Meister Eckhart

First published Mon May 1, 2023

[Editor’s Note: The following new entry by Amber Griffioen replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous authors.]

Although rather unlikely to make many philosophers’ “top-five” list of medieval Christian thinkers (and even less likely to be found on a history of philosophy syllabus), few medieval thinkers are as wildly popular today in non-academic circles (and even more widely quoted out of context—both in his day and in ours) than Meister Eckhart. Both the scholarly philosophical neglect and the popular spiritual embrace of Eckhart have, in no small part, to do with his contemporary recasting as a “mystic”—a designation which has led present-day scholars to downplay his intellectual importance and spiritual seekers to up-play his esotericism. Even the German title Meister (“master”) is often mistakenly assumed to reflect Eckhart’s status as a spiritual “guru” of sorts, when in reality it derives from the Latin honorific magister, a title granted only to the most learned of university-trained scholars of his day. Yet neither the contemporary philosophers who ignore him nor the new-age enthusiasts who adore him adequately capture the complexity of the Meister, who was both a sophisticated and well-respected intellectual—a master of letters, learning, and language—as well as a spiritual leader of his order helping the men and women under his instruction to master the “wayless ways” of leaving the self, knowing God, and living well. This entry seeks to show the ways in which the intellectual, spiritual, and ethical aspects of Eckhart’s thought are deeply intertwined, using his unique approach to language and communication as a guiding thread.

Unfortunately, the neglect in philosophical circles of Eckhart’s intellectual contributions to the history of philosophy makes it difficult to find a comprehensive list of the magister’s (confirmed) Latin and German works, and there is to-date no complete English translation of the Latin works. Additionally, various editors and translators over the years have numbered the German sermons differently, often leading to confusion regarding the ordering and cross-referencing of the sermons. For this reason, citations of primary-source material in this entry provide, first, the abbreviation of the relevant work with the section number, followed by the volume and page number from the German critical edition (LW or DW for Lateinische Werke and Deutsche Werke, respectively), as well as the page number of the English translation when possible. With respect to Eckhart’s German sermons, I have used Quint’s numbering, as it is the most widely recognized by Eckhart scholars (and that used by the critical editions). Finally, where relevant, I have cited LW I/2, as opposed to LW I, since the former is also used in the more accessible (and affordable) Latin-German study edition.

1. Life

Meister Eckhart, also known as Eckhart of Hochheim, was born around 1260, most likely in or near the German village of Tambach near the Thuringian capital of Erfurt, where he probably entered into the Dominican order sometime during his late teenage years. It is unclear where Eckhart completed his initial studies, but the obvious influence of Albert the Great on his intellectual formation indicates that he may have studied in Cologne sometime before Albert’s death in 1280 (Sturlese 2013: 125–26). What is certain is that Eckhart eventually made his way to study theology in Paris, where he was made a lecturer on Peter Lombard’s Sentences in 1293. Fresh from the university at Paris, the new baccalaureus theologiae returned to Erfurt in 1293–4, this time as the prior of the Dominican monastery where he had spent his early years.

In 1302, Eckhart was called to return to Paris for two years to occupy the external Dominican chair as magister actu regens, a position considered the pinnacle of academic success in the medieval scholastic world, after which he was called back to Erfurt to serve as the provincial for the newly-established province of Saxony. There he was charged with the oversight and administration of at least 47 convents and monasteries in Eastern and Northern Germany and the Low Countries. During this time, he established three new convents for women and was additionally appointed general vicar of Bohemia. Yet Eckhart remained as much an academic as an administrator, and the status he enjoyed as a scholar and teacher is reflected by the fact that, in 1311, he was called back to Paris to serve a second term as magister, a distinction previously only granted to Thomas Aquinas (McGinn 2001: 2ff.; Ruh 1996: 239ff.). In the summer of 1313, Eckhart left Paris for Strasbourg in the Alsace region to function as the special vicar for the Dominican Master General. Over the next decade, he had close contact with several female convents, as well as with the growing communities of Beguines in the region, and he is recorded as having made personal visits to the convents of St. Katharinental, Ötenbach, and Unterlinden (McGinn 2001: 10). It is not unlikely that his encounter with these female religious communities played a role in Eckhart’s increasing focus on his vernacular preaching during this period (Largier 1998), and some scholars (e.g., Milem 2013) have even proposed that many of the Meister’s German sermons were aimed at a female audience interested in pursuing unitive and/or ecstatic religious experiences, though the exclusivity and aims of his audience in this respect is (rightly) considered controversial (cf. Wegener 2013).

Ever the scholar, however, Eckhart left Strasbourg sometime between 1323–24 to return to the German center of Dominican learning, Cologne (Senner 2013). In the years that followed, he was presented with several lists of purportedly heretical ideas and passages he had written or preached. The first list, presented to him in 1325 by Nicholas of Strasbourg (who was otherwise generally supportive of Eckhart’s preaching), likely contained passages from the Book of Divine Consolation drawn up by two “renegade” Dominicans, Hermann of Summo and William of Nideggen, who only accused Eckhart of heresy after themselves being accused of corruption (Tobin 1986: 11; Senner 2013: 50–52). In response, Eckhart appears to have written a now-lost treatise, the Requisitus, that satisfied Nicholas for the time being. William was eventually reassigned to a priory in Aachen, while Hermann was later found guilty of being a false accuser (among other, more serious crimes) and imprisoned in the priory jail, but it would appear that both of them would manage to dodge their punishments and continue to accuse Eckhart of heresy (Senner 2013: 52–53). In 1326 they presented the Archbishop of Cologne Henry II of Virneburg (who was significantly less sympathetic to Eckhart’s cause than Nicholas) with their list of 74 purportedly heretical propositions from Eckhart’s Latin and German works. A further list from the German sermons seems to have been drawn up later, and there may have been subsequent lists (Tobin 1986: 10). On September 26, 1326, Eckhart appeared before the diocesan inquisitorial commission to speak to the charges of heresy in a trial that, as Bernard McGinn notes, was “unprecedented” for the late middle ages (McGinn 2001: 15). In his defense at these proceedings, Eckhart cleverly appealed to the distinction between intellect and will central to the debates between the Franciscans and the Dominicans. Even if he were in error regarding certain theological statements, he maintained, this was merely an intellectual failure and could not by itself amount to his having committed heresy, since the latter is, properly understood, a volitional matter (Senner 2013: 61; McGinn 2001: 15). Eckhart thereby publicly declared that he was willing to retract any and all errors the commission might find.

In the Spring of 1327, Eckhart set off for the papal court at Avignon to appeal directly to the pope, who set up a commission of theologians to examine the lists from the Cologne hearings. By this point, the concern was no longer whether Eckhart was a heretic (perhaps due to the careful distinction he had drawn in his earlier defense) but rather to determine the orthodoxy of the propositions themselves. The list was ultimately reduced to 28 propositions, all of which were eventually deemed by the commission to be as “heretical as the words sound” (LW V:569), indicating that its members were inclined to take the propositions literally and out of context, despite Eckhart’s protestations that he had been misunderstood (Senner 2013: 75–76). These articles range from the claim that the world has existed from eternity to the idea that God’s glory is also revealed in evil to assertions that God is glorified in those who renounce the pursuit of inwardness, holiness, reward, or heaven. Many of the articles center on claims that hint at notions of apotheosis, deification, and/or the identification of the human soul with the (or a) Son of God. (For a full list, see EE 77–81 and MW 26–28.)

The commission’s findings, however, were merely a recommendation to the pope, and unfortunately, by the time the pope’s official consistorium with the cardinals was able to take place, Eckhart had fallen ill and most likely died on January 28, 1328 (Senner 1997). On March 27, 1329, Pope John XXII issued the bull In agro dominico, which followed the commission’s recommendation in condemning all 28 articles, but ordered them according to various levels of severity, eleven of them being merely claimed to be “likely misunderstood”. The bull was sent to Cologne with the order that it be published, so that

the hearts of the simple [people to whom Eckhart had preached such articles] which are easily seduced […] may not be filled with the errors contained in them. (LW V:602; quoted in Senner 2013: 84)

Nowhere in the bull or its accompanying documents, however, was Meister Eckhart himself ever declared a heretic.

2. Influences

Although Eckhart was an innovative and controversial figure, he was also a product of his time—and by those standards not nearly as heterodox as he is often made out to be. While much has been made of the accusations against him, there has also been a significant effort by various Eckhart scholars to rehabilitate the Meister’s orthodoxy and demonstrate his adherence to the theological and philosophical doctrines from which his thought arose.

Similar to other thirteenth-century Dominicans of the Cologne School like Albert the Great (d. 1280), Thomas Aquinas (d. 1274), and Dietrich of Freiburg (d. 1310)—all of whom exercised a significant influence on the young Dominican—Eckhart’s thought represents a kind of synthesis between, on the one hand, a deeply Augustinian and Dionysian Christian Neoplatonism (one strongly influenced by Proclus and the Liber de causis) and, on the other hand, the late medieval scholastic Aristotelianism of the universities. Eckhart’s own analysis of Aristotle was not seldomly filtered through the Jewish and Islamic sources available to him in Latin—most especially in the works of Maimonides, Avicenna, Averroes, and Avicebron (Palazzo 2013; Schwartz 2002). Indeed, in Eckhart’s Latin works only Aristotle is cited more frequently than Maimonides, leading Bernard McGinn to claim that “no Christian author of the Middle Ages […] knew Maimonides better or reflected greater sympathy for his view” (McGinn 1986: 17). In a similar vein, Kurt Flasch (2006 [2015]) characterizes Eckhart as having inherited the “spirit of Arabic philosophy”.

With respect to lesser known figures and movements, Eckhart’s relationship with his female contemporaries, especially Dominican nuns and the Beguines in Strasbourg—as well as the similarities in aspects of his thought to the work of Rhineland contemplatives like Hadewijch of Antwerp (d. 1260), Mechthild of Magdeburg (d. c.1282), and especially Marguerite Porete (burned at the stake in Paris in 1310 for heresy)—have been the subject of much speculation. It is still debated as to whether Eckhart was explicitly familiar with Marguerite’s Mirouer des simples âmes anienties [The Mirror of Simple Annihilated Souls]. We do know that he shared a residence with her inquisitor, William of Paris, the year after her execution, and there are certainly striking parallels between some of the ideas in Eckhart’s sermons and Marguerite’s Mirouer (e.g., the metaphor of the “spark” of the soul and the divine as abyss, the notions of poverty or freedom of spirit, the negation or “annihilation” of the self-possessed soul, and the hypernomian allusions to the detached soul’s transcendence of the virtues). But their thought also diverges in significant ways—as can be seen, for example, in the stark contrast between Eckhart’s staunch intellectualism and Marguerite’s repeated emphasis on the supremacy of love over reason and intellect. Thus, whether the parallels between the two more likely suggest a direct connection between Marguerite and Eckhart, a third party who exercised influence on both individuals, or the cultural influence of ideas that were simply “in the air” in the late thirteenth and early fourteenth centuries remains a topic for further research. (For more on comparisons between medieval women’s spirituality and Eckhart’s thought see, among others, Wegener 2013; Hollywood 1995 [2001]; Sells 1994; and the collection of essays in McGinn 1994.)

3. Lebemeister or Lesemeister? Eckhart as Mystic, Theologian, and Philosopher

In much contemporary spiritual literature, various popular new-age tomes, and not a little academic scholarship, Meister Eckhart has been characterized first and foremost as a mystic—and only secondarily as a theologian or philosopher. This characterization has to do, in part, with the recovery of Eckhart’s vernacular works by nineteenth-century Romantic and Idealist movements in Germany for whom the so-called “mystics” symbolized the representatives and custodians of “true” religion (Schmidt 2003). (Eckhart’s more “scholarly” Latin writings were not discovered until the second half of the nineteenth century by which time he had already been claimed for mysticism.) Relatedly, Eckhart’s vernacular works lent themselves well to a growing interest in religious perennialism and a desire in the burgeoning fields of religious studies, philosophy of religion, and religious psychology to locate parallels between the attitudes, experiences, and ideas found in Christianity and those of other religious and spiritual traditions (Griffioen 2021: 9–12). Already in Volume 2 of The World as Will and Representation (1844), Schopenhauer compared Eckhart’s ideas with those found in Buddhism, Sufism, and the Upanishads (Schopenhauer 1844 [2018]), and Rudolf Otto compared the Meister to Shankara in his influential 1926 Mysticism East and West (Otto 1926 [1932]). Since then, Eckhart has often been set alongside other figures sometimes claimed for mysticism—e.g., Abraham Abulafia, Ibn ‘Arabi, Rumi, Zhuangzi, and Zhu Xi, to name just a few—and his work has been compared to traditions as wide ranging as Advaita Vedanta, Confucianism, Sufism, Taoism, Zen Buddhism, and Zoharic Kabbalism, among others. Indeed, Eckhart remains a significant touchstone for scholars of comparative mysticism today. (For a few direct comparisons see, e.g., Ueda 2018, 1977; Griffioen & Zahedi 2018; Zarrabi-Zadeh 2016; Wolfson 2013; Zheng 2016b, 2016a; Heitz 2007; Shah-Kazemi 2006; Suzuki 1957.)

Eckhart’s modern reception as a mystic is unfortunately also due to entrenched scholarly biases, both past and present, against medieval vernacular spiritual and theological writing. Quite often, the category commonly referred to as “vernacular mysticism” has been misleadingly set up as an irrationalist foil to medieval scholasticism, leading to the outright dismissal as “non-philosophical” of many traditions and genres of late medieval religious writing—especially those penned by women and laypersons (Griffioen 2022). And although Eckhart belonged to neither of these social categories, his connections to such groups and the air of heterodoxy surrounding his later work may have played a significant role in the perpetuation of his contemporary reputation as a mystic and his partial exclusion from the scholastic canon. (It is telling that, although an English translation of Eckhart’s German sermons appeared already in 1909, his Latin works have never been completely translated into English.)

At the same time, in contrast to his Beguine counterparts, Eckhart’s role as a speculative thinker and champion of natural philosophy did not go wholly unnoticed. For example, his adoption by German Idealists like Franz von Baader and G.W.F. Hegel transformed the Dominican master into “the father of modern speculation” in the German-speaking world (Moran 2013: 669–70) and served to make him culturally and philosophically relevant in a way “unmatched in the German intellectual sphere in the second half of the nineteenth and for much of the twentieth century” (O’Regan 2013: 666). However, this also resulted in twentieth-century German philosophers like Martin Heidegger adapting Eckhartian terms like Gelassenheit (“the state of letting-go” or “releasement”) for their own philosophical purposes, further obscuring the Meister’s own use of such terms, as well as the rebranding of Eckhart by the National Socialists as the progenitor of a uniquely “German” Christianity (Moran 2013: 675). However, although Eckhart’s playful use of his vernacular tongue was indeed distinctive, and there is certainly a Rhenish-Flemish spiritual tradition to which he can be said to belong, there is nothing particularly “German” about his theology. (Or, if there is, he has other “German” thinkers like Albert or Dietrich to thank for it.)

More recently, scholars like John Caputo have seen in Eckhart’s thought an early critique of what has come to be known as “ontotheology” (Caputo 1975), placing him squarely in a historical lineage of thinkers taken to anticipate contemporary phenomenology and Continental philosophical theology. Others like Kurt Flasch place Eckhart in a more recognizably analytic lineage, focusing on his

attempts to prove those theses generally considered essential tenets of Christian thought with what he considers to be a purely rational method. (Flasch 2006 [2015: 15–16])

Still, we should not be so hasty to completely disassociate Eckhart with “mystical theology” altogether, at least as the term was commonly understood in the late middle ages, in which it was associated less with religious experience and more with a special kind of hermeneutical expertise (Griffioen 2021: 1–2; Jantzen 1995: 59ff.). Several places in the Dominican’s work discuss his self-described aim as a teacher and preacher to uncover the “mystical” (i.e., “hidden”) meanings lying under the surface of Holy Scripture, a task that for Eckhart was simultaneously speculative and practical, involving both the pursuit of truth and the edification of the soul. Moreover, although Eckhart rarely speaks of anything resembling mystical experience—in fact, his work might be better characterized as “anti-experiential” (Yadav 2016; Van Dyke 2010)—the ideas expressed in both his German sermons and his Latin writings do appear to set out a spiritual program of the kind that has traditionally been identified with apophatic (and especially Dionysian) mysticism. For this reason, we might do better to think of his work as embodying a kind of speculative mystagogy—an edificatory spiritual itinerary grounded in a complex philosophical cosmology and anthropology, fused to a sophisticated Trinitarian doctrine of God, and culminating in (without aiming at!) the intellectual realization of the unity of the Divine and human natures.

Indeed, to assume that Eckhart’s intellectual and pastoral tasks were completely divorced from one another fails to capture the richness of his thought. Eckhart has often been called both a Lesemeister (“master of learning”) and a Lebemeister (“master of living”), and it does not seem inappropriate to characterize him as simultaneously occupying the roles of mystic, theologian, and philosopher, even in his written works (McGinn 2005: 108ff.; Ruh 1996: 229ff.). However we choose to label him, Eckhart’s thought has been taken up (and adapted, revised, or repurposed) by a wide range of figures and movements, including proponents of Thomism, negative theology, ecological theology, liberation theology, analytic philosophy, Continental philosophy, phenomenology, feminist theory, Marxist theory, and other intellectual circles—as well as by spiritualists, artists, new age gurus, and those simply seeking spiritual or existential guidance, demonstrating his relevance for thinkers and movers from all walks of life.

4. Saying and Unsaying: Language and the Philosophical Eckhart

Just as it is difficult to separate Eckhart the philosopher from Eckhart the theologian or Eckhart the mystic, it is often equally difficult to systematically tease apart Eckhart’s speculative metaphysics from his epistemological, practical, and pastoral views. To be sure, with respect to the debate between the Dominicans and the Franciscans regarding the primacy of intellect versus will, Eckhart falls decidedly on the side of his order, emphasizing that intellect and our rational nature (Middle High German: vernünfticheit) are “nobler” than the will. However, this does not mean that Eckhart’s philosophical focus is solely or even primarily on the cognitive or even the rational, at least as these terms are employed today. Even if he agrees with his fellow Dominicans that human beings’ rational nature represents the aspect in which they most closely resemble the Divine, not only does the late medieval understanding of “rational nature” goes far beyond the mere ability to reason, Eckhart himself claims that true wisdom and genuine knowledge of God involves leaving reason (or at least discursive reasoning) behind (Van Dyke 2019, 2022). This “sapiential” approach establishes a tight connection between cosmology (the “top-down” order of reality and divine creation), the pursuit of wisdom (the “bottom-up” order of knowledge and human intellection), and the perfection of the human being (a rightly-ordered will grounded in the divine reality). Still, as discussed in more detail below, creating, knowing, and willing all involve fundamental motions of intellection for Eckhart: ontologically on the part of God (in “birthing” creation via an “overflowing” act of divine causal knowing), epistemically and spiritually within the human being (in “birthing the Word” in the depths of the soul via the non-teleological “non-activity” of silent contemplation).

One way of thinking about how the various vertices of Eckhart’s thought are connected to each other is to explore his nuanced approach to and use of language in the pursuit of what his student, Heinrich Seuse (Henry Suso), would later characterize in his widely read Horologium Sapientiae as the highest form of philosophy, a philosophia spiritualis (one which Seuse took Eckhart to embody). Not only does the Meister engage in a kind of “serious play” with words and language in both his Latin and German writings, much of his work ultimately revolves around the ways in which words, especially understood as “signs” or “images”, can both reveal and obscure. This tension is played out in a dynamic, distinctly Eckhartian dialectic that moves back and forth between saying and “unsaying” (Sells 1994), univocity and equivocity (Mojsisch 1983 [2001]; Wendlinder 2014), speech and silence (Duclow 1984)—between the limits of finite human language and the self-communication of the Divine Intellect in the “Eternal Word” (i.e., Christ). In fact, despite his strong apophatic tendencies, the speculative aspect of Eckhart’s mystagogy might best be characterized as a philosophy of the Word, according to which the second person of the Christian Trinity (understood as the divine logos or scholastic ratio) represents the metaphysical threshold between the human and the divine, as well as the medium by which the timeless, singular Godhead (the “One” of Neoplatonist philosophy) is “translated”—linguistically, epistemically, and even ontologically—into the discursivity and multiplicity characteristic of the grammar, thought, and very existence of creatures.

Therefore, although it is to some extent misleading and anachronistic to carve up Eckhart’s thought into distinct philosophical subdisciplines, to borrow one of Eckhart’s favorite “hermeneutical keywords” (Ruh 1985: 96)—namely in quantum (MHG: als verre)—it may nevertheless be helpful to explore his philosophical views insofar as they might be said to fall under various contemporary philosophical categories, using his approach to language, interpretation, and communication as a guide. In practice, however, these different aspects of his philosophical system were not intended to be thought independently of one another.

5. Faith and Philosophy: Eckhart’s Hermeneutical Approach

The best way to understand Eckhart’s views on the relationship between revelation and reason, faith and philosophy, is to explore its relevance with respect to his views on the interpretation of Scripture in the Opus tripartitum—a novel orientation toward exegesis that would become increasingly prominent in his later work, perhaps as a result of his encounter with Beguine spirituality (Ruh 1996: 303; Largier 1998). To begin with, Eckhart explicitly maintains in several passages that the truths of Scripture are wholly commensurate with those derivable via natural philosophy, and in the Commentary on John he writes that

holy scripture can be interpreted […] so that what the philosophers have written about the natures and properties of things agree with it, especially since everything that is true, whether in being or knowing, in scripture or in nature, proceeds from one source and one root of truth.

He even goes so far as to claim that

Moses, Christ and the Philosopher teach the same thing, differing only in the way they teach, namely as worthy of belief [Moses], as probably or likely [Aristotle], and as truth [Christ]. (In Ioh. n.185; LW III:154–5; quoted in McGinn 1981: 27)

Importantly, however, the exegetical tendency in Eckhart to blur the boundaries between theology and philosophy is not a matter of downplaying the centrality of revelation; rather, it is more expressive of his desire to demonstrate just how much philosophy can be found “hidden under the image and surface of the literal sense” of Scripture (In Gen. II n.1; LW I/2:333; EE 92; cf. also Tobin 1986: 25ff.).

In this sense, Eckhart’s approach to the question of revelation and reason is less akin to later Enlightenment projects that would subject purportedly revealed Scripture to rational verification. Rather, it is just the other way around: reason and natural philosophy can also be used to illuminate the truths and “hidden meanings” revealed in Scripture (Ruh 1996: 295). Unlike philosophy, Eckhart thinks, Scripture by itself does not prove the truths revealed within it, but rather “parabolically intimates in hidden fashion […] what we [elsewhere] prove and declare about matters divine, ethical and natural” (In Gen. II n.4; LW I/2:336; EE 95). The job of the exegete and the preacher, then, is to extract this hidden (or “mystical”) meaning from the text and to clarify it for the audience, using whatever tools she has at her disposal—including those of rational argumentation and natural philosophy. Thus, in his discussion of John 1:1 (“In the beginning was the Word”), Eckhart notes that

in interpreting this Word and everything else that follows my intention is the same as in all my works—to explain what the holy Christian faith and the two Testaments maintain through the help of the natural arguments of the philosophers. (In Ioh. n.2; LW III:4; EE 122–3)

However, unlike the traditional “fourfold” hermeneutical method employed by many medieval scholars, which usually appeals to each of the literal/historical, allegorical, moral/tropological, and anagogical/eschatological senses of particular Biblical passages in turn, Eckhart’s biblical exegesis largely divorces what we today would call the “literal” reading of the text from the meaning he draws out of it in ways that often strike modern readers as remarkably idiosyncratic. There is some evidence that Eckhart’s hermeneutical method seems to have been intentionally disruptive—a way of shocking his medieval audiences out of their complacency and opening them up to new and “deeper” ways of (philosophically, theologically, and spiritually) encountering familiar passages (Tobin 1986: 23). His so-called “parabolic” method takes a dehistoricized and decontextualized approach to Scripture, in which a passage is dissected into individual words, phrases, or sentences, which are then given particular philosophical, theological, or metaphorical glosses and sometimes recombined with other similarly interpreted biblical passages in what McGinn calls “a dense web of intertextuality” (McGinn 2005: 112). It also provides multiple, not necessarily commensurate interpretations, so that “the reader can freely take now one and now the other as seems useful to him” (In Ioh. n.39; LW III:33; EE 135). This pragmatic approach served an explicitly pastoral function, insofar as the preachers and clerics under Eckhart’s tutelage would have encountered different situations in their vocations that might call for different approaches to Scripture. But it was also intellectually legitimate, Eckhart thought, insofar as every true sense “comes from the Truth itself” (In Gen. II n.2; LW I/2:334; EE 93). In fact, for Eckhart, all remotely true senses found in Scripture can be understood as literal senses, “since the literal sense is that which the author […] intends, and God is the author of holy scripture” (ibid.).

From an epistemic standpoint, Eckhart may have seen this polyphonic hermeneutical method as providing a way for finite and limited humans to mirror the infinite and all-encompassing divine perspective—namely, by using a kind of deliberate multi-perspectivity to achieve a more comprehensive and objective “God’s-eye view”, one which (in the human case) discursively subsumes all things under the unified aspect of the divine logos, allowing the human mind to reflect, albeit imperfectly, the timeless, or eternally present, nû/nunc of the divine Intellect (McGinn 2005: 112).

6. Esse or Intelligere? Eckhart on God and Creation

Perhaps due to this pragmatic and multi-perspectival approach, Eckhart is not always entirely clear when it comes to the nature of God on which, if any, of the so-called transcendentals or divine perfections (being, truth/understanding, unity, or goodness) he takes to have conceptual or metaphysical priority. For example, in the opening sentence to the “Prologue to the Book of Propositions” in the Opus tripartitum, Eckhart appears to follow his Dominican predecessor Thomas Aquinas in giving being place of priority—though he subtly reverses Thomas’s emphasis on the idea that God is being itself, asserting instead: Esse est deus (Prol. op. prop. n.11; LW I/2:29; PQP 93). Elsewhere, he speaks of God as “existence itself” (In Exod. n.21; LW II:28; TP 48), or as “the fullness of all existence [plenitudo omnis esse]”, which “can have nothing outside of it” (ibid. n.48; LW II:52; TP 58). However, in the first of the Parisian Questions, Eckhart boldly states that

it is not my present opinion that God understands because he exists, but rather that he exists because he understands. God is an intellect and understanding [intellectus et intelligere], and his understanding itself is the ground of his existence. (Qu. Par. 1 n.4; LW V:40; PQP 45)

In fact, not only does Eckhart claim here that “among [the] perfections intelligence comes first and then being or existence” (ibid. n.6; LW V:43; PQP 47), he claims that “everything in God transcends existence” (ibid. n.8; LW V:44; PQP 48) and that “nothing in him has the nature of being” (ibid. n.10; LW V:46; PQP 49).

These seemingly inconsistent statements themselves correspond to two ways the Meister discusses God’s creation of the universe and the status of the creatures that emerge from God’s creative act. The first involves what Bernard McGinn (2001, 2005), following Alain de Libera (1990), has called a metaphysics of flow, involving a sort of “spilling over” of the divine plenitude of being into creation. The second—perhaps best described as a form of causative epistemology—maintains that the divine’s thinking or knowing all things is what both formally grounds and efficiently causes those things to come to be. The former account of creation, in which Eckhart commonly uses maternal metaphors to represent creation as a kind of ontological “emanation” from the “pregnant” Godhead (McGinn 2001: 84–85), is commonly cited in discussions of the Meister’s “mystical” Neoplatonism. The latter account, in contrast, is sometimes invoked by contemporary scholars to highlight the Dominican’s adherence to a form of Aristotelian intellectualism and his commitment to the doctrine of the primacy of intellect over will (or, for Eckhart, even over being itself). To see how Eckhart can consistently maintain both views, it will be important to more closely examine both his doctrine of analogy and his understanding of the role of the divine logos as an intermediary between God and creature. First, however, it will help to take a brief look at each of these accounts on their own.

6.1 The Boiling (Over) of Being: Eckhart’s “Metaphysics of Flow”

In his discussion of Exodus 3:14 (“I am who I am”), Eckhart speaks of God as “the fullness of existence and full existence [plenitudo esse et plenum esse]” and “nothing else but pure existence [nihil aliud nisi purum esse]” (In Exod. n.74; LW II:77; TP 68). This “pure naked existence [purum esse et nudum esse]”, he maintains, is “without any accident, without anything foreign, [pure] substance without quality, without this or that form” and is “above accident, species, and genus” (In Exod. n.15; LW II:21; TP 45–6). Moreover, like Avicenna, Aquinas, and most of his contemporaries, he affirms that God’s qualityless existence is identical with God’s essence. Adapting for his own purposes the metaphors of “boiling” employed by scholastic thinkers like Albert the Great and Dietrich of Freiburg, and drawing heavily on the mystical imagery of birthing, metalworking, liquid, light, and mirrors reminiscent of contemplative authors like Bernard of Clairvaux and Marguerite Porete, Eckhart writes:

[…] the repetition [in I am who I am] indicates […] a “boiling” or giving birth to itself [bullitionem sive parturitionem sui]—glowing in itself, and melting and boiling in and into itself, light that totally forces its whole being in light and into light [lux in luce et in lucem se toto se totum penetrans] and that is everywhere totally turned back and reflected upon itself. (In Exod. n.16; LW II:21–22; EE 46)

He continues, citing John 1:4 (“In him was life”):

“Life” expresses a type of “pushing out” [exseritionem] by which something swells up in itself [in se intumescens] and first breaks out totally in itself [se profundit primo in se toto], each part into each part, before it pours itself forth and “boils over” on the outside [effundat et ebulliat extra]. (ibid.)

Eckhart’s use here and elsewhere of bullitio (“boiling”) and ebullitio (“boiling over”) is central to his metaphysics of flow. The former term refers to the timeless divine emanation of the Trinity within the Godhead. Put in terms of the transcendentals, the Father (here identified with “Oneness” or “Unity”) eternally begets the Son (“Truth” or “Wisdom”), and together they “breathe” or “spirate” the Holy Spirit (“Love”/“Goodness”) (cp. In Sap. n.28; LW II:348; TP, 150). This “inner boiling” or “swelling” is, for Eckhart, a purely formal emanation. It does not result in any new beings but rather merely represents the internal dynamism of the Godhead—i.e., the eternal “unfolding” of the divine perfections within Godself. The latter ebullitio, on the other hand—the “boiling over” or “outflowing” of God’s overabundant fullness of being into the world—represents God’s constant, wholly free act of creation ex nihilo that not only grounds the being of all creatures (as their formal cause) but also gives rise to their existence (as their efficient cause) and orders them to their proper ends (as their final cause). Put in more Neoplatonist terms, it represents the Eckhartian version of the ontological exitus—the “fall” or “departure” from divine unity into created multiplicity. On this view, only God has “true being”, and creatures are, strictly speaking, nothing. Since, for Eckhart, “whatever is outside of God, inasmuch as it is outside of being is not something else or [even] something at all” (In Ioh. n.215; LW III:181, quoted in Tobin 1986: 39), whatever being creatures might be said to have is derivative of the puritas essendi that is the Godhead and wholly dependent on their participation in it.

Importantly, according to the Meister, although God’s inner boiling is conceptually prior to God’s ebullitive act, and although the Father is logically prior to the Son and Spirit, there is no temporal distinction between the unfolding of the divine persons within Godself and the flowing out of the universe from the Godhead (In Gen. I, n.7; LW I/2:65; EE 84–5). When considered from the divine perspective, God’s inward-directed activity of begetting and spirating Godself and God’s outward-directed activity of forming, birthing, and sustaining all of creation occur simultaneously in the “eternal now” and might be said to constitute a single, unified, always-occurring event of divine superabundance. However, viewed from our limited and finite human perspective, creation is conceived as a temporal unfolding of the Trinitarian divine image in the “flowing out” (ǔzganc/uzfliessen) of Being—one which secondarily “in-forms” Truth and is ultimately expressed in creation through the self-giving nature of divine Love.

6.2 The Primacy of Intellect: Eckhart’s Causative Epistemology

Whereas Eckhart’s metaphysics of flow characterizes God as a kind of fullness of being “boiling over” into creation, his account of creative divine intellection, while continuous with a long medieval tradition of theories of divine causal knowledge, rests on a somewhat surprising idea of God as non-being, a kind of nothingness, or better: no-thing-ness. This negative characterization of God is also reflected in the metaphors Eckhart employs in his vernacular sermons when he speaks of God variously as a “desert” (VeM n.25; DW V 119; EE 247), an “abyss” (Pr. 29; DW II:84 ; TP 289), a “wasteland” or “wilderness” (Pr. 10; DW I:171; TP 265), or simply “the divine nothing” (Pr. 71; DW III:228; TP 324).

This identification of God with utter non-being, as opposed to total fullness of being, rests on Eckhart’s approach to intellectus more generally. In human beings, for example, the intellect, as a natural power of the soul, is a capacity to take on the representations or “cognitive forms” (species) of the objects that it cognizes and, ultimately, to become in some sense identical with them (an idea Eckhart takes over from Averroes: cf. Flasch 2006 [2015: 184ff.]). However, when considered apart from its objects, the created intellect is, strictly speaking, nothing. Its objects lend it form and content, but taken by itself it is “none of the things it knows” (Qu. Par. 2 n.2; LW V:50; PQP 51) and therefore, unlike the objects it cognizes, cannot be considered a determinate thing—a “this or that” (esse hoc et hoc). The intellect is, Eckhart maintains, “neither here, nor now, nor a definite thing […], [it] is not a being, nor does it have an existence” (Qu. Par. 2 n.7; LW V:52–3; PQP 53). It is more like an emptiness or void—one able to be cognitively (in)formed by its intentional objects. Indeed, given Eckhart’s commitment to the identity of the intellect and the intelligible, in order to come to know anything, the intellect must itself be nothing. It must be “‘unmixed’ with anything […] so that it might know everything” (Qu. Par. 2 n.2; LW V:50; PQP 51).

Further, on Eckhart’s view the “cognitive forms” that mediate the object to the intellect also lack existence. They may properly be said to “have” objects, but they themselves are not substances in which accidents inhere. Neither are they accidents because, although they are found in the soul or intellect, they do not inhere in it or ontologically depend on it, as an accident would in relation to its subject (Qu. Par. 2 n.5; LW V:51; PQP 52). And what is neither substance nor accident is, simply put, not a being. Instead, the species for Eckhart is much more like a relation of intentionality—a way of being directed toward entities—than an entity itself (Caputo 1975: 108), since on his view such relations are not themselves existents. Thus, while Eckhart appears to build on Aquinas’s distinction between the object (the “quod”) of knowledge and the means (the “quo”) by which the object is known, he goes beyond Thomas’s approach to knowledge by explicitly characterizing both as non-being (Caputo 1975: 104).

Interestingly, unlike many of his late medieval counterparts, it appears to be this “nothingness” of the human intellect in its sheer potentiality and indeterminateness that Eckhart sees as most closely mirroring the divine intellect. Indeed, in contrast to the Albertian tradition, it is the possible intellect, not the agent intellect, on which the Meister models the divine mind (Keenan 2013; Goris 2009; Mojsisch 1983 [2001]). For Eckhart, in order to understand God as the true ground (fundamentum) of Being (and of all created beings), God cannot himself have being or otherwise be a being. Rather, God must first and foremost be a “nothing”—i.e., a no(n)-thing. Since intellect in and of itself is fundamentally characterized by a kind of indeterminate nothingness (one capable, however, of conceiving everything), it is more properly said of God than of any other attribute, name, or perfection one might ascribe to him. It is in this sense that Eckhart can assert in the Parisian Questions that God’s understanding is prior to (and the foundation of) God’s existence.

Eckhart famously illustrates this point in German Sermon 9 (DW I:141ff.; TP 255ff.) by employing the architectural and sartorial imagery common to many of his vernacular works (and found in much thirteenth-century Beguine mystical literature). He claims that, while considering God under the aspect of being (in dem wesene) is not illegitimate, to do so is still to qualify God in some way—to make of him something determinate—and therefore merely to see God as he resides in the “antechamber” (vorbürge) of the temple in which “he shines as holy”. Likewise, approaching God under the aspect of will or love is to encounter a God still enshrouded (verborgen) in the “mantle of goodness” (kleide der güete). Considering God under the aspect of intellection (vernünfticheit), on the other hand, is to witness the wholly “naked” (blôz) Godhead in his true “temple”, unclothed and “stripped [entkleidit] of [all] goodness and being”.

Of course, the non-being of the intellect considered in itself is where the comparison between the human intellect and the divine mind ends:

Here the imagination fails. For our knowledge is different from God’s. His knowledge is the cause of things whereas our knowledge is caused by them. (Par. Qu. 1 n.8; LW V:44; PQP 48)

On Eckhart’s view the human intellect is largely receptive, its potentiality actualized by the already-existing objects in the world that it passively receives. The nothingness of the divine intellect, in contrast, is essentially productive. It “reaches out” to those things that are not and, in cognizing them, simultaneously causes them to be. Put in more contemporary terms, human cognition is characterized by a mind-to-world direction of fit, with the direction of causation proceeding from world to mind. With respect to God, things are exactly the other way around. Divine intentionality causes the world to fit with what the divine mind eternally understands.

Eckhart’s idea here is that the divine intellect “pre-conceives” both being itself and the entirety of knowable forms within it, and in God’s knowing them (as their ratio), they come to exist. Considered merely as essences or forms that have their principle in the divine mind, they are said to be pre-contained “intellectually” like a house in the mind of an architect (In sap. n.21; LW, II:34; TP 148), which has no being until the architect herself “trans-forms” the idea into a real building. However, in the divine intellect they are neither individually distinct nor determinate, but are rather contained as a unity. Moreover, because of the utter Oneness of God, as well as Eckhart’s Aristotelian commitment to the identity of intellect and intelligible, the unity of the ratio of the forms in the divine intellect is nothing other than God himself, in the form of the eternal logos. (On this point, see Section 8 below.) Thus, when the divine intellect knows, it simultaneously knows itself and the whole world, and in knowing itself as the formal cause of creatures, its self-giving intentionality gives rise to them as their efficient and final cause. The potentiality of the divine intellect, therefore, is perhaps best thought of as a pluripotential prescience (or “pre-science”), an originative “potency” eternally exercised as the divine mind knows itself.

Importantly, however, despite his views on God’s intellective “conception” of the world, Eckhart need not be viewed as a pantheist, or even a panentheist. Rather, the universe and everything in it reflect the rationality of the divine mind, even as they are distinct from it. To put it in more Eckhartian linguistic terms, the existence of the universe is “synonymous” with (and wholly dependent upon) God’s act of knowing it (Milne 2010: 10), but it is not identical with God, even if God is in some essential sense “in” it (though not as a proper part). In any case, with regard to God Eckhart’s ontology is distinctly epistemological (insofar as he gives primacy to intellect over being), and his epistemology is distinctly ontological (insofar as the “self-reflective” activity of the divine mind is the cause of what it knows).

In one sense, then, Eckhart’s metaphysics of flow and his doctrine of causative knowledge appear to stand in tension with one another. One affirms the identity of being and God (esse est deus), construing being as God’s most fundamental attribute, that out of which all creation (over)flows. The other negates being of God (esse formaliter non est in deo) and gives God’s intellect priority of place over existence. On the one hand, this kind of tension is not out of character for Eckhart and perhaps simply represents one more example of what might be called his dialectic apophaticism—or the attempt to show how God both grounds and utterly transcends the standard categories of human cognition and language by pushing common scholastic tropes to their conceptual limits. It may also simply be a product of Eckhart’s pragmatic commitment to presenting various models of God that his audiences could “freely take […] as seems useful” to them, as discussed in Section 5 above. On the other hand, a closer look at the Meister’s doctrine of analogy, when combined with his emphasis on the importance of in quantum-qualifications, might reveal one way in which Eckhart’s intertwined views on language and metaphysics create a space in which God can legitimately be said to be both “being” and “non-being”.

7. Signs of the Divine: Eckhart’s “Metaphysics of Analogy”

Much has been written on the extent to which Eckhart’s views on analogy draw on and/or depart from those of his philosophical predecessors (e.g., Aristotle, Proclus, Augustine, Maimonides, Albert the Great, Dietrich of Freiberg, Henry of Ghent, and especially Thomas Aquinas)—as well as on whether his approach endorses an analogy of attribution, proportionality, or both/neither. Earlier scholars tended to view Eckhart’s doctrine of analogy as largely derivative of (and perhaps even deficient by comparison with) these scholars, but more recent work has focused on the ways in which his position represents something distinctive and innovative. (For a comprehensive overview, see Hackett & Weed 2013.) In any case, like his medieval contemporaries, Eckhart saw analogy as an important means of spelling out the relationship between God and creatures.

There were several understandings of analogy in play in the late middle ages, but the theories one is most likely to encounter have to do with either the so-called “analogy of attribution” or the “analogy of proportionality”. Different thinkers employed these terms in different ways, but in general “analogy of attribution” was used to refer to a relation between items in which some predicate or property is “properly” or “primarily” said of one of the objects of comparison, while the others are related to it in a lesser, “derivative” or “secondary” sense (e.g., causally or as a sign). “Analogy of proportionality”, on the other hand, postulates some relevant similarity in the way the subject and predicate of the respective objects of comparison are related. The former approach to analogy maintains the radical (ontological, epistemological, and semantic) gulf between God and creatures. It thereby helped medieval theologians guard against worries concerning idolatry and the anthropomorphization of God, while still allowing them to positively identify conceptual lines along which a (usually causal) relationship could be postulated between God and creatures with respect to a particular attribute or property. The latter approach, however, preserves the intuition that our human language can actually express genuine truths about God without committing a category mistake, thereby helping to bridge the gap between God and creatures (Tobin 1986: 35).

With respect to the transcendental perfections discussed at the beginning of Section 6, Aquinas had attempted to “synthesize” analogy of attribution and proportionality in what is sometimes called an “analogy of participation”. Roughly speaking, he proposed that God has being, wisdom, goodness, and unity essentially, whereas creatures can only be said to be (and to be good, wise, one, etc.) in a secondary and deficient sense—and only insofar as they “share” or “participate” in these properties as they are in God, of whom they are properly and primarily predicated, and with respect to whom they stand in a relation of causal dependence (Ashworth & D’Ettore 2021). However, even (or especially) with respect to being, Aquinas appears to have thought that, despite the immense gulf between God and creatures, “being” could be properly attributed to both God and creatures (Tobin 1986: 35). Even though God is Being whereas creatures only “have” being, in some important sense creatures still have their own “proper being” (Hackett & Weed 2013: 219).

Eckhart, too, seems to have a doctrine of analogy that makes participation central to understanding the relation between God and creatures, but he goes beyond both mere attribution and structural proportionality to a more radical participational view than that espoused by his Dominican predecessor. Like Aquinas, he agrees that “God alone properly speaking exists and is called being, one, true, and good”, and he further agrees that “everything that is being, one, true, or good does not have this from itself but from God and from him alone” (Prol. gen., n.4; LW I:132; PQP 79). However, whereas Thomas indicates that attributes like “being” or “goodness” can be predicated of both God and creatures (albeit to radically different degrees or levels of perfection), Eckhart restricts the proper attribution of predicates to only one of the analogates:

The things which are analogous to something have nothing in themselves by which they are in a positive way rooted to the form which is the basis of the analogy. (In Eccli. n.53; LW II:282; quoted in Tobin 1986: 45)

Pace Aquinas, then, on Eckhart’s approach creatures do not have their own “proper”, albeit derivative, being. Any being creatures might be said to have can only be “borrowed” (Hackett & Weed 2013). Or, as he puts it:

[E]very created being radically and positively possesses existence, life, a wisdom from and in God, not in themselves as a created being. (ibid.; TP 178)

Likewise, the goodness of creatures is not an “imperfect” or “secondary” way of instantiating what God exhibits perfectly. It simply is God’s goodness to which the creature’s goodness refers. Considered in and of themselves, creatures and their properties are nothing—mere “signs pointing to what is real” (Tobin 1986: 64).

In this sense, the relation of analogy for Eckhart is not a matter of degree or level of perfection, nor is there any form of proportional symmetry in the relations between subject and predicate in God and creatures. There is only one proper attribution of the predicates “is”, “one”, “wise”, and “good”, namely to God, and their attribution to any other being merely refers one immediately back to the divine essence. So in God the predicate “is-good” and goodness express a relation of (essential) identity, whereas in creatures, “is good” is merely related to God’s goodness in the mode of a sign. Eckhart tries to explain this idea in his defense against the list of 49 articles brought against him. There, he claims that

the good man and goodness are one. The good man insofar as he is good signifies [God’s] goodness alone, just as something white signifies only the quality of whiteness.

He continues:

These two things, being good and goodness, are univocally one in the Father, Son and Holy Spirit. They are analogically one in God and in us considered as good. (Resp. n.82; LW V:278; EE 73)

Still, even if God and creatures differ with respect to the modes in which they signify the divine perfections, it nevertheless appears that, for Eckhart, the meaning (in the sense of ratio propria) of terms like “being”, “goodness”, “unity”, “wisdom”, is univocal whether said of God or creatures, even if it is God alone who is properly the subject of such attributions. (On the significance of univocity in Eckhart’s doctrine of analogy, see Mojsisch 1983 [2001].) This might lead one to question whether his doctrine really is one of analogy at all.

Whatever the case, like many medieval thinkers, Eckhart’s metaphysics and semantics were deeply, perhaps inextricably, intertwined. This makes things doubly difficult for Eckhart as a philosopher and theologian, since it might turn out on his view that there is very little we can say about anything whatsoever. For example, with respect to ourselves as creatures, if we care about the cultivation of virtues and the pursuit of the good life, we want to be able to talk about things like “this just woman” or “that virtuous person”. We also tend to naturally speak of ourselves as though we really exist, have properties, do things, think about stuff, gain knowledge, and so on. But if we really “are” nothing more than mere signs pointing to the divine essence, it would seem that there is very little we can say about our-selves at all. With respect to God, on the other hand, the problem is exactly reversed, especially for theologians like Eckhart with strong apophatic leanings who think that the divine radically transcends the limits of human language. If terms like “being”, “good”, “one” are all only “properly” predicated of the divine essence, yet that essence is simultaneously thought to radically surpass all human understanding, let alone anything we might say about it, then it might seem the most appropriate approach to God is simply to remain silent.

This is certainly an attitude Eckhart sometimes appears to endorse, as when he writes that “the very best and noblest attainment in this life is to be silent and let God work and speak within” (Pr. 101; DW IV/1:355; MW 33). Yet despite his insistent injunctions to move past concrete “images” and ultimately to give up the attempt to “capture” God in language, symbol, or story (see Section 9 below), his hermeneutical approach as discussed above together with the rich imagery he employs in his preaching (e.g., the images of the Godhead as pregnant mother, desert, abyss, wilderness, etc., as well as the descriptions of the uncreated “ground” of the soul as a castle, a spark, a nobleman, etc.) imply that the Meister thought that imagery and positive language about God (and creatures) had at least some role to play in helping the individual make both epistemic and spiritual progress (Griffioen & Zahedi 2018).

Eckhart’s use of the qualifier in quantum is again key here. This “reduplication”, as he calls it, is used to “exclude from the term in question everything that is other or foreign to it even according to reason” (Resp. n.81; LW V:277; EE 72). Take the example of a caterpillar. If we are considering it merely insofar as it is a locomotive animal, and we understand animal legs merely as “weight-bearing anatomical structures used for locomotion”, it might not be inappropriate to say that a caterpillar has 16 legs. However, the caterpillar will someday turn into a butterfly, and butterflies are insects. If we are therefore specifically considering the caterpillar insofar as it is an insect, and given that insects per definitionem have 6 legs, it will be more appropriate to understand the caterpillar as having 6 legs and to characterize the other weight-bearing locomotive structures differently—e.g., as “prolegs”. We can also consider it insofar as it is, e.g., a living thing, a creature, a being, or very hungry—and what counts as a fitting characterization of it may change according to the conceptual, metaphysical, and pragmatic restrictions imposed on it by the qualifying class or context to which it is indexed. In this sense, then, Eckhart thinks that it is not always inappropriate to speak of creatures as possessing “being” or even as “being wise” or “being good”, so long as we always keep in mind that when we speak of the creature insofar as it has being, we are speaking about created being—i.e., “borrowed” being—not “absolute” or “pure” being. So even if created beings are technically “nothing” when compared to the divine esse, insofar as they are considered under the aspect of their creatureliness, they may appropriately be said to possess being, truth, goodness, and unity, albeit in a radically qualified and restricted sense that always necessarily points back to the divine.

Importantly, invoking the in quantum qualifier does not require sacrificing metaphysical or conceptual precision. In fact, the use of in quantum indicates both a logical and a metaphysical connection between two terms that can only be set in relation to each another if the one is related to the other as a mode or sign (Beccarisi 2013: 122). If anything, such qualifications are supposed to better preserve precision by clarifying which aspects of the subject are under discussion in which context. Eckhart is therefore careful to consistently apply the driving principle behind his doctrine of analogy—namely, that what is said of one analogate must be denied of the other. (This derives from a causal principle the Meister cites from the Book of Causes that “nothing is formally in both a cause and its effect if the cause is a true cause”: Par. Qu. 1 n.9; LW V:43; PQP 48.) When combined with the in quantum-strategy, this allows Eckhart’s use of analogy to be “reversible”, especially as concerns esse and intelligere (McGinn 2001: 92). That is, if we are speaking of God as an eternally creative and overflowing plenitude of being, then in predicating “being” of God we must deny it of creatures and affirm their nothingness. On the other hand, if we are concerned with the existence of creatures (or with construing “being” as the first of created things, as per the Book of Causes), then we must reject the attribution of being to God (Beccarisi 2013: 113). In the latter case, intelligere becomes a clearer and more appropriate way of speaking about the divine than esse, given the special kind of non-being that constitutes intellect (insofar as it is pure intellect), as discussed above. Consequently, when we view ourselves as genuinely existing beings, we are considering the human being in the mode of creaturely existence, and this appropriately retains the gulf between the divine-qua-creator and the human being-qua-created. However, when we view ourselves as “nothing” in comparison to the absolute being of the divine, we locate in that nothingness the very mode in which human beings are made ad imaginem Dei—namely, insofar as they possess that very same mode of non-being, i.e., intellect. In this way, Eckhart’s “metaphysics of analogy” (Libera 1980) attempts to preserve intuitions concerning both God’s utter transcendence and the real presence of God in creation.

Nevertheless, adherence to these two principles—the in quantum-principle and the analogical principle—might also take Eckhart’s semantics past traditional scholastic metaphysics and to usher his audience into a dialectical space in which, for example, negation can itself be negated to come to an even deeper understanding of God’s utter fullness and transcendence (which, paradoxically, is what Eckhart thinks is needed to allow the individual to be capable of apprehending God’s utter immanence in the ground of the soul, as will be discussed below). For example, when Eckhart discusses unum with respect to God, he notes that

the term “one” is a negative word but is in reality affirmative. Moreover, it is the negation of negation which is the purest form of affirmation and the fullness of the term affirmed. (In Sap. n.147; LW II:485; TP 167)

Elsewhere, he clarifies:

The One itself is the negation of [the] negation […] which every multitude that is opposed to the One includes. The negation of negation is the core, the purity, and the repetition of the affirmation of existence. “I am who am”. (In Ioh. n.556; LW III:485; TP 185)

As Bernard McGinn puts it, the divine unity

“negates” everything that we know “is”; but the negation of all that is […] opens up vistas into a new world in which our distinctions between what is and what is not no longer pertain. God as negatio negationis is simultaneously total emptiness and supreme fullness. (McGinn 2001: 93–94)

Still, this understanding of unum as negatio negationis is not mere wordplay; it represents an attempt on Eckhart’s part to explode the strict conceptual divide between what-is and what-is-not that permeates and constrains human thought and language.

8. A Unified Onto-logos? The Divine Word as Principle and Mediator

Eckhart’s reversible doctrine of analogy, when taken together with the in quantum principle, allows him to characterize God in ways that alternately give Being, Intellect, and Unity conceptual primacy among the transcendentals, and there is some controversy over which divine attribute, if any, he ultimately took to be most fundamental. Of course, Eckhart himself might have countered that such a question posed simpliciter and without qualification is just another instance of trying to say what cannot be said. In any case, it does not seem wrong to characterize Eckhart’s metaphysics as heavily intellectualist, even where he centers Being or Unity (or occasionally even Goodness). At the same time, it is an intellectualism centered not only on thinking or cognition but also crucially on speech and the communication of being—in the case of God, through an singular, eternal, self-communicating speech-act.

Indeed, for Eckhart, “being” just is acting in the sense of communicating something intelligible: “To exist is to communicate” (Dobie 2010: 32). This is exemplified most perfectly in God, whose “inner boiling” is characterized by its wholly self-sufficient intellectual activity, in which the Father “speaks” (and thereby generates) the Son, and the Father and the Son together “breathe” out the Holy Spirit in their bond of divine love. As Eckhart formulates it in his analysis of John 1:1 (“In the beginning was the Word”):

Under the name “Beginning” or “Principle”, understand the Father, under “Word” the Son, and because a word cannot exist without a breath, consequently also understand the Holy Spirit. (In Ioh. n.82; LW III:70; EE 152)

However, as we have seen, the intellection of God is not wholly self-contained in the internal activity of bullitio. Rather, God’s self-communication is also outward-directed, and it is this notion of “ebullitive” divine speech that allows Eckhart to better express how it is that God’s intellection is essentially causative: In speaking the Word in love, God “boils over” into creation and thereby also “speaks” the world into existence. There is therefore a very real sense in which we might characterize Eckhart’s views on God and creation (whether in the context of viewing God as esse or intelligere) as a verbal ontology (Duclow 1984).

Eckhart’s ontology is verbal not only in the sense that God the Father speaks but also regarding what is spoken (even if in a strict sense the activity of God’s speaking and the content of God’s speech is identical). In fact, it is the “Word” or logos spoken by the Father that lies at the center of Eckhart’s philosophical theology and unites the approach to God-as-intellect in the Parisian Questions with that of being-as-God in the prologue to the Opus tripartitum. Eckhart use of the term principle is key here. As was not uncommon for his time, Eckhart interpreted the phrase “In principio” that opens both the book of Genesis and the gospel of John as referring not only to the temporal beginning of the universe but also to the “principle” that designates the origin of and ratio underlying all creation. Thus, when considering God under the aspect of plenitudinous being, Eckhart tends to use principium to designate the internal principle of the Trinitarian Godhead. This principle is equated with the Neoplatonic “One” (understood either as the conceptually pre-Trinitarian Godhead itself or as God the Father), who is the fontal source or “generator” of the Son and Spirit in the internal activity of bullitio—which, as we have seen above, culminates in the expressive ebullitio of divine plenitude into creation (McGinn 2001: 75).

Of course, the Godhead’s “overflowing” of being into creation puts God in the role of efficient cause, whereas Eckhart focuses his energies predominantly on the divine viewed as the essential or formal cause of creation (such causes being the proper domain of metaphysics, according to the Meister). Here, it is the act of divine intellection in the form of the verbum in principio—i.e., the second person of the Trinity, the Son—that stands at the center of the Meister’s account of the relation between God and creation. In his receptive role as the person of the Trinity most immediately generated by the One, the Son can appropriately be called “the principle from the principle”, as he “receive[s] the power to flow” solely from the Father, who is “the principle without principle” (In Ioh. n. 656; LW III:570; quoted in McGinn 2001: 75). At the same time, in his role as the content of divine speech—that which is spoken by (but is also one with) the Father—the Son contains the ratio of all intelligible forms and can thus be characterized as “the Word in the principle” (In Ioh. n.12; LW III:12; EE 126). In this respect, the Son, as emanated by the One, is both the representation or “image” of the Father and himself “the blueprint of all creatures” (Pr. 117; DW IV/2:1123; SW 245), who in turn are the images and signs pointing back to the divine. The Son qua Word, Idea, or logos is thus simultaneously the receptive “conduit” of ebullitio and the active, intellectual formal cause of (and ultimate exemplar for) all creation. Any genuine reality that particular creatures might have from the Divine is mere “formal being” (esse formale), but the Word contains their being “virtually” (esse virtuale), a mode of being which Eckhart considers to be “prior and more eminent” (In Ioh. n.38; LW III:32–3; EE 135), insofar as the latter is eternal and unchanging, whereas the former is transient and mutable. Thus, even if there was no time “before” creation, when we consider the universe under the aspect of being still-uncreated, “everything in the universe was not mere nothing, but was in possession of virtual existence” in the Word (In Ioh. n.45; LW III:37; EE 137). Importantly, this “virtual existence” that things have in their “principle” or “Idea” is the “really real” mode of existing (McGinn 1981: 40). Everything else is just an image.

Eckhart’s verbal “onto-logos” not only reconciles the idea of God as absolute (plenitudinous) being and pure (intellectual) nothingness, it also shows how his views on analogy and univocity are related. On the one hand, insofar as the Word is the conduit or medium of divine speech, it can be understood as the pure intellect—the “no-thing” that is “beyond being”—through which the principial Godhead flows, thereby lending or communicating being to creatures as an essential (and final) cause. In this respect, the divine activity of ebullitio, in which all things are created through the Word, establishes an analogical relationship between God and creatures, since there are clear relationships of causal dependence and superiority in play. But insofar as the Word is the content of divine speech—the expression of God thinking Godself and containing all things as one in the divine mind—it grounds the essences of creatures and thus represents a univocal cause of the perfections in things, as well as the very ground of the human soul (McGinn 2001: 77; Mojsisch 1983 [2001: 33]).

9. Birthing the Word and Being in the World: Eckhart’s Mystagogical Ethics

As noted above, for Eckhart there is ultimately no clear-cut distinction between theoria and ethica, nor between his metaphysics and his mystagogy. As with many mendicant orders of the period, the goals of the Meister’s academic work and his mission as a preacher and provincial were “inextricably united in their understanding of the apostolic goal” (Hollywood 1995 [2001: 120]). And while much of the more “practical” and “mystical” aspects of Eckhart’s thought come out in his vernacular works, the Meister’s Dominican emphasis on intellect over will and the key role of the verbum that we find in his more systematic works remain ever-present themes throughout the Eckhartian corpus. In fact, for Eckhart the intellect is the aspect of the human being that most directly reflects the image of the Godhead. It is also importantly the space where the Eternal Word can be “born” within us, a concept central to Eckhart’s mystagogical and moral approach.

However, when speaking of the intellect insofar as it images God or “births” the Word in the soul, Eckhart is not referring to the traditional notion of intellect understood as one of the three main “powers” of the soul (i.e., memory, intellect, and will). As with his treatment of the divine nature of which it is an image, he means the intellect insofar as it is intellect—which, as we saw above, he takes to be pure negativity or “no-thing-ness”. This is not the human intellect insofar as it apprehends or “takes in” the environment around it via the senses, nor even insofar as it reasons abstractly or performs certain cognitive operations to extract intelligibles from its sensory input. Rather, it is nothing but pure potentiality—a wholly receptive intellectus possibilis (Largier 2002: 849). To put it in more Eckhartian terms, it is the soul taken in its bare (“naked”) intellective essence or ground (MHG: grunt)—which Eckhart characterizes as an uncreated, eternal aspect of the soul, one related univocally, not analogically, to its Creator (Connolly 2014: 162; Kern 2013: 246). Insofar as it images the Godhead in being wholly one and simple (ein und einvaltic)—“neither this nor that” (diz noch daz), but a “something” (waz) higher than any particular thing or created power—it transcends memory, reason, will, and even contingent being itself (Largier 2002: 764–65). It even lies beyond the purview of God understood as Father, Son, or Holy Spirit. Only the Godhead itself, insofar as it is “one and indivisible [einvaltic ein], without mode [wîse] or properties [eigenschaft]”, can enter into the soul’s ground (Pr. 2; DW I:[43–44]; MW 81). As bare intellect, absent any contingent or created object that could serve to distract it, the soul is able to take on—and become one with—its proper object, i.e., the eternal logos as communicated in an outpouring of self-giving love by the Father. Thus, the eternal unfolding of the Trinity is, according to Eckhart, one that also takes place in the ground of the soul.

Thus, the Eckhartian parallel to the Neoplatonic reditus—the final end and fulfillment of the human being—is the “return” to and unification with the einvaltic ein in the ground of the soul. Yet just as the “overboiling” of the Godhead into creation proceeds by way of the eternally true logos, the return to God can only take place through the Word in the ground of the soul. In the soul’s ground, Eckhart claims, the human being as an intellective imago dei is like a bîwort or adverbium—i.e., a “secondary word” that accompanies a princip(i)al Word to form a single unit of meaning. Thus he claims, “where the [eternal] Word remains within”—in its intellectual ground—“there the soul should be an ad-verb and work one work with God in order to receive its happiness in the same inwardly hovering knowledge where God is happy” (Pr. 9; DW I:158; TP 260). In this sense, the ultimate “happiness” of the human being is not distinct from God’s happiness. United in the ground via the Word, the soul’s activity is nothing other than God’s activity, and what it is for the human being to flourish just is to participate in divine happiness.

9.1 Images for De-Imaging: Birthing the Word Without a Why

Eckhart uses various metaphors in his vernacular discussions of the soul’s ground. In some places, he speaks of a “temple” or a “little castle” (bürgelin)—a place in which God can “reside”. In others, it is a “sprout” or “little spark” (vünkelin)—the intellective power or potential to, like God, “work in nonbeing”. As the highest (or “richest”) aspect of our humanity, it is sometimes referred to as a “nobleman”. Yet, as with his account of God’s creation of the universe, the driving metaphor behind much of Eckhart’s language about the ground of the soul is that of pregnancy and birth. Although his language is in keeping with a longstanding Christian tradition of allegorically representing the human soul as a female (the MHG word sêle and the Latin anima are both feminine nouns), and despite taking on familiar tropes from Rhenish-Flemish bridal mysticism as well as the common scholastic understanding of women’s bodies as mere “passive receptacles”—Eckhart is perhaps at his most creative (or at least his most emphatic) when discussing what he calls the “birth of the Word” in the human soul. (For an extended discussion of the ways in which Eckhart’s views both perpetuate and subvert medieval gender stereotypes and norms see Hollywood 1995 [2001], especially Chapters 5 and 6. For Eckhart’s own extended reflections on the birth of the Word in the soul, see the famous “birth cycle”—Pr. 101–104—which the Meister likely composed for the Advent/Christmas season; DW I/1V:279–610; MW 29–61.)

One of Eckhart’s most interesting allegorical uses of these metaphors involves his innovative reading of Luke 10:38 (which Eckhart translates as “Our Lord Jesus Christ went up into a citadel and was received by a virgin who was a wife”) and his discussion of the ways in which the soul itself should be like a “virgin wife”. Roughly speaking, Eckhart’s claim is that the soul must be “stripped” of all the external objects of consciousness that serve to distract it and “emptied” of all its finite attachments. When it is pure, naked, and unsullied by worldly things—“void of alien images” (von allen vremden bilden ledic) as Eckhart puts it—the soul becomes truly “free” and unobstructed (“offering no hindrance to the highest Truth”), and therefore “a maiden, a virgin” who can receive the “empty and free and virginal” Jesus, i.e., the Truth that is the Word. When the intellect is thusly “freed” and “bare”—when it is turned inward toward itself and brought back down to its objectless grunt (which is also univocally God’s ground)—it is thereby transformed into the passive vehicle of the Eternal Word. In fact, Eckhart goes so far as to claim that, once it has become purged of external images and creaturely things, God cannot refrain from thusly “impregnating” the receptive soul:

When God finds you ready, He has to act, to overflow into you, just as when the air is clear and pure the sun has to burst forth and cannot refrain, (Pr. 103; DW IV/1:484; MW 58)

and elsewhere, “he is forced to do it; he must do it of necessity” (Pr. 14; DW I:234; TP 272).

The claim that God is forced to do anything with respect to the human being, let alone enter into their soul, may appear quite radical at first glance, but when we recall that the ground of the soul is the univocal point of connection to the divine, and that this connection is, for Eckhart, fundamentally intellectual, we may think of the Meister’s necessity claim less as making a causal assertion (e.g., “the emptied soul causes God to enter the soul”) and more as expressing a fundamental truth to be discovered by the subject. Indeed, the problem of human beings as creatures occupied with finite things is first and foremost an epistemic one: We neither understand what we, at our core, really are—namely, the images and “offspring” of God—nor how to “want” properly (Connolly 2014: 141). We need to be “still”, to empty ourselves of worldly distractions and illusory attachments, to be able to “hear” and come to understand the Word that is eternally communicated by the Father in the ground. In this sense, it is not as though God is absent in us and then becomes present due to some action of ours that we undertake of our own initiative. Rather, for Eckhart, our task as human beings is to come to be able to listen to—and thereby apprehend—the Word that is eternally and always poured out into in us. (It is also noteworthy that Eckhart shifts the traditional Christian emphasis on the beatific vision in which one sees God face to face to the modality of spiritually hearing the self-communication of the divine.) Further, just as a pregnant person is, in a very real sense, one with that which they have conceived, the “pregnant” soul and God are united in the ground—thereby again preserving the identity of the intellect and the intelligible.

In this sense, then, only the soul “stripped bare” of its objects and attachments—a soul that has been wholly “de-imaged” (entbildet) can truly conceive the divine already within it. However, this “birth” is not, according to Eckhart, something we can simply will to bring about—at least not in the ordinary sense of prudential means-ends reasoning. First, Eckhart is emphatic that God should not be sought for the sake of any reward or external state such as heaven, eternal bliss, or even the rapturous experience of God itself. In other words, the return of the soul to God is not a mere means to some further desirable or pleasurable end. It is identical with our ultimate end, our telos, and should be sought for its own sake. Neither is it an end that can be reached by adopting particular methods or techniques. According to Eckhart, God should not—indeed, cannot—be sought in such “special ways” as devotion, prayer, meditation, good works, or even divinely inspired religious ecstasy: “Whoever seeks God in a special way gets the way and misses God, who lies hidden in it” (Pr. 5b; DW I:91; MW 110). Rather, Eckhart says, the soul in its ground must always act as God acts, i.e., “without [a] why” (ȃne warumbe). When we give ourselves wholly over to God, and the Word is born in the ground of our souls, God will simply act through us, such that our actions are God’s actions and therefore performed simply for their own sake without some further “why” or “wherefore”.

9.2 Learning to Let Go: Negative Virtue and Non-Attachment

The idea that God cannot be found in ways puts those who wish to follow Eckhart’s spiritual advice in a tricky position. On the one hand, the Meister claims that God cannot be sought in means and that we should give up our attempts to find God via spiritual, mystical, or moral techniques. On the other hand, he often seems to imply that we can and even should do something to put ourselves in a position that would allow the intellectual conception of the Word to be “triggered” in us:

All God wants of you is for you to go out of yourself in the way of creatureliness and let God be within you,

he exclaims.

My dear friend, what harm can it do you to do God the favor of letting Him be God in you? Go right out of yourself for God’s sake, and God will go right out of Himself for your sake. (Pr. 5b; DW I:91; MW 110)

Eckhart also extols the active pursuit and cultivation of certain habitual ways of being that he takes to be most valuable in freeing the self from its worldly attachments and keeping our “creaturely impulses” in check (Connolly 2014: 185), thereby opening up the very possibility of becoming receptacles for the divine. Whereas the more traditional Aristotelian and Christian virtues tended to revolve around moral and spiritual formation, Eckhart’s focus on cultivating attitudes of “detachment” (abgescheidenheit) and “releasement” or “letting-go-ness” (gelȃzenheit) created a set of more Stoic-sounding negative virtues (Griffioen & Zahedi 2018) that could assist the individual in the pursuit of the un-formation (another sense of entbildung) of their sinful souls (see, e.g., BgT; DW V:12; MW 527; see also Wackernagel 1993). Insofar as the cultivation of such virtues can lead a soul from division to unity, from distraction by attachment to the world to a focus on knowledge of one’s “true” self (and therefore of God), the soul can be “purified in the exercise of virtues”, creating the conditions for the ascent “into the life of unity” and the realization of oneness with the Word in the ground of the soul (Pr. 9; DW I:136; MW 405).

Understanding Eckhart on these points is not easy, and scholars have struggled with this mystagogical aspect of his thought. However, the Meister was not the first to grapple with the tension between activity and passivity, between human action and divine grace, that inevitably appears when classical philosophy comes into contact with Christian theology. To some extent, much of his philosophical thought might even be characterized as an attempt to provide a metaphysics that can make sense of these aspects of Christian doctrine. Whatever the case, the common thread in Eckhart’s mystagogical and moral thought seems to be that attachment to anything distinct from God hinders the soul from true freedom and keeps God and the soul apart from one another (Milne 2016: 97). This includes those seeking God via such methods as “prayer, fasting, vigils, and all kinds of outward discipline and mortification”, since any “work to which you are possessively attached” is something that

involves the loss of freedom to wait on God in the here and now, and to follow Him alone in the light wherein He would show you what to do and what not to do, every moment freely and anew, as if you had nothing else and neither would nor could do otherwise. (Pr. 2; DW I:28–29; MW 78)

Indeed, it is perhaps the notion of possessiveness that characterizes the fundamental problem of the human being. True freedom involves a kind of self-dispossession, and a letting go of the attachment to the “mine-ness” of one’s actions. This for Eckhart is the kind of spiritual “poverty” that results in genuine freedom. Here, the Meister mirrors many of his Beguine predecessors (and not a few of his Muslim Sufi counterparts) in characterizing human freedom, not in the modern sense of freedom from external constraint, or even the ability to do otherwise, but rather as acting in consonance with that which is wholly unified and thereby wholly unencumbered by the hindrances of multiplicity, division, and internal conflict—namely, with the divine will (Griffioen & Zahedi 2018). In fact, Eckhart’s emphasis on dispossession takes him even further. It is not merely sufficient that our will be in conformance with God’s will, but rather our actions should be a result of God’s acting through us: “If our will is God’s will, that is good, but if God’s will is our will, that is far better” (Pr. 25; DW II:9; MW 92).

9.3 “Fruitful Virginity”: Being in the World and the Christian Life

Importantly, however, although becoming appropriately abgescheiden, gelȃzen, and entbildet can be the ladder one climbs up to eventually throw away for a life of unity in, with, and through participation in the “wayless way” of the divine life of the Trinity—this “virginal” conception of the Word in the soul liberated from attachment to the world is not the end of the story. So long as we remain embodied created beings, we are always beings in the world (even if we are no longer of it). The “letting-go” involved in true spiritual poverty is itself a negatio negationis—a turning of nothingness “from a simple negation of creation into a way of being in the world” (Howells 2010: 38). Put in the terms of Sermon 2, the “virginal” soul must also “bear fruit” and be a “wife”. It is not enough to be merely “pregnant” with the divine logos, the soul must also continually “birth” the Word in itself, such that God can work through the soul and thereby bring it to a “deeper mode of participation in the truth and goodness of all things” (Milne 2016: 107). For this reason, even if Eckhart’s selective focus on negative virtues like releasement and detachment, together with his repeated warnings that God cannot be sought in ways or by technical means, might make one question whether Eckhart’s thought can really be considered to contain any sort of normative ethical force, there is nevertheless a role for the traditional virtues and virtuous moral action to play in his conception of the good life.

First, Eckhart seems to think that it is better for us to be created as we are than to have always rested in God and perfect self-awareness (Milne 2016: 101). Like the “nobleman” in the parable of the ten pounds (Luke 19:12), who “went to a distant region to receive royal power for himself” and (on Eckhart’s reading) returned home wealthier, our lives, too, are richer for having “flowed out of God’s will” into creaturely bodies endowed with reason and having experienced the moral and epistemic struggle involved in our return to the Creator (Pr. 15; DW I:245; MW 270). Even the inclination to sin, Eckhart thinks, is itself beneficial for human beings, insofar as the “perfection of virtue comes by struggle”, and the struggle against our sinful inclinations “makes [us] ever more zealous to practice virtue strongly” (RdU n.9; DW V:213; MW 494).

Second, as part of this return, the cultivation of the traditional moral and theological virtues can be a useful—perhaps even necessary—preparation for the life of detachment and spiritual poverty. Indeed, Eckhart cautions that his words regarding leaving images and goal-oriented actions behind are

only for the [already] good and perfected people, who have so absorbed and assimilated the essence of all virtues that these virtues emanate from them naturally, without their seeking. (Pr. 101; DW IV/1:354; MW 33)

Third, and most importantly, the soul united with God in pure detachment—although in some sense having transcended the virtues—nevertheless continues to act virtuously in the world, though she does not act for the sake of anything else, even of virtue itself (Connolly 2014: 190ff.). Rather, her will and God’s will are a singular will, such that she acts wholly freely in virtue, but unbound by the constraints that even morality would place on her. As Eckhart exhorts his audience, “You should traverse [durchgân] and transcend all the virtues, drawing virtue solely from its source in that ground where it is one with the divine nature” (Pr. 16b; DW I:276; MW 117; cf. also TP 278). When this happens, Eckhart thinks, “all virtues should be enclosed in you and flow out of you in their true being [wesenlîche von dir vliezen]” (ibid.).

It is with this in mind that Eckhart turns the Mary and Martha story on its head in Sermon 86 (Pr. 86; DW III:481–503; MW 83–90), claiming that it is not Mary, sitting enraptured at the feet of Christ, who represents the moral and spiritual exemplar. Rather, this role is played by Martha, who busily tends to the guests and the housework, being “so well grounded in her essence that her activity was no hindrance to her”. Although Mary has correctly grasped what is most valuable and worthy of worship—and therefore begun her journey of spiritual progress—according to Eckhart, we might suspect that she nevertheless “sat there a little more for her own happiness than for spiritual profit”. Martha, on the other hand, is “unhindered” insofar as all her works are “guided by the eternal light”. In contrast to her contemplative sister, who is just beginning her “schooling” in “learning how to live”, the experienced and busy Martha has already progressed to being “with things and not in them”. Eckhart concludes the sermon by noting that “some people hope to reach a point [of spiritual progress] where they are free of works”, but that “this cannot be” (Pr. 86; DW III:492; MW 89). In this sense, then, there is ultimately no distinction for Eckhart between the vita activa and the vita contemplativa:

It is actually the same thing, for we take only from the same ground of contemplation and make it fruitful in works, and thus the object of contemplation is achieved. (Pr. 104; DW IV/1:580; MW 48)

Indeed, as has been shown repeatedly throughout this entry, Eckhart’s “philosophy of the Word” attempts to bring these two strands together with the help of an intellectualist metaphysics that places divine thought and speech—the eternal logos and ewig wort—at its (silent and still) core.


Primary Literature

N.B. It is no easy task to find a comprehensive list of Eckhart’s (confirmed) Latin and German works, and there is to date no complete English translation of the Latin works. Additionally, various editors and translators over the years have numbered the German sermons differently, often leading to confusion with regard to the ordering and cross-referencing of the sermons.

For a complete list of Eckhart’s works with helpful cross-references across editions, see the extremely detailed (if somewhat outdated) webpage at the Meister Eckhart website (in German). See also Hackett (2013) for English-language overviews of Eckhart’s Latin Works (by Alessandra Beccarisi, pp. 85–123) and German Works (by Dagmar Gottschall, pp. 137–183), as well as a full list of the contents of LW I–VI and DW I–V (p.725).

Listed below is the information for the critical editions (LW and DW). Since these volumes are extremely expensive and few have been digitized, I have also listed the more recent, accessible, and affordable Latin-German study edition, as well as the re-release of DW and parts of LW from the Deutscher Klassiker Verlag, which includes extremely helpful commentaries (in German) by Niklaus Largier. This is followed by a list of Eckhart’s major works with their common abbreviations (in alphabetical order) and a list of the most commonly cited English translations.

Critical Editions

  • The Latin-German critical edition (LW): Die lateinischen Werke, edited by E. Benz, C. Christ, B. Decker, H. Fischer, B. Geyer, J. Koch, E. Seeberg, L. Sturlese, K. Weiß, and A. Zimmermann, vols. I–V (Stuttgart: Kohlhammer, 1936–2007).
  • The MHG-German critical edition (DW): Die deutschen Werke, edited by J. Quint and G. Steer, vols I–V (Stuttgart: Kohlhammer, 1936–2007).
  • The Latin-German study edition (from LW I/2 and LW II): Studienausgabe der lateinischen Werke, edited by L. Sturlese and E. Rubino, vols. 1–2 (Stuttgart: Kohlhammer, 2016–2018). Includes the Prologi, In Gen. I, and In Gen. II (vol. 1) and In Exod., In Eccli., In Sap., and the Expositio Cantici Canticorum (vol. 2).
  • The re-releases: Meister Eckhart, Werke I & II, edited with commentaries by N. Largier. Deutscher Klassiker Verlag im Taschenbuch, vols. 24–25 (Frankfurt a.M.: DKV, 2008). Includes German Sermons 1–65 (vol. 24), German Sermons 66–86 (vol. 25), and selections from Prol. gen., In Ioh., Qu. Par., and Serm. (vol. 25).

Latin Works

[In Eccli]
Sermones et Lectiones super Ecclesiastici ch. 24:23–31 [Sermons and Lectures on Ecclesiasticus Ch. 24: 23–31], LW II:231–300
[In Exod.]
Expositio Libri Exodi [Commentary on the Book of Exodus], LW II:1–227
[In Gen. I]
Expositio Libri Genesis [Commentary on the Book of Genesis], LW I:185–444; LW I/2:61–329
[In Gen. II]
Liber Parabolarum Genesis [Book of the Parables of Genesis], LW I:445–702; LW I/2:331–452
[In Ioh.]
Expositio sancti Evangelii secundum Iohannem [Commentary on the Gospel of John], LW III
[In Sap.]
Expositio Libri Sapientiae [Commentary on the Book of Wisdom], LW II:303–644
[Prol. gen.]
Prologus generalis in Opus tripartitum [General Prologue to the Tripartite Work], LW I:148–165; LW I/2:21– ­­39
[Prol. op. prop.]
Prologus in Opus propositionum [Prologue to the Work of Propositions], LW I:166–182; LW I/2:41–57
[Qu. Par.]
Quaestiones Parisienses [Parisian Questions], LW I:37–83 (Questions 1–5); LW I/2:461–469 (recently discovered Questions 6–9)
Magistri Echardi Responsio ad articulos sibi impositos de scriptis et dictis suis [Eckhart’s Defense against the Articles], LW V:275–354
Sermones [Latin Sermons], LW IV

German Works

Daz buoch der goetlichen troestunge [Book of Divine Consolation], DW V:1–105
Die rede der underscheidunge [Talks of Instruction], DW V:137–376
Von abegescheidenheit [On Detachment], DW V:400–437
Von dem edeln menschen [On the Noble Person], DW V:106–136
Predigten [German Sermons] (DW I, II, III, IV/1, IV/2)

Meister Eckhart in English Translation

Below are the most commonly cited Eckhart translations with their abbreviations. In recent years, new English translations of some of Eckhart’s German homilies have been published alongside their vernacular texts by Loris Sturlese and Markus Vinzent in the Peeters series, Eckhart Texts and Studies, and a further edition of the Latin homilies also appears to be in planning.

Meister Eckhart: The Essential Sermons, Commentaries, Treatises, and Defense, translated with introductions by Edmund Colledge and Bernard McGinn, New York: Paulist Press, 1981.
The Complete Mystical Works of Meister Eckhart, translated and edited by Maurice O’C. Walshe, revised by Bernard McGinn, New York: Crossroad Publishing, 2009.
Parisian Questions and Prologues, edited and translated by Armand Maurer, Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Medieval Studies, 1974.
Meister Eckhart: Selected Writings, selected and translated by Oliver Davies, London: Penguin Books, 1994.
Meister Eckhart: Teacher and Preacher, edited by Bernard McGinn with the collaboration of Frank Tobin and Elvira Borgstadt, New York: Paulist Press, 1986.

Secondary Literature

  • Ashworth, E. Jennifer, and Domenic D’Ettore, 2021, “Medieval Theories of Analogy”, in The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2021 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>.
  • Beccarisi, Alessandra, 2013, “Eckhart’s Latin Works”, in Hackett 2013: 85–123. doi:10.1163/9789004236929_004
  • Caputo, John D., 1975, “The Nothingness of the Intellect in Meister Eckhart’s ‘Parisian Questions’”, The Thomist: A Speculative Quarterly Review, 39(1): 85–115. doi:10.1353/tho.1975.0004
  • Connolly, John M., 2014, Living without Why: Meister Eckhart’s Critique of the Medieval Concept of Will, New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199359783.001.0001
  • Dobie, Robert, 2010, “Science and Mysticism in the Middle Ages: Meister Eckhart’s Synthesis”, Eckhart Review, 19(1): 15–34. doi:10.1558/mmt.v19.15
  • Duclow, Donald F., 1984, “Hermeneutics and Meister Eckhart”:, Philosophy Today, 28(1): 36–43. doi:10.5840/philtoday198428112
  • Flasch, Kurt, 2006 [2015], Meister Eckhart: die Geburt der «Deutschen Mystik» aus dem Geist der arabischen Philosophie, München: C. H. Beck. Translated as Meister Eckhart: Philosopher of Christianity, Anne Schindel and Aaron Vanides (trans.), New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 2015.
  • Goris, Wouter, 2009, “The Unpleasantness With The Agent Intellect In Meister Eckhart”, in Philosophical Debates at Paris in the Early Fourteenth Century, Stephen F. Brown, Thomas Dewender, and Theo Kobusch (eds.), (Studien und Texte zur Geistesgeschichte des Mittelalters 102), Leiden/Boston: Brill, 151–159. doi:10.1163/ej.9789004175662.i-526.25
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