologicis complementis). There he features God as a mathematician who creates in the Equality of the Divine Word—unfolding as well human beings whose quadrivial mathematics is an image of the divine creativity. God is now named “infinite angle” that unites maximal and minimal angles and the non-quantitative number of everything. Nicholas thus brings together his theological and mathematical concepts from the 1440s and unites number, enfolding/unfolding and the Divine Word.

3. A Neoplatonism of His Own

How does Nicholas’ Neoplatonism aid his thinking about God? One advantage is that Nicholas can take the basic asymmetry between paradigmatic Platonic Forms and the perceptible realm of particular things that are images of the Forms and apply that asymmetry to the way the First Principle, God, is related to all other created realities. In working out this relationship, Plato proposed that what results for individual Forms is that all particulars “participate” in the relevant Form just the way an image reflects and depends on its original. That is to say, the Form does not require the particulars but is prior ontologically. The relation between Form and particulars is not one of reciprocal dependence. Applied to the first ontological principle, or to the Christian God, the result is to let all the multiple, complex creatures participate in their ultimate Source while the divine Creator remains simple, unparticipated and unchanged. As Christian medieval thinkers (even the Aristotelians agreed on this point) were accustomed to express it, creatures depend on God while God is not at all dependent on creatures. All the dependence is one-way.

And that dependence is interpreted in Platonic and Biblical terms, as the dependence of creaturely images on a divine Original. While the total reality of an image requires the influence of the original, there is nothing about the latter that is ontologically in need of the image. In Platonism this effectively means there is “separation” of the intelligible and perceptible realms, for in fact the perceptible cannot exist without the very intelligible that abides unaffected by the realm of multiplicity and change. While not being themselves Forms, perceptible things are not really separate from the intelligible Forms on which they depend. No less than Form and perceptible thing in Platonism and Neoplatonism, in Christian Neoplatonism Creator and creature are bound together in a parallel asymmetry.

If this asymmetry is rethought in terms of the presence required for the creatures to be all that they are by nature, it will turn out that God (or the One in non-Christian Neoplatonisms), the greater and prior reality, must always be there if creaturely reality is to be forthcoming and to continue. Now creatures as created images can stand for manifestation and reflection of (and for Christian thinkers, likeness to) as well as for dependence on God, for the divine presence penetrates and encompasses each and all creatures without ever being limited or captured by any of them. While Plato’s Forms play a definitive role in the perceptible realm as responsible for the determinate characteristics of things, they count as a kind of present absence. No less determinative is the ongoing presence of the Christian God and that, too, has become a kind of absence. How should we attempt to understand this?

Our conceptions of the absence or presence of one thing to another are taken originally from and remain most at home in the realm of limited physical beings. Here presence to or absence from another involves the same sort of mutuality or reciprocity that the same corporeal realm of limited things must always manifest. If body A is present to or absent from body B, B is present to or absent from A and vice versa. The other sorts of important presence or absence we are familiar with—presence in thought, in memory and imagination and affection, for instance—are metaphorical to some degree and are extensions from and find their source in our experience of some prior physical presence, whether merely perceived and understood, or hoped for, or feared. So too with the kinds of metaphorical absence we recognize when some present person is, as we say, “just not there.” And absence, whether indifferent, bad or good, presupposes presence. Such metaphorical presences and absences of limited things to one another might thus be understood as absent presences or present absences.

And so we are able to speculate about the case of a non-finite presence-in-absence by starting with but moving beyond the limits of the presence and absence we are familiar with in the realm of limited things. Now we turn to the presence of the unfamiliar infinite One as what is finally required, even if not obviously experienced, to keep the creaturely image present and real. In this case, we may think that absence becomes what is metaphorical and the presence of the First is in truth ineluctably and literally necessary to explain the reality of anything and everything. But God’s presence is hardly like that of one physical thing to another.

This means that the presence of God and God’s identity with things is not to be thought as the kind of reciprocity, say, that two created physical things have that are present to one another, let alone similar or identical to each other. What is distinctive about Christian Neoplatonism is its ability to hold together dialectically in thought the insight it provides about this asymmetrical, non-reciprocal ontological connection between God and creatures. God penetrates and surpasses or exceeds each thing God creates and encompasses. Creatures are thus themselves real with the limited sort of independence they manifest, yet they are at once in God and indeed one with God without being themselves divine.

But what has all this to do with Nicholas of Cusa’s having a Neoplatonism of his own? What is characteristic of his thought, I want to propose, is that in key passages of major works he proposes this same kind of dialectical thinking to enable our grasping the general relationship between God and creatures. But the thinking is supposed to reflect an ontological dialectic, that is to say, a relationship that is real whether we acknowledge it or not. The dialectical relation between God and creatures is something towards which we mostly gesture in our efforts to do it justice in thought and speech. But is this not merely Proclus or Dionysius or Eriugena or Eckhart revisited in the fifteenth century? The answer is both yes and no.

Yes, the dialectical reality envisioned by Nicholas should be little different than that pointed to by earlier Christian Neoplatonists. Neither Plato’s Forms nor the Christian God did or could change over the centuries nor did the need of particulars and creatures for their intelligible and divine originals. But also, no, for Cusanus gives the dialectical relation his own expression in a series of novel metaphors for the connection between God and creatures. Some of his original metaphors, such as the coincidence of opposites, enfolding/unfolding, God as the Not Other, and as the Oppositeness of opposites, are controlled by and witness to that same asymmetrical relationship, yet lead our speculative imaginations in some new directions that would otherwise remain unexplored.

If only God can bespeak Godself in literal terms, then we humans are graced with metaphors. What Cusanus provides in his metaphorical forays is not simply imaginative originality, but a series of metaphors designed to remind us that there is no proportion between creatures and creator; that indeed there is an asymmetry between them. Moreover, our best ways of conceiving and asserting this necessary lack of reciprocal dependence should be built into the metaphors we choose. This is why one may not need a theory of metaphor to do justice to the Cusan project of philosophical theology. Rather, the Cusan project is Neoplatonic and has its own traditional strictures on any metaphors he chooses: the ontology determines the metaphors, the metaphors do not determine the ontology. What makes Nicholas’ thought a Neoplatonism of his own is precisely the grasp his metaphors demonstrate of those ontological strictures, as well as the speculative imagination he evinces in the range, originality and variety of metaphors for what we can and cannot understand about God’s connection with creatures.

4. Contribution to Political Ideas

Nicholas of Cusa has attracted frequent notice in the history of political ideas because of his early work, The Catholic Concordance/De Concordantia Catholica (1433–34). This lengthy work in three books is aimed first of all at an ecclesiatical audience at the Council of Basel and only secondarily, in Book 3, at the Holy Roman Empire and its electors of the emperor. Nicholas’ ideas stand squarely in the conciliarist tradition following proposals from the Council of Constance (1414–18), and thus privilege the council’s authority above the pope’s. In Book 1 he expounds a hierarchical view of creation and of the church, following Dionysius the Areopagite. Then he uses both canon law and historical documents from and about the early church councils to undergird his view of council and papacy. Yet he never denies the importance of the positions of pope and emperor. Throughout Nicholas works to harmonize (=concordantia) the many different strands in church law and political theory.

Over the last century scholars of political history have singled out chapters, particularly in Book 2, where Nicholas discusses consent as a prerequisite for legitimate law and government. Going beyond tradition and canon law, he argues on the basis of people’s natural freedom (“men are by nature equal in power and equally free”) that all governance comes from the consent of the subjects. This argument to explicitly institutionalize consent is Nicholas’ original contribution. He follows it with proposals on representation that move from representation as virtual impersonation to representation as delegation based on those represented selecting their representatives. This is one of the first explicit statements in the West of the institutional limits to be placed on rulers and of the idea that people must consent to their representative institutions.

Even after he changed allegiance to the side of papal supremacy, Nicholas used his ideas to argue in later brief writings that Basel was not truly representative and that consent was embodied in the college of cardinals. In the following centuries, secular parliaments returned to ideas of consent and representation (though not directly to Nicholas’ book) in attempting to restrict the power of monarchs. In the church itself, tradition continued to outweigh innovation, and the idea of conciliar superiority to the pope seemed dead for centuries. Some twentieth-century thinking in the Roman Catholic Church has returned to and enlivened ideas about council and papacy propounded by Nicholas of Cusa.


Primary Texts

Nicolai de Cusa Opera Omnia jussu et auctoritate Academicae Litterarum Heidelbergensis, 1932–2007, Leipzig-Hamburg: Meiner.

German Translations

  • Philosophisch-Theologische Schriften, 1967, 3 volumes, L. Gabriel (ed.), D. & W. Dupré (trans.), Vienna: Herder. (Facing Latin and German text.)
  • Schriften des Nikolaus von Kues in deutscher Übersetzung im Auftrag der Heidelberger Akademie der Wissenschaften, Philosophische Bibliothek, 1936–, Leipzig-Hamburg: Meiner.
  • De docta ignorantia I, 1994, Philosophische Bibliothek (Volume 264a), P. Wilpert and H. G. Senger (ed. and trans.). (Facing Latin and German text.)
  • De docta ignorantia II, 1999, Philosophische Bibliothek (Volume 264b), P. Wilpert and H. G. Senger (ed. and trans.). (Facing Latin and German text.)
  • De docta ignorantia III, 1999, Philosophische Bibliothek (Vol. 264c), R. Klibansky (ed.), H.G. Senger (trans.). (Facing Latin and German text.)

English Translations

  • Bond, H.L. (tr.), 1997, Nicholas of Cusa: Selected Spiritual Writings, New York: Paulist.
  • Hopkins, J. (tr.), 2001, Complete Philosophical and Theological Treatises of Nicholas of Cusa, Minneapolis: Banning.

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