A Trinity doctrine is commonly expressed as the statement that the one God exists as or in three equally divine “Persons”, the Father, the Son, and the Holy Spirit. Every term in this statement (God, exists, as or in, equally divine, Person) has been variously understood. The guiding principle has been the creedal declaration that the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit of the New Testament are consubstantial (i.e. the same in substance or essence, Greek: homoousios). Because this shared substance or essence is a divine one, this is understood to imply that all three named individuals are divine, and equally so. Yet the three in some sense “are” the one God of the Bible.
After its formulation and imperial enforcement towards the end of the fourth century, this sort of Christian theology reigned more or less unchallenged. But before this, and again in post-Reformation modernity, the origin, meaning, and justification of trinitarian doctrine has been repeatedly disputed. These debates are discussed in supplementary documents to this entry. One aspect of these debates concerns the self-consistency of trinitarian theology. If there are three who are equally divine, isn’t that to say there are at least three gods? Yet the tradition asserts exactly one god. Is the tradition, then, incoherent, and so self-refuting? Since the revival of analytic philosophy of religion in the 1960s, many Christian philosophers have pursued what is now called analytic theology, in which religious doctrines are given formulations which are precise, and it is hoped self-consistent and otherwise defensible. This article surveys these recent “rational reconstructions” of the Trinity doctrine, which employ concepts from contemporary analytic metaphysics, logic, and epistemology.
- 1. One-self Theories
- 2. Three-self Theories
- 3. Four-self, No-self, and Indeterminate Self Theories
- 4. Mysterianism
- 5. Beyond Coherence
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Additional material related to this entry can be found in three supplementary documents:
1. One-self Theories
One-self theories assert the Trinity, despite initial appearances, to contain exactly one self.
1.1 Selves, gods, and modes
A self is a being who is in principle capable of knowledge, intentional action, and interpersonal relationships. A deity is commonly understood to be a sort of extraordinary self. In the Bible, the deity Yahweh (a.k.a. “the LORD”) commands, forgives, controls history, predicts the future, occasionally appears in humanoid form, enters into covenants with human beings, and sends prophets, whom he even allows to argue with him. More than a common deity in a pantheon of deities, he is portrayed as being the one creator of the cosmos, and as having uniquely great power, knowledge, and goodness.
Trinitarians hold this revelation of the one God as a great self to have been either supplemented or superseded by later revelation which shows the one God in some sense to be three “Persons.” (Greek: hypostaseis or prosopa, Latin: personae) But if these divine Persons are selves, then the claim is that there are three divine selves, which would seem to be three gods. Some Trinity theories understand the Persons to be selves, and then try to show that the falsity of monotheism does not follow. (See section 2 below.) But a rival approach is to explain that these three divine Persons are really ways the one divine self is, that is to say, modes of the one god. In current terms, one reduces all but one of the three or four apparent divine selves (Father, Son, Spirit, the triune God) to the remaining one. One of these four is the one god, and the others are his modes. Because the New Testament seems to portray the Son and Spirit as somehow subordinate to the one God, one-self Trinity theories always either reduce Father, Son, and Spirit to modes of the one, triune God, or reduce the Son and Spirit to modes of the Father, who is supposed to be numerically identical to the one God. (See section 1.8 for views on which only the Holy Spirit is reduced to a mode of God, that is, the Father.)
Because God in the Bible is portrayed as a great self, at the popular level of trinitarian Christianity one-self thinking has a firm hold. Liturgical statements, song lyrics, and sermons frequently use trinitarian names (“Father”, “Son”, “Jesus”, “God”, etc.) as if they were interchangeable, co-referring terms, referring directly or indirectly (via a mode) to one and the same divine self.
1.2 What is a mode?
But, what is a “mode”? It is a “way a thing is”, but that might mean several things. A “mode of X” might be
- an intrinsic property of X (e.g., a power of X, an action of X)
- a relation that X bears to some thing or things (e.g., X’s loving itself, X’s being greater than Y, X appearing wonderful to Y and to Z)
- a state of affairs or event which includes X (e.g., X loving Y, it being the case that X is great)
One-self trinitarians often seem to have in mind the last of these. (E.g., The Son is the event of God’s relating to us as friend and savior. Or the Son is the event of God’s taking on flesh and living and dying to reveal the Father to humankind. Or the Son is the eternal event or state of affairs of God’s living in a son-like way.) If an event is (in the simplest case) a substance (thing) having a property (or a relation) at a time, then the Son (etc.) will be identified with God’s having a certain property, or being in a certain relation, at a time (or timelessly). By a natural slide of thought and language, the Son (or Spirit) may just be thought of and spoken of as a certain divine property, rather than God’s having of it (e.g., God’s wisdom).
Modes may be essential to the thing or not; a mode may be something a thing could exist without, or something which it must always have so long as it exists. (Or on another way to understand the essential/non-essential distinction, a mode may belong to a thing’s definition or not.)
There are three ways these modes of an eternal being may be temporally related to one another: maximally overlapping, non-overlapping, or partially overlapping. First, they may be eternally concurrent—such that this being always, or timelessly, has all of them. Second, they may be strictly sequential (non-overlapping): first the being has only one, then only another, then only another. Finally, some of the modes may be had at the same times, partially overlapping in time.
1.3 One-self Theories and “Modalism” in Theology
Influential 20th century theologians Karl Barth (1886–1968) and Karl Rahner (1904–84) endorse one-self Trinity theories, and suggest replacements for the term “Person”. They argue that in modern times “person” has come to mean a self. But three divine selves would be three gods. Hence, even if “Person” should be retained as traditional, its meaning in the context of the Trinity should be expounded using phrases like “modes of being” (Barth) or “manners of subsisting” (Rahner) (Ovey 2008, 203–13; Rahner 1997, 42–5, 103–15).
Barth’s own summary of his position is:
As God is in Himself Father from all eternity, He begets Himself as the Son from all eternity. As He is the Son from all eternity, He is begotten of Himself as the Father from all eternity. In this eternal begetting of Himself and being begotten of Himself, He posits Himself a third time as the Holy Spirit, that is, as the love which unites Him in Himself. (Barth 1956, 1)
All of Barth’s capitalized pronouns here refer to one and the same self, the self-revealing God, eternally existing in three ways. Similarly, Rahner says that God
…is – at once and necessarily – the unoriginate who mediates himself to himself (Father), the one who is in truth uttered for himself (Son), and the one who is received and accepted in love for himself (Spirit) – and… as a result of this, he [i.e. God] is the one who can freely communicate himself. (Rahner 1997, 101–2)
Similarly, theologian Alastair McGrath writes that
…when we talk about God as one person, we mean one person in the modern sense of the word [i.e. a self], and when we talk about God as three persons, we mean three persons in the ancient sense of the word [i.e. a persona or role that is played]. (McGrath 1988, 131)
All three theologians are assuming that the three modes of God are all essential and maximally overlapping.
Mainstream Christian theologians nearly always reject “modalism”, meaning a one-self theory like that of Sabellius (fl. 220), an obscure figure who was thought to teach that the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit are sequential, non-essential modes, something like ways God interacts with his creation. Thus, in one epoch, God exists in the mode of Father, during the first century he exists as Son, and then after Christ’s resurrection and ascension, he exists as Holy Spirit (Leftow 2004, 327; McGrath 2007, 254–5; Pelikan 1971, 179). Sabellian modalism is usually rejected on the grounds that such modes are strictly sequential, or because they are not intrinsic features of God, or because they are intrinsic but not essential features of God. The first aspect of Sabellian modalism conflicts with episodes in the New Testament where the three appear simultaneously, such as the Baptism of Jesus in Matthew 3:16–7. The last two are widely held to be objectionable because it is held that a doctrine of the Trinity should tell us about how God really is, not merely about how God appears, or because a trinitarian doctrine should express (some of) God’s essence. Sabellian and other ancient modalists are sometimes called “monarchians” because they upheld the sole monarchy of the Father, or “patripassians” for their (alleged) acceptance of the view that the Father (and not only the Son) suffered in the life of the man Jesus.
While Sabellian one-self theories were rejected for the reasons above, these reasons don’t rule out all one-self Trinity theories, such as ones positing the Three as God’s modes in the sense of his eternally having certain intrinsic and essential features. Sometimes the Trinity doctrine is expounded by theologians as meaning just this, the creedal formulas being interpreted as asserting that God (non-contingently) acts as Creator, Redeemer, and Comforter, or describing “God as transcendent abyss, God as particular yet unbounded intelligence, and God as the immanent creative energy of being… three distinct ways of being God”, with the named modes being intrinsic and essential to God, and not mere ways that God appears (Ward 2002, 236; cf. Ward 2000, 90; Ward 2015).
1.4 Trinity as Incoherent
The simplest sort of one-self theory affirms that God is, because omniscient, omnipotent, and omnibenevolent, the one divine self, and each Person of the Trinity just is that same self. The “Athanasian” creed (on which see section 5.3) seems to imply that each Person just is God, even while being distinct from the other two Persons. Since the high middle ages trinitarians have used a diagram of this sort to explain the teaching that God is a Trinity.
If each occurrence of “is” here expresses numerical identity, commonly expressed in modern logical notation as “=” then the chart illustrates these claims:
- Father = God
- Son = God
- Spirit = God
- Father ≠ Son
- Son ≠ Spirit
- Spirit ≠ Father
But the conjunction of these claims, which has been called “popular Latin trinitarianism”, is demonstrably incoherent (Tuggy 2003a, 171; Layman 2016, 138–9). Because the numerical identity relation is defined as transitive and symmetrical, claims 1–3 imply the denials of 4–6. If 1–6 are steps in an argument, that argument can continue thus:
- God = Son (from 2, by the symmetry of =)
- Father = Son (from 1, 4, by the transitivity of =)
- God = Spirit (from 3, by the symmetry of =)
- Son = Spirit (from 2, 6, by the transitivity of =)
- God = Father (from 1, by the symmetry of =)
- Spirit = Father (from 3, 7, the transitivity of =)
This shows that 1–3 imply the denials of 4–6, namely, 8, 10, and 12. Any Trinity doctrine which implies all of 1–6 is incoherent. To put the matter differently: it is self-evident that things which are numerically identical to the same thing must also be numerically identical to one another. Thus, if each Person just is God, that collapses the Persons into one and the same thing. But then a trinitarian must also say that the Persons are numerically distinct from one another.
But none of this is news to the Trinity theorists whose work is surveyed in this entry. Each theory here is built with a view towards undermining the above argument. In other words, each theorist discussed here, with the exception of some mysterians (see section 4.2), denies that “the doctrine of the Trinity”, rightly understood, implies all of 1–6.
1.5 Divine Life Streams
Brian Leftow sets the agenda for his own one-self theory in an attack on “social”, that is, multiple-self theories. (See sections 2 and 3.1 below.) In contrast to these, he asserts that
…there is just one divine being (or substance), God…[As Thomas Aquinas says,] God begotten receives numerically the same nature God begetting has. To make Aquinas’ claim perfectly plain, I introduce a technical term, “trope”. Abel and Cain were both human. So they had the same nature, humanity. Yet each also had his own nature, and Cain’s humanity was not identical with Abel’s… A trope is an individualized case of an attribute. Their bearers individuate tropes: Cain’s humanity is distinct from Abel’s just because it is Cain’s, not Abel’s. With this term in hand, I now restate Aquinas’ claim: while Father and Son instance the divine nature (deity), they have but one trope of deity between them, which is God’s…bearers individuate tropes. If the Father’s deity is God’s, this is because the Father just is God. (1999, 203–4)
Leftow characterizes his one-self Trinity theory as “Latin”, following the recent practice of contrasting Western or Latin with Eastern or Greek or “social” Trinity theories. Leftow considers his theory to be in the lineage of some prominent Latin-language theorists. (See the supplementary document on the history of trinitarian doctrines, section 3.3.2, on Augustine, and section 4.1, on Thomas Aquinas.) In a later discussion Leftow adds that this Trinity theory needn’t commit to trope theory about properties. Rather, whether or not properties are tropes, “…the Father’s having deity = [is numerically identical to] the Son’s having deity. For both are at bottom just God’s having deity.” (Leftow 2007, 358)
Leftow makes an extended analogy with time travel; just as a dancer may repeatedly time travel back to the dance stage, resulting in a whole chorus line of dancers, so God may eternally live his life in three “streams” or “strands” (2004, 312–23). Each Person-constituting “strand” of God’s life is supposed to (in some sense) count as a “complete” life (although for any one of the three, there’s more to God’s life than it) (2004, 312). Just as the many stages of the time-traveling dancer’s life are united into stages of her by their being causally connected in the right way, so too, analogously, the lives of each of the three Persons count as being the “strands of” the life of God, because of the mysterious but somehow causal inter-trinitarian relations (the Father generating the Son, and the Father and the Son spirating the Spirit) (313–4, cf. 321–2, Leftow 2012a, 313).
Time-travel does not require that entities are four-dimensional (2012b, 337). If a single dancer, then, time travels to the past to dance with herself, this does not amount to one temporal part of her dancing with a different temporal part of her. If that were so, neither dancer would be identical to the (whole, temporally extended) woman. But Leftow supposes that both would be identical to her, and so would not be merely her temporal parts. He holds that if time travel is possible, a self may have multiple instances or iterations at a time. His theory is that the Trinity is like this, subtracting out the time dimension. God, in timeless eternity, lives out three lives, or we might say exists in three aspects. In one he’s Father, in another Son, and in another the Holy Spirit. But they are all one self, one God, as it were three times repeated or multiplied.
Leftow argues that his theory isn’t any undesirable form of “modalism” (i.e. a heretical one-self theory) because
Nothing in my account of the Trinity precludes saying that the Persons’ distinction is an eternal, necessary, non-successive and intrinsic feature of God’s life, one which would be there even if there were no creatures. (2004, 327)
Leftow wants to show what is wrong with the following argument (2004, 305–6; cf. 2007, 359):
- the Father = God
- the Son = God
- God = God
- the Father = the Son (from 1–3)
- the Father generates the Son
- God generates God (from 1, 2, 5).
Creedal orthodoxy requires 1–3 and 5, yet 1–3 imply the unorthodox 4, and 1, 2 and 5 imply the unorthodox (and necessarily false) statement 6. So what to do? Lines 1–4 seem perfectly clear, and the inference from 1–3 to 4 seems valid. So too does the inference from 1, 2, and 5 to 6. Why should 6 be thought impossible? The idea is that whatever its precise meaning, “generation” is some sort of causing or originating, something in principle nothing can do to itself. One would expect Leftow, as a one-self trinitarian, to deny 1 and 2, on the grounds that neither Father nor Son are identical to the one self which is God, but rather, each is a mode of God. But Leftow instead argues that premises 1 and 2 are unclear, and that depending on how they are understood, the argument will either be sound but not heretical, or unsound because it is invalid, 4 not following from 1–3, and 6 not following from 1, 2, and 5.
The argument seems straightforward so long as we read “Father” and “Son” as merely singular referring terms. But Leftow asserts that they are also definite descriptions “which may be temporally rigid or non-rigid” (Leftow 2012b, 334–5). A temporally rigid term refers to a being at all parts of its temporal career. Thus, if “the president of the United States” is temporally rigid, then in the year 2013 we may truly say that “The president of the United States lived in Indonesia”, not of course, while he was president, but it is true of the man who was president in 2013, that in his past, he lived in Indonesia. If the description “president of the United States” (used in 2013) is not temporally rigid, then it refers to Barack Obama only in the presidential phase of his life, and so the sentence above would be false.
“The Father”, then, is a disguised description, something like “the God who is in some life unbegotten” (2012b, 335) (For “the Son” we would substitute “begotten” for the last word.) Because the “=” sign can have a temporally non-rigid description on one or both sides of it, then there can be “temporary identities”, that is, identity statements which are true only at some times but not others. Leftow gives as an example the sentence “that infant = Lincoln”; this is true when Lincoln is an infant but false when he has grown up. Such identity statements can only be true or false relative to times, or to something time-like (2004, 324). If the terms “Father” and “Son” are temporally rigid, or at least like such a term in that each applies to God at all portions of his life (which isn’t temporally ordered), then 4 does follow from 1–3. But 4, Leftow argues, is theologically innocuous, as it means something like “the God who is in some life the Father is also the God who is in some life the Son” (2012b, 335). This is “compatible with the lives, and so the Persons, remaining distinct,” seemingly, distinct instances of God (each of which is identical to God), and Leftow accepts 1–4 as sound only if 4 means this (ibid.).
If the terms “Father” and “Son” are temporally non–rigid, or at least like such a term in that each applies to God relative to some one portion of his life but not relative to the others, then the argument is unsound. Relative to the Father-strand of God’s life, 1 will be true but 2 will be false. Relative to the Son-strand, 2 will be true, but 1 will be false. 3 and 5 will be true relative to any strand, but in any case, we will not be able to establish either 4 or 6.
Leftow’s theory crucially depends on a concept of modes–intrinsic, essential, eternal ways God is, that is, lives or life-strands. But he does not identify the “persons” of the Trinity with these modes. Rather, he asserts that the modes somehow constitute, cause, or give rise to each Person (2007, 373–5). Like theories that reduce these Persons to mere modes of a self, Leftow’s theory has it that what may appear to be three selves actually turn out to be one self, God. But they, all (apparently) three of them, just are (are numerically, absolutely identical to) that one self, that is, God thrice over or thrice repeated.
Some philosophers object that Leftow’s time-travel analogy is unhelpful because time-travel is impossible (Hasker 2009, 158). Similarly, one may object that Leftow is trying to illuminate the obscure (the Trinity) by the equally or more obscure (the alleged possibility of time travel, and timeless analogues to it). If Leftow’s one-self theory is intended as a literal interpretation of trinitarian language, a “rational reconstruction” (Tuggy 2011a), this would be problematic; but if he means it merely as an apologetic defense (i.e. we can’t rule out that the Trinity means this, and this can’t be proven incoherent) then the fact that some intellectuals believe in the possibility of time travel supports his case.
One may wonder whether Leftow’s life stream theory is really trinitarian. Do not his Persons really, so to speak, collapse into one, since each is numerically identical to God? Isn’t this modalism, rather than trinitarianism? (McCall 2003, 428) Again, one may worry that Leftow’s concept of God being “repeated” or having multiple instances or iterations is either incoherent or unintelligible. And how can such Persons be fully God or fully divine when they exist because of something which is more fundamental, God’s life-strands? (Byerly 2017, 81)
William Hasker objects that assuming Leftow’s theory,
In the Gospels, we have the spectacle of God–as–Son praying to himself, namely to God–as–Father. Perhaps most poignant of all… are the words of abandonment on the cross, “My God, why have you forsaken me?” On the view we are considering, this comes out as “Why have I–as–Father forsaken myself–as–Son?” (Hasker 2009, 166)
In reply, Leftow argues that if we accept the coherence of time travel stories, we should not be bothered by the prospect of “one person at one point in his life begging the same person at another point” (2012a, 321). About the cry of abandonment on the cross, Leftow urges that the New Testament reveals a Christ who (although divine and so omniscient) did not have full access to his knowledge, specifically knowledge of his relation to the Father, and so Christ could not have meant what Hasker said above. Instead, he “would have been using the Son’s ‘myself’ and ’I,’ which… pick out only the Son” (2012a, 322).
Hasker also objects that Leftow’s one–self theory collapses the interpersonal relationships of the members of the Trinity into God’s relating to himself, and suggests that in Leftow’s view, God would enjoy self–love, but not other–love, and so would not be perfect (2009, 161–2, 2012a, 331). (On this sort of argument see sections 2.3 and 2.5 below.) Leftow replies that the self–love in question would be “relevantly like love of someone else” and so, presumably, of equal value (2012b, 339).
Does the theory imply “patripassianism”, the traditionally rejected view that the Father suffers? (After all, the Son suffers, and both he and the Father are identical to God.) Leftow argues that nothing heretical follows; if his analysis is right “then claiming that the Father is on the Cross is like claiming that The Newborn [sic] is eligible to join the AARP [an organization for retirees]”, that is, true but misleading (2012b, 336).
1.6 Analogy to an Extended Simple
Recent metaphysicians have discussed the possibility of a simple (partless) object which is nonetheless spatially extended, occupying regions of space, but without having parts that occupy the sub-regions. Martin Pickup (2016) makes an analogy between these and the idea of a triune God, inspiring his own “Latin” account. Motivated by skepticism about any three-self theory, and taking the “Athanasian” creed as a starting point, he understands the claims that each Person “is God” as asserting the numerical identity of God with that Person. While God is like an extended simple, the relationships between the Persons is “analogous to the relationships between the spatial regions that an extended simple occupies” (418).
To expound the theory Pickup uses the terminology of a “person space”, an imagined realm of all possible persons, which is just “an abstraction of the facts about possible personhood” (422). A point within person space is “a representation of a group of properties that are jointly necessary and sufficient for being a certain possible person” (423). This is supposed to help us “see the conceptual space between being a certain person and being a certain entity” (422, n. 18). Pickup gives some non–theological examples to motivate the idea that one thing may occupy multiple points of person space: the fictional example of Dr. Jekyll and Mr. Hyde, and humans suffering from Dissociative Identity Disorders (420–1).
The prima facie trinitarian claims which generate a contradiction are as follows, where each “is” means numerical (absolute, non-relative) identity.
- The Father is God.
- The Son is God.
- The Holy Spirit is God.
- The Father is not the Son.
- The Father is not the Holy Spirit.
- The Son is not the Holy Spirit.
If the three Persons are numerically distinct (4–6), then it can’t be that all of them are numerically identical to some one God. (1–3) Pickup proposes to understand these using person space concepts. Using p1, p2, and p3 for different points in person space, the points which correspond to being, respectively, the Father, Son, and Spirit, claims 1–3 are read as:
- The occupant of p1 is God.
- The occupant of p2 is God.
- The occupant of p3 is God.
These claims entail the 1–3 we started with, understood as claims of numerical identity. But this method of interpretation transforms 4–6, which become:
- p1 is not p2.
- p1 is not p3.
- p2 is not p3.
In other words, “4. The Father is not the Son” is not understood as asserting the numerical distinctness of the Father and the Son, but rather, as asserting the distinction of the Father’s person space from the Son’s person space. (And similarly with 5, 6.) The point of all of this is that the six interpreted claims seem to be coherent, such that possibly, all of them are true. Notably, this account accepts what we can call “Person-collapse”, the implication of 1-3 that the Father just is the Son, the Father just is the Spirit, and the Son just is the Spirit. (In other words, those are numerically identical.) Thus, unlike many Trinity theories, this one is arguably compatible with a doctrine of divine simplicity.
Pickup defends this account from several objections. Against the objection that this is a heretical modalism, Pickup argues that it can’t be, since here God’s being three Persons is a fundamental metaphysical fact, not a derivative fact. Further, each Person is a real person, as real as any human person (426–7). Still, one may think the account denies the reality of the Persons. Pickup clarifies that they are not so many distinct realities, but rather each just is God. Nor are they parts of God. When this theory countenances the “distinctness of the Persons” it is not implying the numerical distinctness of the Persons, but only the distinctness of the person spaces they occupy (p1, p2, and p3). But as explained above, person spaces are not understood to be real entities (435).
Second, it can be objected that catholic tradition demands the numerical distinctness of the Persons. Pickup denies that it does, since it aims to avoid tritheism and affirms that each just is God (427).
Third, Person-collapse entails claims any trinitarian should deny, including that the Father just is the Son, and that the Spirit is three Persons. (Being numerically the same with God, since God is three Persons, the Holy Spirit will be three Persons.) Pickup concedes that at first glance such claims “sound bad”, but replies that any “Latin” account of the Trinity will as such have to accept such claims (428).
Fourth, it is self-evident that if any x and any y are numerically identical, it follows that x and y can’t ever differ. But arguably any account of the Trinity must allow that the Persons differ at least in respect of origin, so that only the Son is begotten, only the Spirit proceeds, and only the Father begets the Son.
In reply, Pickup argues that metaphysicians who accept the possibility of extended simples also accept that such “can be heterogeneous: that they can have different properties at the different locations at which they exist” (429). Metaphysicians differ in how they try to show that this is possible (432–4). But according to Pickup, it is plausible that there are “fundamental distributional properties”. An example of a distributional property is an object being polka-dotted, which requires that it is one color some places and another color in other places. What is controversial is that such properties can be fundamental, that they can belong to the basic metaphysical structure of reality, rather than being explained as no more than various smaller items having non-distributional properties (430). Thus, we should not think that an extended simple which is heterogeneous both has and lacks a property, being F and not being F. Rather, we should think that it has a single distributional property of being F at some of its locations and not being F at others. If, for instance, an extended simple could be colored, it might be polka-dotted, where this is understood as a fundamental property, rather than, for instance, black in some spots and not-black in others. Thus, we avoid saying that one and the same object at a single time is and is not black (429–31).
Applied to the Trinity , Pickup suggests that what at first look like different properties (generating the Son, being generated, and being spirated) really amount to a single distributional property of God, which he calls “generation”. This is the property of generating the Son at p1, being generated at p2, and being spirated at p3. This is not a matter of God being different at different person spaces; rather, at each space God has the distributional property called “generation” (431). In this way, the theory does not deny the indiscernibility of identicals, the principle that if any x and any y are numerically identical, then they can’t ever differ. The persons of the Trinity, on this account, never do differ, although it may seem that way at first glance.
An objection to this is that the Father’s generation of the Son implies that the Father is logically or causally prior to the Son, and a distributional property can’t account for this. Pickup suggests in reply that perhaps instead it is p1 which is prior to p2, or perhaps God’s occupying p1 is prior to his occupying p2 (432).
Finally, it can be objected that necessarily, any person just is a certain entity, and that even if this is false, still, it seems that necessarily persons and entities can’t be separated, so that if anything is one person it must be one entity as well (436). In reply, Pickup denies that such claims are true, and suggests that conceptually, it seems that one may count persons and beings differently, even in merely human cases like the fictional Jekyll and Hyde, which he takes to be an instance of one entity that is two persons (436, 420). Pickup also argues that it is a virtue of this account that it doesn’t specify what it takes to be a person (436).
One may object that the suggested paraphrase or interpretation of the statements that no Person is either of the others seems to change the subject from divine Persons to imaginary “person spaces”. Again, the cost of denying the numerical distinctness of the Persons may be too high for many trinitarians to accept. And it would seem that trinitarians are committed to many differences between the Persons other than the properties or relations relating to origin. The Son died, but the Father did not. The Holy Spirit descended upon Jesus at his baptism, but the Father and Son did not. The Father at Jesus’s baptism said “This is my beloved Son”, but the Son and Spirit did not. It is not clear that all of these seeming differences can be understood as really involving fundamental distributional properties of God.
1.7 Difficulties for One-self Theories
Any one-self theory is hard to square with the New Testament’s theme of the interpersonal relationship between Father and Son. (Layman 2016, 129–30; McCall 2010, 87–8, 2014c, 117–27; Plantinga 1989, 23–7) Any one-self theory is also hard to square with the Son’s role as mediator between God and humankind (Tuggy and Date 2020, 122–3). These teachings arguably assume the Son to be a self, not a mere mode of a self, and to be a different self than his Father. Theories such as Ward’s (section 1.3 above), which make the Son a mere mode, make him something less than a self, whereas others (see section 1.6) make him a self, but the same self as his Father. Either way, the Son seems not to be qualified either to mediate between God and humankind, or to be a friend of the one he calls “Father”.
Again, some traditional incarnation theories seems to assume that the eternal Son who becomes incarnate (who enters into a hypostatic union with a complete human nature) is the same self as the historical man Jesus of Nazareth. But no mere mode could be the same self as anything, and the New Testament seems to teach that this man was sent by another self, God.
Some one–self theories run into trouble about God’s relation to the cosmos. If God exists necessarily and is essentially the creator and the redeemer of created beings in need of salvation, this implies it is not possible for there to be no creation, or for there to be no fallen creatures; God could not have avoided creating beings in need of redemption. One-self trinitarians may get around this by more carefully specifying the properties in question: not creator but creator of anything else there might be, and not redeemer but redeemer of any creatures in need of salvation there might be and which he should want to save.
1.8 The Holy Spirit as a Mode of God
Some ancient Christians, most 17th-19th century unitarians, present-day “biblical unitarians”, and some modern subordinationists such as the Jehovah’s Witnesses hold the Holy Spirit to be a mode of God—God’s power, presence, or action in the world. (See the supplementary document on unitarianism.) Not implying modalism about the Son, this position is harder to refute on New Testament grounds, although mainstream theologians and some subordinationist unitarians reject it as inconsistent with New Testament language from which we should infer that the Holy Spirit is a self (Clarke 1738, 147). Modalists about the Spirit counter with other biblical language which suggests that the “Spirit of God” or “Holy Spirit” refers to either God himself, a mode of God (e.g., his power), or an effect of a mode of God (e.g., supernatural human abilities such as healing). (See Burnap 1845, 226–52; Lardner 1793, 79–174; Wilson 1846, 325–32.) This exegetical dispute is difficult, as all natural languages allow persons to be described in mode-terms (“Hillary is Bill’s strength.”) and modes to be described in language which literally applies only to persons. (“God’s wisdom told him not to create beer-sap trees.”)
2. Three-self Theories
One-self Trinity theories are motivated in part by the concern that if there are three divine selves, this implies that there are three gods. Three-self theories, in various ways, deny this implication. They hold the Persons of the Trinity to be selves (as defined above, section 1.1). A major motivation here is that the New Testament writings seem to assume that the Father and Son (and, some also argue, the Holy Spirit) are different selves (e.g. Layman 2016, 131–2).
2.1 Relative Identity Theories
Why can’t multiple divine selves be one and the same god? It would seem that by being the same god, they must be numerically the same entity; “they” are really one, and so “they” can’t differ in any way (that is, this one entity can’t differ from itself). But then, they (really: it) can’t be different divine selves.
Relative identity theorists think there is some mistake in this reasoning, so that things may be different somethings yet the same something else. They hold that the above reasoning falsely assumes something about numerical sameness. They hold that numerical sameness, or identity, either can be or always is relative to a kind or concept.
Relative identity theorists are concerned to rebut this sort of argument:
- The Father is God.
- The Son is God.
- Therefore, the Father is the Son.
If each occurrence of “is” here is interpreted as identity (“absolute” or non-relative identity), then this argument is indisputably valid. Things identical to the same thing must also be identical to one another. The relative identity trinitarian argues that one should read the “is” in 1 and 2 as meaning “is the same being as” and the “is” in 3 as meaning “is the same divine Person as”. Doing this, one may say that the argument is invalid, having true premises but a false conclusion.
These theorists reject another response to the above argument, which would be to reject it is invalid because 1 and 2 mean that each is a mode of God (see section 1), and while these claims are true, they don’t imply 3, since the Father and the Son are two different modes. Against this, the theories of this section assume that the three Persons of the Trinity are three selves (Rea 2009, 406. 419; van Inwagen 1995, 229–31).
Following Rea (2003) we divide relative identity trinitarian theories into the pure and the impure. Pure theories accept (1) either that there is no such relation as absolute identity or that such statements are definable in terms of relative-identity relations, and (2) that trinitarian statements of sameness and difference (e.g. the Father is God, the Father is not the Son) are to be analyzed as involving relative and not absolute identity relations, whereas the impure theories accept only (2), allowing that statements about absolute identity (e.g. a = b) may be both intelligible and true, against (1). (434–8)
2.1.1 Pure Relative Identity Theories
Peter Geach (1972, 1973, 1980) argues that it is meaningless to ask whether or not some a and b are “the same”; rather, sameness is relative to a sortal concept. Thus, while it is senseless to ask whether or not Paul and Saul are identical, we can ask whether or not Paul and Saul are the same human, same person, same apostle, same animal, etc. The doctrine of the Trinity, then, is construed as the claim that the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit are the same God, but are not the same Person. They are “God-identical but Person-distinct” (Rea 2003, 432).
As Joseph Jedwab explains, traditional Trinity language and commitments arguably lead naturally to a relative identity account.
Prima facie, the doctrine of the Trinity implies the sortal relativity of identity thesis, which says that where “R” and “S” are sortals, it could be that for some x and y, x and y are the same R but different Ss. The Father and the Son are the same God, else they are two Gods, which implies polytheism and so is false. But the Father and the Son are different divine Persons, else they are one divine Person, which implies the Sabellian heresy and so is false. So the Father and the Son are the same God but different divine Persons. (2015, 124)
Geach’s approach to the Trinity is developed by Martinich (1978, 1979) and Cain (1989). Jedwab (2015) criticizes Cain’s version as implying philosophical, theological and christological difficulties. Cain (2016) defends his more Geachian approach.
Pure relative identity trinitarianism depends on the controversial claim that there’s no such relation as (non-sortal-relative, absolute) identity. Most philosophers hold, to the contrary, that the identity relation and its logic are well-understood; such are expounded in recent logic text-books, and philosophers frequently argue in ways that assume there is such a relation as identity (Baber 2015, 165; Layman 2016, 141). One might turn to a weaker relative identity doctrine; outside the context of the Trinity, philosopher Nicholas Griffin (1977; cf. Rea 2003, 435–6) has argued that while there are identity relations, they are not basic, but must be understood in terms of relative identity relations. On either view, relative identity relations are fundamental.
It has been objected to Geach’s claim about the senselessness of asking if a and b are (non-relatively) “the same” that,
Given that we have succeeded in picking out something by the use of “a” and in picking out something by the use of “b” it surely is a complete determinate proposition that a = b, that is, it is surely either true or false that the item we have picked out with “a” is the item we have picked out with “b”. (Alston and Bennett 1984, 558)
Rea objects that relative identity theory presupposes some sort of metaphysical anti-realism, the controversial doctrine that there is no realm of real objects which exists independently of human thought (2003, 435–6). Baber replies that such worries are misguided, as the only aim of relative identity theory should be to show a way in which the Trinity might be coherent (2015, 170).
Trenton Merricks objects that if a and b “are the same F”, this implies that a is an F, that b is an F, and that a and b are (absolutely, non-relatively) identical. But this widely accepted analysis is precisely what relative identity trinitarians deny. This leads to the objection that relative-identity trinitarian claims are unintelligible (that is, we have no grasp of what they mean). If someone asserts that Fluffy and Spike are “the same dog” and denies that they’re both dogs which are one and the same, we have no idea what this person is asserting. Similarly with the claim that Father and Son are “the same God” but are not identical (Merricks 2006, 301–5, 321; cf. Tuggy 2003a, 173–4, Layman 2016, 141–2).
Baber (2015) replies that if the sortal dog is “dominant”, meaning that for any sortal F, if x and y are the same dog, they will also be the same F, then the claim that Fluffy and Spike are the same dog but not absolutely identical is intelligible. After all, we can understand that the claim implies that Fluffy and Spike are the same animal, the same pet, and so on (167). The relative identity trinitarian, Baber says, must hold that “Being does not dominate [i.e. imply sameness with respect to] Person but rather that Person dominates Being”. However, there’s no easy way to prove this, and dominance claims are theory-relative (ibid.). But such a claim will just be a part of the relative identity theorist’s Trinity theory (169).
One may also object to either sort of relative identity account being the historical doctrine on the grounds that only those conversant in the logic of the last 120 years or so have ever had a concept of relative identity. But this may be disputed; Anscombe and Geach (1961, 118) argue that Aquinas should be interpreted along these lines, Richard Cartwright (1987, 193) claims to find the idea of relative identity in the works of Anselm and in the Eleventh Council of Toledo (675 C.E.), and Jeffrey Brower (2006) finds a similar account in the works of Peter Abelard. (On Aquinas, see the supplementary document on the history of trinitarian doctrines section 4.) Christopher Hughes Conn (2019) argues that Anselm was the first to consciously develop a Trinity theory involving relative identity.
2.1.2 Impure Relative Identity Theories: A Relative Identity Logic
Peter van Inwagen (1995, 2003) tries to show that there is a set of propositions representing a possibly orthodox interpretation of the “Athanasian” creed (see section 5.3) which is demonstrably self-consistent, refuting claims that the Trinity doctrine is obviously self-contradictory. He formulates a trinitarian doctrine using a concept of relative identity, without employing the concept of absolute identity or presupposing that there is or isn’t such a thing (1995, 241). Specifically, he proves that the following eight claims (understood as involving relative and never absolute identity, the names being read as descriptions) don’t imply a contradiction in his system of relative identity logic.
- There is (exactly) one God.
- There are (exactly) three divine Persons.
- There are three divine Persons in one divine Being.
- God is the same being as the Father.
- God is a person.
- God is the same person as the Father.
- God is the same person as the Son.
- The Son is not the same person as the Father.
- God is the same being as the Father. (249, 254)
Van Inwagen neither endorses this Trinity theory, nor presumes to pronounce it orthodox, and he admits that it does little to reduce the mysteriousness of the traditional language.
It may be objected, as to the preceding theory, that van Inwagen’s relative identity trinitarianism is unintelligible. Merricks argues that this problem is more acute for van Inwagen than for Geach, as the former declines to adopt Geach’s claim that all assertions of identity, in all domains of discourse, and in everyday life, are sortal-relative (Merricks 2006, 302–4).
Michael Rea (2003) objects that by remaining neutral on the issue of identity, van Inwagen’s theory allows that the three Persons are (absolutely) non-identical, in which case “it is hard to see what it could possibly mean to say that they are the same being” (Rea 2003, 441). It seems that any things which are non-identical are not the same being. Thus, van Inwagen must assume that there is absolute identity, and deny that this relation holds between the Persons. Thus, van Inwagen has not demonstrated the consistency of (this version of) trinitarianism. Further, the theory doesn’t rule out polytheism, as it doesn’t deny that there are non-identical divine beings. In sum, the impure relative identity trinitarian owes us a plausible and orthodox metaphysical story about how non-identical beings may nonetheless be “one God”, and van Inwagen hasn’t done this, staying as he has in the realm of logic (Rea 2003, 441–2).
In a later discussion, van Inwagen goes farther, claiming that trinitarian doctrine is inconsistent “if the standard logic of identity is correct”, and denying there is any “relation that is both universally reflexive [i.e., everything bears the relation to itself] and forces indiscernibility [i.e. things standing in the relation can’t differ]” (2003, 92). Thus, there’s no such relation as classical or absolute identity, but there are instead only various relative identity relations (92–3). In so doing he moves to a “pure” relative identity approach to the Trinity, as described in section 2.1.1.
Many philosophers would object that whatever reason there is to believe in the Trinity, it is more obvious that there’s such a relation as identity, that the indiscernibility of identicals is true, and that we do successfully use singular referring terms.
Vlastimil Vohánka (2013) argues that van Inwagen has done nothing to show the logical possibility of any Trinity theory. Just because a set of claims can’t be proven inconsistent in van Inwagen’s relative identity logic, it doesn’t follow that such claims don’t imply a contradiction, or that it is metaphysically possible that all the claims are true. At one point van Inwagen tells a short non-theological story whose claims, when translated into his relative identity logic, have the same forms as the Trinity propositions. The story, he argues, is clearly not self-contradictory; thus, he concludes, neither are the Trinity propositions, since they have the same logical forms. In response, Vohánka concocts a short non-theological story whose claims translate into claims of the same form in relative identity logic, and yet are clearly logically impossible (207–11). He concludes that “there’s no ground for thinking that formal consistency in [relative identity logic] guarantees logical possibility”, and that “sharing a form in [relative identity logic] with a logically possible proposition does not guarantee logical possibility” (211–2).
2.1.3 Impure Relative Identity Theories: Constitution Trinitarianism
Another theory claims to possess the sort of metaphysical story van Inwagen’s theory lacks. Based on the concept of constitution, Rea and Brower develop a three-self Trinity theory according to which each of the divine Persons is non-identical to the others, as well as to God, but is nonetheless “numerically the same” as all of them (Brower and Rea 2005a; Rea 2009, 2011). They employ an analogy between the Christian God and material objects. When we look at a bronze statue of Athena, we should say that we’re viewing one material object. Yet, we can distinguish the lump of bronze from the statue. These cannot be identical, as they differ (e.g., the lump could, but the statue couldn’t survive being smashed flat). We should say that the lump and statue stand in a relation of “accidental sameness”. This means that they needn’t be, but in fact are “numerically the same” without being identical. While they are numerically one physical object, they are two hylomorphic compounds, that is, two compounds of form and matter, sharing their matter. This, they hold, is a plausible solution to the problem of material constitution (Rea 1995).
Similarly, the Persons of the Trinity are so many selves constituted by the same stuff (or something analogous to a stuff). These selves, like the lump and statue, are numerically the same without being identical, but they don’t stand in a relation of accidental sameness, as they could not fail to be related in this way. Father, Son, and Spirit are three quasi form-matter compounds. The forms are properties like “being the Father, being the Son, and being the Spirit; or perhaps being Unbegotten, being Begotten and Proceeding” (Rea 2009, 419). The single subject of those properties is “something that plays the role of matter,” which Rea calls “the divine essence” or “the divine nature” (Brower and Rea 2005a, 68; Rea 2009, 420). Whereas in the earlier discussion “the divine essence [is] not… an individual thing in its own right” (Brower and Rea 2005a, 68; cf. Craig 2005, 79), in a later piece, Rea holds the divine nature to be a substance (i.e. an entity, an individual being), and moreover “numerically the same” substance as each of the three. Thus, it isn’t a fourth substance; nor is it a fourth divine Person, as it isn’t, like each of the three, a form-(quasi-)matter compound, but only something analogous to a lump of matter, something which constitutes each of the Three (Rea 2009, 420; Rea 2011, Section 6). Rea adds that this divine nature is a fundamental power which is sharable and multiply locatable. He doesn’t say whether it is either universal or particular, saying, “I am unsure whether I buy into the universal/particular distinction” (Rea 2011, Section 6). All properties, in his view, are powers, and vice versa. Thus, this divine nature is both a power and a property, and it plays a role like that of matter in the Trinity.
This three-self theory may be illustrated as follows (Tuggy 2013a, 134).
There would seem to be seven realities here, none of which is (absolutely) identical to any of the others. Four of them are properties: the divine nature (d), being unbegotten (u), being begotten (b), and proceeding (p). Three are hylomorphic (form-matter) compounds: Father, Son, and Holy Spirit (f, s, h)–each with the property d playing the role of matter within it, and each having its own additional property (respectively: u, b, and p) playing the role of form within it. Each of these compounds is a divine self. The ovals can be taken to represent the three hylomorphs (form-matter compounds) or the three hylomorphic compounding relations which obtain among the seven realities posited. Three of these seven (f, s, h) are to be counted as one god, because they are hylomorphs with only one divine nature (d) between them. Thus, of the seven items, three are properties (u, b, p), three are substances which are hylomorphic compounds (f, s, h), and one is both a property and a substance, but a simple substance, not a compound one (d).
Brower and Rea argue that their theory stands a better chance of being orthodox than its competitors, and point out that a part of their motivation is that leading medieval trinitarians such as Augustine, Anselm, and Aquinas say things which seem to require a concept of numerical sameness without identity. (See Marenbon 2007, Brower 2005, and the supplementary document on the history of Trinity theories, sections 3.3.2, on Augustine, and 4.1, on Thomas Aquinas.)
In contrast to other relative-identity theories, this theory seems well-motivated, for its authors can point to something outside trinitarian theology which requires the controversial concept of numerical sameness without identity. This concept, they can argue, was not concocted solely to acquit the trinitarian of inconsistency. But this strength is also its weakness, for on the level of metaphysics, much hostility to the theory is due to the fact that philosophers are heavily divided on the reality, nature, and metaphysical utility of constitution. Thus, some philosophers deny that a metaphysics of material objects should involve constitution, since strictly speaking there are no statues or pillars, for these apparent objects should be understood as mere modes of the particles that compose them. Arguably, truths about statues and pillars supervene on truths about arrangements of particles (Byerly 2019, 82–3).
This Constitution theory has been criticized as underdeveloped, unclear in its aims, unintelligible, incompatible with self-evident truths, unorthodox relative to Roman Catholicism, polytheistic and not monotheistic, not truly trinitarian, involving too many divine individuals (primary substances), out of step with the broad historical catholic tradition, implying that the Persons of the Trinity can’t simultaneously differ in non-modal and non-temporal properties, not a theological improvement over simpler relative identity approaches, and as wrongly implying that terms like “God” are systematically ambiguous (Craig 2005; Hasker 2010b; Hughes 2009; Layman 2016; Leftow 2018; Pruss 2009, Tuggy 2013a).
2.1.4 Impure Relative Identity Theories: Constitution and Indexicals
Scott Williams has constructed a similar theory, which he calls a “Latin Social” account. In common with Leftow’s “Latin” theory and Hasker’s “Social” theory (see sections 1.5, 2.4), Williams says that there is one “concrete instance or trope of the divine nature” which is a constituent of each Person. Each Person is also constituted by an incommunicable attribute, begetting (Father), being begotten (Son), and being spirated (Spirit) (Williams 2017, 324). He understands each Person to be “an incommunicable existence of an intellectual nature” (326). In his view any person is a person “ontologically and explanatorily prior to any cognitive acts of volitions that that person in question has or might have” (Williams 2017, 327; cf. 2013, 2019). And for him, the Persons are persons. Each Person is essentially numerically the same essence as the one divine essence, while being a numerically different Person from the other two Persons. Thus, the account involves irreducible relations of kind-relative numerical sameness. But the divine Persons are not (absolutely) numerically identical to one another, and each is not (absolutely) numerically identical to the divine essence. This divine essence is like an Aristotelian first substance in that it exists on its own (not in another) and in being a concrete particular, but unlike first substances it is communicable, in other words, it can be shared by non-identical things, the divine Persons (Williams 2017, 326). The term “God” can refer to any of the Persons, or to the divine essence. The term “Trinity” is a plural-referring term which refers to the plurality of the divine Persons (Williams 2013, 85). (See section 5.1.)
Williams considers it an axiom of trinitarian theorizing that “the divine persons are necessarily unified or necessarily agree regarding all things” (2017, 321). Some rival theories try to account for this “necessary agreement thesis” by showing how, allegedly, the Persons would have to come up with some policy which would prevent disagreement. Williams finds such claims “philosophically unsatisfying”, and instead argues that the three Persons can never disagree because they have numerically one will, one power of choosing (322). Unlike any other three persons, the Persons of the Trinity, because they share one divine nature, share one set of powers, and so any exercise of any divine power belongs to each of the three. In this case, Williams analyzes thinking as producing and using a token sentence in what we might call divine mentalese. Building on work by philosopher John Perry on indexical terms like “I”, Williams points out that a single token of a sentence in English may be used by different agents, and may thus have multiple meanings. For example,
Suppose that Peter produces…a sign that reads, “I am happy,” and that Peter uses this sign by holding it up. Peter affirms that Peter is happy. Later, Peter puts the sign on the ground and Paul picks up the same sign and holds it up such that Paul affirms that Paul is happy. Paul uses numerically the same token as Peter did, yet when Paul uses it he affirms something different than Peter. (Williams 2013, 81)
Similarly, if divine Persons think using a language-like divine mentalese, then one token of this may be used by different Persons and have a different significance for each. The idea is that a person relates to a proposition (the content of his thought) by means of a token sentence which he produces and uses to think. But these mental acts, given that the Persons share one set of powers, must be shared by all three of them. Yet, the thoughts thereby thought will differ. For example,
…if the Father uses a mental token of “I am God the Father” and in so doing affirms a proposition, then the Father affirms that God the Father is identical to God the Father. If the Son uses the same mental token of “I am God the Father”…the Son affirms the proposition that the Son is essentially numerically the same divine nature as the Father without being identical to the Father. (Williams 2017, 331)
This account denies what some philosophers assume to be obvious, that “distinct and incommunicable intellectual acts and volitional acts are necessary conditions for being a person” (339). Williams rejects this as an ungrounded modern assumption. While it employs recent thinking about indexical terms and other matters, Williams considers this account to fit well with historical theologians such as Gregory of Nyssa, Henry of Ghent, and John Duns Scotus (345). That the persons share all mental acts does not imply that they share one mind or that there is one consciousness in the Trinity. Rather, the access consciousness, experiential consciousness, and introspective consciousness of each Person may differ (2020, Section 3).
A New Testament reader might question the assumption that the Persons of the Trinity can’t disagree, given the temptation of the Son (but not of the Father) and an occasion when the Son asked the Father to be excused from a difficult trial (Matthew 4:1–11; James 1:13; Mark 14:36).
In a response, William Hasker objects that it seems that sometimes human beings can think without using any language. Why, then, should we suppose divine Persons to think only by means of mental token sentences? Perhaps they can just relate directly to propositions (the contents of their thoughts). Worse, Williams posits that this divine mental language is ambiguous, but Hasker says, “we would naturally expect a divine language of thought to be very precise indeed, perhaps maximally so” (Hasker 2018b, 364). He also objects that the theory wrongly counts mental acts. Hasker imagines that the Holy Spirit intends to become incarnate on some other planet, and that before this Incarnation or the Incarnation of the Son, the three of them together produce the mental token “I shall become incarnate”. Hasker urges that this seems to be two uses of the same mental sentence, one by the Son and the other by the Spirit. “To be aware of a proposition is precisely to perform a mental act,” and here the Son is aware of one, but the Spirit is aware of another (365). But this clashes with Williams’s claim that there is but one mental power shared by the three.
Williams replies that divine mental tokens are needed “to explain why a divine person’s mental act is directed at (among all possible propositions) the proposition it is directed at” (Williams 2020, 115). Williams denies that ambiguity is always an imperfection of a language, and urges that there is nothing objectionable about divine Persons using mental tokens that can be used to express various propositions (110–1). About Hasker’s allegation that the theory mis-counts the mental acts of the Persons, Williams says that to the contrary, we should see but one mental act here, though we should keep in mind the Persons’ background knowledge about who will become incarnate, which provides the contexts relative to which the one token mental sentence means different things. Moreover, “Why posit several mental acts here, when one mental act will do the same explanatory work?” Finally, Williams clarifies that the necessary sharing of divine acts does not apply to “internal divine productions”, such as the Father’s eternal generation of the Son (111–4, 115–6).
2.1.5 Impure Relative Identity Theories: Episodic Personhood
Another relative identity theory by Justin Mooney (2020) depends on an entirely different metaphysical account to show how multiple persons may each be the same being. Metaphysician Ned Markosian proposes a thought experiment in which a man dies and is mummified, and then a long time later the mummy’s parts are re-arranged into a living woman who has an utterly different psychology than the dead man. The point is that the woman is the same object as the man but is not the same person as the man, because the instances of personhood in his life aren’t part of the same episode of personhood (3–4). Mooney applies Markosian’s ideas about “identity under a sortal” to the Trinity. On this account, “God is a single, divine substance that is simultaneously or atemporally participating in three distinct episodes of personhood–those of the Father, Son, and Spirit” (5). Thus, each Person just is God, but none is the same Person as any other divine Person. The account may be illustrated by modifying the traditional Trinity shield:
On this theory, being different Persons doesn’t imply being numerically distinct.
One may worry that such Persons must be one and the same Person since they have but one substance between them, but Mooney answers that they are individuated by their causal relationships, following Swinburne (1994) (5). In addition, following Effingham, he says that they are not one and the same Person because they aren’t linked by immanent causal relations. (5–6) These are “those causal links an entity bears to itself from one time to another whereby the way it is earlier on causes how it is later on” (Effingham 2015, 35). Following Moreland and Craig (2017), Mooney adds that God possesses three mental faculties, each had by one of the Persons (6). Finally, adapting ideas from Swinburne (1994), he says that
…the Father’s episode of personhood occurs simply because God is a divine being, and a divine being is essentially a personal being. By nature, God instantiates whatever psychological properties are necessary for being a person. The Son’s episode of personhood occurs because the Father wills that there is an instantiation of personhood by the divine substance which is not immanent-causally linked to the Father’s instantiation of personhood. And the Spirit’s episode occurs because one or both of these persons will(s) that there is yet another instantiation of personhood by the divine substance which is not connected by immanent causal relations to either the Father’s or the Son’s instantiation of personhood (6).
He remains neutral on whether this process is either temporal or necessary (ibid.).
Unlike other relative identity theories, this account, like some one-self theories, affirms the absolute identity of each Person with God; each is the same thing or being or primary substance, God (7). This generates a concern that the account may count as a heretical modalism. Mooney replies that “if Markosian’s episodic view of personal identity is right, the model is not modalist” (ibid.). The reason is that on this account there are three episodes of personhood, which implies that there are three Persons, even though there is one being which is the component thing in each episode, a single subject of the properties that are involved in being a Person.
Even though the account has it that these three are different Persons, still, it identifies each with God, which entails their identity with one another; being the same thing as God, they must be the same thing as each other. Given this, it would seem that they can’t differ in any way, e.g. the Son becomes incarnate but the Father does not (7). Mooney replies that the Trinity is mysterious, and that probably a sentence like “The Son became incarnate but the Father didn’t” might be understood as not requiring a simultaneous or eternal difference between the being that is the Son and the one which is the Father. In Markosian’s thought experiment, one would think that person-names would track with the different stages in the career of the one object, so that, say, “Alice” would refer to the thing only in its latest stages, and “Bob” would apply to it only in its pre-mummy career. Thus, names like “Father” and “Son” should refer to God only in one or the other of God’s Person-episodes. Mooney suggests, then, that “The Son became incarnate but the Father didn’t” will be true if and only if the Son but not the Father is the same person as someone who became incarnate, that is, God becomes incarnate in the Person-episode associated with the name “Son” but not in the one associated with “Father” (8).
This, Mooney argues, shows why when counting objects, we should count by (absolute) identity, while when counting persons we should count by the relation same-person. In the Trinity, then, we count one thing but three Persons; the Persons are the same thing but different persons (9). The account also solves his “problem of Triunity” (2018), which is that as normally analyzed, these three statements can’t all be true, and yet arguably a trinitarian is committed to all three of them:
- God is triune.
- The Son is God.
- The Son is not triune. (2020, 10)
The solution is that even though “strictly speaking, the Son is triune” since the Son just is God and God is triune, the meaning of 3 is that “the Son is not the same person as anyone who is triune”, which is both true and consistent with 1 and 2 (10). Mooney adds that the property being triune should not be confused with the property of being the same Person as someone who is triune; only the first, in his view, is an essential divine attribute (10–1).
Mooney argues that this account also solves problems relating to divine processions and aseity. The Son, being God, must have the property of aseity. But Mooney suggests that the Father’s generation of the Son doesn’t explain the Son’s existence (which would rule out the Son's aseity), but only the Son’s being a person distinct from the Father (12).
The viability of this theory rests on a particular metaphysics of personhood. One might think, contra Markosian and Mooney, that the woman in the story is one being, the mummy is a second being (even though composed of many or all of the same parts), and the man who follows is a third being. Similarly, one may wonder whether numerically distinct Persons can each be numerically the same as one god. The theory implies the falsity of the principle that for any x and y, if they are different Fs, then x is an F, y is an F, and x≠y. One might also question the theory’s way of dealing with apparent differences between the (numerically identical) Persons; any differences of the form the “the Father is F but the Son is not F” get analyzed as meaning “the Father is the same Person as someone who is F and the Son is not the same Person as someone who is F”. Does the original claim really mean what the analysis says?
2.2 20th Century Theologians and “Social” Theories
Some influential 20th-century theologians interpreted the Trinity as containing just one self. (See section 1.3 above.) In the second half of the century, many theologians reacted against one-self theories, criticizing them as modalist or as somehow near-modalist. This period also saw the wide and often uncritical adoption of a paradigm for classifying Trinity theories which derives from 19th c. French Catholic theologian Théodore de Régnon (Barnes 1995). On this paradigm, Western or Latin or Augustinian theories are contrasted with Eastern or Greek or Cappadocian theories, and the difference between the camps is said to be merely one of emphases or “starting points”. The Western theories, it is said, emphasize or “start with” God’s oneness, and try to show how God is also three, whereas the Eastern theories emphasize or “start with” God’s threeness, and try to show how God is also one. The two are thought to emphasize, respectively, psychological or social analogies for understanding the Trinity, and so the latter is often called “social” trinitarianism. But this paradigm has been criticized as confused, unhelpful, and simply not accurate to the history of Trinitarian theology (Cross 2002, 2009; Holmes 2012; McCall 2003).
Although the language of Latin vs. “social” Trinity theories has been adopted by many analytic philosophers (e.g. Leftow 1999; Hasker 2010c; Tuggy 2003a), these have interpreted the different theories as logically inconsistent (i.e. such that both can’t be true), and not merely as differing in style, emphasis, or sequence.
Some 20th century theological sources, accepting the de Régnon paradigm, proceed to blame the Western tradition for “overemphasizing the oneness” of God, and recommend that balance may be restored by looking to the Eastern tradition. A number of concerns characterize theologians in this 20th and 21st century movement of “social” trinitarianism:
- Preserving genuinely interpersonal relationships between the Persons of the Trinity, particularly the Father and the Son.
- Doing justice to the New Testament idea of Christ as a personal mediator between God and humankind.
- Suspicion that the “static” categories of Greek philosophy have in previous trinitarian theologies obscured the dynamic and personal nature of the triune God.
- Concern that traditional or Western trinitarian theology has made the doctrine irrelevant to practical concerns such as politics, gender relations, and family life.
- The idea that to be Love itself, or for God to be perfectly loving, God must contain three subjects or persons (or at any rate, more than one). (See sections 2.3, 2.5, and 2.6.)
(For surveys of this literature see Kärkkäinen 2007; Olson and Hall 2002, 95–115; Peters 1993, 103–45.) These writers are often unclear about what Trinity theory they’re endorsing. The views seem to range from tritheism, to the idea that the Trinity is an event, to something that differs only slightly, or only in emphasis, from pro-Nicene or one-self theories (see section 1 and section 3.3 of the supplementary document on the history of trinitarian doctrines). Merricks observes that some views advertised as “social trinitarianism” make it “sound equivalent to the thesis that the Doctrine of the Trinity is true but modalism is false” (Merricks 2006, 306). However, a number of Christian philosophers, and some theologians employing the methods of analytic philosophy, have started with this literature and then proceeded to develop relatively clear three-self Trinity theories, which are surveyed here. They differ in how they attempt to secure monotheism (Leftow 1999). There are many such Trinity theories, and it is not clear that all the options have yet been explored (Davidson 2016).
2.3 Ersatz Monotheism
A problem for any three-self Trinity theory is that numerically three selves are, it would seem, numerically three things. And according to a theory of essences or natures, a thing which has or which is an instance of an essence or nature is thereby a thing of a certain kind. All Trinity theories include the Nicene claim that the Persons of the Trinity have between them but one essence or nature, the divine one. But it would seem that by definition a thing with the divine essence is a god, and so three such things would be three gods.
Some three-self theories in effect concede that they imply tritheism (three things, each of which has properties sufficient for being a god), but argue that surely a correct Trinity theory can’t avoid the right type of tritheism, and can avoid any undesirable tritheism, such as ones involving unequal divinity of the Persons, Persons which are in some sense independent, or Persons who are in principle separable (McCall 2010, 2014c; Plantinga 1988, 1989; Yandell 2010, 2015).
Richard Swinburne has long developed and defended a type of three-self Trinity theory which in the eyes of most critics seems to be “a fairly straightforward form of tritheism” (Alston 1997, 55. See also Clark 1996; Davidson 2016; Feser 1997; Howard-Snyder 2015a; Moreland and Craig 2017; Rea 2006; van Inwagen and Howard-Snyder 1998; van Inwagen 2003, 88; Vohánka 2014, 56). In a series of articles and books Swinburne’s views have changed in significant ways (Swinburne 1988, 1994, 2008, 2018), but this entry focuses on his latest work on the Trinity.
Swinburne aims to build his theory on widespread traditional agreements between most catholic theologians since at least the fourth and fifth centuries (Swinburne 2018, Section 1). The Persons of the Trinity are three beings, each a self which satisfies Boethius’s definition of a “person” as “an individual substance (substantia) of a rational nature” (421). Each is divine in that each has all the divine attributes. “A divine person is naturally understood as one who is essentially eternally omnipotent and exists (in some sense) ’necessarily’” (427). He argues that omnipotence entails perfect goodness and omniscience. While all three of the Persons exist necessarily (inevitably), the Father does this independently while the Son and Spirit exist of necessity dependently, because necessarily, the Father exists, and his existence implies that he causes them (437, n. 14). These actions of the Father are inevitable and not voluntary, but they are via the Father’s will (425, 428). This causing is traditionally described as the eternal generation of the Son by the Father, and the eternal proceeding of the Spirit from the Father, or from the Father and the Son. For Swinburne, the Son is “caused by the Father alone” while the Spirit is “caused by the Father and/or through the Son” (429). The theory then is committed to one of these two models of the divine processions.
Swinburne has constructed a couple versions of an argument which purports to show why, if there is at least one divine being or Person, there must be exactly three, with the second and third being caused ultimately by the first. In other words, given that it is possible that there be a divine Person, it is metaphysically impossible that there be only one, and it is metaphysically necessary that there be exactly three. Most trinitarians have assumed that such an argument is neither possible nor desirable, as the Trinity can be known only by divine revelation. Against this, Swinburne says that “even if you regard the New Testament as an infallible source of doctrine, you cannot derive from it a doctrine of the Trinity”, because when it comes to passages about the Spirit,
…there are non-Trinitarian ways of interpreting…[these] which are just as plausible as interpreting them as expressing the doctrine that the Holy Spirit is a divine person…So unless Christians today recognize some good a priori argument for a doctrine of the Trinity (and most of them do not recognize such an argument), or unless they consider that the fact that the subsequent Church taught a doctrine of the Trinity is a significant reason for interpreting the relevant passages in a Trinitarian way, it seems to me that most Christians today (that is, those not acquainted with any a priori argument for its truth) would not be justified in believing the doctrine. (419–20)
One may wonder if there could be two omnipotent beings; there have been arguments from theism (at least one god) to monotheism (exactly one god) based on the idea that it’d be impossible for there to be more than one who is omnipotent. (See the Monotheism entry, section 5.) Suppose that one omnipotent being willed a certain object to move and simultaneously another omnipotent being willed that it should remain in place. It would seem that whether the object moves or stays in place, one of the being’s wills is thwarted, so that, contrary to our stipulation, one of them fails to be omnipotent. Swinburne argues that such conflicts of will are impossible given the omniscience, perfect goodness, and causal relations of the omnipotent beings. In his view, in causing the Son and Spirit, the Father must “lay down the rules determining who has the right to do which actions; and the other members of the Trinity would recognize his right, as the source of their being to lay them down” (428).
Inspired by similar arguments given by Richard of St. Victor, Swinburne argues that a divine Person must be perfect in love. But
…perfect love must be fully mutual love, reciprocated in kind and quantity, involving total sharing, the kind of love involved in a perfect marriage; and only a being who could share with him the rule of the universe could fully reciprocate the love of another such. …it would be a unique best action for the Father to cause the existence of the Son, and so inevitably he would do so. …at each moment of everlasting time the Father must always cause the Son to exist, and so always keep the Son in being. (429–30)
Thus, if there is one divine Person, there must also be another. Further, there must be a third, for
A twosome can be selfish. …Perfect love for a beloved…must involve the wish that the beloved should be loved by someone else also. Hence it will be a unique best action for the Father to cause the existence of a third divine being whom Father and Son could love and by whom each could be loved. Hence the Holy Spirit. And I suggest that it would be best if the Father included the Son as co-cause (as he is of all other actions of the Father) in causing the Spirit. And again they must have caused the Spirit to exist at each past moment of everlasting time. Hence the Trinity must always have existed. (430)
What stops this process of deity-proliferation from careening into four, seventy-four, or four million divine Persons? Swinburne replies that it is not better to cause four (or more) divine Persons than it is to cause three, since
…when there is an infinite series of incompatible possible good actions, each better than the previous one, available to some agent, it is not logically possible that he do the best one–because there is no best action. An agent is perfectly good in that situation if he does any one of those good actions. So since to bring about only three divine persons would be incompatible with an alternative action of bringing about only four divine persons, and so generally, the perfect goodness of the Father would be satisfied by his bringing about only two further divine persons. He does not have to bring about a fourth divine person in order to fulfil his divine nature. To create a fourth divine person would therefore be an act of will, not an act of nature. But then any fourth divine person would not exist necessarily in the sense in which the second and third divine persons exist necessarily–his existence would not be a necessary consequence of the existence of a necessary being; and hence he would not be divine. So there cannot be a fourth divine person. There must be and can only be three divine persons. (430–1)
In sum, divinity implies “perfect love”, which implies exactly three divine Persons.
Lebens and Tuggy (2019) object that such arguments trade on the ambiguity of “perfect love”. Divinity, by implying moral perfection, implies the character trait of being perfectly loving. But someone may have this and yet not be in the sort of interpersonal relationship that Swinburne describes as “perfect love”. (See also Tuggy 2015.) Using familial analogies, Brian Leftow challenges Swinburne’s claim that the three would lack an overriding reason to produce a fourth, noting that “Cooperating with two to love yet another is a greater ‘balancing act’ than cooperating with one to love yet another” (1999, 241).
Tuggy (2004) objects that if a three-self theory like Swinburne’s were true, it would seem that one or more members of the Trinity have wrongfully deceived us by leading us to falsely believe that there is only one divine self. He also argues that the New Testament writings assume that “God” and “the Father of Jesus” (in all but a few cases) co-refer, reflecting the assumption that God and the Father are numerically the same. (See also Tuggy 2014, 2019.) Denying this last claim, he argues, amounts to an uncharitable and unreasonable attribution of a serious confusion to the New Testament writers and (if they’re to be believed) to Jesus as well. These arguments are rebutted by William Hasker (2009) and the argument is continued in Hasker 2011, Tuggy 2011b, and Tuggy 2014.
But as mentioned at the outset, the most common objection to Swinburne’s Trinity theory is that it is tritheism and not monotheism. Looking, for instance, at this account of divine processions, a reader wonders why this doesn’t amount to one god eternally causing a second god, and with that second god eternally causing a third god. To assuage such concerns, Swinburne argues that on his model of the Trinity, it is natural to say that there is “one God”. Swinburne observes that the Greek theos (and equally the Latin deus) may be used either as a name, a singular referring term picking out a certain individual thing, or as a predicate, a descriptive word equivalent in meaning to “divine”, which might in principle be applied to more than one thing. Then he observes,
While no doubt the Fathers of the  Council did not have a clear view of what was the sense in which there is just one “God” and the sense in which each of the three beings is “God” the distinction between the two senses of the crucial words makes available one obvious way of resolving the apparent contradiction. This is by thinking of these words as having the former sense [i.e. referring to one thing like a name] when the Creed says that there is “one God”, and as having the latter sense [i.e. being equivalent the adjective “divine”] when it claims that each of the beings “is God.” Thus understood, the Creed is saying that there is one unique thing which it names “God,” which consists of three beings. (420)
The suggestion is that the tradition is somewhat confused, but that charitably, we should think its talk of “one God” should be understood as referring to the Trinity. (However, see the opening line of the Nicene creed.) What sort of thing is this Trinity? It is not a divine Person, and is not a thing (person or not) with the divine essence. Rather, it is a thing of which the three divine beings (selves, persons) are proper parts (425). Despite this complex entity not having the divine essence (and so, not being a god), Swinburne sometimes refers to it as “God himself” (424). He argues that these three beings can’t help but cooperate, and so agrees with the traditional claim that apart from the aforementioned eternal causings of one another, any act of one Person of the Trinity is an act of all three Persons (425). In sum, “This common omnipotence, omniscience, and perfect goodness in the community of action makes it that case that in a natural sense there is one God” (428). That is, given the three divine beings described above, it is “natural”, when it comes to the name-like use of the word “God,” to apply the term to that thing which is the whole consisting of those three Persons. But it remains that there are three things here each of which is divine, and that this whole is not itself divine; it’s hard to see why this is monotheism and not tritheism.
Brian Leftow objects that in Swinburne’s account God is not itself divine. Nor does it makes sense to worship it, as it is not the sort of thing which can be aware of our addressing it. Further, the issue of monotheism isn’t the issue of how unified the divine beings are, but rather of how many there are.
…it is hardly plausible that Greek paganism would have been a form of monotheism had Zeus & Co. been more alike, better behaved, and linked by the right causal connections. (Leftow 1999, 232; cf. Rea 2006)
Moreover, Swinburne’s theory entails serious inequalities of power among the Three, jeopardizes the personhood of each, and carries the serious price of allowing (contrary to most theists) that a divine being may be created, and the possibility of more than one divine being (Leftow 1999, 236–40).
Daniel Howard-Snyder (2016) argues that Swinburne is committed to descriptive polytheism, normative polytheism, and cultic polytheism, and so is a “polytheist par excellence”. He also argues that Swinburne’s account of the Trinity is unorthodox.
Daniel Spencer (2019) argues that the several factors which Swinburne and others appeal to in order to lend some sort of unity to the three persons are obviously inadequate to show how they amount to one God and not three gods. At most, we get three divine beings who in some ways resemble a god. Spencer observes that sometimes Swinburne simply accepts tritheism, as when he says that there are three divine individuals or beings (Spencer 2019, 192, 198 n. 2; Swinburne 1994, 170, 179). In his first treatment of the subject Swinburne talks of “three Gods” (Swinburne 1988, 234). In later writings he doesn’t use that phrase, but his conception of the Persons is substantially the same. Spencer observes that in principle, making the Persons proper parts of a whole which is the only God might do the trick (195–6), and Swinburne does suggest that there is a part-whole relationship between the Persons and God; however, for Swinburne the whole is not a god.
Perhaps the most sympathetic voice in the literature is William Hasker (2013, Chapter 18), but in the end he agrees that Swinburne has not done enough to unify the Persons. (Hasker 2013b, Chapters 25–8, 2018, 5–7; Swinburne 2014)
2.4 Trope-Constitution Monotheism
William Hasker (2013b) has constructed what is arguably the most developed three-self theory of the Trinity. As with Swinburne, his thoughts have developed over decades (Tuggy 2013b), but this entry will focus on his recent publications. For Hasker, following Plantinga, the Persons of the Trinity are “distinct centers of knowledge, will, love, and action…persons in some full sense of the term” (22; cf. Chapter 24). Hasker argues that such a view is widespread in ancient sources, including Gregory of Nyssa and Augustine (Chapters 4–5, 9). While we can’t reasonably retain the ancient doctrine of divine simplicity (Chapter 7, 2016, 2018a, 7–8, 18–9), we ought to uphold as many of the traditional claims as possible, for we should assume divine guidance of theological development, even though “the Church’s doctrine of the Trinity is not as such to be found in the New Testament” (8). The “fathers” of the late fourth century should be seen as “the giants on whose shoulders we need to stand” (10). In the second part of his book (Chapters 11–20) Hasker interacts with a number of Trinity theories, attempting to salvage whatever is correct in them for use in his own three-self theory; he incorporates ideas particularly from Leftow, Craig, Rea, and Swinburne.
For Hasker, the Persons of the Trinity are three divine selves (Chapters 22–5). Against a modern Protestant trend, Hasker insists that a doctrine of processions must be retained, arguing that it enjoys “significant support” from scripture (217), and he points out the awkwardness accepting “the main results of the [ancient] trinitarian controversy” while thinking that this “developmental process…had at its heart a fundamentally wrong assumption”, that is, that the Son and Spirit exist because of the Father (222–3).
Hasker spends several chapters (25–8) addressing the question: “in virtue of what do the three persons constitute one God?” (203). The three enjoy some sort of unity of will and fellowship, and they are united in that the second and third exist and have the divine nature because of the first, but such factors don’t, by themselves, imply that they somehow amount to a single god. Hasker holds that a crucial factor is the idea of their shared divine nature as a concrete property or trope. Following Craig, sometimes Hasker characterizes this concrete divine nature as a divine mind or soul. He argues that for all we know, it is possible for one such trope of divinity “to support simultaneously three distinct lives” which belong to the Persons (228). He argues that this possibility is indirectly supported by split-brain and multiple-personality phenomena in human psychology. He takes these to show that “It is possible for a single concrete human nature–a single trope of humanness–to support simultaneously two or more centers of consciousness” (236).
This supporting or sustaining relation, Hasker says, may optionally be specified to involve the divine nature constituting each Person (Chapter 28).
We shall say, then, that the one concrete divine nature sustains eternally the three distinct life-streams of the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit, and that in virtue of this the nature constitutes each of the persons although it is not identical with the persons. (244)
Constitution is defined here as asymmetric, so none of the Persons also constitutes the divine nature (245). In a later discussion, he seems to make constitution central to the theory (Hasker 2018a). Adapting work on the metaphysics of material constitution by Lynne Rudder Baker, Hasker offers this definition:
Suppose x has F as its primary kind, and y has G as its primary kind. Then x constitutes y just in case
- x and y have all their parts in common;
- x is in “G-favorable circumstances”;
- necessarily, if an object of primary kind F is in G-favorable circumstances there is an object of primary kind G that has all its parts in common with that object; and
- it is conceptually possible for x to exist but for there to be no object of primary kind G that has all its parts in common with x. (Hasker 2018a, 16–7, cf. 2013b, 241–3; Howard-Snyder 2015b, 108–9)
Applying this doctrine of non-material constitution to the Trinity, to say that the divine nature constitutes the Father is to say that those have all their parts in common and that the nature is in divine-Person-favorable circumstances. For a thing of the type “divine mind/soul or concrete nature” to be in “divine trinitarian Person”-favorable circumstances means that there is a divine trinitarian Person which has all his parts in common with the first thing, and that it is conceivable that the first thing exists even though there is nothing of the type “divine trinitarian Person” that has all its parts in common with it. Hasker clarifies that in his view all the entities mentioned here are simple (lacking in proper parts), so each will be what metaphysicians call an improper part of one another, satisfying condition i. He also clarifies that the conceptual possibility in condition iv does not imply metaphysical possibility; Hasker denies that this is metaphysically possible: the divine nature exists but no divine Person exists (18). He adds that
The divine nature constitutes the divine trinitarian Persons when it sustains simultaneously three divine life-streams, each life-stream including cognitive, affective, and volitional states. Since in fact the divine nature does sustain three such life-streams simultaneously, there are exactly three divine Persons. (2018a, 17)
Presumably, the divine-Person-favorable circumstances which the divine nature is in, is support of these life-streams.
Hasker argues that the “grammar” of the Trinity forbids a Christian from saying things like “three gods” based on there being three Persons each of which is divine (2013b, 247). Again, although “God” in the New Testament nearly always refers to the Father, one can’t infer that the Father and God are numerically one (248). With a nod to a mereological account of the Persons and God, he says that “Each Person is wholly God, but each Person is not the whole of God” (250; cf. 257). Hasker also argues, plausibly, that the “Athanasian” creed can be read as non-paradoxical if we realize that it is laying down rules about what must be said and what must not be said (250–4).
In the end, as with Swinburne, the Trinity which is called “God” is not literally a god, as it is not divine. But Hasker suggests that
…in virtue of the closeness of their union, the Trinity is at times referred to as if it were a single person. The Trinity is divine, exhibiting all the essential divine attributes—not by possessing knowledge, power, and so on distinct from those of the divine persons, but rather in view of the fact that the Trinity consists precisely of those three persons and of nothing else. It is this Trinity which we are to worship, and obey, and love as our Lord and our God. (2013b, 258)
In an attack on theories of divine simplicity, in which he sets aside considerations of God as Trinity, Hasker objects that if God is simple, God is “dehumanized” in that God must lack certain qualities which Christians should think God literally shares with human beings, such as caring for and being responsive to his creatures, and being able to either judge or forgive them (2016, Section 5). But while none of those qualities implies being human, each arguably implies selfhood. Yet Hasker denies that God is literally a self.
Brian Leftow points out the oddness of ascribing a soul to God the Trinity.
This [soul] is not God. It is not a Person either. It is some other sort of concrete divine individual. We had not suspected that a spirit could have a soul; lo, God does! (Leftow 2018, 10)
Leftow also objects that the sentence “God is the ultimate reality” seems to be true by definition. But on Hasker’s theory, this soul (a.k.a. the divine nature), which is not God, would be the ultimate reality, being the source of the Persons and so of God (the Trinity) (12). Again, Leftow objects that this theory is not monotheistic; rather, the theory features three deities which we can’t describe as such because there is one object (the divine nature/soul) which constitutes them (15).
Daniel Howard-Snyder objects that Hasker’s talk of the nature “supporting” or “sustaining” the lives or “life-streams” of the Persons is unintelligible (2015b, 108–10). He also argues that it is unclear quite what constitutes the Persons, as in various places Hasker says that this is the divine mind/soul, the concrete divine nature (a trope of divinity), and a single mental substance–and these would appear to be different claims (110). Also, monotheism uncontroversially implies that there is exactly one god. But Hasker forbids saying that any of the Persons is a god. And by definition being a god implies having the divine nature, and like others Hasker understands divinity to imply perfection in knowledge, power to intentionally act, and moral goodness–thus, divinity implies being a self. This, Howard-Snyder says, is a necessary truth and one with which basically all Christians agree. But Hasker’s “God”, whether this is a community or a composite object, is not a self, and so is not literally divine. But then, we’ve run out of candidates for being the only god; if neither the Father, nor the Son, nor the Spirit is a god, then it would seem that for Hasker there is no god! Anticipating monotheism-related objections, Hasker lobs various charges at Howard-Snyder (112–3), but in the end it seems that Hasker’s view is just that “God” can be spoken of as if it were a self (114–5). Taking a term from recent philosophy of mind, Howard-Snyder says that for Hasker God is a “zombie”, a merely apparent self which in fact lacks any consciousness, any point of view, and any mentality (114). He concludes that Hasker is not aiming for the sober metaphysical truth about the Trinity but is instead settling for some sort of “as-ifery”. How, he asks, could it be more accurate to describe God as “omnipotent and omniscient” than it is to describe God as “powerless and ignorant” when on Hasker’s account God is straightforwardly the latter? (115)
Hasker replies that his claim that the divine nature supports the lives of the Persons is no more unintelligible than is the claim that “my desktop computer supports word processing”; to support is to “maintain in being or in action; to keep up, keep going” (Hasker 2018a, 11). Nor should it worry us that we can’t understand how this supporting works (12).
2.5 Trinity Monotheism
The Trinity monotheist says that even though there are three divine Persons, there is one God because there is one Trinity (Moreland and Craig 2017, 588; Craig 2006; Layman 1988, 2016). William Lane Craig has defended the best known such theory. The aim is to go beyond mere analogies, providing a literal model of how to understand traditional trinitarian claims.
Craig and Moreland offer Cerberus, the three-headed dog from Greek mythology as “an image of the Trinity among creatures” (592). The point of this fictional example is that Cerberus would be one dog with three “centers of consciousness”. Though only parts of one dog, each head is literally canine. If we were to upgrade the mental capacity of the three here, it would be one dog which is three persons. And if we imagine that Cerberus survives death, in that case we can’t say that the three are one dog because they have one body. In fact, we’re now imagining one (canine) soul which supports three persons. Change canine to divine, and this is the model of the Trinity. (592–3)
God is an immaterial substance or soul endowed with three sets of cognitive faculties each of which is sufficient for personhood, so that God has three centers of self-consciousness, intentionality, and will…the persons are [each] divine… since the model describes a God who is tri-personal. The persons are the minds of God. (Craig 2006, 101)
Only the Trinity, on this theory, is an instance of the divine nature, as the divine nature includes the property of being triune. (See section 5.1.) Beyond the Trinity “there are no other instances of the divine nature” (2017, 589). So if “being divine” means “being identical with a divinity” (i.e., being a thing which instantiates the nature divinity), then none of the Persons are “divine”. But the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit are each “divine” in that they are parts of the one God, somewhat as the bones of a cat are “feline”, or as the heads of Cerberus are “canine” (592).
But the theory also makes the Persons “divine” in other ways too. In a sense the theory divides the divine attributes between the Persons and the Trinity.
…when we ascribe omnipotence and omniscience to God, we are not making the Trinity a fourth person or agent. Divine attributes like omniscience, omnipotence and goodness are grounded in the persons’ possessing these properties, while divine attributes like necessity, aseity and eternity are not so grounded. With respect to the latter, the persons have these properties because God as a whole has them. For parts can have some properties in virtue of the wholes of which they are parts. …The point is… [the persons’] deity seems in no way diminished because they are not instances of the divine nature. (590)
Like Swinburne (see section 2.3) Craig argues that it is impossible for God to be a single Person because “if God is perfectly loving by his very nature, he must [eternally] be giving himself in love to another” (593). And since God is free not to create, but must be loving another, “the other to whom God’s love is necessarily directed must be internal to God himself” (ibid.). For Craig this is a plausibility argument rather than a strict proof, in support of the claim that the concept of unipersonal God is incoherent. Unlike Swinburne, he does not seem to think that this argument is important to reasonable belief in the Trinity (Craig believes the Trinity can somehow be derived from the Bible–on which see section 5.4), nor does Craig mount a philosophical argument for why there must be exactly three divine Persons.
One may object that this argument depends on an equivocation on the phrase “perfectly loving”. One who thinks that God is a perfect being must hold that God has the character trait of being perfectly loving, but this doesn’t seem to imply the action of perfectly loving (i.e. engaging in the best kind of loving relationship with another) (Lebens and Tuggy 2019).
Daniel Howard-Snyder (2003) offers numerous objections to Craig’s theory. First, it can’t avoid either polytheism or different levels of divinity, either of which would make it unorthodox. The Cerberus analogy is criticized on the grounds that it would not be one dog with three minds, but rather, three dogs with overlapping bodies. (This seems clear in the parallel case of human conjoined twins; everyone considers them to be siblings, two humans with overlapping bodies, not a human with two heads.) While Craig’s theory upholds (with the creeds) one divine substance, by his own criteria each of the three Persons must be a substance as well, and the account says that each Person is divine. Thus, the theory implies polytheism (393–5). Here God is not a personal being, in the sense of being numerically identical with a certain self, even though it (God) has parts which are selves. Craig wants to say, for example, that each of the three is all-knowing, and also that God is all-knowing, in that God has parts which are all-knowing. But Howard-Snyder objects that,
…there can be no “lending” of a property [i.e., a whole “getting” a property from one of its parts] unless the borrower is antecedently the sort of thing that can have it….[Therefore,] Unless God is antecedently the sort of thing that can act intentionally—that is, unless God is a person—God cannot borrow the property of creating the heavens and the earth from the Son….All other [statements involving] acts attributed to God [in the Bible] will likewise turn out to be, strictly and literally, false. (399–400)
According to Trinity monotheism, a thing can exemplify the divine nature without itself being a self. Nor can divinity include properties which require being a self, e.g., being all-knowing, being perfectly free. This, Howard-Snyder argues, is “an abysmally low” view of the divine nature, since “If God is not a person or agent, then God does not know anything, cannot act, cannot choose, cannot be morally good, cannot be worthy of worship” (401).
Craig replies to Howard-Snyder’s objection to the Cerberus analogy that the claim that it represents three dogs is “astonishing”, as we all speak of two headed snakes, turtles and such (Craig 2003, 102). While on Trinity monotheism God isn’t identical to any personal being, it doesn’t follow that God isn’t “personal”. He is personal in the sense of having personal parts. Further, the view that God isn’t a self
…is part and parcel of Trinitarian orthodoxy…Howard-Snyder assumes that God cannot have such properties [i.e., knowledge, freedom, moral goodness, worship-worthiness] unless He is a person. But it seems to me that God can have them if God is a soul possessing the rational faculties sufficient for personhood. If God were a soul endowed with a single set of rational faculties, then He could do all these things. By being a more richly endowed soul, is God thereby somehow incapacitated? (105)
As to the charge of polytheism, Craig accuses Howard-Snyder of confusing monotheism with unitarianism (106), i.e. assuming that the existence of exactly one god entails that there is exactly one divine self. Finally, Craig argues that the issue of whether or not the Three count as parts of God is unimportant (107–13). Tuggy (2013b) presses some of Howard-Snyder’s objections, concluding that the theory is either not monotheistic, or turns out to be a one-self theory.
Stephen Layman (2016) has constructed a similar and arguably better developed three-self Trinity theory. Motivated by the New Testament, Layman says that the three Persons of the Trinity are three selves (124–31). Each is “divine” in that he is a fitting object of worship, and so is God the Trinity. God the Trinity is literally a social entity, a concrete, primary substance which is strongly analogous to a living thing, and which like a living thing is a self-maintaining event (149–50). “Strictly speaking, only the Trinity, the community of divine persons, is God, that is, ruler of all” (148). Yet the Persons are “of one substance” in that “each belongs to the kind divine being”, where this means a person which is a part of a god (150–1, 165–6).
One may object that a social entity can’t be a god, as such a thing is merely an abstraction. Layman answers that social entities are concrete, not abstract, and can intentionally act (159–60). Intentionally acting requires having intentions, but social entities may have these, even though they are not selves or even subjects of consciousness. Social entities may have intentions because their parts (i.e. various selves) have them. As a fallback, Layman suggests the view that social entities may act even though they’re incapable of intentional action (159). Like Craig, Layman argues that the Trinity can be omnipotent, perfectly good, and omniscient because its persons are (160). Why then is the Trinity not a fourth divine person (see section 3.1)?
In order to count as a person, an entity must be able to refer to itself rightly with the first-person singular pronoun “I” (or its equivalent). And the Trinity can not do this. (161)
But doesn’t the Bible portray God as a self who speaks in the first-person? Layman concedes that the Old Testament does. But because they believe in progressive divine revelation, Christians should read the Old Testament as corrected by the New Testament. And in the New Testament arguably there are “three divine persons (conscious beings)” (164). Old Testament passages where “God” speaks first-person should be read as the Father speaking on behalf of the Trinity (ibid.).
The account is not polytheism because only the Trinity is God, and because of the necessary unity of the three (160, 167). But isn’t “Every divine person is a god” true by definition? No, because “divine” can mean relating to a god (without being a god), and in this common meaning the Persons of this theory are “divine”. Similarly, a hand can be “human” without itself being a human being (165).
How can the Son and Spirit be fully divine if each is caused by the Father and so does not exist a se? Layman answers that “the objector’s intuition that divinity requires aseity is not shared by those who drew up the [Nicene] creed” (167). Further, “it seems to me that aseity is clearly not essential to divinity, that is, it is not essential for being worthy of worship” (168). The qualities of omnipotence, omniscience, eternality, perfect goodness, and necessary existence are sufficient to guarantee the worship-worthiness of the Persons (ibid.).
Like Swinburne and Craig, Layman argues that a God who is a single self is impossible. While aware than a theist may understand God to be “perfectly loving” in the sense of having a perfect disposition to love which doesn’t have to be actualized, Layman nonetheless asserts that
There is…considerable plausibility in the claim that a truly solitary person who throughout all eternity never expressed any love for anyone would not be a perfectly loving person. (153)
Thus, given that God must be perfect independently of creation, “a truly solitary person would not be divine, for it would not be perfectly loving” (154). Additionally, Layman argues that it is “inconceivable” that a divine Person should flourish without loving another, and that surely only the love of finite selves would not be enough (154–5). A solitary divine Person would be “an appropriate object of pity” (155). Again, Layman argues that the Bible suggests that a divine Person must have not only splendor (exalted attributes) but also glory, “something at least akin to fame–a kind of recognition, approval, or appreciation” which is conferred by another (156). A solitary divine Person would be lacking this glory; but presumably a divine Person must have glory. Thus, there couldn’t be just one divine person (156–7).
Layman is skeptical about philosophical arguments purporting to show why there must be exactly three divine Persons, but he think’s he’s shown why there can’t be only one. The limit of divine Persons to three, in his view, can only come from the Bible (157–8).
Tuggy (2015) objects to arguments that there can’t be a single divine self based on divine happiness or flourishing, urging instead that a divine self who exists and is perfect of himself would automatically be well-off, happy, or flourishing despite lacking countless important goods. It is too anthropomorphic, he argues, to suppose that a god or a divine self, like a human, is a social animal which can’t flourish without interpersonal relationships.
2.6 Material Monotheism
Christopher Hughes (2009) suggests a theory much like the Constitution theory (section 2.1.2 above) but without its controversial claim that there can be numerical sameness without identity. On this picture,
…we have just one (bit of?) divine “matter,” three divine forms, and three (“partially overlapping,” materially indiscernible but formally discernible divine hylomorphs [compounds of form and matter]. …“divine person” is true of the three hylomorphs, but… “God” is true of the (one and only) (bit of?) “divine matter.” (2009, 309)
On this theory, “The Father is God,” means that the Father has God for his matter, or that the Father is “materiated by” God, and “The Father is the same God as the Son” means that these two are materiated by the same God (309–10).
An objection is that the one God of Christianity is not supposed to be a portion of matter. Hughes replies that perhaps it is orthodox to say that God is a very unusual kind of matter (310).
Alternately, Hughes suggests a retreat from matter terminology, and argues that Persons of the Trinity can’t bear the same relation they bear to one another that each bears to God. That is, it can’t be correct, for example, that Father and Son are consubstantial, and that the Father and God are consubstantial. The reason is that for two things to be consubstantial is for there to be something which both are “substantiated” or “ensubstanced” by. They are consubstantial because they both bear this other relation to a third, substantiating thing. Thus, e.g. “The Father is God” means “The Father is (a person of the substance) God.” Thus, even though Father and Son are numerically two, still it can be true that “There is just one (substance) God” (311).
On this alternate view, though, what does it mean to say that God is the substance of a divine Person? Hughes suggests that the case is analogous to material objects. A sweater and some wool thread are “co-materiate” in that both are “materiated” or “enmattered” by one portion of matter, though they are numerically distinct (311; cf. 313). Hughes suggests it is an open question whether this is a different theory, or just a restatement of the first “in more traditional theological terminology.” It will be the latter “If we can stretch the notion of ‘matter’ far enough to cover God, and stretch the notion of material substance (aka hylomorph) far enough to cover the divine persons” (312). Hughes ends on a negative mysterian note (see section 4.1 below), claiming that it is an advantage of this last account that ensubstancement is “a (very, though not entirely) mysterious relation” (313).
Leftow (2018) objects that this theory features four things which are divine, which is at least one too many. Further, on this account God has but the Persons lack the divine attribute of aseity, which makes the Persons “at best only second-class deities” (10).
2.7 Concept-relative Monotheism
Einar Bøhn (2011) argues that trinitarian problems of self-consistency vanish when one realizes that the Trinity “is just an ordinary case of one-many identity” (363). He takes from Frege the idea that number-properties are concept-relative. Thus,
…conceptualizing the portion of reality that is God as the Father, the Son, and the Holy Spirit, we have conceptualized it as being three in number, but it is nonetheless the same portion of reality as what we might conceptualize as God, and hence as being one in number. (366)
There is no privileged way of conceptualizing [this portion of reality] in terms of which we can explain the other way. Both ways are equally legitimate. (369)
A difficulty for this approach is that most philosophers don’t think there can be one-many identity relations. Some think identity is of necessity a one-one relation, although others allow there can be many-many identity; for instance, it may be that the three men who committed the robbery are identical to the three men who were convicted of the robbery. Those who believe identity can be one-many typically do so because they accept the controversial thesis that composition (the relation of parts to a whole they compose) should be understood as identity. Although Bøhn does accept that thesis (Bøhn 2014), he argues that this Trinity theory relies only on our having “a primitive notion of plural identity” (371), that is, a concept we understand without reference to any concept from mereological (parts and wholes) theory. For example, we can recognize a certain human body to be identical to a certain plurality of head, torso, two arms, and two legs. And we can recognize that a pair of shoes is identical to a plurality of shoes (365).
Bøhn argues that orthodoxy, by the standards of either the New Testament or the “Athanasian” Creed (see section 5.3), requires that the Persons of the Trinity be distinct (i.e. no one is identical to any other) but not that any is identical to the one God. Rather, orthodoxy requires that the one God is identical to the Three considered as a plurality. Thus, e.g. “The Father is God” must be read predicatively, that is, not as identifying the Father with God, but rather as describing the Father as divine (364, 367 n. 13).
Does this theory make God’s triunity dependent on human thought? And might the divine portion of reality equally well be conceived as seventeen? Bøhn replies,
That numerical properties are relational properties with concepts as their relational units is compatible with reality having a real and objective numerical structure. (372)
Thus, it doesn’t follow that any conceptualization of this portion of reality is equally correct. While in this context he demurs from saying anything about concepts (372), it seems that Bøhn assumes in Fregean fashion that concepts are objective and not mind-dependent (Bøhn 2013, Section 1).
Joseph Long (2019) objects that the theory is unorthodox because it requires a type of thing which is divine and yet which is neither the Trinity nor any divine Person. Further, Bøhn’s talk of “portions of reality” is unintelligible. Finally, orthodoxy demands that the Persons of the Trinity “are one God regardless of our conceptual scheme”, whereas on this account whether or not the Persons are one god is relative to how we conceptualize them.
Sheiva Kleinschmidt argues that theories on which composition is explained in terms of identity are of no use to the trinitarian, for such theories add no significant options to the options the trinitarian already has (Kleinschmidt 2012).
3. Four-self, No-self, and Indeterminate Self Theories
Some Trinity theories don’t fit in to either one-self or three-self categories, because they imply more divine selves than three, less than one, or are unclear about how many selves there might be in the Trinity.
3.1 God as a Functional Person
Chad McIntosh (2015) formulates a Trinity theory which is similar to three-self theories except that it adds God the Trinity as a fourth divine self. This theory is inspired by recent work by philosophers on group persons. It’s a longstanding part of legal tradition to treat various kinds of non-persons, such as corporations, as if they were persons. This is particularly useful, e.g. in holding corporations responsible for damages they cause. But some philosophers have argued for group agency realism, the thesis that some groups of persons are themselves literal persons, with interests, knowledge, freedom, power to intentionally act, and moral responsibility (168–71). McIntosh distinguishes “intrinsicist” persons, persons which are so because of their nature, from “functional” persons, persons which are so because of how they function. On this account the Persons of the Trinity are intrinsicist persons, while God the Trinity is a functional person (171).
McIntosh argues that since moral responsibility implies personhood (of some kind), and it is clear that the Trinity must be praiseworthy, e.g. “for having achieved salvation for humankind” or “just for having the character of a loving community”, then the Trinity must himself be a person. And it is widely agreed by Christians that the Trinity should be worshiped, but a non-person can’t be a fitting recipient of worship (173).
One may object that the Christian God is supposed to be a Trinity of Persons, not a Quaternity of Persons. As Leftow objects to another theory,
…the very fact that the doctrine the Creed states is known as that of the Trinity militates against calling a four-[divine]-individuals view orthodox. Had the Creed-writers envisioned God plus the Persons as adding up to four divine individuals, surely the doctrine would have been called Quaternity from the beginning (Leftow 2018, 10).
McIntosh replies that the tradition demands that there are exactly three Persons (Greek: hypostases) which share the divine nature or essence, which is captured by his claim that there are exactly three intrinsicist persons. This account does not claim that God is a fourth hypostasis, a fourth intrinsicist person. Rather, God is a functional person, a person not by his essence, but rather who exists as a person because of the unified functioning of the Father, Son, and Spirit (174).
McIntosh argues that the theory neatly sidesteps a number of common objections to three-self theories: here, God is a self and not merely a group or a composite object which is less than a self. In contrast with three-self theories, as a literal self, personal pronouns may be literally used of him. And this group which is a “he” can have the divine attributes which imply being a self, such as omniscience and moral perfection. (See sections 2.4, 2.5.) It also, McIntosh argues, either falsifies or casts doubt on the key premise in Tuggy’s divine deception argument against three-self theories (175–7, 180; see section 2.3.) Following some Old Testament scholars, McIntosh claims that ancient Israelites recognized many groups, including their own nation, as literal (group, functional) persons. He argues that this belief explains a number of oddities in the Old Testament, such as the idea of group guilt, apparent beings which seem in some sense to be extensions of Yahweh’s personhood, and texts which switch easily between singular and plural subjects (177–80).
3.2 Temporal Parts Monotheism
H. E. Baber (2002) argues that a Trinity theory may posit the Persons as “successive, non-overlapping temporal parts of one God” (11). This one God is neither simple nor timeless, but is a temporally extended self with shorter-lived temporally extended selves as his parts. This does not violate the requirement of monotheism, because we should count gods by “tensed identity”, which is “not identity but rather the relation that obtains between individuals at a time, t, when they share a stage [i.e. a temporal part] at t” (5). At any given time, only one self bears this relation of temporal-stage sharing with God.
How can any of these selves be divine given that they are neither timeless nor everlasting? Following Parfit, she argues that a self may last through time without being identical to any later self at the later times; that is, “identity is not what matters for survival” (6). Each of these non-eternal selves, then, counts as the continuation of the previous one, and is everlasting in the sense that it is a temporal part of an everlasting whole, God. The obscure traditional generation and procession relations are re-interpreted as non-causal relations between God and two of his temporal parts, the Son and Spirit (13–4). In a later paper, she argues that any trinitarian may and should accept this re-interpretation (Baber 2008).
Although Baber argues that this is a “minimally decent” Trinity theory, she admits that it is heretical, and names it a “Neo-Sabellian” theory, because on it, the Persons of the Trinity are non-overlapping, temporary modes of the one God (15; on Sabellianism see section 1.3). But the Persons in this theory are not mere modes; they are truly substances and selves, and there are (at least) three of them, though each is counted as the continuation of the one(s) preceding him. It is unclear whether the theory posits only three selves (10–1). But she argues that the theory is preferable to many of its rivals “since it does not commit us to relative identity or require any ad hoc philosophical commitments” (15), and even though its divine selves don’t overlap, sense can be made of, e.g. Jesus’s interaction with his Father (meaning not the prior divine Person, but God, the temporal whole of whom Jesus is a temporal part) (11–4).
This theory is notable in being a case not of rational reconstruction, but of doctrinal revision (Tuggy 2011a). Many of its features are controversial, such as its unorthodoxy, its metaphysical commitments to temporal parts and the lasting of selves without diachronic identity, its denials of divine simplicity and divine timelessness, and its redefinitions of “monotheism”, “generation”, and “procession”.
In a later discussion Baber argues that some form or other of Sabellianism about the Trinity is theoretically straightforward and fits well with popular Christian piety. Further, such theories can survive the common objections that they imply that God is only contingently trinitarian, and that they characterize God only in relation to the cosmos. While some Sabellian theories do have those implications, Baber argues that a trinitarian may just accept them (2019, 134–8).
Alternately, Baber (2019) develops a structuralist approach to the Trinity which doesn't imply anything about how many selves it involves.
3.3 Persons as Relational Qua-Objects
Rob Koons (2018) constructs an account inspired by Aquinas, Augustine, and recent work on “qua-objects” by Fine and by Asher. Following the latter, Koons understands “qua-modified noun phrases as picking out intentional objects consisting of tropes or accidents, metaphysical parts of the base object” (346). Koons holds that even everyday objects imply the existence of such intentional objects, i.e. things that can be thought. Thus, we can distinguish Trump-qua-husband from Trump-qua-President; while these are real objects of thought, they both amount to being properties of Trump, which Koons thinks of as metaphysical parts of Donald Trump.
Unlike most of the other theories in this entry, Koons builds his on the foundation of divine simplicity, traditionally understood. According to this, God is numerically identical with his nature, his one action, and his existence. God has no accidental (non-essential) properties and no proper parts, and he just is any essential property of his. In sum, God has no parts or components in any sense (339). While one might suppose that this would rule out God being a Trinity, Koons argues that to the contrary, we can understand how and why God is a Trinity by “locating God in an extreme and exotic region of logical space” (ibid.)
The divine nature just is any divine attribute, e.g. omnipotence. In addition, Koons argues that the divine nature just is “an intentional relation: namely, perfect knowledge and perfect love.”. Understanding or knowledge generally should be understood “as an internal relation between the mind and its external object.” (340).
Following Aquinas, Koons says that God (a.k.a. the divine nature) understands all things through himself; God is essentially omniscient and essentially self-understanding. Thus, the divine nature implies the existence of three relational qua-objects, which are the Persons of the Trinity. These are not merely three ways we can think of God, or three ways God may appear to us, but rather these objects result from God’s essential self-understanding (345). Each of these four things–God (the divine nature), the Father, the Son, and the Spirit–has the divine nature as its one metaphysical component, and each has all the divine attributes (346). Each of those four is numerically distinct from each of the three others (347).
The theory requires more than the relation of (absolute) numerical sameness or identity. In addition, Koons defines a relation of “real” sameness. Like identity, this relation is reflexive and symmetrical, but unlike identity it is neither transitive nor Euclidian (such that if any x is related to some y and to some z then this implies that y and z are related in that same way). Thus, real sameness is not an equivalence relation (348, 357 n. 5) According to this theory each Person is really the same as the divine nature (God), but not identical to him. But no Person here is really the same as any other Person; all three are really distinct from one another. To summarize: there are four divine realities on this model of the Trinity. The three Persons are so many qua-objects, while God is not. None of these four is really distinct from God; all are really the same as him. Yet none of the four is identical to any of the others (348).
One may ask why there should be only three qua-objects here, when objects like a human person or an apple, having many properties, might imply hundreds or thousands of qua-objects. The answer is that not every qua-object of God is a divine Person. Many such, Koons says, are contingent, e.g. God-as-creator, or God-as-friend-of-Abraham; such would not have existed had God not created. And any qua-object of God which involves only an essential property of his, e.g. God-as-omnipotent, is numerically identical to God (345). To be a “hypostatic qua-object” (i.e. a God-as-thing which is a divine Person) something must exist necessarily, be numerically distinct from God, and be such that “It is not wholly grounded in a logical or conceptual way on any other divine qua-object or objects. So, it must be fully determinate (non-general, non-disjunctive, and non-negative) in its definition” (346). This last condition is meant to prevent the proliferation of divine qua-objects (354–6). Koons argues that this account explains why there are exactly three divine Persons.
My main claim is that, as a matter of metaphysical necessity, there are exactly three hypostatic qua-objects (namely, Father, Son, and Spirit, as defined above). This is because there are only two intrinsic, relational properties of God (knowing and being known), and these give rise (on purely logical grounds) to only three non-disjunctive combinations. (346)
Divine love doesn’t imply further Persons because it’s the same relational property as divine self-knowing. God-as-knower isn’t numerically the same as God-as-known because of the essential asymmetry of the knowing relation (ibid.). Divine love, Koons says, is a kind of charity of friendship; thus, lover and beloved can’t be numerically identical. So if the Father loves the Son, this implies that they are numerically distinct (non-identical). It also implies that they are really distinct and not really the same. In specifying what he means by real distinctness Koons writes,
Two qua-objects with the same ultimate base are really distinct if and only if they are numerically distinct and the distinction between them is intrinsic to their ultimate base. (348)
The distinction between these qua-objects Father and Son is intrinsic to their ultimate base, God (the divine nature) because he is the intrinsic yet relational property of love (348–9). This has the consequence that “the divine nature cannot love or be loved by any of the divine Persons” (351).
Koons argues that this theory has many advantages over some rivals. Against the constitution based three-self theory of Brower and Rea (see section 2.1.3), it allows for divine simplicity, as the Trinity does not involve any metaphysical components or parts other than the divine nature. And he claims that their account amounts to tritheism, “since each Person is divine in His own unique and incomparable way”. In contrast, on Koons’s theory, “each of the three Persons is divine in the same way–simply by being a divine qua-object, and the divine nature is complete and fully divine in itself”. Again, Koons’s theory can, and theirs can’t, explain why there are exactly three divine Persons. And their theory requires three different odd and hard to explain personal attributes (352). As contrasted with any “social” theory, this one doesn’t have divine Persons which are really distinct from the divine nature (God) (353).
Koons recognizes that many will object that this theory is tetratheism; it features four realities, each of which is divine; prima facie, these would be four gods. Koons believes that the real sameness of each of the Persons with God should rule out any polytheism and rule in monotheism. He offers this definition of monotheism:
There is one and only one thing such that no divine being is really distinct from it (348).
This would be equivalent to:
There is one and only one thing such that every divine being is really the same as it.
But a “divine being” is a god. Thus the meaning of this definition can be restated as:
There is one and only one thing such that every god is really the same as it. Or: There is one and only one thing such that no god is really distinct from it.
This is a controversial definition; one may think that Koons simply redefines “monotheism” as compatible with any number of gods greater than zero. Put differently, one may count things by identity. Why can’t one also count gods in this way? Again, if a is a god, and b is a god, and they are non-identical, what is it about “real sameness” that implies that they’re really the same god? Why isn’t this an ad hoc, theory-saving definition?
One may wonder here how the four realities can be equally divine. It would seem that whereas God (the divine nature) would not exist because of any other, and so would exist a se, each of the qua-object persons would exist because of God, their base. Wouldn’t this make God greater than each of the Persons? Again, on this account each of these four is intrinsically and essentially divine, yet the Persons can love, while God can not. How then can all four be omnipotent?
Some will judge this theory to inherit all the problems of the traditional divine simplicity doctrine it assumes. Others will consider its fit with simplicity to be a feature and not a bug. Koons points out that it also assumes constituent ontology, a Thomistic account of thought, and the claim that the divine nature is an intentional relation (356).
3.4 Persons as Improper Parts of God
An account of the Trinity by Daniel Molto tries to preserve the idea found especially in Western creeds that “each divine person is, in some sense, all of God” (2018, 395). (Because of this he claims the title “Latin” for the theory.) He employs a non-standard mereology (theory of parts and wholes) to interpret what he considers to be the three requirements for a Trinity theory: that there’s only one god, that no Person of the Trinity is identical to any other, and that in some sense it is true that each Person individually “is wholly” God (400). The view is that God, the Father, the Son, and the Spirit are all improper parts of one another, while none is numerically identical to any other. This is shown in the following chart; the lines represent the symmetrical and transitive improper parthood relation.
On more “classical” mereological systems, if A is an improper part of B, this implies that A and B are numerically identical, but in the system suggested by Molto, this is denied. He argues that this change is not merely theologically motivated, but may be applicable to other issues in metaphysics (410–3).
Molto discusses a problem for the model which arises from the transitivity of parthood and the axiom that things which are improper parts of one another must have all their proper parts in common. If the body of the incarnate Son is a proper part of him, then given Molto’s model of the Trinity, this body would also have to be a proper part of God, of the Father, and of the Holy Spirit – claims which most Christian theologians would reject. In response, he adds three further elements to the model, as shown here:
Here, D = the divine nature of the Son, N = the human nature of the Son, and B = the body of the Son. As before, the lines with arrows on each end represent the symmetrical improper parthood relation. In this illustration the one-arrow lines represent the asymmetrical proper parthood relation. Thus, the divine nature of the Son and the human nature of the Son are proper parts of the composite Son, and the human body is a proper part of the human nature (and thus, also of the composite Son).
Molto leaves it up to theologians whether this sort of theory is orthodox (514–7). His suggestion is only that this may be a simpler and less controversial solution to the logical problem of the Trinity, that is, to showing how trinitarian claims do not imply a contradiction. (397–8, 416–7)
Often “mystery” is used in a merely honorific sense, meaning a great and important truth or thing relating to religion. In this vein it’s often said that the doctrine of the Trinity is a mystery to be adored, rather than a problem to be solved. In the Bible a “mystery” (Greek: musterion) is simply a truth or thing which is or has been somehow hidden (i.e., rendered unknowable) by God (Anonymous 1691; Toulmin 1791b). In this sense a “revealed mystery” is a contradiction in terms (Whitby 1841, 101–9). While Paul seems to mainly use “mystery” for what used to be hidden but is now known (Tuggy 2003a, 175), it has been argued that Paul assumes that what has been revealed will continue to be in some sense “mysterious” (Boyer 2007, 98–101).
Mysterianism is a meta-theory of the Trinity, that is, a theory about trinitarian theories, to the effect that an acceptable Trinity theory must, given our present epistemic limitations, to some degree lack understandable content. “Understandable content” here means propositions expressed by language which the hearer “grasps” or understands the meaning of, and which seem to her to be consistent.
At its extreme, a mysterian may hold that no first-order theory of the Trinity is possible, so we must be content with delineating a consistent “grammar of discourse” about the Trinity, i.e., policies about what should and shouldn’t be said about it. In this extreme form, mysterianism may be a sort of sophisticated position by itself—to the effect that one repeats the creedal formulas and refuses on principle to explain how, if at all, one interprets them. More common is a moderate form, where mysterianism supplements a Trinity theory which has some understandable content, but which is vague or otherwise problematic. Thus, mysterianism is commonly held as a supplement to one of the theories of sections 1–3. Again, it may serve as a supplement not to a full-blown theory (i.e., to a literal model of the Trinity) but rather to one or more (admittedly not very helpful) analogies. (See section 3.3.1 in the supplementary document on the history of trinitarian doctrines.) Unitarian views on the Father, Son, and Spirit are typically motivated in part by hostility to mysterianism. (See the supplementary document on unitarianism.) But the same can said of many of the theories of sections 1–3.
Mysterians view their stance as an exercise of theological sophistication and epistemic humility. Some mysterians appeal to the medieval tradition of apophatic or negative theology, the view that one can understand and say what God is not, but not what God is, while others simply appeal to the idea that the human mind is ill-equipped to think about transcendent realities.
Tuggy (2003a) lists five different meanings of “mystery” in the literature:
…a truth formerly unknown, and perhaps undiscoverable by unaided human reason, but which has now been revealed by God and is known to some…  something we don’t completely understand…  some fact we can’t explain, or can’t fully or adequately explain…  an unintelligible doctrine, the meaning of which can’t be grasped…. a truth which one should believe even though it seems, even after careful reflection, to be impossible and/or contradictory and thus false. (175–6)
Sophisticated mysterians about the Trinity appeal to “mysteries” in the fourth and fifth senses. The common core of meaning between them is that a “mystery” is a doctrine which is (to some degree) not understood, in the sense explained above. We here call those who call the Trinity a mystery in the fourth sense “negative mysterians” and those who call it a mystery in the fifth sense “positive mysterians”. It is most common for theologians to combine the two views, though usually one or the other is emphasized.
Sophisticated modern-era mysterians include Leibniz and the theologian Moses Stuart (1780–1852). (Antognazza 2007; Leibniz Theodicy, 73–122; Stuart 1834, 26–50.)
4.1 Negative Mysterianism
The negative mysterian holds that the true doctrine of the Trinity is not understandable because it is too poor in intelligible content for it to positively seem either consistent or inconsistent to us. In the late fourth-century pro-Nicene consensus this takes the form of refusing to state in literal language what there are three of in God, how they’re related to God or to the divine essence, and how they’re related to each other. (See section 3.3 in the supplementary document on the history of Trinity theories.) The Persons of the Trinity, in this way of thinking, are somewhat like three men, but also somewhat like a mind, its thought, and its will, and also somewhat like a root, a tree, and a branch. Multiple incongruous analogies are given, the idea being that a minimal content of the doctrine is thereby expressed, though we remain unable to convert the non-literal claims to literal ones, and may even be unable to express in what respects the analogies do and don’t fit. Negative mysterianism goes hand in hand with the doctrines of divine incomprehensibility (that God or God’s essence can’t be understood completely, at all, or adequately) and divine ineffability (that no human concept, or at least none of some subset of these, applies literally to God). Some recent studies have emphasized the centrality of negative mysterianism to the pro-Nicene tradition of trinitarian thought, chastising recent theorists who seem to feel unconstrained by it (Ayres 2004; Coakley 1999; Dixon 2003).
The practical upshot of this is being content to merely repeat the approved trinitarian sentences. Thus, after considering and rejecting as inadequate multiple analogies for the Trinity, Gregory of Nazianzus concludes,
So, in the end, I resolved that it was best to say “goodbye” to images and shadows, deceptive and utterly inadequate as they are to express that reality. I resolved to keep close to the more truly religious view and rest content with some few words, taking the Spirit as my guide and, in his company and in partnership with him, safeguarding to the end the genuine illumination I had received from him, as I strike out a path through this world. To the best of my powers I will persuade all men to worship Father, Son, and Holy Spirit as the single Godhead and power, because to him belong all glory, honor, and might forever and ever. Amen. (Nazianzus, Oration 31, 143.)
Opponents of this sort of mysterianism object to it as misdirection, special pleading, neglect of common sense, or even deliberate obfuscation. They emphasize that trinitarian theories are human constructs, and a desideratum of any theory is clarity. We literally can’t believe what is expressed in trinitarian language, if we don’t grasp the meaning of it, and to the extent that we don’t understand a doctrine, it can’t guide our other theological beliefs, our actions, or our worship (Cartwright 1987; Dixon 2003, 125–31; Nye 1691b, 47; Tuggy 2003a, 176–80). Negative mysterians reply that it is well-grounded in tradition, and that those who are not naively overconfident in human reason expect some unclarity in the content of this doctrine.
4.2 Positive Mysterianism
In contrast, the positive mysterian holds that the trinitarian doctrine can’t be understood because of an abundance of content. That is, the doctrine seems to contain explicit or implicit contradictions. So while we grasp the meaning of its individual claims, taken together they seem inconsistent, and so the conjunction of them is not understandable, in the sense explained above. The positive mysterian holds that the human mind is adequate to understand many truths about God, although it breaks down at a certain stage, when the most profound divinely revealed truths are entertained. Sometimes an analogy with recent physics is offered; if we find mysteries (i.e., apparent contradictions) there, such as light appearing to be both a particle and a wave, why should we be shocked to find them in theology (van Inwagen 1995, 224–7)?
The best-developed positive mysterian theory is that of James Anderson (2005, 2007), who develops Alvin Plantinga’s epistemology so that beliefs in mysteries (merely apparent contradictions) may be rational, warranted, justified, and known. Orthodox belief about the Trinity, Anderson holds, involves believing, for example, that Jesus is identical to God, the Father is identical to God, and that Jesus and the Father are not identical. Similarly, one must believe that the Son is omniscient, but lacks knowledge about at least one matter. These, he grants, are apparent contradictions, but for the believer they are strongly warranted and justified by the divine testimony of scripture. He argues that numerous attempts by recent theologians and philosophers to interpret one of the apparently contradictory pairs in a way that makes the pair consistent always result in a lapse of orthodoxy (2007, 11–59). He argues that the Christian should take these trinitarian mysteries to be “MACRUEs”, merely apparent contradictions resulting from unarticulated equivocations, and he gives plausible non-theological examples of these (220–5).
It is plausible that if a claim appears contradictory to someone, she thereby by has a strong epistemic “defeater” for that belief, i.e., a further belief or other mental state which robs the first belief of rational justification and/or warrant. A stock example is a man viewing apparently red objects. The man then learns that a red light is shining on them. In learning this, he acquires a defeater for his belief that the items before him are red. Thus with the Trinity, if the believer discovers an apparent contradiction in her Trinity theory, doesn’t that defeat her belief in that theory? Anderson argues that it does not, at least, if she reflects properly on the situation. The above thought, Anderson argues, should be countered with the doctrine of divine incomprehensibility, which says that we don’t know all there is to know about God. Given this truth, the believer should not be surprised to find herself in the above epistemic situation, and so, the believer’s trinitarian belief is either insulated from defeat, or if it’s already been defeated, that defeat is undone by the preceding realization (2007, 209–54).
Dale Tuggy (2011a) argues that Anderson’s doctrine of divine incomprehensibility is true but trivial, and not obviously relevant to the rationality of belief in apparent contradictions about God. The probability of our being stuck with such beliefs is a function not only of God’s greatness in comparison to humans’ cognitive powers, but also of what and how much God chooses to reveal about himself. Nor is it clear that God would be motivated to pay the costs of inflicting apparently contradictory divine revelations on us. Moreover, Anderson has not ruled out that the apparent contradictions come not from the texts alone, but also from our theories or pre-existing beliefs. Finally, he argues that due to the comparative strength of “seemings”, a believer committed to paradoxes like those cited above will, sooner or later, acquire an epistemic defeater for her beliefs.
In a reply, Anderson (2018) denies that divine incomprehensibility is trivial, while agreeing that many things other than God are incomprehensible (297). While Tuggy had attacked his suggestions about why God would want to afflict us with apparent contradictions, Anderson clarifies that
…my theory doesn’t require me to identify positive reasons for God permitting or inducing MACRUEs. For even if I concede Tuggy’s point that “the prior probability of God inducing MACRUEs in us is either low or inscrutable,” the doctrine of [divine] incomprehensibility can still serve as…an undercutting defeater for the inference from D appears to be logically inconsistent to D is false. (298–9)
The defense doesn’t require, Anderson argues, any more than that MACRUEs are “not very improbable given theism” (299). As to whether these apparent contradictions result from the texts rightly understood, or whether they result from the texts together with mistaken assumptions we bring to them, this is a question only biblical exegesis can decide, not any a priori considerations (300). As to Tuggy’s charge that a believer in theological paradoxes will inevitably acquire an undefeated defeater for her beliefs, Anderson argues that this has not been shown, and that Tuggy overlooks how a believer may reasonably add a relevant belief to her seemingly inconsistent set of beliefs, such as that the apparently conflicting claims P and Q are only approximately true, or that “P and Q are the best way for her to conceptualize matters given the information available to her, but they don’t represent the whole story” (304).
Anderson’s central idea is that the alleged contradictions of Christian doctrine will turn out to be merely apparent. In contrast, some theologians have held that doctrines including the Trinity imply not merely apparent but also real contradictions, but are nonetheless true. Such hold that there are exceptions to the law of non-contradiction. While some philosophers have argued on mostly non-religious grounds for dialetheism, the claim that there can be true (genuine, not merely apparent) contradictions, this position has for the most part not been taken seriously by analytic theologians (Anderson 2007, 117–26) (For a recent exception, see Beall 2019.)
5. Beyond Coherence
Analytic literature on the Trinity has been laser-focused on the logical coherence of “the” doctrine, addressing an imagined critic arguing that the doctrine is clearly incoherent. They do this by suggesting models of the Trinity, intelligible and arguably coherent interpretations of most or all of the traditional language. But in recent work the tools of analytic philosophy have been applied to several closely related issues.
5.1 “The Trinity” and Tripersonality
The term “Trinity” has been used either as a singular referring term or as a plural referring term (Tuggy 2016, 2020). The first usage goes hand in hand with the claim that the one God just is the tripersonal God, the Trinity. But the earlier use of “Trinity”–(Greek: trias, Latin: trinitas) where that term refers to a “they” and not a “he” or an “it”–still survives, and some Trinty theories imply that the term “Trinity” can refer only in this way.
Most statements of faith by trinitarian Christian groups seem to assume or imply that the Trinity just is God (and vice-versa); the only god is the tripersonal God, the Trinity, and “Trinity” is a singular referring term denoting that reality. This God, it is assumed, does not merely happen to be tripersonal, but must be so; on such a view, it looks like tripersonality will be an essential divine attribute. Thus, it can seem axiomatic that “Christians hold that God is Trinitarian in God’s essential nature” (Davis and Yang 2017, 226). Some Trinity theories embrace this (section 2.5). However, if this is so, it is hard to see how each of the Persons could be divine in the way the one God is divine, since generally trinitarians don’t want to say that each is himself tripersonal. (See section 2.1.5 for an exception.) Thus, some Trinity theories eschew a thing which is tripersonal, while affirming three divine Persons whose divinity does not require tripersonality (sections 2.1.3, 2.1.4). For such theories, “Trinity” is a plural referring term.
5.2 Logic Puzzles and Language
While many discussions start with claims that are seen as the heart of the “Athanasian” creed, a recent piece by Justin Mooney (2018, 1) starts with this seemingly inconsistent triad of claims:
- God is triune.
- The Son is not triune.
- The Son is God.
Dale Tuggy (2014, 186) presents this inconsistent triad.
- The Christian God is a self.
- The Christian God is the Trinity.
- The Trinity is not a self.
One-self trinitarians deny 3, and three-self trinitarians deny 1. But Tuggy argues that for scriptural reasons a Christian should deny 2. (See also section 5.4 and the supplementary document on the history of trinitarian doctrines, section 2.)
Ryan Byerly (2019) explains “the philosophical challenge of the Trinity” as centering on the key Nicene term “consubstantial” (Greek: homoousios). How can the three Persons be “consubstantial” so that each equally in some sense “is God”, where this implies neither their numerical identity, nor that there’s more than one god?
Jedwab and Keller (2019, 173) see the fundamental challenge for the orthodox trinitarian as showing how this seemingly inconsistent triad of claims is, rightly understood, consistent:
- There is exactly one God.
- There are exactly three divine persons.
- Each divine person is God.
They argue that this must involve paraphrases, clearer formulations of 1–3 which can be seen as possibly all true. They compare how the theories of sections 2.1, 2.3, and 1.5 above must do this, and conclude that it is easier for the first of these to provide paraphrases which plausibly express the same claims as the originals, which is a point in favor of such relative identity theories.
Beau Branson (2019) explores these claims as constituting “the logical problem of the Trinity”: each Person “is God”, they are distinct from one another, and yet there is only one thing which “is God”. These provide materials for a formidable argument against any doctrine that entails those seven claims. He argues that all possible non-heretical solutions to that problem either equivocate on the predicate “is God” (roughly: what are called “social” theories, discussed in sections 2.2–7) or insist that divine Persons must be counted by some relation other than “absolute” or “classical” identity (i.e. relative identity theories as discussed in section 2.1).
Another recent piece compares different approaches to the Trinity by how they respond to an anti-trinitarian argument based on alleged differences between the Father and the Son (Tuggy 2016b).
A tradition going back at least to Cartwright (1987) is using the language of the so-called “Athanasian” creed to generate contradictions, the task of the philosophical theologian then being to show how these can be avoided by more careful analysis. This Latin document is by an unknown author, and is not the product of any known council. Modern scholarship places it some time in the fifth century, well after the life of Athanasius (d. 373), and sees it as influenced by the writings of Augustine (Kelly 1964). Objecting to making it a standard of trinitarian theology, several authors have pointed out its dubious provenance and coherence, and have observed that it has mainly been accepted in the Western realm and not in the East, and that it seems to stack the deck against three-self theories (Layman 2016 136–7, 169–71; McCall 2003, 427; Tuggy 2003b, 450–55). Tuggy (2016b) objects that starting with this problematic creed causes analytic theologians to neglect the question of if and how the teaching of this creed is the same as various statements from the “ecumenical” councils, pre-Nicene theologies, or the Bible. But William Hasker argues that rightly understood, the claims of this creed may not be paradoxical, as it is largely concerned with what may and may not be said (2013b, 250–4).
Apart from the “Athanasian” creed, H.E. Baber describes five different foundations for theorizing about the Trinity, endorsing the fourth.
This poses the question of what the ‘foundations’ for the philosophical investigation of Trinitarian theology should be if it is not either  the declarations of Church councils or  the theological works of the Fathers or  Scripture which…does not include any Trinitarian doctrine. …what philosophical theology should be about…[is]  the discourse and practice of the Church, and by that I do not mean  the doctrinal claims of the Church in its pretension to being a teaching institution, but  the liturgy, hymnody, and art, customs and practices, religious objects and religious devotions which, together, constitute the Christian religion and its practice. The aim of philosophical theology is to make sense of the discourse and provide a rationale for the practices while avoiding logical incoherence. (Baber 2019, 186–7)
Some in the literature fall cleanly into one of Baber’s categories, but more commonly, work in analytic theology is done while leaving unclear just what are the foundations of trinitarian theorizing. Following the example of his earlier work on christology, Timothy Pawl (2020) focuses on the teachings of the “ecumenical” councils, which arguably give the central trinitarian language of catholic traditions.
In favor of Baber’s second approach, Beau Branson (2018) critiques what he calls “the virtue approach”–basically, treating theological issues like metaphysical or logical puzzles calling for creative theorizing–as point-missing, question begging, and unclear. In contrast, he advocates for “the historical approach”, which assumes that the content of “the doctrine of the Trinity” should be considered as fixed by the views of “mainly various fourth-century theologians” (Section 4). It is misguided, he argues, to focus merely on the theoretical virtues of various rational reconstructions of what traditional Trinity language is really supposed to be expressing, as most of these will not plausibly be expressing the historical doctrine. New-fangled accounts, Branson argues, have a burden of showing how they, if coherent, imply that the historical doctrine of the Trinity is coherent, and indeed why the former should even count as a version of the latter (Section 5). (Similarly with other theoretical virtues.) At any rate, nothing about the project of analytic theology requires the neglect of the crucial historical definers of the Trinity doctrine (Section 13).
Analytic theologians have expended much effort on metaphysical models which if accurate would arguably show that “the doctrine of the Trinity” is coherent (i.e. seemingly not self-contradictory). But only a recent monograph by Vlastimil Vohánka (2014) asks in depth how, if at all, a person might be able to know that the doctrine of the Trinity is logically possible. Vohánka argues for “Weak Modal Scepticism about the Trinity Doctrine” (83), which is the claim that “it is psychologically impossible to see evidently and apart from religious experience that the Trinity doctrine is logically possible” (86). The arguments for this conclusion defy easy summary (but see Chapter 7 and Jaskolla 2015). What is “the doctrine” in question? Vohánka uses a minimal definition, that “there are three persons, each of whom is God but there is just one being which is God” (47). Admittedly, this better fits one-self theories than it does three or four-self theories (52–7) Like most, Vohánka assumes that a Trinity doctrine is essential to Christianity (57–8), so the main thesis implies the impossibility of knowing that Christianity is logically possible. But the overall project is not an attack on the truth or knowability of Christianity (see the author’s clarifications about his aims on 244–7, 276–7). Rather, such claims as the Trinity and Christianity seemingly can’t be evident to us (i.e. roughly, can’t be obviously true to us, as is 1+1=2 and such propositions–see 18), and moreover, we shouldn’t expect that we’ll have any religious experience in this life which is sufficient to make them evident (277). For all that’s been said, such claims “may well be epistemically justified, well-argued, have clearly high non-logical probability, etc.” (279). But the Christian philosopher should give up on “fulfilling the classical idea of evidentness in matters viewed by him as of utmost importance: the truth of Christianity and of the Trinity doctrine” (ibid.).
5.4 Competing Narratives
In some scholarly circles it is taken as obvious that New Testament teaching is not trinitarian–that it neither asserts, nor implies, nor assumes anything about a tripersonal God (see e.g. Baber 2019, 148–56; Küng 1995, 95–6; see also supplement on the history of Trinity doctrines, section 2). But most analytic literature on the Trinity assumes the truth of an orthodox narrative about where Trinity theories come from. According to this, from the beginning Christians were implicitly trinitarian; that is, they held views which imply that God is a Trinity, but typically did not realize this or have adequate language to express it. By at least the late 300s, they had gained enough new language and/or concepts to express what they had been committed to all along.
But in recent analytic literature on the Trinity there are two counternarratives, both of which see the idea of a triune God as entering into Christian traditions in the last half of the 300s. Beau Branson argues that “Monarchical Trinitarianism”, which in his view correctly understands the theology of the authoritative fourth century Greek “fathers” (Basil of Caesarea, Gregory of Nyssa, and Gregory of Nazianzus) is a trinitarian theology on which “Strictly speaking, The One God just is the Father” (Branson forthcoming, Section 6). He contrasts this with most other Trinity theories, which he calls “egalitarian” or “symmetrical”, theories on which “all three persons have an ‘equal claim’ to being called ‘God,’ in any and every sense.” (ibid.) Branson criticizes Tuggy’s (2016a) analyses of the concepts trinitarian and unitarian, and offers rival definitions on which “Monarchical Trinitarianism” is trinitarian and not unitarian. To be trinitarian, a theology needs only to assert that “there are exactly three divine ‘persons’ (or individuals, etc.). Nevertheless…there is exactly one God” (Section 5). As Branson understands the history of Christian theology, the idea that “the Trinity” is a tripersonal God is a misunderstanding of tradition which is due particularly to “Western” thinkers, such as Augustine. Branson cites some recent Orthodox theologians who hold, like John Behr, that “there is not One God the Trinity, but One God Father Almighty” (Behr 2018, 330). In reply, Tuggy has argued that recent Orthodox theologians seem divided on this point, and that the idea of a triune God (the one God as the Trinity) is found even in some of the Greek writers Branson claims as exemplars of theological orthodoxy (Tuggy 2020).
Another recent counternarrative sees ancient mainstream Christian theology as changing from unitarian to trinitarian. Tuggy (2019) argues that in the New Testament the one God is not the Trinity but rather the Father alone. The argument moves from facts about the texts of the New Testament to what the authors probably thought about the one God, using what philosophers of science call the likelihood principle or the prime principle of confirmation. Tuggy sees such identification of the one God with the Father dominating early Christian theologies until around the time of the second ecumenical council in 381 C.E. (Tuggy 2017, Chapter 5). Then, the Son and the Spirit, which in many 2nd to early 4th c. speculations were two lesser deities in addition to God, were taught to, together with the Father, somehow comprise the one God, the Trinity. (2016b, Sections 2–3)
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Other Internet Resources
Recent Articles and Ancient Documents
- Aquinas, Summa Theologiae, Part 1, Question 31: The unity or plurality in God
- Bowman, R., 2011, “The Biblical Basis for the Doctrine of the Trinity: An Outline Study”.
- Cartwright, R. 1987, “On the Logical Problem of the Trinity”.
- John of Damascus, An Exact Exposition of the Orthodox Faith.
- Wilbur, E. M., 1925, Our Unitarian Heritage.
- Williams, R., 2008, “A Common Word for the Common Good”. (Word document).
Articles on the Trinity in:
- Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
- Oxford Handbooks Online.
- European Journal for Philosophy of Religion
- Faith and Philosophy.
- Journal of Analytic Theology.
- Religious Studies.
- trinities—theories about the father, son, and holy spirit, a blog and podcast by the author of this entry.