Philosophy and Christian Theology
Many Christian doctrines raise difficult philosophical questions. For example, Christians have traditionally insisted that they worship a single God, while simultaneously identifying that God with a trinity comprised of three numerically distinct, fully divine persons: the Father, the Son, and the Holy Spirit. It is not easy to see how three divine persons add up to one God. Similarly, Christians have also asserted that a human man, Jesus of Nazareth, is also God-the-Son, the second person of the divine trinity. It is not easy to see how a human man, who is born, lives, and dies, could also be a fully divine being. Consider also the relationship between divine providence and human freedom. Are human beings free to accept or reject God, or does God alone decide who will accept or reject God? Any answer to this theological question will also assume some specific philosophical account of human freedom and moral responsibility.
Christian thinkers have always drawn on philosophy to help answer these kinds of questions. In the earliest years of Christianity, running roughly from the second to the seventh centuries CE, and often called the “Patristic” period, the emerging Christian Church faced the daunting task of defining doctrinal orthodoxy in the face of internal and external challenges. In pursuing this task, Patristic thinkers typically did not understand themselves as “theologians” in contrast to “philosophers”. Indeed, they may not have endorsed any sharp distinction between philosophy and theology at all. But they still reasoned about their Christian commitments in the intellectual idiom of the ancient Mediterranean world, which was the idiom of Platonic, Aristotelian, and Stoic philosophy.
Over the course of the Patristic period, as the early Church successfully established its own intellectual framework, it formally defined the boundaries of Christian orthodoxy through a series of ecumenical councils. These councils—including the Councils of Nicaea (325 CE), Constantinople (381), and Chalcedon (451)—established the orthodox doctrine of the Trinity and its corollary, the doctrine of the Incarnation (see Kelly 1978).
Yet even after the parameters of orthodoxy were established, Christian thinkers continued to face difficult philosophical questions about the meaning, coherence, and plausibility of settled Christian doctrines. They continued to try to answer those questions using the best philosophy of their day—from Scholastic Aristotelianism in the Medieval period to analytic metaphysics today. For Christian thinkers, the already settled doctrines of Christian orthodoxy provide a normative framework within which this philosophical reflection occurs, by demarcating the logical space that constrains the field of acceptable solutions. For example, it is not open to an orthodox Christian thinker to dispel the logical problem of the Trinity (the problem of how God can be both three and one) by arguing that there is in fact no God, or that God is not triune, or that the Father and the Son are two stages in the temporal life of the one God. These theoretical options are ruled out by virtue of the philosopher’s own orthodox Christian commitments.
As a general, formal matter, this point holds even though different Christian groups disagree about what the constraints of orthodoxy actually are. So Roman Catholic Christians and Protestant Christians will accept different constraints about, say, the nature of the Eucharist, and rival Protestant Christian groups will differ with each other in a similar way. But as a formal matter, Christian thinkers who think philosophically about Christian doctrines typically do so inside the intellectual framework provided by what they regard as authoritative Christian orthodoxy. Obviously, it is not the case that everyone who wants to think philosophically about Christianity must accept the constraints of Christian orthodoxy, even in this more relativistic sense of “orthodoxy”. Some modern and contemporary thinkers still identify as Christians even though they reject the very idea of normative orthodoxy, for example. And, of course, non-Christian thinkers, including non-theists, will reject any notion of Christian orthodoxy in its entirety. Yet they can still think philosophically about Christian doctrines.
Because its twin foci are so broad, an encyclopedia entry on “Philosophy and Christian Theology” could legitimately go in many different directions. This entry has two related aims. First, the entry discusses methodological questions about how philosophy and theology should be related. Accordingly, it surveys some of the most important ways they have been related in the history of the Christian tradition (Section 1), before turning to contemporary debates about the way Anglo-American analytic philosophy of religion interacts with theology (Section 3). Second, in between these two methodological sections, the entry also discusses recent work in analytic philosophical theology (Section 2). Note that the previous version of this entry (Murray and Rea 2008 ) focused on topics in contemporary philosophical theology. That version is archived and available via the Other Internet Resources but see, also, the topic-focused entries linked in the Related Entries for additional coverage.
Philosophical critics of contemporary analytic philosophy of religion (APR) are often struck by just how Christian and theological much of it seems. This criticism expresses the worry that APR as such looks too much like Christian philosophical theology. At the same time, theological critics often fault APR for lacking theological sophistication (Section 3). In order to understand both poles of criticism, it is useful to have a better sense of the relevant historical background (Section 1). But it is also important to appreciate what the best contemporary work in analytic philosophical theology actually looks like (Section 2).
- 1. The Relationship Between Philosophy and Theology in the Christian Tradition
- 2. Recent Work in Analytic Philosophical Theology
- 3. Philosophy of Religion, Philosophical Theology, Christian Theology: Is There A Difference and Does it Matter?
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. The Relationship Between Philosophy and Theology in the Christian Tradition
Although modern thought tends to assume a sharp disjunction between philosophy and theology, it is not at all obvious how to distinguish them in a principled way. Suppose that we take philosophy in the broadest sense to be the systematic use of human reason in an effort to understand the most fundamental features of reality, and suppose that we take theology in the broadest sense to be the study of God and all things in relation to God. Then we should expect to see considerable overlap between the two: after all, God, if there is a God, is surely one of the fundamental features of reality, and one to which all the other features presumably relate.
In practice, when we survey the history of Christian thought, we do see considerable overlap between philosophy and theology. With respect to their topics of inquiry, philosophers and theologians alike ask questions about epistemology, axiology, and political theory, as well as about metaphysics and fundamental ontology. Similarly, with respect to their methods of inquiry, philosophers and theologians alike interpret authoritative texts, deploy arguments, and marshal evidence to support their conclusions. Here one might insist that Christian theological claims are grounded by appeals to “faith” or “authority”, whereas philosophical claims are grounded by appeals to “reason”. This contrast is promising when suitably developed, but it is not as sharp as one might initially suppose. Theology also makes appeals to common sense and ordinary human reason, and philosophy also has its versions of faith and authority.
Of the making of typologies there is no end, but it is still worth examining some of the most common ways that Christian thinkers throughout the centuries have understood the relationship between philosophy and theology. Without this historical background, it becomes all-too-easy to draw the relationship in naïve, anachronistic, and overly simplistic ways. In fact, no single interpretation of the relationship between philosophy and theology can claim overwhelming support from the Christian tradition. From outside the Christian tradition, while many non-Christian thinkers see philosophy and theology as quite distinct, others deliberately blur the distinction between them—because they think that theology is actually just misguided philosophy.
At the top-level of the proposed typology, we can distinguish between “Integration” and “Contrast” views. Integration views do not distinguish philosophy and theology at all, whereas Contrast views do. We can disambiguate the “Contrast” category into “Cooperation” views, “Disjunction” views, and “Conflict” views. The most prominent Cooperation views treat philosophy as a valuable, perhaps even necessary, tool for theological inquiry, and still allow some degree of overlap between the two. Disjunction views, by contrast, regard philosophy and theology as non-overlapping forms of inquiry, which feature distinct and ultimately unrelated goals and methods. “Conflict” views treat philosophy and theology as not only distinct but mutually antagonistic. In fact, however, few Christian thinkers have endorsed outright conflict between philosophy and theology. But it is still worth discussing the Conflict view explicitly, because some prominent Christian theologians throughout history—for example, Tertullian, Martin Luther, or Karl Barth—initially seem to advocate Conflict. Upon closer inspection, however, their views are closer to those in the Disjunction category.
These categories are crude. They could each be further divided, and subdivided again. They focus mainly on different Christian attitudes toward the interaction of philosophy and theology, rather than on the attitudes of non-Christian philosophers. Some non-empty categories are omitted altogether. But these categories do capture much of the landscape, and at least show that there are more options available than a naïve conflict between faith and reason.
The Integration model treats philosophy and Christian theology as continuous, integrated activities. On this model, rational inquiry about God does not sharply divide into discrete activities called “philosophy” and “theology”. Instead, there is simply the single, continuous intellectual task of trying to understand God, and all things in relation to God, using all of one’s intellectual resources. This account does not deny the importance of faith or revelation to the Christian intellectual life; rather, it denies that faith and revelation properly belong to a separate activity called “theology” in distinction from another activity called “philosophy”. According to this view, when we engage in rational inquiry of any sort, we should draw on every available source of knowledge that is relevant to that inquiry. So when we engage in rational inquiry about Christian topics, we should draw on scripture, Church tradition, and other such sources of knowledge, whether we call the resulting inquiry “theology”, “philosophy”, or something else. To do anything else would be to hobble our inquiry from the outset, according to the Integration view.
This account of the relationship between philosophy and theology has deep roots in the Christian tradition. Before the rise of the medieval university, it was the dominant view, and it still has contemporary defenders (discussed below). Patristic thinkers did not typically describe their own intellectual work as “theology”. The term “theology” already had a fixed meaning in late antiquity. It meant “poetic speech about the gods”, and was in general associated with pagan story-telling and myth-making: the great “theologians”, were Homer and Hesiod. Even though Christian thinkers like Gregory of Nazianzus sometimes acquired the honorific title “Theologian”, they did so because of the lyrical and poetic quality of their writing, not because they wrote about Christian doctrinal topics (Zachhuber 2020; McGinn 2008).
The general term that early Christian thinkers used to describe their intellectual work was, more often than not, simply “philosophy” or “Christian philosophy”. Christianity was regarded as the “true philosophy” over against the false philosophical schools associated with pagan thought. (See Justin Martyr, Dialogue with Trypho 8.1; Clement of Alexandria, Stromata 1.28.3, 1.28.4 1.80.5,6; Augustine of Hippo, Against Julian, 4.14.72.) This usage is consistent with Pierre Hadot’s (1995) claim that in Greco-Roman antiquity philosophy was understood as a comprehensive way of life. Christianity, on this model, is analogous to a philosophical school, in Hadot’s sense (see also Zachhuber 2020).
The Integration account continued to be the default account of the relationship between philosophy and theology into the early Medieval period. Before the rise of scholasticism in the great Western universities, there was no sharp distinction between philosophy and theology. Anselm of Canterbury, for example, certainly has the concept of a line of inquiry that proceeds using reason alone, without appealing to revelation, but he does not label that inquiry “philosophy” in distinction from “theology”. Moreover, in his own writings, he frequently blurs any such distinction, as he seamlessly moves between rational reflection and argument, on the one hand, to prayers, meditations, and exclamations of thanksgiving, on the other (e.g., Proslogion 1–4). Like many premodern Christian thinkers, Anselm also held that intellectual inquiry and personal holiness are linked, so that the more one grows in Christian virtue, the more rationally one is able to think about God (Adams 2004; Sweeney, 2011). This understanding of inquiry and virtue is also a hallmark of the Integration account.
Unlike the Integration model, the Contrast model insists that philosophy and theology are fundamentally different forms of inquiry. Strictly speaking, there can be many different Contrast models, because the relevant sense of “contrast” comes in degrees. I focus on three: Cooperation, Disjunction, and Conflict. On the Cooperation account, philosophy and theology remain close cousins. When rightly pursued, they cannot really conflict, and they can even overlap in their respective topics of inquiry, sources, and methods. Nevertheless, the Cooperation account holds that the overlap between philosophy and theology is only partial, because they each begin from different intellectual starting points and appeal to different sources of evidence (Baker-Hytch 2016; Chignell 2009: 117; Simmons 2019). On another version of the Contrast model, Disjunction, philosophy and theology are even further apart: although they still do not conflict, and may even consider the same topics in an attenuated sense, their starting assumptions and methods of investigation are different enough that they share no significant conclusions. Finally, Conflict accounts assert that the conclusions of Christian theology are positively irrational from the point of view of philosophy. Although some historically important Christian thinkers might seem to endorse Conflict, closer inspection shows that they do not. Nevertheless, in the popular imagination, a persistent assumption holds that Christianity requires a sharp conflict between theology and philosophy—or at least faith and reason—and so it is worth briefly discussing why Conflict has had few traditional defenders.
On the Cooperation account, philosophy and theology are understood to be different, but mutually supporting, intellectual activities. For Christian thinkers who advocate Cooperation, philosophy and theology form a coherent, mutually supportive whole. They are not in conflict with respect to their conclusions, since truth cannot contradict truth, but they differ with respect to their foundational axioms, goals, and sources of evidence. Philosophy is understood as a preamble to theology, while theology completes and fulfills philosophy. Thomas Aquinas is a foundational advocate of the Cooperation account (Summa Theologiae 1.1.1–8, Summa Contra Gentiles 1.1.1–9, Hankey 2001). Often the relationship between philosophy and theology is described in hierarchical and instrumental terms: theology draws on philosophy as needed, because philosophy is instrumentally useful to theology. According to a traditional metaphor, philosophy is the servant of theology (ancilla theologiae, literally “handmaid” of theology; see Thomas Aquinas, Summa Theologiae, 1.1.5). In a more contemporary idiom, theology uses conceptual tools provided by philosophy in the pursuit of its own distinctive intellectual task: elucidating the meaning and truth of revealed Christian doctrines.
On the Cooperation account, theology differs from philosophy chiefly because theology assumes the truth of divine revelation, whereas philosophy does not. Philosophy takes its foundational axioms and assumptions from generally available truths of human reason and sensory experience. Philosophy and theology also differ in the way they argue and in the kinds of intellectual appeals that are proper to each. Theologians can appeal to revelation—scripture and authoritative Church tradition—in order to generate new lines of inquiry, and can treat revealed truths as evidence in their investigations. For their part, philosophers must appeal only to premises and evidence that are in principle available to any rational inquirer.
This distinction between “revealed truths” and “truths of reason” implies that at least some revealed truths are not also truths of reason. By hypothesis, such truths would have remained unknown and unknowable had they not been revealed by God. (It therefore follows that without revelation, Christian theology could not exist, on the Cooperation account.) Paradigmatic instances of revealed truths are the doctrine of the Trinity, and the doctrine of the Incarnation. Throughout the centuries, most, though not all, broadly orthodox Christian thinkers have held that human beings could not reason their way to the truth of these doctrines without the aid of divine revelation.
According to Aquinas, theologians use the conceptual tools furnished by philosophy to elucidate the contents of revelation. Just like philosophers, theologians make arguments, and their arguments appeal to common standards of logic and rigor, even though they also draw on theology’s own unique (revealed) axioms and sources of evidence (Summa Theologiae 1.1.1). Philosophical arguments cannot prove the foundational truths of revelation, according to Aquinas, but at the same time, revelation and reason cannot conflict. (That God exists is a truth of reason, not revelation, for Aquinas—see Summa Theologiae 1.2.2, reply to obj. 1.) Theologians can therefore use common standards of philosophical reasoning to answer any putative objections to their theological claims, by showing that any alleged conflict is only apparent. So, for example, even though it is not possible to establish that God is triune by means of philosophical arguments, it is possible to use philosophical arguments in a defensive mode, to answer objections alleging that the doctrine of the trinity is logically incoherent. When arguing with other Christians, theologians can appeal to revelation to support their claims. When arguing with opponents who do not accept revelation, they cannot (Summa Theologiae 1.1.8). Yet this restriction is not really a disciplinary maxim designed to oppose philosophy to theology, but a pragmatic admission that one cannot successfully persuade opponents by appealing to premises they deny.
Like Cooperation, the Disjunction view holds that philosophy and theology are different forms of inquiry. Similarly, like Cooperation, the Disjunction view also that agrees that there can be no real conflict between the conclusions of philosophy (when true) and those of theology. But the Disjunction view goes further: Disjunction advocates deny that there is any significant overlap between philosophy and theology at all.
Disjunction does not subordinate philosophy to theology or treat philosophy as an essential tool for theology. Instead, to borrow a term from contemporary science and religion debates, philosophy and theology are “non-overlapping magisteria” (Gould 1997). In particular, Cooperation’s appeal to the distinction between truths of reason and truths of revelation does not suffice to distinguish philosophy from theology, according to Disjunction advocates, who instead appeal to various more fundamental distinctions of method or approach (see discussion below). Of course, even those who explicitly advocate Disjunction will occasionally deploy some methods associated with philosophy: carefully defining terms, making formally valid arguments, uncovering contradictions in opposing views, etc. Yet these methods are found in any form of rational inquiry, and so (presumably) they do not belong to philosophy alone.
Any given thinker’s view of Disjunction will of course depend on their underlying construal of philosophy and theology. Some thinkers—even some Christian thinkers—endorse the Disjunction view because they deny that theology is really a propositional, truth-apt discourse that proceeds by way of arguments and evidence. Instead, theology is something else entirely—poetry, perhaps; or a form of worship, praise, or prayer (Caputo 2015). This view of theology implies a sharp contrast with Aristotelian and scholastic philosophy, modern philosophy, and contemporary Anglo-American Analytic philosophy, though perhaps not with philosophy tout court. Philosophers might associate this view with the “expressivist” or “emotivist” critiques of theology that were common in the heyday of logical positivism. But in fact, versions of the “theology as poetry” view are found throughout the history of Christian thought (Beggiani 2014).
Other versions of the Disjunction view figure even more prominently in the Christian tradition. The foundational Protestant reformers, Martin Luther and John Calvin, both advocate Disjunction, in part because they both reject the synthesis of philosophy and theology that characterized late medieval scholasticism. According to Luther, philosophy and theology proceed from entirely different perspectives, with different starting points and different goals (1539 [1966: 244]; Grosshans 2017). Philosophy considers its objects of inquiry from the perspective of common human reason and sense experience, with the goal of trying to understand things as they actually are in the real world. Theology considers its objects of inquiry from a creational and eschatological perspective, with the goal of trying to understand them in relation to God as their creator and final end. Furthermore, for Luther, “creation” and its cognates are properly theological terms whose meaning derives from scripture and revelation, and which should not be identified with any philosophical notion of a first cause or prime mover; mutatis mutandis, the same point hold for creation’s final end in God (1539 [1966: 245, 248]).
Even when philosophy and theology do consider the same object of inquiry—for example, the human being—this difference in perspective ensures that the lines of inquiry remain completely separate. Luther’s 1536 “Disputation Concerning Man”, for example opens with the thesis that “Philosophy or human wisdom defines man as an animal having reason, sensation, and body” and then goes on to explore this definition. But his exploration only serves to contrast this philosophical view of the human being with the perspective of theology. Theology,
from the fulness of its wisdom, defines man as whole and perfect… made in the beginning after the image of God… subject to the power of the devil, sin and death…freed and given eternal life only through the Son of God, Jesus Christ. (1536 [1966: 137–138])
Luther’s theological account of the human being does not contradict the philosophical account, but it also does not complete or augment that account, because (according to Luther) properly theological claims are simply unintelligible to philosophy (1536 [1966: 137–140]; 1539 [1966: 240–241, 242]). They do not belong to the same universe of discourse.
Calvin shares Luther’s basic understanding of the disjunction between philosophy and theology. Like Luther, Calvin holds that the Fall has corrupted the power of human reason, but has not destroyed it altogether (Institutes 2.2.12–17). When restricted to its proper sphere—matters pertaining to the natural world—philosophy remains valuable. But as a result of the Fall, “heavenly things” are inaccessible to unaided human reason (Institutes 2.2.13). By “heavenly things”, Calvin means the saving truths of the Gospel.
So far, Calvin’s understanding might seem quite similar to the Cooperation view, which also denies that revealed truths are accessible to human reason. But Calvin further distinguishes philosophy from theology at the level of method, by denying that true theology engages in abstract, speculative reasoning, which he associates with philosophy, and insisting that any legitimate knowledge of God must be practical and affective (Institutes 1.12.1, 1.5.10). For example, according to Calvin, it would be impious and dangerous to speculate on all the actions that God could possibly do—God’s absolute power. Instead, we should focus our loving attention on what God has actually done, paradigmatically in the person and work of Christ (Institutes 3.24.2; Helm 2004: 24–26). Theology presupposes Christian faith, which is an affective response to Christ, and which requires “confidence and assurance of heart” (Institutes 3.2.33). Yet scholastic philosophy, with its “endless labyrinths” and “obscure definitions”, has “drawn a veil over Christ to hide him” (Institutes 3.2.2).
For Luther and Calvin, then, there can be no genuinely philosophical theology. Even though both agree that philosophical speculation can arrive at some limited truths about, e.g., a first cause, or about the nature of human beings, those truths are of no theological interest; even as bare propositional claims, they are already better and more fully known in theological inquiry. From the other direction, the properly Christian notions of God as creator and of the human being as imago dei, e.g., resist all philosophical speculation. Of course, Luther and Calvin can only hold these views because of the way they understand philosophy and theology. They both identify philosophy with late medieval scholasticism, and they both understand theology as a kind of existential encounter with God and Christ, as revealed in the scriptures. Different accounts of philosophy and theology would yield different construals of the underlying disjunction, or no disjunction at all.
None of the three views considered so far—Integration, Cooperation, and Disjunction—assume any real, essential conflict between philosophy and theology. All three views allow for apparent conflict, due to errors of reasoning or interpretation, or when either discipline departs from its own proper sphere, but they do not assert that Christian theology or Christian faith is irrational from the point of view of philosophy, nor do they hold that any significant Christian doctrinal claims can be falsified by sound philosophical reasoning. Throughout the history of Christian thought, many prominent Christian philosophers and theologians have criticized philosophy, or fulminated against what they regard as philosophical overreach, but few if any have regarded philosophy and theology as essentially incompatible, in the sense just outlined. Popular understandings of “faith” and “reason” often posit a deep and abiding conflict between the two, and so it is important to emphasize just how rare that position has actually been among major Christian philosophers and theologians. Key figures who are often regarded as Conflict advocates, turn out, upon closer inspection, to hold a different view.
For example, the Patristic theologian Tertullian famously asks “What has Athens to do with Jerusalem?” but he never actually asserted the irrationalist credo “I believe because it is absurd” (De praescriptione haereticorum 7; De carne Christi 5.4; see also Harrison 2017). Instead, like all the Patristic fathers, Tertullian regarded human reason as one of God’s greatest gifts; ratio (reason) is one of his most frequently used nouns, and his own writing draws heavily on the stoic philosophy of his day (Osborn 1997).
Turning to a putative modern irrationalist, Søren Kierkegaard presents the incarnation as a paradox that offends human reason in his (pseudonymous) 1844 Philosophical Fragments, but close reading shows that “paradox” and “offence” do not equate to “formal contradiction” (1844 [1985: 53, 101]; Evans 1989). Rather, the incarnation seems paradoxical only to fallen, sinful human reason (1844, [1985: 46–47]). So the “offence” of the incarnation resolves into the claim that the doctrine of the incarnation had to be revealed, because its truth exceeds the limits of fallen reason. But, as discussed above, accepting this claim about the incarnation has been the norm throughout the Christian tradition. Moreover, according to Kierkegaard, even though the truth of the incarnation exceeds the limits of human reason, the claim that reason has limits is itself one that can be assessed by human reason (1846 [1992: 580]; Evans 1989: 355).
Finally, the twentieth century theologian Karl Barth’s famous “No!” to philosophical reasoning about God is also best understood as a rejection of philosophical overreach rather than a rejection of philosophy per se (Brunner & Barth 1946). According to Barth, we cannot establish the truth of theological claims using generally persuasive arguments available to any rational enquirer. But Barth had no quarrel with using philosophy in an Anselmian mode, to elucidate and clarify the implications of divine revelation, and in principle he even allows that there could be a genuinely Christian philosophy (1932 [1975: 6]; Diller 2010).
These prominent Christian thinkers all criticize what they see as philosophical hubris, but they do not set philosophy and theology as such in essential opposition, and they do not agree that any belief-worthy Christian doctrines actually are irrational—still less that they can be falsified by sound philosophical reasoning. In a way, this conclusion should be unsurprising. It is a basic claim of Christian orthodoxy that God is the very summit and source of rationality, and that human reason is one of God’s greatest gifts (Turner 2004; A. N. Williams 2007; Crisp et al. 2012). Christian thinkers have differed about the degree to which sin and the Fall have caused human reason to malfunction, but the suggestion that theological truths conflict with properly functioning human reason is alien to the orthodox Christian tradition, and so it is unsurprising that few major Christian thinkers have endorsed it. Far more common is the claim that some theological truths are inaccessible to philosophy because they somehow surpass human reason. On this line, when there is an apparent conflict between a philosophical conclusion and some Christian truth, the conflict is treated as a sign that philosophy has overstepped its own proper boundaries, not a sign that Christian truth actually conflicts with human reason. By and large, even the sharpest Christian critics of philosophy have held this view.
1.3 From Historical Models to Contemporary Philosophical Theology
This historical survey has focused on prominent models of the relationship between philosophy and theology in the history of Christian thought. The survey also illuminates some contemporary philosophical and theological debates about how to understand this relationship.
Notwithstanding its Patristic origins, the Integrationist view has been especially prominent in recent philosophy of religion. For example, Alvin Plantinga’s (1984) programmatic essay “Advice to Christian Philosophers” intentionally blurs the distinction between philosophy and theology. Plantinga argues that Christian philosophers qua philosophers are entitled to base their arguments on revealed truths, and urges them to investigate distinctively Christian questions that may be of no interest to the wider philosophical community. More recent defenders of “analytic theology” have also taken an integrationist line. According to Nicholas Wolterstorff, the demise of Enlightenment-style foundationalism has thoroughly blurred the distinction between philosophy and theology:
What difference does [this distinction] make, now that analytic philosophers no longer believe that for some piece of discourse to be a specimen of philosophy, the writer must base all his arguments on public philosophical reason? Call it what you will. (Wolterstorff 2009: 168; see also Stump 2013: 48–49; Timpe 2015: 13)
Yet this prominent Integrationist line has been strongly criticized by other philosophers of religion, who implicitly endorse some version of the Contrast view, on which philosophy cannot legitimately appeal to theological sources of evidence like revelation and Church authority (Simmons 2019; Schellenberg 2018; Oppy 2018; Draper 2019: 2–4). At the same time, according to many Christian theologians, analytic philosophy as such is almost uniquely unsuitable for investigating properly theological questions (Milbank 2009; Hart 2013: 123–134). On the view of these critics, analytic philosophical theology does not revive the Patristic integration of philosophy and theology at all; rather, it remains a distinctly anti-theological form of modern philosophy.
Contemporary philosophers and theologians continue to debate the proper relationship between philosophy and theology. Before considering these debates in further detail (in Section 3), however, it is useful to briefly survey recent work in analytic philosophical theology. The fact that the Integrationist view has been so prominent among contemporary analytic philosophers of religion has helped shape a philosophical climate in which self-identified philosophers, working in departments of philosophy, find it completely natural to investigate explicitly Christian theological questions, from within the framework of normative Christian orthodoxy, in the course of their academic work.
2. Recent Work in Analytic Philosophical Theology
Recent work in analytic philosophical theology has engaged with nearly every major Christian doctrine. But work has focused on the most central doctrines: Trinity, Incarnation and Christology, Salvation and Atonement, and Sin and Original Sin. This section lays out the most significant philosophical problems associated with each doctrine and identifies some of the foundational philosophical responses from contemporary thinkers.
Analytic philosophical theology on the Trinity has focused primarily on the “logical” problem of the Trinity, the problem of how the Father, the Son, and the Holy Spirit—construed as three really existing, really distinct divine entities—can also be exactly one God (Cartwright 1987). The Church’s first two ecumenical councils defined the orthodox terminology now used to state the doctrine, but the councils did not attempt a philosophical solution to the logical problem. In the traditional terminology, the Father, Son, and Spirit are three distinct divine persons (personae in Latin; hypostases in Greek) who share a single divine nature (substantia in Latin; ousia in Greek; see Tanner 1990: 5, 24, 28). The logical problem then becomes the problem of how three divine persons (whatever we mean by “persons”) can instantiate a single divine nature (whatever we mean by “nature”) while remaining numerically distinct.
Responses to the logical problem can be grouped into several families, each with its own advantages and disadvantages. “Social” trinitarians defend an account of the Trinity on which the Father, Son, and Spirit are three distinct centers of consciousness, with three distinct centers of knowledge, will, and action, who nevertheless count as a single God. Social trinitarians attempt to secure the divine unity by arguing that a single divine nature can support three separate consciousnesses. They may also claim that the three persons necessarily love each other so perfectly and act in such harmony that they are properly regarded as a single God. Prominent social trinitarians include Richard Swinburne (1994), William Lane Craig (2006), Keith Yandell (2009), and William Hasker (2013).
By contrast, “Latin” trinitarians deny that the Father, Son, and Spirit are distinct centers of consciousness. On Latin trinitarianism, even though the Father, Son, and Spirit are numerically distinct persons, they are not numerically distinct divine agents. When they act, they do not merely act in perfect harmony (as on social trinitarianism). Rather they are (somehow) a single actor, with a single will, carrying out a single action. The special challenge for Latin trinitarianism is to explain how it can be the case that the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit, so construed, really do exist as concrete, distinct entities, and are not just different names for the same entity, or different phases in the life of a not-essentially triune God. Brian Leftow offers the most well-developed Latin model, which appeals to an extended analogy to a time-travelling chorus-line dancer (2004).
Unsurprisingly, the sharpest critics of Latin trinitarianism are those who advocate a social trinity, and vice-versa: each side insists that the theoretical costs of the opposing view are too great. So Latin trinitarians charge that social trinitarians do not escape tri-theism (Leftow 1999; see also Merricks 2006); social trinitarians argue that their Latin counterparts cannot explain how the Father and Son could have a genuine, “I–you”, personal relationship, as the Biblical account seems to suggest (e.g., Matt 3:17, Mark 14:36; Hasker 2013: 114–118; McCall 2010: 87–88).
Philosophical responses to the logical problem of the Trinity do not divide exhaustively into social models and Latin models. “Relative identity” theorists argue that identity is kind-relative, so the Father can be the same God as the Son without being the same person as the son (van Inwagen 1995). “Constitution” theorists make a similar claim by drawing on the metaphysics of constitution. According to constitution theorists, a lump of bronze can constitute a statue without being identical to it, since we can destroy the statue (by melting it down) without destroying the bronze. So too, they argue, the divine nature can constitute the three divine persons without being identical to them, or without entailing that they are identical to each other (Brower & Rea 2005). The metaphysics of constitution requires a coherent notion of “numerical sameness without identity”. The sharpest criticism of relative identity accounts of the Trinity takes aim at the underlying notion that identity is kind-relative in the relevant sense. Similarly, the sharpest criticism of constitution views expresses doubts about the cogency and usefulness of the metaphysics of constitution (Merricks 2006).
Scott Williams defends a hybrid “Latin social” model of the Trinity on which the Father, Son, and Spirit are each constituted by the single divine nature, without being numerically identical to the divine nature or to any other person (2013, 2017). Unlike other Latin models, on Williams’s account each of the persons is a distinct agent; unlike other social models, they share numerically one set of powers, including one will (2017). Even so, according to Williams, the persons can each token the indexical “I” with different senses. Critics argue that Williams’s model falters at precisely this point (Hasker 2018b; see also S. Williams 2020).
For an extended discussion, see the entry, Trinity.
2.2 Incarnation and Christology
By the close of the fourth century, the early Church had agreed that God the Son, the second person of the Trinity, is no less divine than God the Father. But this Trinitarian settlement led directly to another, equally vexing question: how could Jesus of Nazareth, a human man, also be identical to God the Son? After another period of intense debate, the Church defined the doctrine of the Incarnation, which asserts that Christ is one person (or one hypostasis) who exists in two natures, one fully human, the other fully divine (Tanner 1990: 83; Kelly 1978: 338–343). Yet, as with the doctrine of the Trinity, on its own, this conciliar terminology does not attempt to solve the underlying philosophical problem.
In contemporary philosophy, this problem has been called the “fundamental philosophical problem of Christology”. As Richard Cross puts it:
how is it that one and the same thing could be both divine (and thus, on the face of it, necessary, and necessarily omniscient, omnipotent, eternal, immutable, impassible, and impeccable) and human (and thus, on the face of it, have the complements of all these properties)? (Cross 2009: 453)
In other words, the fundamental philosophical problem of Christology is the problem that arises when a single subject bears incompatible properties. Christ seems to be both necessarily omniscient, as the divine Son, the second person of the Trinity, and yet also limited in knowledge, as the human man, Jesus of Nazareth—and so on for other divine and human attributes. Yet Christ is one person, not two: he just is the divine Son and he just is Jesus of Nazareth. On standard interpretations of logical consistency, nothing can have logically incompatible properties at the same time and in the same respect—hence the problem.
A venerable attempted solution to the problem of incompatible properties makes use of grammatical modifiers to index Christological predications to their respective natures: Christ is limited in knowledge qua his human nature, and omniscient qua his divine nature, where “qua” means “with respect to” or “in virtue of”. More simply: Christ qua human is limited in knowledge; Christ qua divine is omniscient. The thought of Thomas Aquinas furnishes a foundational source for this solution (Summa Theologiae 3.16.1–12; for broader discussion of patristic and medieval uses, see Cross 2002: 192–205). Thomas Senor forcefully argues that this grammatical solution does not work, for it cannot block the relevant entailment: since the one Christ really is human and really is divine, it follows that the one Christ is also limited in knowledge (qua human) and omniscient (qua divine), and so the contradiction remains (Senor 2002; see also Morris 1986).
Kenotic Christologies hold that at the point of incarnation, in order to become a human being, God the Son relinquished the divine attributes (Forrest 2000; Evans 2002, 2006). In a way, the kenotic option neatly solves the problem of incompatible properties, since Christ is not omnipotent and omniscient (etc.) at the same time as he is limited in power and knowledge. Kenotic Christologies have a venerable pedigree, as well as some clear Biblical warrant (Philippians 2; for discussion see Evans 2006; McGuckin 1994 [2004: 189]. But if omnipotence and omniscience are essential divine attributes, then it is not possible for God the Son to relinquish them during the incarnation and regain them after the incarnation while remaining self-identical.
Compositional Christologies try to solve the problem of incompatible properties by appealing to the various “parts” that together compose the whole Christ. According to Thomas V. Morris, Christ is composed of the divine mind of God the Son, a human mind, and a human body. On his telling, Christ counts as fully divine, because he has a divine mind, which is the seat of his omnipotence and omniscience; he also counts as fully human because he has a human mind and a human body (Morris 1986). Morris seeks to dispel the contradiction between divine and human attributes by revising our understanding of Christ’s human attributes. Morris denies that human beings as such are essentially limited in power and knowledge (etc.). This move clears the way for attributing omnipotence and omniscience (etc.) even to the human, incarnate Christ, while also denying that the human, incarnate Christ is limited in power and knowledge. Richard Swinburne (1994) defends a similar Christology, but according to Swinburne, Christ is composed only of God the Son and a human body, which together constitute both a human way of thinking and acting and also a divine way of thinking and acting.
Other compositional Christologies appeal to supposed mereological facts about the incarnation to ground a more sophisticated version of the “qua move” (discussed above). If God the Son has human parts and divine parts, then perhaps the whole mereological composite can borrow properties from its constituent parts without violating the law of non-contradiction. Analogously, we might say that an apple is both colored and not colored, since it is red (colored) with respect to its skin, but white (not colored) with respect to its flesh. There is a sense in which the apple as a whole is both colored and not colored because it borrows properties from its parts. Perhaps something similar can be said about Christ, understood as a mereological composite of God the Son, a human body, and a human soul. Leading advocates of this sort of view include Brian Leftow (1992, 2011) and Eleonore Stump (2002).
Timothy Pawl (2014, 2016) seeks to dispel the fundamental problem by revising the truth conditions of Christological predications like “Christ is omniscient” and “Christ is limited in knowledge”. According to Pawl, it is incorrect that “being omniscient” and “being limited in knowledge” are logically contradictory properties at all. In fact, according to Pawl, once we correctly understand their truth conditions, we can see that they can both be true of the same subject after all. On Pawl’s account, “Christ is omniscient” is true just in case Christ has a nature that is omniscient and “Christ is limited in knowledge” is true just in case Christ has a nature that is limited in knowledge. Because Christ, and only Christ (so far as we know) has two natures, only Christ can be both omniscient and limited in knowledge. At first glance, Pawl’s proposed solution might seem to be the “qua move” once again, in different dress. But it is importantly different: Pawl is content to affirm the very entailments (e.g., “Christ is omniscient and limited in knowledge”) that the qua move seeks to block; he simply denies that this entailment is logically contradictory.
Jc Beall goes a step further and argues that some predicates really are both true and false of Christ, because Christ really is a contradictory being (2019, 2021). Beall defends a contradictory Christology because he accepts a non-standard model of logic, one on which some predicates can be neither true nor false of a subject, and other predicates can be both true and false of a subject. According to Beall, logic as such—that is, his favored account of logic—is neutral about whether any given substantive theory contains true contradictions. To determine whether it does, we must examine the theory’s axiomatic statements. When we examine the axioms of orthodox Christology, according to Beall, we find that they include authoritative conciliar statements that are most naturally read as contradictory—e.g., “Christ is passible and impassible” (2019: 415). Rather than revise or reinterpret such statements so that they are not contradictory, we should accept that they are.
2.3 Atonement and Salvation
Arguably, the deepest and most fundamental Christian affirmation is that Christ saves. In traditional terminology, another way to express the same affirmation is that Christ “atones” for the sins of human beings. Unlike the doctrines of the Trinity and the Incarnation, however, the early Church never formally defined a single orthodox account of exactly how Christ saves or what it is about his life, death, and resurrection that accomplishes that saving work. As a result, a variety of theories or models of atonement have proliferated throughout the centuries. Contemporary work in analytic philosophical theology typically builds on these models, reformulates them in contemporary language, and seeks to defend them from criticism.
Satisfaction models argue that as a result of their sinfulness, human beings have a debt or obligation to God that they cannot possibly repay. By becoming incarnate, living a sinless life, and voluntarily dying for the sake of humanity, Christ successfully discharges the debts and obligations that human beings owe to God. Anselm’s “Why God Became Human” (Cur deus homo) is the locus classicus for the satisfaction theory, which has more recently been defended by Swinburne (1988). Closely related to satisfaction models, penal substitution models claim that human beings deserve punishment from God as a result of their sinfulness. Christ saves by freely agreeing to be punished in their place. Mark Murphy (2009) proposes a similar model of “vicarious punishment”, on which Christ’s suffering actually counts as the required punishment for guilty human beings, since knowing that a loved one suffers in one’s place is itself a form of punishment.
Satisfaction and penal substitution theorists must explain why a perfectly merciful God would require satisfaction or punishment from human beings at all, and why a perfectly just God would allow an innocent person to play the required role (Porter 2004). Accordingly, satisfaction and penal substitution views have been heavily criticized by modern and contemporary theologians for depicting God as a petty, wrathful tyrant. Adolph von Harnack’s nineteenth-century criticism of Anselm remains representative. According to Harnack, Anselm’s account depends on a
mythological conception of God as the mighty private man, who is incensed at the injury done to His honor and does not forego His wrath till He has received an at least adequately great equivalent. (1899: 77)
More recently, feminist theologians and philosophers have criticized satisfaction and penal substitution views for valorizing suffering (Brown and Parker 1989).
Eleonore Stump (2018) argues that typical satisfaction and penal substitution accounts cannot address the sinner’s persistent dispositions toward wrongdoing and concomitant feelings of shame. She dubs her positive proposal the “Marian” interpretation of atonement, and argues that it can explain how sinners are freed from shame and restored to fellowship with God. The proposal defies easy summary but it advances an account of atonement as union with God that is further explained using second-personal, psychological notions like “mind-reading” and empathy (2018: 138–139). Christ on the cross mind-reads—that is, psychically experiences—the mental states of every human sinner. Sinful human beings are thereby united to Christ, and so to God. When the indwelling Holy Spirit leads sinners to respond to Christ with love, they also will what God wills. The resulting state of union with God also heals the stain on the soul that is the sinner’s shame.
Several other models, also prominent in the Patristic and medieval tradition, have so far received little attention from analytic philosophers of religion. These include “ransom” theories on which human beings are freed from Satan’s grasp, and especially “theosis” or “divinization” accounts of atonement and salvation, on which Christ’s saving work consists in perfecting human beings so that they become as divine as a creature can be. (Jacobs 2009 and Mosser 2021 are important exceptions). Similarly, few contemporary philosophers defend the modern “moral exemplar” model, on which Christ saves by being a perfect moral example for other human beings to imitate. (Quinn 1993 offers a highly qualified defense, but holds that Christ is more than just a moral exemplar).
2.4 Sin, Original Sin, and the Fall
The doctrine of sin and the doctrine of atonement are correlative in the same way that a disease and its remedy are correlative. If sin is that from which Christ saves us, then the strength of the remedy (atonement) must vary according the severity of the disease (sin). As a first approximation, a sinful act can be thought of as a morally bad act for which the sinner is responsible. But the language of “sin” adds something to the language of moral wrongdoing: a sin is a failure or fault with respect to God. Like other Christian doctrines, the doctrine of sin poses tricky philosophical problems. To see those problems more clearly, it is useful to disambiguate the doctrine of sin into several distinct components: the first sin, the Fall, original sin, and personal sin.
For extended discussion, see the entry sin in Christian thought.
2.4.1 The First Sin
The problem of the first sin is the problem of how the very first sinful act is even possible, given various Christian axioms about the goodness and creative power of God, and various philosophical assumptions about the nature of freedom and moral responsibility. The problem of the first sin is sometimes treated as a question about the fall of Satan. It turns out to be surprisingly difficult to explain how Satan—by hypothesis, an angel created by God with a rational intellect, an upright will, and wholly good desires and dispositions—could ever make the sinful choice to reject God. Augustine (City of God, Book 12), Anselm (“On the Fall of the Devil” De casu diaboli), and Duns Scotus (Ordinatio 2, dist. 6, q. 2 ) all wrestle with this problem. Contemporary philosophers who try to improve on their efforts include Barnwell (2009, 2017), MacDonald (1999), Rogers (2008), and Timpe (2012). Their responses all seek to explain how Satan’s choice is metaphysically possible, by appealing to their own favored accounts of human freedom and conscious attention. Wood (2016) further distinguishes between the “hard problem” of how Satan’s sinful choice is metaphysically possible, and the “harder problem” of how it can be subjectively rational—rational from the point of view of Satan himself.
2.4.2 The Fall of Adam and Eve
The biblical story of Adam and Eve (Genesis 3) recounts the story of the first human sin and its consequences. The traditional story of the fall of Adam and Eve does not seem consistent with either an evolutionary account of human origins or what we know about human history more generally. On some understandings, questions about the historicity of the Fall are not properly philosophical questions at all. Yet it does seem like a properly philosophical task to articulate a doctrine of the fall that is both internally consistent and consistent with other things we know to be true. Moreover, the doctrine of the Fall is conceptually connected to other aspects of the doctrine of sin as well as to the doctrine of salvation.
Peter van Inwagen presents an account of the Fall that maintains many of its most important elements and, he claims, is consistent with evolutionary theory. Importantly, van Inwagen does not assert that this account is true, but only “true for all we know” (2004). In a similar vein, Hud Hudson (2014) offers an ingenious defense of a literal reading of the Genesis account that appeals to contemporary “growing block” theories of time. Despite initial impressions, neither van Inwagen nor Hudson are really concerned with defending quasi-literal readings of Genesis. Instead, they want to show that objections to those readings presuppose highly contestable philosophical—rather than empirical or scientific—assumptions.
2.4.3 Original Sin
In Christian theology, “original sin” in the strictest sense refers to the human condition after the Fall and not to the first human sin itself. The fall is the cause of the condition of original sin: because of Adam and Eve’s sin, subsequent human beings somehow “inherit” a disposition toward sin and an attraction toward evil that makes it inevitable that they will sin. On some stronger interpretations, all subsequent human beings are also justly regarded as guilty by God from birth, even before they have sinned themselves. Even apart from worries about the historicity of the fall, the philosophical challenges posed by this doctrine are obvious. How can people living now be morally responsible for the sins of the first human beings? What is the mechanism by which sin and guilt are “inherited” from past generations? If it is inevitable that all human beings will sin, can God justly punish them?
Some Christian philosophers have simply rejected the stronger versions of the doctrine of original sin as incoherent. Swinburne, for instance, denies that all human beings are born guilty as a result of the sin of their first parents and argues that the condition of original sin only makes it very likely, rather than inevitable, that they will sin themselves (1989: 141–43). Other philosophers have attempted to show that even a strong doctrine of original sin can be philosophically coherent, given the right metaphysical framework. Michael Rea, for instance, draws on fission theory and the metaphysics of temporal parts to suggest a way that contemporary humans might bear responsibility for the sin of Adam by virtue of being counterparts or stages of Adam himself (2007). He also argues that a Molinist-inspired doctrine of “transworld depravity” might accomplish much of what Christians want from the traditional doctrine of original sin (2007). John Mullen (2007) also constructs a Molinist account of original sin and inherited guilt. On Molinism, God knows all the true counterfactuals of creaturely freedom, which means that God knows every free choice that every human being would make in every possible situation. According to Mullen, if it were true that every free creature would sin in an ideal, garden of Eden situation, then God could justly punish them in the actual world for what they would have done in that counterfactual world.
2.4.4 Personal Sin
“Personal sin” refers to individual sinful acts. Because the philosophical problems associated with personal sin initially seem very similar to the problems associated with moral wrongdoing, there has been comparatively little philosophical work on personal sin. Still, important definitional questions remain about exactly how, if at all, sin should be distinguished from moral wrongdoing, whether there are sinful actions that are not immoral actions, and, conversely, whether there are immoral actions that are not sinful (Mitchell 1984; Dalferth 1984; Adams 1991; Couenhoven 2009).
2.5 Other Topics
There are philosophical questions raised by nearly all Christian doctrines and practices, and so there are many fertile areas of inquiry that still remain comparatively underexplored. This brief survey has focused on the most widely treated areas of analytic philosophical theology. But some of the most creative work has branched out into other domains including the Eucharist (Arcadi 2018; Pickup 2015); liturgy, ritual, and worship (Cuneo 2016); bodily resurrection and personal identity (van Inwagen 1978; Merricks 1999; Zimmerman 1999; Rudder Baker 2001); heaven (Walls 2002; Ribeiro 2011), hell (Walls 1992; Adams 1993; Kvanvig 1993; Sider 2002; Buckareff & Plug 2005) and purgatory (Walls 2011; Dumsday 2014).
2.6 The Rise of “Analytic Theology”
In 2009 Oliver Crisp and Michael Rea published their edited volume Analytic Theology: New Essays in the Philosophy of Theology. The volume’s contributors collectively try to make the case that analytic philosophy offers a valuable and neglected resource for Christian theologians. A new research program developed in its wake, and the ensuing years have seen the rise of a self-identified school of “analytic theologians”, who use the tools and methods of analytic philosophy to address Christian theological topics.
At present, it is not clear whether there is any meaningful difference between Christian “analytic theology” and Christian “philosophical theology”, which has been treated as a kind of philosophy. As the discussion above indicates, analytic philosophical theology has been produced largely by Christian philosophers working in philosophy departments, rather than by theologians in departments of theology or divinity schools. Classic works of philosophical theology like Swinburne (1994) and Adams (2000) seem like analytic theology avant la lettre, for example, and much recent work called “analytic theology” seems quite similar to previous work called “philosophical theology” or even “philosophy of religion” (e.g., Mullins 2016). Yet some self-described analytic theologians have also insisted that Christian analytic theology is really a form of theology (Torrance [Alan] 2013; Torrance [Andrew] 2019; Crisp, Arcadi, & Wessling 2019). They emphasize that Christian analytic theology is an internal project of faith seeking understanding that, as theology, holds itself accountable to scripture and Church tradition. Yet whether Christian analytic theology is properly regarded as a kind of philosophy or a kind of theology depends on how we draw the underlying distinction between philosophy and theology—if indeed we draw such a distinction at all.
3. Philosophy of Religion, Philosophical Theology, Christian Theology: Is There A Difference and Does it Matter?
It might seem odd that analytic philosophy of religion (APR) includes explicitly Christian philosophical theology of the sort discussed in Section 2. Yet most philosophers of religion working in the analytic tradition are Christian theists (Bourget & Chalmers 2014; De Cruz 2017). They avowedly want to explore their faith using analytic philosophical tools, and see no problem in calling their work Christian philosophy, philosophical theology, or more recently, “analytic theology”. Of course, philosophy of religion as such is broader than APR, and APR is broader than Christian APR. There are philosophers of religion whose work is analytic but not Christian (e.g., Lebens 2020; Mizrahi 2020; Steinhart 2020; Oppy 2018; Schellenberg 2018; Draper 2019), Christian but not analytic (e.g., Westphal 2001; Pattison 2011), and neither analytic nor Christian (e.g., Hammerschlag 2016; Burley 2016). Even so, the predominance of Christian philosophical theology—or “Plantinga-style Christian philosophy” (Schellenberg 2018)—within APR has recently reopened some contentious debates about the proper relationship between philosophy and Christian theology.
These debates can be grouped around two different—and opposing—lines of criticism. According to the first line, much APR is too Christian and too theological: not really philosophy at all, but a thinly-disguised form of Christian theology—perhaps even a form of apologetics (Levine 2000; Knepper 2013: 9; Draper 2019: 2). Conversely, according to the second line, advanced by prominent theologians, APR is neither fully Christian nor fully theological. On this line of criticism, APR does not really wrestle with the transcendent God of Christian faith, but tends to construct and examine its own false “God of the philosophers” (Milbank 2009; Hart 2013; Oliver 2010; see also Harris & Insole 2005, 17). Although mutually opposing, both lines of criticism raise an important methodological question: how—if at all—should we distinguish philosophy about Christian topics from Christian theology? Section 1 (above) surveyed important responses to this question in the history of Christian thought. This section addresses the question in the context of contemporary challenges to analytic philosophy of religion.
3.1 Analytic Philosophy of Religion: Too Theological?
The charge that APR is “too theological” can be disambiguated into two distinct worries. The first worry concerns the scope of APR when considered as a whole: APR is too narrow, because it focuses excessively on Christian theological topics, to the exclusion of other equally important matters. The second worry concerns the sources and methods of Christian APR specifically: the sources and methods of Christian APR belong more properly to theology than to philosophy.
3.1.1 Narrowness of Scope?
The charge that APR as a discipline is “too Christian” or “too theological” could be understood as a worry about its scope: perhaps APR focuses too much on Christian theological topics, or at least on versions of monotheism that are compatible with Christianity, and is therefore too narrow in scope. Critics who advance the narrowness worry include Trakakis 2008, Wildman 2010, Knepper 2013, Schilbrack 2014, Lewis 2015, Jones 2019, Draper 2019, Timpe & Hereth 2019, Mizrahi 2020. Although the narrowness worry has wide currency, it is not always clear how to understand it as a properly philosophical criticism. This problem is exacerbated by the fact that the narrowness worry is more often aimed at the field of APR as a whole, rather than at individual instances of APR. After all, the general claim that APR is “too Christian” does not entail that any specific argument of any specific philosopher is unsound. Similarly, even if it is true that APR as a whole should be “less Christian”, it is hard to see why that fact would require any individual philosopher to change her research and teaching focus (Schilbrack 2014: 12).
Still, some versions of the narrowness worry are more philosophical than others. According to more philosophical versions, Christian APR frequently fails as philosophy: as a result of their Christian-theological biases, analytic philosophers of religion inadvertently make bad arguments. On this line, Christian analytic philosophers are especially likely to engage in motivated reasoning and ignore counter-arguments or alternative points of view drawn from other religious traditions. Because APR is so narrow, Christian philosophers unwittingly work in an echo-chamber or an epistemic bubble (Schilbrack 2014: 14; Draper 2019: 5; De Cruz 2020). As a result, according to critics, the conclusions of their putatively philosophical arguments are often unwarranted for anyone outside the Christian community, even when they purport to be generally probative.
Less philosophical versions of the narrowness worry assert the general principle that APR should be more capacious, and should include more non-Christian voices, without explicitly challenging the soundness of specific analytic arguments (Knepper 2013; Carroll 2016; Mizrahi 2020). Here the worry is simply that APR does not—but should—reflect the diversity of religious and non-religious viewpoints that actually obtain in the world. Phrased differently, APR as a field wrongly excludes too much good philosophical work that just happens not to fit into the dominant Christian, monotheistic paradigm. Yet one can hold this view without also agreeing that existing APR fails on its own terms or that any specific philosophers should alter their practices.
3.1.2 Inappropriate Methods?
The charge that APR is too theological could also be understood as a question about philosophical methodology. On this version of the charge, Christian APR does not begin from generally accessible assumptions and argue toward generally acceptable conclusions, as good philosophy should. Instead, it typically begins from Christian assumptions and argues toward Christian conclusions, like theology.
J.L. Schellenberg, for example, argues that philosophy must seek solutions to philosophical problems that are in principle “shareable” by any member of the philosophical community. Because much Christian APR assumes the truth of Christianity, its solutions cannot satisfy this condition, and should properly count as theology rather than philosophy (Schellenberg 2018). J. Aaron Simmons agrees: even though theology “can and should” appeal to evidence restricted to “determinate communities defined by revelational authorities”, philosophy should appeal to “evidence that is, in principle, accessible by all members of the philosophical community” (2019: 147). According to Simmons, the dominant strand of APR has ignored this criterion, and threatens to “become simply a subset of Christian theological practice” (2019: 149; see also Oppy 2018; Draper 2019: 2).
3.1.3 Responses to the Worry that APR is “Too Theological”
Analytic philosophers of religion have a variety of ways to respond to the charge that APR is too theological. First, with respect to the narrowness charge, they can accuse critics of mistaking the part for the whole, by denying that the charge applies to APR as such, and by pointing to those analytic philosophers of religion who neither assume nor defend the truth of Christianity. Yet this response is undercut by the fact that non-Christian practitioners of APR often make the narrowness themselves (Schellenberg 2018; Oppy 2018; Draper 2019). Second, its defenders also emphasize that much Christian APR does not actually assume the truth of Christianity at all, but instead argues for that truth. (Hasker 2018a: 90; citing Swinburne is a paradigmatic example). This kind of philosophy would clear even Schellenberg’s “shareable in principle” bar. Similarly, even those philosophical projects that eschew Swinburne-style natural theology might still clear the “sharable in principle” bar so long as they engage only in defensive maneuvers—for example, by answering philosophical objections to the plausibility of Christian claims (e.g., van Inwagen 1995; Pawl 2014).
Others argue that even explicit appeals to Christian revelation could in principle still count as philosophical appeals, albeit indirectly. Suppose we agree that theology can appeal to revelation, while philosophy trades only in “generally accessible” arguments. We still must distinguish between direct, first-order appeals to revelation, and indirect, second-order arguments that it is sometimes permissible to appeal to revelation (Wood 2021: 213–215). The second-order arguments could still be generally accessible philosophical arguments, even though the first-order appeals are not. For example, a first-order “theological” appeal might be: “The New Testament asserts p; therefore p”. But a philosopher might offer a general epistemological argument, accessible to anyone in the philosophical community, to defend the rationality of that same first-order appeal. (For example, she might offer a general argument that it is rational to form beliefs based on testimony, and the same general argument might establish that it is rational to treat the New Testament as testimonial evidence.) In a similar vein, Plantinga’s claim that belief in God may be “properly basic” is not itself presented as a Christian assumption or a revealed truth, but as a specific application of his general philosophical theory of warrant, which he has defended at length (1983, 1993a, 1993b).
Finally, because there is no single uncontested way to understand the boundaries between philosophy and theology, it is open to Christian philosophers of religion simply to deny the sharp distinction presupposed by critics like Schellenberg and Simmons (see, for example, Plantinga 1984, Wolterstorff 2009). In so doing, they would implicitly endorse a more Patristic “Integration” model instead of either the Medieval “Cooperation” model or the modern “Disjunction” model (see Section 2 above).
3.2 Or Not Theological Enough? Theological Critiques of Analytic Philosophy of Religion
While one set of critics accuse APR of becoming too theological, another set takes the opposite line. According to several prominent theologians and philosophers, something about the analytic style of philosophizing makes APR particularly unsuitable for investigating Christian doctrines. On this line of criticism, far from becoming a species of Christian theology, APR is constitutively opposed to Christian theology, and the problem with analytic philosophical theology is not that it is too theological but that it is too analytic. This criticism takes several forms.
Sometimes, theological objections to APR simply reiterate Barthian objections to natural theology, presumably on the assumption that most APR is really a form of natural theology (Moore 2007). Other critics charge analytic philosophers of religion with historical anachronism and ignorance of the Christian tradition. Perhaps “a-historical” analytic philosophers of religion do not understand pre-modern ways of thinking and reading (so runs the charge), and so they wrongly believe that their own constructive work is congruent with the historic Christian tradition, when it in fact depends modern assumptions that are inimical to the Christian tradition (Hart 2013: 123, 129; Milbank 2009: 320). Other critics press the related worry that APR ignores the real Christian tradition altogether in favor of theorizing its own abstract, self-constructed version of the Christian god. Here APR
does not deal with the God of any tradition or encounter, but with a conceptual construct, a simulacrum or ‘the God of the philosophers’…. (Oliver 2010: 467–468; see also Hyman 2010)
Another multi-faceted line of theological criticism criticizes APR for “idolatry”, “univocity”, and “ontotheology”. This line reflects the general worry that APR does not take divine mystery or transcendence seriously enough. “Ontotheology” is a theological term of opprobrium that, in its current usage, derives from Heidegger (1957; see also Marion 1982 ). It means, roughly, treating God like “a being” or “a thing in the world”. According to its theological critics, APR constitutively assumes that God is a possible object of human knowledge, even apart from revelation, and therefore treats God as fundamentally similar to any other object “out there” passively waiting to be discovered. Yet a God like this (so runs the worry) is not really God at all, but something else—an idol.
The worry about ontotheology and idolatry is also a worry about univocity—the view that our terms bear the same meaning when applied to God and creatures (Trakakis 2010). According to opponents of theological univocity, precisely because God is not “a being” or a “thing in the world”, God and creatures differ absolutely; they share no properties and so cannot be described by univocal predications. (So, e.g., the word “good” cannot have the same meaning in the statements “God is good”, and “Socrates is good”.) Worries about theological predication and univocity date back to the Patristic period, but in contemporary philosophy of religion, they are best understood as continuations of the late medieval disputes between followers of Duns Scotus, who defends univocal predication, and his Thomist opponents (T. Williams 2005; Burrell 2008; Cross 2008). As a generalization, most contemporary analytic philosophers of religion endorse a univocal account of theological language, whereas contemporary Christian theologians are more likely to deny univocity in favor of analogical or metaphorical predication, or even non-predicative forms of theological language (Pickstock 2005; Marion 1999).
Notwithstanding the sharp rhetoric, there has been very little direct engagement between analytic philosophers of religion and their theological opponents on these questions. T. Williams (2005), Cross (2008) defend univocal predication, and Adams (2014) tries to rehabilitate ontotheology. Other analytic thinkers offer their own positive accounts of divine transcendence (Crisp and Rea [eds.] 2009: 9–11; Rea 2015, 2020; Jacobs 2015). More generally, analytic philosophers and theologians have a variety of strategies for avoiding the deleterious consequences of univocity and ontotheology (Wood 2021: 130–74).
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- –––, 2007, Anselm of Canterbury: Basic Writings, Thomas Williams (tr. and ed.), Indianapolis, IN: Hackett.
- Aquinas, Thomas, Summa Theologiae. Translated in Brian J. Shanley, OP (tr. and ed.), Summa Theologiae: The Treatise on the Divine Nature, Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 2006.
- –––, Summa Contra Gentiles. Translated in Antony Pegis (tr.), Summa Contra Gentiles: Book I, New York: Hanover House, 1955.
- Arcadi, James M., 2018, An Incarnational Model of the Eucharist, New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/9781108588560
- Augustine of Hippo, Against Julian [Contra Julianum]. Translated in Matthew A. Schumacher (tr.), Against Julian, Vol. 55, The Fathers of The Church, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press, 1957.
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Other Internet Resources
- Murray, Michael and Michael Rea, “Philosophy and Christian Theology”, Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2021 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/fall2021/entries/christiantheology-philosophy/>. [This was the previous entry on this topic in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy — see the version history.]