A dialetheia is a sentence, \(A\), such that both it and its negation, \(\neg A\), are true. If falsity is assumed to be the truth of negation, a dialetheia is a sentence which is both true and false. Such a sentence is, or has, what is called a truth value glut, in distinction to a gap, a sentence that is neither true nor false. (We shall talk of sentences throughout this entry; but one could run the definition in terms of propositions, statements, or whatever one takes as one’s favourite truth-bearer: this would make little difference in the context.)
Dialetheism is the view that there are dialetheias. If we define a contradiction as a couple of sentences, one of which is the negation of the other, or as a conjunction of such sentences, then dialetheism amounts to the claim that there are true contradictions. As such, dialetheism opposes—contradicts—the Law of Non-Contradiction (LNC), sometimes also called the Law of Contradiction. The Law can be expressed in various ways; fixing the precise formulation is itself a topic of debate (Priest et al 2004, Part II). Thomas Reid put the LNC in the form ‘No proposition is both true and false’. A strong (modal) statement of the LNC is: for any \(A\), it is impossible that both \(A\) and \(\neg A\) be true.
In Book \(\Gamma\) of the Metaphysics, Aristotle introduced (what was later to be called) the LNC as “the most certain of all principles” (1005b24)—firmissimum omnium principiorum, as the Medieval theologians said. Since Aristotle, there have been few sustained attempts to defend the law. The LNC has been an (often unstated) assumption, felt to be so fundamental to rationality that some claim it cannot be defended, e.g. David Lewis 1999. As a challenge to the LNC, therefore, dialetheism assails what most philosophers take to be unassailable common sense, calling into question the rules for what can be called into question (cf. Woods 2003, 2005; Dutilh Novaes 2008).
Since the advent of paraconsistent logic in the second half of the twentieth century, dialetheism has been developed as a view in philosophical logic, with precise formal language. Dialetheism has been most famously advanced as a response to logical paradoxes, in tandem with a paraconsistent logic. The view has been gaining, if not acceptance, the respect of other parties in the debate; one critic writes that dialetheists have shown,
as clearly as anything like this can be shown, that it is coherent to maintain that some sentences can be true and false at the same time. … [A]nd that perhaps is a radical conclusion, and a major advance in our understanding of the issues (Parsons 1990).
In this article, 1) we will start by explaining the connection between dialetheism and other important related concepts, such as the ones of trivialism and paraconsistency. Next, we will describe 2) the history of dialetheism and 3) the motivations for contemporary dialetheism, among which the logical (semantic and set-theoretic) paradoxes figure prominently, though not exclusively. We will then 4) indicate and discuss some of the objections to dialetheism, and 5) its connections with the notion of rationality. Finally, 6) we will point at some possible themes for further inquiry concerning the connections between dialetheism, realism and antirealism in metaphysics.
- 1. Some Basic Concepts
- 2. Dialetheism in the History of Philosophy
- 3. Motivations for Dialetheism
- 4. Objections to Dialetheism
- 5. Dialetheism and Rationality
- 6. Themes for Further Research
- 7. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
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1. Some Basic Concepts
The word ‘dialetheism’ was coined by Graham Priest and Richard Routley (later Sylvan) in 1981 (Priest et al 1989, p. xx). The inspiration for the name was a passage in Wittgenstein’s Remarks on the Foundations of Mathematics, concerning Russell’s paradox (see also below):
Why should Russell’s contradiction not be conceived of as something supra-propositional, something that towers above the propositions and looks in both directions like a Janus head? The proposition that contradicts itself would stand like a monument (with a Janus head) over the propositions of logic (1978, III.59).
A dialetheia is a two-way truth, facing both truth and falsity like a Janus-headed figure. Unfortunately, Priest and Routley forgot to agree how to spell the ‘ism’, and versions with and without the ‘e’ appear in print.
In philosophy, there tends not to be a distinction between a view being inconsistent and being incoherent. Both are unacceptable. Since dialetheism claims that some inconsistency can be maintained without incoherence, these two concepts must be disentangled. For a start, dialetheism should be distinguished from so-called trivialism, that claim that all sentences are true, and hence all contradictions are true too (Kabay 2010). Dialetheism is the view that some contradictions are true. A trivialist must be a dialetheist, since a trivialist accepts every claim. But since ‘some’ does not imply ‘all’, the converse is not the case: a dialetheist typically claims that only some (and, usually, very specific) sentences are dialetheias, not that all of them are. Trivialism is by all accounts incoherent, and so is minimally what counts as unacceptable even for someone who thinks that some contradictions are true.
How to allow inconsistency without incoherence is one of the main topics of dialetheim. A standard solution consists in subscribing to the view that deductive logical consequence is paraconsistent. A logical consequence relation \(\vdash\) is explosive if, according to it, a contradiction entails everything (ex contradictione quodlibet: for all \(A\) and \(B\): \(A,\neg A \vdash B\)). It is paraconsistent if and only if (iff) it is not explosive. By adopting a paraconsistent logic, a dialetheist can countenance some contradictions without being thereby committed to countenancing everything and, in particular, all contradictions. The development of paraconsistent logics has contributed to the most recent developments (and acceptance of the legitimacy) of dialetheism.
Dialetheism should, however, be clearly distinguished from paraconsistency. Whereas dialetheists must embrace some paraconsistent logic or other to avoid trivialism, paraconsistent logicians need not be dialetheists: they may subscribe to a non-explosive view of entailment for other reasons. Within paraconsistency, one may distinguish (at least) four grades of paraconsistent involvement (Beall and Restall 2006, p.80):
- Gentle-strength paraconsistency is simply the rejection of explosion with respect to logical consequence.
- Full-strength paraconsistency has it that there are interesting or important theories that are inconsistent but not trivial.
- Industrial-strength paraconsistency has it that some inconsistent but non-trivial theories are possibly true.
- Dialetheic paraconsistency has it that some inconsistent but non-trivial theories are true.
Most people working on paraconsistent logics have commitments at the lower grades of the spectrum. The unifying thought behind paraconsistency is gentle-strength: logical consequence should not validate arbitrary conclusions following indiscriminately from inconsistent premises. This may simply be because entailment must preserve more than just truth, e.g., information content, topicality, or some meaningful connection between premises and conclusion. Carnielli and Rodrigues (2019) advance an explicitly anti-dialetheic interpretation of paraconsistent logic, where there may be epistemic contradictions—inconsistencies in evidence or belief—but no true contradictions. Or it may be that a paraconsistent logician simply need not assume anything about truth in order to provide a working treatment of inconsistency as it may arise in databases, legal situations, works of fiction, theory change, belief-revision, etc.
Stepping up, full-strength paraconsistentists treat inconsistent models, in which contradictions hold, as useful mathematical tools without committing to them as representing real possibilities.
And stepping up again, industrial-strength paraconsistentists may hold that, though truth at the actual world is consistent, still entailment must preserve what holds in peculiar non-actual situations, some of which may be inconsistent (see Berto, 2007a, Ch. 5, and Priest, Beall and Armour-Garb, 2004, p. 6). The first three levels appear to be independent of dialetheism. (But for reason to worry that there is a ‘slippery slope’ from gentle to dialetheic paraconsistency, see Priest 2000. For particular worries about model theory, see Asmus 2012, and in the modal case, Martin 2015.)
At the top of the spectrum, dialethiec paraconsistency holds that some contradictions are, in some sense, true in the actual world. Even among full-fledged dialetheists, differences remain, for example, in what is meant by “true”, e.g., on whether they subscribe to a deflationary theory of truth, a correspondence view, a view in which true contradictions are merely semantic, or something else. We will come back to this point in section 6 below.
We said at the outset that dialetheism challenges the LNC. Now this claim needs some qualification, since forms of the LNC are, in fact, accepted as a general logical law in dialetheism, at least in versions based in e.g. the paraconsistent logic LP. Dialetheism as set out by Priest takes all instances of the schema \(\neg(A \wedge \neg A)\) to be true, as well as taking as true some sentences that are inconsistent with it, namely, true sentences whose negations are true: dialetheias. According to such versions of dialetheism, all contradictions are false and some are true: dialetheism is itself a dialetheia (‘Concluding self-referential postscript’ to Priest 1979, p. 203).
Much of the ongoing discussion about dialetheism involves not just the LNC but its dual, the Law of Excluded Middle (LEM). (See section 3.2 below.) The LEM says (informally) that for every sentence \(A\), either \(A\) or \(\neg A\) is true (we bracket here views that disentangle the LEM from Bivalence). Dialetheism is the thesis that there are truth value gluts, challenging the LNC; the dual position, challenging the LEM, is that there are truth value gaps. It is a subtle issue, which we will not discuss here, whether a gap should count as lacking any truth value, or as having a non-classical value distinct from both truth and falsity, and similarly whether a glut has two truth values, or some third ‘glutty’ value. In any case, these dual approaches are nowadays labelled paracomplete versus (paraconsistent) dialetheic theories of truth. (The paraconsistent/paracomplete terminology is not entirely happy: see Ripley 2015a, footnote 1; but is now standard.) Priest’s logic includes the LEM and he rejects the existence of gaps in Priest 1987/2006, ch.1. Other approaches are both paracomplete and paraconsistent; they include a place for both gaps and gluts. The case for and against dialetheism turns as much on the status of the LEM as the LNC; see Beall and Ripley 2018.
2. Dialetheism in the History of Philosophy
While the word ‘dialetheism’ is relatively new, the idea is not. In this section we note some points in the history of philosophy where true contradictions appear salient, either explicitly or implicitly. (Much of this scholarship is due originally to Priest and Routley 1983, and Priest 1995/2002.) Then we address methodological issues to do with historical interpretation, and give a quick sketch of more recent history. For another history of dialetheism, see Ficara 2021. (Note that Ficara, following d’Agostini’s interpretation of Hegel, takes dialetheism to be the view that there are non-explosive true contradictions, and distinguishes this from glut theory, the view that there can be true and false propositions. This diverges from the way we’ve set things out here, and merits further discussion in itself.)
2.1 Dialetheism in Western Philosophy
Aristotle takes a number of the Presocratics to endorse dialetheism, and with apparent justification. For example, in Fragment 49a, Heraclitus says: “We step and do not step into the same rivers; we are and we are not” (Robinson, 1987, p. 35). Protagorean relativism may be expressed by the view that man is the measure of all things; but according to Aristotle, since “Many men hold beliefs in which they conflict with one another”, it follows that “the same thing must be and not be” (1009a10–12). The Presocratic views triggered Aristotle’s attack in Metaphysics, Book \(\Gamma\). Chapter 4 of this Book contains Aristotle’s defence of the LNC. As we said above, historically Aristotle was almost completely successful: the LNC has been orthodoxy in Western Philosophy ever since.
As an aside, and as mentioned above, there is an often-remarked upon duality between truth-value gaps and truth-value gluts (Parsons 1990). And yet, it is perhaps worth noting that in Metaphysics \(\Gamma\) (Chapter 7) Aristotle also defends the dual of the LNC, the Law of Excluded Middle, LEM, particularly in the version which has nowadays been distinguished as the Law of Bivalence: for any \(A\), it is necessary for (at least) one of \(A\) and \(\neg A\) to be true. But the LEM has often had a less secure place in Western Philosophy than the LNC, in spite of the numerous obvious dualities between the two principles. Aristotle himself, at least according to one interpretation, appears to attack the Law in De Interpretatione, Chapter 9, when he comes to the famous subject of future contingents.
Despite the orthodoxy about the LNC since Aristotle, during the Middle Ages the problem of seemingly true contradictions surfaced in connection to the paradoxes of divine omnipotence—for instance: can God make a stone too heavy for Him to lift? (See Cotnoir 2018.) We find St. Pier Damiani getting close to dialetheism in the De divina omnipotentia, by blaming St. Girolamus for having claimed that God cannot overturn the past and twist what happened into something that didn’t happen. Since God lives an eternal present, denying Him power over the past equates to denying Him power over current and future events, which is blasphemous. So God must have the power of making what is done undone. Later on, Nicholas of Cusa placed at the core of his book De docta ignorantia the idea that God is coincidentia oppositorum: as a truly infinite being, He includes all opposite and incompatible properties, therefore being all things, and none of them: God has all properties, including contradictory ones (Heron, 1954, I.4).
In the Critique of Pure Reason, Kant argues that some contradictions, the antinomies of pure reason (concerning time, space, and other categories), are produced by an illicit use of pure concepts; nevertheless, he also holds such an illicit use to be a “natural and inevitable illusion” (Kant, 1781, p. 300)—a side effect of reason’s pursuit of completeness in knowledge. Reasoning about the world as a whole, a totality which is never given to us as such, can lead us to apparently dialetheic conclusions: e.g. that it has a beginning in time and a limit in space, and that it has no beginning nor limits in space, that it is infinite in space and time. Both horns assume the opposite thesis and seemingly perform a reductio. (In Kantian terms, the “transcendental illusion” begins when we turn what should just be a regulative ideal into a limit-object.) According to Kant, at least in one way of resolving the antinomies, the fallacy lies in treating the world as a whole as an object—in mistaking a subjective “condition”, as Kant says, for an objective reality.
Now, according to Hegel such a conception has something to be said for it as well as against it. Kant has a point in showing, via the antinomies, that dialectics is “a necessary function of reason”, and in defending “the necessity of the contradiction which belongs to the nature of thought determinations” (Hegel, 1831, p. 56). However, Kant takes from this only the familiar result that reason is incapable of knowing the Absolute, that is, actual reality. A dialetheic interpretation holds that, on the contrary, we should abandon such “tenderness for the things of this world”, and the idea that “the stain of contradiction ought not to be in the essence of what is in the world; it has to belong only to thinking reason” (Hegel, 1830, p. 92). On a dialetheic interpretation, contrary to what Kant held, the Kantian antinomies are not a reductio of the illusions of reason; they are perfectly sound arguments, deducing the dialetheic nature of the world. (For a reconstruction of this Kantian-Hegelian debate, see Part II of Priest 2002.) Hegel himself has been interpreted as being a dialetheist. Notably, d’Agostini argues that while Hegel held that some conjunctions of contradictory sentences are true, he did so without the further commitment that either of the two contradictory terms are separately true; see d’Agostini 2021.
2.2 Dialetheism in East Asian Philosophy
In non-Western traditions, there are more overt examples of what appears to be dialetheic thought. In ancient Indian logic/metaphysics, there were standardly four possibilities to be considered on any statement at issue: that it is true (only), false (only), neither true nor false, or both true and false. Some logicians added a fifth possibility: none of these. Both positions were, arguably, called catushkoti (Priest 2002, ch.16; Deguchi et al 2008; Tillemans 2009.) The Jains went even further and advocated the possibility of contradictory values of the kind: true (only) and both true and false (see Smart 1964).
Contradictory utterances are a commonplace in Daoism, perhaps most famously in Laozi (Lao-Tsu): on one translation,
The Way that can be spoken of is not the true Way… (Daodejing I)
a statement which appears to be speaking about the true Way. The Zhuangzi says: “That which makes things has no boundaries with things, but for things to have boundaries is what we mean by saying ‘the boundaries between things’. The boundaryless boundary is the boundary without a boundary” (Mair, 1994, p. 218). When Buddhism and Daoism fused to form Chan (or Zen, to give it its Japanese name), a philosophy arose in which contradiction plays a central role. The very process for reaching enlightenment (Prajna) is a process, according to Suzuki (1969, p. 55), “which is at once above and in the process of reasoning. This is a contradiction, formally considered, but in truth, this contradiction is itself made possible because of Prajna.”
Recent discussions of dialetheism have centered on Buddhist thought in particular, where some interpreters argue that texts invoke outright contradictions. For example, in the Mahayana tradition, Nagarjuna presents many passages similar in form to:
Everything is real and not real, both real and not real, neither real nor not real. This is the Lord Buddha’s teaching (Garfield 1995, XVIII:8).
On a dialetheic interpretation, advocated by Priest, Garfield, and Deguchi (see Priest 2002 ch.16, Deguchi et al 2008), readers should take Nagarjuna and others in the Madhyamaka school at their word—not as invoking some sort of mysticism, but as affirming the nature of reality. This is most salient in Nagarjuna’s doctrine of emptiness (sunyata), that all things are empty or lacking independent existence (svabhava). Since all things are empty, it follows that emptiness is empty too; or, more prosaically, “The ultimate truth is that there is no ultimate truth” (Siderits 2007, p.182; Priest 2002, p.260). These utterances, if true, would appear to be self-contradictory, and therefore dialetheias. See Priest 2018.
For work on dialetheism in Buddhism, see the collections Garfield et al 2009 and Tanaka et al 2015. For discussion as to whether dialetheism is the appropriate way to interpret Buddhist texts, see the papers in Tanaka 2013. For more general difficulties see the entry on comparative philosophy: Chinese and Western.
2.3 On interpretation of history
Interpreting the philosophers we have mentioned is a sensitive issue. Many commentators have suggested that the seemingly contradictory utterances of the philosophers in question are not really contradictory. There are a number of standard devices that may be employed to block a dialetheic interpretation. One is to question, in the case of non-English sources, whether the apparently contradictory translation is correct. Another is to claim that the contradictory utterance is to be taken as having some non-literal form of meaning, e.g., that it is a metaphor, or a way of pointing towards some higher, ineffable truth. Another is to claim that the contradictory assertion is ambiguous in some way, and that it is true on one disambiguation or respect, false in another.
This last technique is called parameterisation: when one is confronted with a seemingly true contradiction, \(A \wedge \neg A\), treat the suspected dialetheia \(A\), or some of its parts, as having different meanings, and hence as ambiguous (maybe just contextually ambiguous). For instance, if one claims that \(P(a) \wedge \neg P(a)\), parameterisation holds that one is in effect claiming that \(P_1 (a) \wedge \neg P_2 (a)\) (e.g. elephants are big and not big, because they are big in the context of land animals on Earth, but not big in the context of stars and planets). In the Metaphysics, Aristotle hints that a critic of the LNC is playing with the equivocal meanings of some words: “for to each definition there might be assigned a different word” (1006b 1–2).
No one would dispute that contradictory utterances are sometimes best construed parametrically. (Again, dialetheists do not claim that all contradictory statements are true.) The question is whether parameterisation is the best approach in the case of the philosophers we have mentioned; answering this in a dialetheic context is a matter for detailed case-by-case consideration. A defender of the dialetheic interpretation would say that consistent parameterisation produces an inaccurate and distorted version of the views of the philosopher in question. In any case, even if parameterisation is always possible, this does not impact arguments for or against the LNC. An a priori claim that contradictions can always be avoided by parameterisation does not show, without begging the question, the correctness of such interpretations: sometimes parameterisation may be the best thing to do, but independent justification should be given on each occasion.
2.4 Modern Dialetheism
In the second half of the twentieth century, with the rapid development of paraconsistent logics, came the modern form of dialetheism. In 1966, Asenjo published a short note, “A Calculus of Antinomies”, based on his 1954 PhD dissertation; the opening line reads
Let us assume that atomic propositions have either one or two truth values (Asenjo 1966, p.103).
Here, having two truth values would mean being both true and false, a glut, or what Asenjo calls (following Kant) an antinomy. Asenjo simply seems to assume without further ado that there are antinomies, and in Asenjo and Tamburino 1975 asserts that they are “useful logical entities”, especially for dealing with paradoxes in mathematical contexts. Born in Buenos Aires, Asenjo came to the University of Pittsburg in 1963 as a professor in the mathematics faculty, where he was in contact with logicians such as Belnap, Anderson, their student Dunn (who thanks Asenjo in his 1966 PhD thesis, that also toys with true contradictions), and nearby, Meyer. By the mid-1970s, Richard Routley (Sylvan), in collaboration with Meyer, was developing a ‘dialectical’ position that rebukes what they call “the consistency hypothesis” and accepts some statements as both true and false (Routley and Meyer 1976; Routley 1977, 1979). In 1979, Priest’s paper “The Logic of Paradox”, developed eventually into the book In Contradiction (1987/2006), presented what are now the most famous arguments for dialetheism. In the collaboration between Priest and Routley, the contemporary dialetheic program was launched. Much of Priest and Routley’s early joint work is summarised in Priest et al 1989 (also available as Priest and Routley 1983). More recent developments are canvassed below.
3. Motivations for Dialetheism
3.1 The Paradoxes of Self-Reference
Probably the master argument used by modern dialetheists invokes the logical paradoxes of self-reference. It is customary to distinguish between two families of such paradoxes: semantic and set-theoretic. The former family typically involves such concepts as truth, denotation, definability, etc; the latter, such notions as membership, cardinality, etc. After Gödel’s and Tarski’s well known formal procedures to obtain non-contextual self-reference in formalized languages, it is difficult to draw a sharp line between the two families, among other things, because of the fact that Tarskian semantics is itself framed in set-theoretic terms. Nevertheless, the distinction is commonly accepted within the relevant literature.
Russell’s paradox is the most famous of the set-theoretic paradoxes; it arises when one considers the set of all non self-membered sets, the Russell set. Cantor’s paradox arises in connection with the universal set. The most famous of the semantic paradoxes is the Liar paradox. Although cases for the existence of dialetheias can be made from almost any paradox of self-reference, we will focus only on the Liar, given that it is the most easily understandable and its exposition requires no particular technicalities.
3.2 A Simple Case Study: the Liar
In its standard version, the Liar paradox arises by reasoning on the following sentence:
(1): (1) is false
where the number to the left is the name of the sentence to the right. As we can see, (1) refers to itself and tells us something about (1) itself. Its truth value? Let us reason by cases. Suppose (1) is true: then what it says is the case, so it is false. Then, suppose (1) is false: this is what it claims to be, so it is true. If we accept the aforementioned Law of Bivalence, that is, the principle according to which all sentences are either true or false, both alternatives lead to a contradiction: (1) is both true and false, that is, a dialetheia, contrary to the LNC.
The paradox can also be produced without any direct self-reference, but via a short-circuit of sentences. For instance, here is a looped Liar:
(2a): (2b) is true
(2b): (2a) is false
If what (2a) says is true, then (2b) is true. However, (2b) says that (2a) is false …. And so on: we are in a paradoxical loop. This is as old as Buridan (his Sophism no. 9: Plato saying ‘What Socrates says is true’; Socrates replying ‘What Plato says is false’).
Paradoxes of this kind have been known since antiquity (the standard Liar is attributed to the Greek philosopher Eubulides, probably the greatest paradox-producer of antiquity). But they were thrown into prominence by developments in the foundations of mathematics around the turn of the twentieth century. In the case of each paradox, there appears to be a perfectly sound argument ending in a contradiction. If the arguments are sound, then dialetheism is true. Of course, many have argued that the soundness of such arguments is merely an appearance, and that subtle fallacies may be diagnosed in them. Such suggestions were made in ancient and medieval logic; but many more have been made in modern logic—indeed, attacking the paradoxes has been something of a leitmotiv of modern logic. And one thing that appears to have come out of this is how resilient the paradoxes are: attempts to solve them often simply succeed in relocating the paradoxes elsewhere, as so called ‘strengthened’ forms of the arguments show. Let us have a look.
A radical solution, which never won big consensus but has been revitalised in recent times (Pleitz 2018), has it that there just cannot be meaningful self-rererential sentences. Various works (notably Martin 1967, van Fraassen 1968, Kripke 1975, Field 2008) have proposed to solve the Liar paradox by dismissing Bivalence, whereby some sentences are neither true nor false, and the Liar is one such truth value ‘gap’. Truth value gaps, and the inclusion of the Liar among them, are differently motivated in the various approaches. But the common core thought is the following: even though the Liar is a sentence such that, if it were true, it would be false, and vice versa, no explicit contradiction according to which it is both true and false need follow. We can avoid the contradiction by rejecting the idea that truth and falsity are the only two options for a sentence: the Liar is neither. For a comparative survey of the two kinds of approach, see Beall and Ripley 2018.
These approaches face difficulties with the so-called ‘strengthened’ Liars—sentences such as the following:
(3): (3) is not true.
(4): (4) is false or neither true nor false.
Now these sentences should be, on the gappy theorist’s non-bivalent approach, either true, or false, or neither. But, for instance, if (3) is true, then things are as it claims they are; therefore, (3) is not true (either false or truth-valueless). If (3) is false, or neither true nor false, in both cases it is not true; but this is precisely what it claims to be; therefore, it is true. We seem to have to conclude that (3) is both true and not true, contrary to the LNC. A similar line of reasoning goes for (4).
According to Priest the strengthened Liars show that a single feature of the semantic paradox underlies its different formulations. The totality of sentences is divided into two subsets: the true ones, and their ‘bona fide complement’—call it the Rest. Now the essence of the liar is “a particular twisted construction which forces a sentence, if it is in the bona fide truths, to be in the Rest (too); conversely, if it is in the Rest, it is in the bona fide truths” (Priest 1987, p. 23). The standard Liar, ‘This sentence is false’, is just a particular instance of this, producing a contradiction within the bivalent framework, in which the Rest is identified with the set of the false sentences. We can try to resolve the problem by admitting sentences that are neither true nor false, so that the false ones become a proper subset of the Rest. However, the strengthened Liars show that we can use the notions introduced to solve the previous paradox to re-describe the Rest. Once the set of sentences is partitioned into a trichotomy (true, false, and neither true nor false), the disjunctive ‘This sentence is false or neither true nor false’ embraces the whole Rest, i.e. the new(ly described) complement of the set of the true sentences. What about adding more values? If there is some fourth thing that a sentence can be, besides true, false, and neither true nor false, we can always take the notion fourth thing and produce another strengthened Liar:
(5): (5) is false, or neither true nor false, or the fourth thing.
See Kirkham 1992, pp. 293–4. These strengthened liars are also called revenge liars, and the general phenomenon we have just witnessed has become known as revenge; see Beall 2007, e.g. the introduction, and Cook 2007, among other essays.
There is no generally agreed upon solution to the semantic paradoxes. One typical way out attempted by the supporters of truth value gaps, for instance, consists in denying that the notion of gap, or defective sentence, or sentence whose truth value is indeterminate, can be fully expressed in the language for which they are proposing their theory of truth. The strengthened paradoxes then seem to force the consistent theorist to admit that the proposed theory was formulated in a language different from, and expressively more powerful than, the one whose semantics it was supposed to express. This entails a limitation of the Tarskian T-schema characterising truth, i.e., of the equivalence\[ Tr\langle A\rangle \leftrightarrow A \]
where ‘\(Tr\)’ is the truth predicate for the relevant language, and \(\langle A\rangle\) is the appropriate name of sentence \(A\). This approach makes a rigid distinction between an object language and its metalanguage. Such a distinction was introduced by Tarski to expel the Liar paradox from formalized languages—but Tarski himself insisted that his solution is inapplicable to natural languages, which do not appear to depend upon some metalanguage for their semantics. As Kripke admits at the end of Outline of a Theory of Truth, “the ghost of the Tarski hierarchy is still with us” (scil. the paracompletists: see Kripke 1975, p. 80).
Tarski, in short, identified the cause of the semantic paradoxes to be semantic closure—the fact that natural languages such as English satisfy the T-schema. Tarski took this to mean that there can be no consistent formalization of a semantically complete language, only a approximation thereof stratified into metalanguages. Dialetheists agree, but draw the conclusion in the other direction: the appropriate formalization of a language such as ours, because it is semantically closed and is not hierarchically stratified, will be inconsistent (Priest 1987, ch.1, Beall 2009, ch.1).
These two features—a claimed immunity to revenge/strengthened liars, and dispensing with the object-language/metalanguage distinction—are argued to give dialetheism about the paradoxes of self-reference some of its major appeal. As Shapiro (in a critical note) puts it, dialetheists offer that we
do not need to keep running through richer and richer meta-languages in order to chase our semantic tails.… We embrace some contradictions in the semantics, and get it all from the start (Shapiro 2002, p. 818).
The simplicity of a dialetheic theory of truth, then, is claimed as an additional further feature. The two most prominent such theories to date are presented in Priest 1987, and Beall 2009. In the former, the truth predicate \(Tr\) for the relevant formal language, modelling the behaviour of truth in English, is simply characterized by the unrestricted T-schema, \(Tr\langle A\rangle \leftrightarrow A\), which, as stressed by many philosophers, is an overwhelmingly intuitive—perhaps even analytic—principle concerning truth. It is admitted that some sentences—notably, the Liars—are truth value gluts, that is, both true and false (the construction may also sustain sentences which are both true and not true, although not all dialetheias need be of this kind); and no hierarchy of metalanguages or further epicycles are needed.
Beall’s 2009 theory allows a fully transparent truth predicate: one such that for any sentence \(A\), \(Tr\langle A\rangle\) and \(A\) can be replaced with each other in all (non-opaque) contexts salva veritate, that is, producing sentences logically equivalent to the sentences one started with. Then the unrestricted T-schema follows from transparency (and the fact that \(A \rightarrow A\) is a logical truth) as a special case. In Beall’s theory, all sentences \(A\) that are dialetheias are not only true and false, i.e. (given that falsity is truth of negation), \(Tr\langle A\rangle \wedge Tr\langle \neg A\rangle\); they are also true and untrue, \(Tr\langle A\rangle \wedge \neg Tr\langle A\rangle\): this again follows from the transparency of truth. Beall’s theory is based on a (relevant) paraconsistent logic, whose modal semantics employs so-called non-normal worlds.
Overall, such paradoxes as the Liar provide some evidence for the dialetheist’s claim that some contradictions are provably true, in the sense that they are entailed by plain facts concerning natural language and our thought processes. Extended Liar paradoxes like ‘This sentence is not true’ are spelt in ordinary English. Their paradoxical characteristics, dialetheists argue, are due exactly to the intuitive features of ordinary language: unavoidable self-reference; the failure of metalinguistic hierarchies, which only produce languages that are expressively weaker than English; and the obvious presence of a truth predicate for English, ‘is true’, which is characterized, at least extensionally, by either the Tarskian T-schema or rules amounting to the transparency of truth. For a sustained critical engagement with paraconsistent dialetheism as a solution to the semantic paradoxes, see Field 2008, part 5 (chapters 23–26).
3.3 Other Paradoxes of Self-Reference
In the larger family of paradoxes of self-reference beyond the semantic, dialetheism affords a treatment of the set-theoretic paradoxes. These paradoxes arise in set theories based on an unrestricted ‘comprehension schema’ for sets: for any condition or property, including paradoxical ones like non-self-membership, there exists a corresponding set. In particular, inconsistent sets like Russell’s are admitted; analogously to the Liar, the Russell set is and is not a member of itself. As with the truth schema, the set comprehension principle seems very natural and intuitive, and such contradictions do not give rise to triviality due to the paraconsistent logic underlying the formal theories. Though the issue is too technical to be addressed here, and more appropriately dealt with in the entries on paraconsistent logic and inconsistent mathematics, the reader can consult Routley 1979, Brady 1989, for inconsistent set theories, and Weber 2012. See also Mortensen 1995. For different approaches to dialetheic set theory, see Restall 1992 and Ripley 2015b.
Since dialetheism appears to resolve both the semantic and set theoretic paradoxes at once and in the same sort of way (namely, accept the contradictory outcomes as true), this has been presented as another major strong point for dialetheism. Priest argues that the paradoxes share an underlying structure (which he calls the Inclosure Schema in Priest 2002). This is used in tandem with what Priest dubs the principle of uniform solution (“same kind of paradox, same kind of solution”) to urge that, since all the set theoretic and semantic paradoxes are of a kind, then dialetheism presents a uniquely unified solution. For a detailed pursuit of a dialetheic response to the paradoxes in general, see Weber 2021.
A point of dispute about the dialetheic approach to the paradoxes of self-reference concerns the Curry paradox. This is produced by a self-referential sentence claiming ‘If I am true, then \(\bot\)’, where \(\bot\) is a constant (what logicians usually call the falsum) which is or entails something that is also dialetheically unacceptable, say \(\bot =\) ‘Everything is true’, the incoherent trivialist claim. Prima facie, this does not involve negation, nor a falsity predicate. However, many logicians think that Curry’s paradox is very similar to the Liar, and therefore by the principle of uniform solution that it should be handled in the same way. A dialetheist, though, cannot simply accept that the Curry sentence is both true and false, because if it is true then \(\bot\) follows. Dialetheists need a different treatment of Curry. A standard dialetheic strategy to deal with the Curry paradox has consisted in exploiting paraconsistent logics with a ‘noncontractive’ conditional (see again Priest 1987, Ch, 6, Beall 2009, Ch. 2), which do not validate the Contraction (or Absorption) Law, i.e., the rule: from \(A \rightarrow(A \rightarrow B)\) infer \(A \rightarrow B\), or the so-called pseudo-modus ponens principle \((A \wedge(A \rightarrow B)) \rightarrow B\). Stronger forms of the paradox, though, validity curry, seem to show that dropping these principles is not enough (Beall and Murzi 2013). This leads to contraction-free logics within the broader family of substructural logics (Restall 2000, Priest 2015), and indeed substructural dialetheic approaches that drop principles other than contraction, such as transitivity (Ripley 2012). Curry’s paradox puts pressure on the dialetheic story about uniform solution to the paradoxes. Beall (2014a, 2014b) urges this point; Weber et al 2014 is a reply.
3.4 Other Motivations for Dialetheism
Dialetheias produced by the paradoxes of self-reference are confined to the abstract realm of notions such as set or to semantic concepts such as truth. However, the paradoxes of self-reference are not the only examples of dialetheias that have been mooted. Other cases involve contradictions affecting concrete objects and the empirical world, and include the following.
(1) Transition states: when I exit the room, I am inside the room at one time, and outside of it at another. Given the continuity of motion, there must be a precise instant in time, call it \(t\), at which I leave the room. Am I inside the room or outside at time \(t\)? Four answers are available: (a) I am inside; (b) I am outside; (c) I am both; and (d) I am neither. There is a strong intuition that (a) and (b) are ruled out by symmetry considerations: choosing either would be completely arbitrary. (This intuition is not at all unique to dialetheists: see the article on boundaries in general.) As for (d): if I am neither inside not outside the room, then I am not inside and not-not inside; therefore, I am either inside and not inside (option (c)), or not inside and not-not inside (which follows from option (d)); in both cases, a dialetheic situation. Or so it has been argued. For a description of inconsistent boundaries using formal mereology, see Weber and Cotnoir 2015.
(2) Some of Zeno’s paradoxes concerning a particular—though, perhaps, the most basic—kind of transition, that is, local motion: a moving arrow is both where it is, and where it is not. In any given instant, argues Zeno, it cannot move to where it is, since it is already there, and it cannot move to somewhere else, because there isn’t time for it to get there. The orthodox way out of the paradoxical situation, as formulated, e.g., by Russell 1903, has it that motion is the mere occupation of different places at different times. But one could argue that this is denial of the phenomenon itself, that is, of the actuality of motion: Russell’s solution entails that motion is not an intrinsic state of the (allegedly) moving thing, for, at each instant, the arrow is not moving at all. Can a going-somewhere be composed by an (even continuum-sized) infinity of going-nowheres? An alternative, dialetheic account of motion, which takes at face value the aforementioned Hegelian idea that “Something moves, not because at one moment it is here and another there, but because at one and the same moment it is here and not here, because in this ‘here’, it at once is and is not”, is exposed in Priest 1987, Ch. 12.
(3) Borderline cases of vague predicates. Popular approaches to vagueness and the sorites paradox, such as the ones based on many-valued logics, or supervaluations, require some under-determinacy of reference, and/or the rejection of Bivalence: if an adolescent, \(m\), is a borderline case of adultness, \(A\), then \(A(m)\) may turn out to have an intermediate truth value between truth and falsity, or no truth value at all. But it may be conjectured that a borderline object like \(m\), instead of satisfying neither a vague predicate nor its negation, satisfies them both: an adolescent both is and is not an adult. Given the obvious dualities between the LEM and the Law of Bivalence on the one side, and (respectively, syntactic and semantic formulations of) the LNC on the other, it is not too difficult to envisage a ‘sub-valuational’ semantic approach, dual to the supervaluation strategy. Sub-valuational paraconsistent semantics have been proposed by Hyde (1997), and Varzi (1997). Other ‘glutty’ approaches to vagueness have been proposed by Colyvan (2009), Weber (2010), Priest (2010), Ripley (2013), and Cobreros et al (2010, 2015), motivated on both theoretical and empirical grounds. If inconsistencies due to vague predicates and borderline objects are taken to be due to merely semantic under- and over- determination of ordinary language (de dicto), then this is further evidence for dialetheism about semantics. If the aforementioned phenomena are taken to be not just about words but things (de re), then actually inconsistent objects are admitted, together with vague objects. And this spreads inconsistency all over the empirical world: if borderline cases can be inconsistent, inconsistent objects are more or less everywhere, given how pervasive the phenomenon of vagueness notoriously is: adolescents, borderline bald men, etc. Inconsistency is observable (Beall and Colyvan 2001). Beall argues against the approach in Ch. 5 of Beall 2009, and Beall 2014a.
(4) Multi-criterial predicates. We may assume that the semantics of a predicate is specified by means of its criteria of application. Now ordinary language hosts predicates with different, and occasionally conflicting, criteria of application (e.g., ‘left wing’): some criteria for applying a predicate \(P\) (e.g., caring about social welfare, raising minimum wages) may entail that object \(m\) (e.g., a political party) is in the extension of the predicate, some others (promoting nationalism, oppressing immigrants), that \(m\) is in its anti-extension, or negative extension. Criteria can in some cases be encoded by such things as meaning postulates (or other similar, albeit more sophisticated, semantic devices); but conflicting meaning postulates may be embedded in our standard linguistic practices, and difficult to detect and identify. If the extensions of our ordinary predicates are constrained by our intuitions, and such intuitions turn out to be inconsistent, a good semantic account of the situation may well have to reflect this fact (accepting, in our example, that a party counts as both left and right wing), instead of destroying it by means of some regimentation (e.g. via the usual parameterisation, or distinction of respects). As Priest 1987, pp 67–9, clarifies, it is also hard to analyse such situations as cases of vagueness (so that a party has to be understood as being left wing to some degree, and right wing to some degree).
(5) Certain legal situations, such as inconsistent bodies of law. Suppose, for instance, that some norm states that a marriage performed by the captain of a ship counts as a legal marriage only if the ship was in open water throughout the ceremony. It turns out, then, that some other law has established that such a marriage is valid also if the ceremony has only begun with the ship in open water, but has ended with the ship in the port. Then someone may turn out to be both a married man and not a married man. (Since it does not appear to follow that he is not a man anymore, or both a man and not a man, we have another putative counterexample to ex contradictione quodlibet). If one accepts the plausible view that statements concerning legal rights, obligations, and statuses, can be truth-value apt, we seem to have a dialetheia. Of course, legal systems sometimes have mechanisms that can be used to remove such inconsistencies (e.g., by ordering different kinds of laws in a hierarchy from customary laws, to established jurisprudence, to ordinary legislation, to constitutional norms, etc.; or via the lex posterior principle, giving priority to the more recent norm in case of conflict). But this is not always the case: the inconsistent laws may be of the same rank, enacted at the same time, etc. For a recent discussion, see Beall 2016.
(6) In post-Kantian metaphysics, a movement sometimes dubbed ‘new realism’ or ‘speculative realism’ has developed, in various work by Quentin Meillassoux, Graham Harman, Markus Gabriel, and others. The idea is that much of philosophy since Kant, especially in the continential tradition, has been lost in postmodernist concern with thought and language, and that a return to the “Great Outdoors” is overdue. The return to realism though is speculative in the sense that it continues to take seriously epistemic concerns: mind-independent objects will be radically resistant to knowledge and almost impossibly removed from us. If such a realism involves specifying objects or making knowledge claims about them that the theory itself seems to preclude, then, much as with the paradoxes at the limit of thought (presented in section 2.1 above), this may crucially involve contradiction. Some practitioners in this area have explicitly endorsed dialetheism, e.g. Morton 2012. Cogburn has identified in this approach what he dubs the ‘object oriented ontology’ paradox (as fitting Priest’s inclosure schema): “To the extent that object-oriented ontologists really are offering speculative systems of metaphysics, they seem to be trying to do what they themselves take to be impossible” (Cogburn 2017, chapter 3; see 3.3 above).
(7) It has long been recognized that theology may involve paradoxes. In traditional Western monotheism, various divine attributes appear to be logically inconsistent. Famously, the question of whether an omnipotent God can create a stone so heavy He Himself cannot lift seems to lead to a contradiction—something that is both possible and not possible for God. Cotnoir 2018 explores whether dialetheism and the tools of paraconsistent logic provide a plausible response to these paradoxes, namely, to accept their conclusions. Beall 2021 focuses more specifically on Christianity and the apparent contradiction that Jesus Christ was both mortal (and limited) but also divine (and so immortal and unlimited), with the suggestion that this can best be accommodated as a truth glut. Weber 2019 expresses disagreement with theological applications of dialetheism.
Each of the above topics undoubtedly call for further development. See Priest 1987 or Ficara 2014. This list is also not exhaustive. For example, some connexive logics are contra-classical (they validate classically invalid arguments) and are even contradictory in their propositional fragment. That is, whereas most motivations for dialetheism come from non-logical sources, connexive logic is dialetheic at the most basic logical level; see Omori and Wansing 2019. Or, for both a motivation and application of dialetheism, Casati 2021 argues for a dialetheic interpretation of the late Heidegger in which Being itself is both an entity and not an entity, and that this can be made sense of through mereology and metaphysical grounding.
4. Objections to Dialetheism
We now turn to arguments against dialetheism. The most prominent sustained defence of the LNC in the history of philosophy is, as mentioned, that given by Aristotle in Chapter 4 of Metaphysics, \(\Gamma\). A critical analysis of Aristotle’s arguments is given point-for-point by Priest (1998b/2006 ch.1), who finds them to often conflate dialetheism with trivialism (that is, conflating the claim that some contradictions are true, and the one that all contradictions are). We will look at some more modern arguments against dialetheism.
4.1 The Argument from Explosion
A standard argument against dialetheism is to invoke the logical principle of Explosion, in virtue of which dialetheism would entail trivialism. Granted that trivialism is absurd (though see Priest 2000a, Priest 2006, Ch. 3, and Kabay 2010), dialetheism must be rejected. Since this argument assumes that explosion is logically valid, it will carry no weight against a dialetheic paraconsistentist.
Interestingly enough, while Aristotle’s defence of the LNC may slide between attacking dialetheism and trivialism, Aristotelian syllogistic—the first formally articulated logic in Western philosophy—is not explosive. Aristotle held that some syllogisms with inconsistent premises are valid, whereas others are not (An. Pr. 64a 15). Just consider the inference:
(P1) Some logicians are intuitionists;
(P2) No intuitionist is a logician;
(C) Therefore, all logicians are logicians.
This is not a valid syllogism, despite the fact that its premises are inconsistent. The principle of Explosion had a certain tenure at places and times in Medieval logic, but it became well-established mainly with the Fregean and post-Fregean development of what is now called classical logic. For the logical aspects of denying explosion, see the article on paraconsistent logic.
4.2 The Argument from Exclusion
There are several objections to dialetheism involving the notion of exclusion. The very rough idea is that dialetheists have let in more truths than non-dialetheists, but subsequently now have trouble keeping enough falisity out. This objection, in one form or another, has been a recurring theme in criticisms of dialetheism.
A version of the argument from exclusion against dialetheism found, for instance, in McTaggart 1922 (see Berto 2006, 2012) is as follows. A sentence is meaningful only if it rules something out. But if the LNC fails, \(A\) does not rule out \(\neg A\), or, a fortiori, anything else. Hence meaningful language presupposes the LNC.
There are problems one may find with this argument. One is that even though a dialetheia does not rule out its negation, it still may rule out several other things. A bigger trouble is that the first premise looks to be simply false. Consider again the sentence ‘Everything is true’. This entails everything, and so rules out nothing. Yet it is meaningful. It is something that everyone, except a trivialist, rejects.
One might attempt a more sophisticated explanation of the notion of ruling out, for instance in terms of information theory, or perhaps possible worlds. One may claim that a statement ‘rules out’ something insofar as there are situations, or worlds, at which it fails. In this sense, ‘Everything is true’ does rule something out. But now, it is this account of propositional meaning which can be challenged in general. If mathematical truths have a strictly necessary status (which may safely be assumed here), Fermat’s Last Theorem rules out nothing: being a necessary truth, it holds at all possible worlds. But it is perfectly meaningful; people wondered whether it was true or false for centuries; and its proof by Andrew Wiles was a substantial discovery.
One argument from exclusion, with a more ad hominem twist, claims that the dialetheist has trouble with expressing disagreement with rival positions in debates (see Parsons 1990, Shapiro 2004, Littman and Simmons 2004). For when the dialetheist utters ‘\(\neg A\)’, this is in itself insufficient to rule out that \(A\) is the case, given that, in a dialetheic world, it may well be that both \(A\) and \(\neg A\). Similarly, ‘\(A\) is false’ and even ‘\(A\) is not true’ might not do the trick, since for the dialetheist some \(A\)’s being false, or untrue, does not rule out its being true. As Parsons puts it,
Suppose that you say ‘\(A\)’ and Priest replies ‘\(\neg A\)’. Under ordinary circumstances you would think that he had disagreed with you. But then you remember that Priest is a dialetheist, and it occurs to you that he might very well agree with you after all—since he might think that \(A\) and \(\neg A\) are both true. How can he indicate that he genuinely disagrees with you? The natural choice is for him to say ‘\(A\) is not true’. However, the truth of this assertion is also consistent with \(A\)’s being true—for a dialetheist, anyway (Parsons 1990, p. 345).
Elaborations and repetitions of this line of thought have come to be known in the literature as the ‘just true’ or ‘true only’ problem, e.g. Rossberg 2013. (Young 2015, however, argues that the exclusion problem is distinct from the just-true problem.)
To this, the dialetheist has various replies. Priest has argued that the logical operation of negation should be distinguished from the speech acts of denial and the cognitive state of rejection. So, contra Frege, assertion of a negation is not the same as denial. The idea is that exclusion is expressed via a primitive notion of rejection: to reject \(A\) is to positively refuse to believe that \(A\). That the notion is taken as primitive means, in particular, that it is not reducible to the acceptance of negation: it is a sui generis act. The linguistic counterpart of rejection is the speech act of denial. Then the dialetheist can rule out that \(A\) is the case by denying \(A\); and this does not amount to the assertion of \(\neg A\) (Priest 2006, Ch. 6). More simply, one can often express denials by uttering ordinary language negations: ‘not’ is, in this sense, pragmatically ambiguous. We will come back below to how, and why, rejection-denial may not be reducible to the acceptance-assertion of any negation.
Another way in which the dialetheist may express the exclusion that \(A\) is the case is by uttering ‘\(A \rightarrow \bot\)’, where again \(\bot\) is ‘Everything is true’. Similarly, a dialetheist may try to fix that \(A\) is consistent by saying ‘if \(A\) is both true and false, then \(\bot\)’. Considerations by e.g. Field (2008, Ch. 27), Murzi and Carrara (2013), and Berto (2014), however, cast doubt on whether ‘arrow-falsum’ can work as a dialetheic exclusion-expressing device in all cases. One reason is due to side-effects of the aforementioned Curry paradox. Another is that ‘arrow-falsum’ is very strong; a mundane sentence like ‘Alice had spaghetti for dinner’ may be false-only (she didn’t), but if it were true too, that wouldn’t be absurd. Cf. Beall 2013, proposing exclusion via non-logical, theory-specific rules of the form \(A,\neg A \vdash \bot\) for each sentence \(A\) we take to be consistent; Scharp 2018 suggests possible problems for this approach.
The exclusion problem gets its strength from some background assumptions. Specifically, it seems to presuppose that the content of a proposition is given in terms of splitting all possible situations, or worlds, into those where the proposition holds and those where it does not. Even accepting this presupposition, though, would not affect a dialetheic challenge to the LNC. For a given \(A\) to be a dialetheia, putting things in these terms, it is sufficient that there be overlap between the worlds where \(A\) holds, and those where its negation holds. And this is compatible with the idea of propositional content as splitting the totality of worlds—but now with overlap. The tenability of such an overlap, though, requires discussing the account of negation from classical logic, to which we now turn.
4.3 The Argument from Negation
Arguments against dialetheism are often focused on the concept of logical negation. The main one goes as follows. The truth conditions for negation are: \(\neg A\) is true iff \(A\) is not true. Hence, if \(A\) and \(\neg A\) were true, \(A\) would be both true and not true, which is impossible.
What to make of this argument? First, the truth conditions for negation employed here are contentious. An alternative view has it that \(\neg A\) is true iff \(A\) is false, and \(\neg A\) is false iff \(A\) is true—and in the semantics of many paraconsistent logics (for instance, the logic of First Degree Entailment), truth and falsity may overlap. Such an account preserves our intuition that negation is the operator which (truth-functionally) switches truth and falsity. It also preserves our intuition on contradictoriness, in the form: \(A\) and \(B\) are contradictories iff, if \(A\) is true, \(B\) is false, and if \(A\) is false, \(B\) is true. What has to go, on this proposal, is the assumption that truth and falsity are exclusive in all cases: there exist dialetheias, that is, sentences falling simultaneously under both categories.
Secondly, a dialetheist can point out that the argument against dialetheism based on the truth conditions for (classical) negation begs the question at its last step: why should we assume that it is impossible for \(A\) to be both true and not true? Well, because it is a contradiction. But that is precisely what is at issue; the critic was supposed to be arguing for the impossibility of any contradiction holding to begin with. In fact, the dialetheist may even accept a characterisation of the truth conditions for negation as: ‘\(\neg A\) is true iff \(A\) is not true’. For if the ‘metalanguage’ in which the characterisation is expressed can be inconsistent in its turn, as a thoroughgoing dialetheist is likely to allow (as in Weber et al 2016), then there is no guarantee that the ‘not’ in that clause behaves consistently. So the debate comes back to the basic question of whether or not consistency can be presupposed.
A variant on the anti-dialetheic argument from negation comes from a Quinean conception of logical vocabulary. It goes as follows. Even granting that there is an operator, say, \(*\), which behaves as dialetheists claim (namely, such that in particular in some cases \(A\) is true together with \(*A)\), it is still perfectly possible to define a negation with all the properties of classical negation; in particular, the property of being explosive. And since classical negation is the standard operator in logic, it is misleading to translate anything non-classical as ‘not’: such a translation risks simply calling ‘negation’ something different. A change in logical vocabulary is a “change of subject”, as the Quinean slogan goes. A version of this objection to dialetheism is due to Slater (1995); see also Restall 1993.
One line of reply to the Quinean objection available to the dialetheist is that the objection is confused between a logical theory and what the theory is a theory of. There are many different and well-worked out logical theories of negation (minimal negation, intuitionistic negation, De Morgan negation, etc.). Insofar as each one of them characterizes its own theoretical object, there is no rivalry between logics. Rivalry begins when we wonder whether some account or other captures the meaning and functioning of negation as it is used in the vernacular. An applied account of negation is a theory of something, and the theoretical object has to fit the real object. Now, to assume beforehand that the classical account of negation is the correct one, in the sense that it captures how negation works in the vernacular, again begs the question against the dialetheist (and, indeed, against most non-classical logicians): it is circular just to assume that classical negation gets it right. People who propose a treatment of negation alternative to the classical one are not thereby proposing to revise negation, but to revise an account of it, which they consider incorrect.
If it is agreed that a fair discussion between dialetheists and non-dialetheists cannot presuppose one account of negation over the other, then this suggests a simpler reply from dialetheists to the just-true/exclusion problems from 4.2 above. The reply now is to demur from the presuppositions of the just-true/exclusion objections. Without begging any questions one way or the other, this reply goes, all agree that for a sentence to be just-true amounts to it being true and not false, and just-false being false and not true. Then as Priest puts it (Priest 1987, p.291 of 2006 edition),
A dialetheist can express the claim that something, \(A\), is not true—in those very words, \(\neg Tr\langle A \rangle\). What she cannot do is ensure that the words she utters behave consistently: even if \(\neg Tr\langle A\rangle\) holds, \(A\) and \(\neg Tr\langle A\rangle\) may yet hold.
In the exclusion objection, it appears that the dialetheist is being asked to ensure that the words she utters behave consistently—which is exactly what is at issue. (See Restall 2010 and the reply in Beall et al 2011 for one round of this sort of discussion.) A dialetheist goes on to question why one should think that commitment to an explosive logic is, in itself, a guard against contradiction, and therefore why dialetheists are supposed to be in special difficulty with respect to the exclusion question any more than a non-dialetheist. Filling in the details here will vary, but the reply, in short, is for a dialetheist as with anyone else, ‘just-true’ is just ‘true’ (Beall 2009, p. 54). For elaboration of a dialetheic solution to the ‘just true’ problem see Omori and Weber 2019.
One final way this same sort of objection is expressed is by asking dialetheists for some way to sort the true-only sentences from the true-and-false sentences:
I often find myself being asked the following question: ‘Since you believe some contradictions, but not all, you must have a criterion for deciding between those that are true and those that are not. What is it?’ In reply I usually point out that the questioner believes some things are true, but not all, and ask them what criterion they have for deciding between those things that are true and those that are not. The answer, I think, is the same in both cases. Nice as it would be to have a criterion of truth, to expect one would seem utopian. One has to treat each case on its merits, whether the proposition concerned is a contradiction or some other thing (Priest 2006 p. 56).
Priest’s suggestion is that dialetheists are working with truth and falsity, just like non-dialetheists. Accounts of negation differ, but this on its own does not create any special obligations on the part of dialetheists.
5. Dialetheism and RationalityLet us turn from some basic objections to dialetheism to concerns that arise in relation to pragmatics and rationality.
5.1 Consistency and Other Epistemic Virtues
Some have felt that what is wrong with dialetheism is not so much violation of the LNC itself, as that an acceptance of the LNC is a precondition for rationality. For example, it is often suggested that it could not possibly be rational to accept a contradiction.
It is a matter of ongoing debate what the conditions are under which it is rational to accept something. Nevertheless, it is commonly agreed that, as Hume put it, the wise person “proportions his beliefs to the evidence” (1955, p. 118). If this is right, then if a sufficient case can be made out for a contradiction, it will be rational to believe it. And sometimes this does seem possible. We have seen that a seemingly compelling argument can be made in favour of the truth of the strengthened Liar sentence, ‘This sentence is not true’. Whether or not one takes the argument in question to be completely persuasive, it suggests that there is nothing in principle impossible about the existence of good arguments for true contradictions. Of course, if there were conclusive evidence for the LNC, then no case for a contradiction could be strong enough. But conclusive evidence for any philosophical position is difficult to achieve.
A more persuasive worry about dialetheism, relating to rationality, is the claim that if a person could legitimately accept a contradiction, then no one could be forced, rationally, to abandon any view held. For if a person accepts \(A\) then, when an argument for \(\neg A\) is put up, they could simply accept both \(A\) and \(\neg A\).
A dialetheist can reply that, again, not all contradictions are equal. Each sentence, including each contradiction, is evaluated on its merits. While a case can be made for the claim that the Liar sentence is both true and false, but this in no way shows that a case can also be made for Brisbane being and not being in Australia. (Of course, if one subscribes to the claim that entailment is explosive, a case for one contradiction is a case for all; but if entailment is paraconsistent, this argument is of no use.)
As orthodox philosophy of science indicates, there are, in fact, many different considerations that speak for or against the rational acceptability of a theory or a view. Among the epistemic virtues of a theory are: its adequacy to the data; its simplicity, cleanness and elegance; its unity and freedom from ad hoc hypotheses; its explanatory and predictive power; etc. Not only do these (and other) criteria come in degrees, but they may also be orthogonal to each other. In the end, the rational evaluation of a view must balance it against all criteria of this kind (of which, consistency is, arguably, one), each, on its own, being defeasible.
Dialetheism asks us to consider the possibility that a theory lacking the virtue of consistency may still overcomes its rivals in all or most of the other respects. According to dialetheists, this is actually the case with the dialetheic account of the semantics of ordinary language, whose advantages with respect to consistent accounts have already been shortly suggested above. And conversely, of course, an inconsistent theory may well be trumped by a consistent theory, all things considered. So it may be rational to reject an inconsistent position, even if it is logically possible that it is true. Rationality considerations are dealt with at length in Priest 2006.
5.2 Accepting and Asserting Dialetheias
If some contradictions are true, it is natural to expect that a dialetheist will sometimes accept, or believe in, contradictions, and assert them. Priest (2006, p. 109) adopts the following Rationality Principle:
(RP) If you have good evidence for the truth of \(A\), you ought to accept \(A\).
Belief, acceptance, and assertion have a point: when we believe and assert, what we aim at is believing and asserting what is the case or, equivalently, the truth. Therefore, the dialetheist will accept and, sometimes, assert both \(A\) and \(\neg A\), if she has evidence that \(A\) is a dialetheia.
Notice that this need not entail that the dialetheist both accepts and rejects \(A\) at the same time. We now come back to the issue flagged in Section 4.2, on the irreducibility of rejection to negation. That rejecting \(A\) is tantamount to accepting its negation is a common view, famously endorsed and defended (more precisely in terms of the corresponding speech acts of assertion and denial) by Frege and Peter Geach. But dialetheists have argued that this fusion is a confusion (see Berto 2008 on this issue). The point can be made independently of the issue of dialetheism: a paracompletist may well want to deny \(A\), but it would be unfair to take such a denial as equivalent to the assertion of \(\neg A\), since if \(A\) is truth-valueless, \(\neg A\) is normally considered truth-valueless, too, not a truth, and so not to be asserted. A dual position can hold for dialetheism: given that accepting \(\neg A\) is different from rejecting \(A\), a dialetheist can do the former and not the latter—exactly when she thinks that \(A\) is a dialetheia.
Does this show that dialetheism is compatible with rationality? The story about assertion and denial, acceptance and rejection has been challenged from several directions. We will just mention a few.
Restall (2015) argues that the the acceptance/rejection issue makes gappy and glutty approaches symmterical: gap theorists cannot assert some true claims about paradoxes, but glut theorists cannot reject some false claims about non-paradoxes; see also Restall 2013, Jenny 2017. In a note by Laura Goodship (1996), she suggests that the proposal of separating denial from assertion of negation runs into problems related, again, to Curry’s paradox. Her proposal is, in effect, that it would be more natural for dialetheists to both accept and reject things after all. Focusing on the phenomenon of disagreement in natural language, Ripley (2015a) argues that dialetheists (and paracompleteists) should rejoin classical logicians in taking negation to embed denial, and denial to express disagreement. Ripley proposes that dialetheists simply admit that (1) agreement and disagreement are incompatible (“it’s incoherent to do both”, p. 306), but (2) in some cases, assert and deny the same thing. The result would be what Ripley calls paracoherentism, which (in echo of paraconsistency) would try to allow local incoherence without global incoherence. How this could be done is an open question. Ripley suggests dropping the transitivity of logical consequence. Goodship herself ultimately recommends dropping modus ponens, a proposal that has been dubbed the ‘Goodship project’ (Beall 2015, Omori 2016, Priest 2017).
There certainly are various other arguments against dialetheism in the philosophical market (see papers in Priest et al. 2004). For example, Zalta (2004, p. 432) argues that preserving “our pretheoretic understanding of what it is to exemplify or instantiate a property” requires us to preserve the LNC. This entry has presented only some of the most immediate issues that arise in objections and replies.
6. Themes for Further Research
Since dialetheism is simply a claim about truth, it can play a role in any area—say in traditional or mainstream philosophy—where truth is involved. Among such topics, a prominent one is the debate between realists and anti-realists (for example, idealists and constructivists) in metaphysics. Very roughly, to be a realist about entities of some kind is to maintain that such entities objectively exist apart from, and antecedently to, anyone’s thought of them; and, therefore, that our thoughts, beliefs and theories concerning such entities are made objectively true or objectively false by them, apart from what we think of them (more refined definitions of realism and anti-realism are certainly available; but this characterization will suffice for our purposes).
It has been claimed (Priest 2000b, Priest 2006, Ch. 2) that dialetheism is not by itself committed to a specific conception of truth (deflationist, semantic, correspondentist, coherentist, constructivist, etc.).
If something is true, there must be something that makes it so. Call this the world. If some contradictions are true, then the world must be such as to make this the case. In this sense, the world is contradictory. What it is in the world that makes something true is another matter (Priest, 2006, p.299).
Nevertheless, if we accept even a mild form of realism, the truth of some contradictions entails the existence of inconsistent objects and/or states of affairs: those that make the contradictions true (Berto 2007b). One may claim that it makes no sense to talk of inconsistent objects, situations, or states of affairs. The world is all there, all together: how could some pieces of it contradict some other pieces? Consistency and inconsistency might be taken as properties of sentences, or theories (sets of sentences closed under logical consequence), or propositions (what sentences express), or maybe thoughts, or (sets of) beliefs, etc. Contradiction (Widerspruch, the Latin contradictio) has to do with discourse (diction, sprechen, dicere). The world, with its non-mental and non-linguistic inhabitants—armchairs, trees, people—is not the right kind of thing that can be consistent or inconsistent, and ascribing such properties to (a part of) the world is, to use Gilbert Ryle’s terminology, a category mistake.
These considerations might drive dialetheism towards an anti-realist interpretation of the claim that there are dialetheias, true contradictions; and anti-realist dialetheic theories of truth have, in fact, been proposed (see e.g. Beall’s ‘constructive methodological deflationism’, in Beall 2004). But other options are available to a dialetheist who wants to embrace some form of metaphysically robust realism about truth. For instance, she can stress that consistency and inconsistency can be ascribed to (pieces of) the world in a derived sense: to say that the world is (locally) inconsistent just is to say that some true purely descriptive sentences about the world have true negations. Consequently, and not accidentally, it is quite common in the current literature both for and against dialetheism to straightforwardly speak of inconsistent objects, states of affairs, and entire inconsistent worlds. A dialetheic correspondence theory of truth might be committed, in particular, to negative facts (requiring the simultaneous existence of truth-makers both for \(A\) and for its negation, when \(A\) is a dialetheia); but these may be not too difficult to handle (see e.g. Priest 2006, pp. 51–3).
There are further intermediate positions. One is ‘semantic dialetheism’ which accepts true contradictions without inconsistent objects or states of affairs as their truth-makers. This position has been explored in the literature (Kroon 2004, Mares 2004). Beall’s view, expressed in his transparent truth theory in Beall 2009, may also be seen as a form of semantic dialetheism. Transparency can be naturally paired with a deflationary view of truth. For suppose the truth predicate is a merely semantic device, coined, as Quine famously stressed, for expressive, ‘disquotational’ purposes. Then dialetheias such as the Liar(s) may well be semantic side-effects (‘spandrels’, in Beall’s terminology) of the introduction of such device, not involving any metaphysically committing contradiction in a language- and mind- independent world. Woodbridge and Armour-Garb (2013) argue that a deflationary view of truth is best understood in terms of semantic pretense (a hermeneutic fictionalist perspective), and on that basis offered a pretense account of the semantic paradoxes. Wansing (2022) advances a view called dimathematism, where there may be contradictions in information (information being “what is left from knowledge when you subtract, justification, truth, and belief” as Dunn puts it) again distinct from contradictions in truth.
Debates on realism and anti-realism quickly spill over into questions concerning the nature of reality in general. Thus the dialetheic programme looks to metaphysical issues: if reality is dialetheic, how should the ontology of a dialetheic world be spelt out? If metaphysics should be placed (once again) at the very core of philosophy, the debate on the possibility of dialetheias occupies a central place in the core. This was, after all, Aristotle’s view, too: he decided to speak on behalf of the unconditional validity of the LNC, not in his Organon (his writings on the subject of logic), but in the Metaphysics, for this was for him an issue to be addressed ontologically, not (only) via formal logical tools. For work in dialetheic metaphysics see Priest 2014, which grounds the very unity of objects in an inconsistent theory of parthood and boundary, and applies it to classic problems such as the One and the Many, and the instantiation of universals.
Since Aristotle, the assumption that consistency is a requirement for truth, validity, meaning, and rationality, has gone largely unchallenged. Modern investigations into dialetheism, in pressing the possibility of inconsistent theories that are nevertheless meaningful, valid, rational, and true, call that assumption into question. If consistency does turn out to be a necessary condition for any of these notions, dialetheism prompts us to articulate why; just by pushing philosophers to find arguments for what previously were undisputed beliefs renders a valuable service (Scharp 2007, p. 544). And if consistency turns out not to be an essential requirement for all theories, then the way is open for the rational exploration of areas in philosophy and the sciences that have traditionally been closed off.
We break up the references into sections corresponding to those of the text. Where a reference is not explicitly referred to in the text, we add a sentence concerning its relevance.
Some Basic Concepts
- Asmus, C., 2012, “Paraconsistency on the Rocks of Dialetheism”, Logique et Analyse, 55(217): 3–21. [Asmus 2012]
- Beall, Jc and G. Restall, 2006, Logical Pluralism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Berto, F., 2007, How to Sell a Contradiction. The Logic and Metaphysics of Inconsistency, London: College Publications.
- Carnielli, W. and Rodrigues, A., 2019, “An Epistemic Approach to Paraconsistency: A Logic of Evidence and Truth“, Synthese, 196(9): 3789–3813.
- D’Agostini, F., 2021, “Conjunctive paraconsistency”, Synthese, 199: 6845–6874.
- Kabay, P., 2010, On the Plenitude of Truth: A Defense of Trivialism, Saarbrücken: Lambert Academic Publishing.
- Lewis, D., 1999, “Letters to Beall and Priest”, in Priest et al 2004, pp.176–177.
- Martin, B., 2015, “Dialetheism and the impossibility of the world”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 93: 61–75.
- Pleitz. M., 2018, Logic, Language, and the Liar Paradox, Muenster: Mentis.
- Priest, G., 2000, “Motivations for Paraconsistency: the Slippery Slope from Classical Logic to Dialetheism”, in D. Batens, et al. (eds.), Frontiers of Paraconsistent Logic, Baldock, UK: Research Studies Press.
- Priest, G., JC Beall, and B. Armour-Garb (eds.), 2004, The Law of Non-Contradiction. New Philosophical Essays, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Priest, G., R. Routley, and J. Norman (eds.), 1989, Paraconsistent Logic: Essays on the Inconsistent, München: Philosophia Verlag.
- Wittgenstein, L., 1956, Remarks on the Foundations of Mathematics, Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 3rd edition, 1978.
- Woods, J., 2003, Paradox and Paraconsistency, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Woods, J., 2005, “Dialectical Considerations on the Logic of Contradiction: Part I”, Logic Journal of the IGPL, 13: 231–60.
Dialetheism in the History of Philosophy
- Aristotle, The Complete Works, J. Barnes (ed.), Princeton: Princeton University Press.
- Cusanus, Nicholas, 1440, Of Learned Ignorance, G. Heron (trans.), London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1954.
- Deguchi Y., J.L. Garfield and G. Priest, 2008, “The Way of the Dialetheist: Contradictions in Buddhism”, Philosophy East and West, 58: 395–402.
- Ficara, E., 2013, “Dialectic and Dialetheism”, History and Philosophy of Logic, 34(1): 35–52.
- Ficara, E., 2021, “The Birth of Dialetheism”, History and Philosophy of Logic, 42(3): 281–296.
- Garfield, J. (translation and commentary), 1995, The Fundamental Wisdom of the Middle Way: Nagarjuna’s Mulamadhyamakakarika, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Garfield, J., T. Tillmans and M. D’Amato (eds.), 2009, Pointing at the Moon: Buddhism, Logic, Analytic Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Hegel, G.W.F., 1830, Enzyklopädie der der philosophischen Wissenschaften in Grundrisse, in Werke in zwanzig Bände, hrg. von E. Moldenhauer und K.M. Michel, Bände 8–10, Suhrkamp, 1970; page references are to the English translation, The Encyclopaedia Logic (with the Zusätze), Indianapolis: Hackett, 1991.
- Hegel, G.W.F., 1831, Wissenschaft der Logik, 1831, vols. 11 and 12 of Gesammelte Werke, in Verbindung mit der Deutschen Forschungsgemeinschaft, hrg. von der Rheinisch-Westfälischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, Meiner, 1968ff; page references are to the English translation, Hegel’s Science of Logic, New York: Humanity Books, 1969.
- Kant, I., 1781, Kritik der reinen Vernunft, 1781, vols. 3 and 4 of Gesammelte Schriften, de Gruyter & Co., 1969; page references are to the English translation, Critique of Pure Reason, New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2003.
- Priest, G., 1990, “Dialectic and Dialetheic”, Science and Society, 53: 388–415.
- Priest, G., 1991, “Was Marx a Dialetheist?”, Science and Society, 54: 468–75.
- Priest, G., 1995, Beyond the Limits of Thought, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2nd expanded edition, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002.
- Priest, G., 2018, The Fifth Corner of Four, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Priest, G., and R. Routley, 1989a, “The History of Paraconsistent Logic”, Chapter 1 of Priest, Routley and Norman, 1989 (above).
- Robinson, T.M., 1987, Heraclitus: Fragments, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
- Routley, R., 1980, Exploring Meingong’s Jungle and Beyond, Canberra: Australian National University.
- Siderits, M., 2007, Buddhism as Philosophy: an introduction, Aldershot: Ashgate.
- Smart, N., 1964, Doctrine and Argument in Indian Philosophy, London: Allen and Unwin.
- Tanaka, K. (ed.), 2013, “Buddhism and Contradiction”, Philosophy East and West (Special Issue), 63(3).
- Tanaka, K., Y. Deguchi, J. Garfield, and G. Priest (eds.), 2015, The Moon Points Back, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Tillmans, T., 2009, “How do Madhyamikas Think?: Notes on Jay Garfield, Graham Priest, and Paraconsistency,” in Grafield et al 2009, pp.83–99.
- Suzuki, D.T., 1969, The Zen Doctrine of No Mind, London: Rider and Co.
- Zhuangzi, Wandering on the Way: Early Taoist Tales and Parables of Chuang Tzu, V. H. Mair (trans.), New York: Bantam Books, 1994.
Motivations for Dialetheism
- Beall, Jc (ed.), 2007, Revenge of the Liar, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Beall, Jc, 2009, Spandrels of Truth, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Beall, Jc, 2014a, “Finding Tolerance Without Gluts”, Mind, 123(491):791–811.
- Beall, Jc, 2014b, “End of Inclosure”, Mind, 123(491):829–849.
- Beall, Jc, 2016, “Do laws deliver gluts?”, in Law and the New Logics, Glenn and Smith (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 199–207.
- Beall, Jc, 2021, The Contradictory Christ, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Beall, Jc and J. Murzi, 2013, “Two Flavors of Curry’s Paradox”, Journal of Philosophy, 100(3): 143–165.
- Beall, Jc and D. Ripley, 2018, “Non-Classical Theories of Truth”, in M. Glanzberg (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of Truth, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Brady, R., 1989, “The Non-Triviality of Dialectical Set Theory”, in Priest, Routley and Norman (above), pp. 437–71.
- Cobreros, P., P. Egre, D. Ripley, and R. van Rooij, 2012, “Tolerant, Classical, Strict”, 41(2): 347–385.
- Cobreros, P., P. Egre, D. Ripley, and R. van Rooij, 2015, “Pragmatic Interpretations of Vague Expressions: Strongest Meaning and Nonmonotonic Consequence”, Journal of Philosophical Logic, 44(4): 375–393.
- Cogburn, J., 2017, Garcian Meditations: The Dialectics of Persistence in Form and Object, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
- Colyvan, M., 2009, “Vagueness and Truth”, in H. Dyke (ed.), From Truth to Reality: New Essays in Logic and Metaphysics, Oxford: Routledge, 2009, pp. 29–40.
- Cook, R., 2007, “Embracing Revenge: on the indefinite extensibility of language”, in Beall 2007, p.31–52.
- Cotnoir, A., 2018, “Theism and Dialetheism”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 96(3): 592–609.
- Ficara, E., editor, 2014, Contradictions: Logic, History, Actuality, Berlin: de Gruyter.
- Field, H., 2008, Saving Truth from Paradox, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Hyde, D., 1997, “From Heaps and Gaps to Heaps of Gluts”, Mind, 106: 640–60.
- Kirkham, R.L., 1992, Theories of Truth. A Critical Introduction, Cambridge, Mass: MIT Press.
- Kripke, S., 1975,“Outline of a Theory of Truth”, Journal of Philosophy, 72: 690–716. Reprinted in R.M. Martin (ed.), Recent Essays on Truth and the Liar Paradox, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1984, pp. 53–81.
- Martin, R.L., 1967, “Towards a Solution to the Liar Paradox”, Philosophical Review, 76: 279–311.
- Mortensen, C., 1995, Inconsistent Mathematics, Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
- Morton, T., 2012, “An Object-Oriented Defense of Poetry”, New Literary History, 43(2): 205–224.
- Omori, H., and Wansing, H., 2019, “Connexive logics: an overview and current trends”, Logic and Logical Philosophy, 28: 371–387.
- Priest, G., 1987, In Contradiction, Dordrecht: Martinus Nijhoff. 2nd expanded edition, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2006.
- Priest, G., 2010, “Inclosures, Vagueness, and Self-Reference”, Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 51: 69–84.
- Priest, G., 2015, “Fusion and Confusion”, Topoi, 34: 55–61.
- Priest, G., and R. Routley, 1983, On Paraconsistency, Research Report #13, Research School of Social Sciences, Australian National University, available online; reprinted in Priest, Routley and Norman (eds.) 1989.
- Priest, G., and R. Routley, 1989b, “Applications of Paraconsistent Logic”, Chapter 13 of Priest, Routley and Norman, 1989.
- Priest, G., and R. Routley, 1989c, “The Philosophical Significance and Inevitability of Paraconsistency”, Chapter 18 of Priest, Routley and Norman, 1989 (above).
- Restall, G., 1992, “A note on naive set theory in LP”, Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 33(3): 442–432.
- Restall, G., 2000, An Introduction to Substructural Logics, London-New York: Routledge.
- Ripley, D., 2012, “Paradoxes and Failures of Cut”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 91: 139–64.
- Ripley, D., 2013, “Sorting Out the Sorites”, in K. Tanaka, F. Berto, E. Mares and F. Paoli (eds.), Paraconsistency: Logic and Applications, Dordrecht: Springer, 2013, pp. 327–45.
- Ripley, D., 2015b, “Naive set theory and nontransitive logic”, Review of Symbolic Logic, 8(3): 553–571.
- Routley, R., 1979, “Dialectical Logic, Semantics and Metamathematics”, Erkenntnis, 14: 301–31. (A defence of a dialetheic account of the paradoxes of self-reference.)
- Routley, R., and R.K. Meyer, 1976, “Dialectical Logic, Classical Logic, and the Consistency of the World”, Studies in Soviet Thought, 16: 1–25.
- Russell, B., 1903, Principles of Mathematics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- van Fraassen, B., 1968, “Presuppositions, Implication and Self-Reference”, Journal of Philosophy, 65: 136–51.
- Varzi, A., 1997, “Inconsistency without Contradiction”, Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 38: 621–39.
- Weber, Z., 2010, “A Paraconsistent Model of Vagueness”, Mind, 119: 1026–45.
- Weber, Z., 2012, “Transfinite Cardinals in Paraconsistent Set Theory”, Review of Symbolic Logic, 5(2):269–293.
- Weber, Z., 2019, “Atheism and Dialetheism; or, Why I am not a (paraconsistent) Christian”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 97(2): 401–407.
- Weber, Z., 2021, Paradoxes and Inconsistent Mathematics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Weber, Z., and Cotnoir, A., 2015, “Inconsistent Boundaries”, Synthese, 192: 1267–1294.
- Weber, Z., D. Ripley, G. Priest, D. Hyde, and M. Colyvan, 2014, “Tolerating Gluts”, Mind, 123(491): 813–828.
Objections to Dialetheism
- Armour-Garb, B. and J. Woodbridge, 2006, “Dialetheism, Semantic Pathology, and the Open Pair”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 84: 395–416. (An objection to dialetheism based on the notion of pathological sentence.)
- Beall, Jc, 2013, “Shrieking against gluts: the solution to the ‘just-true’ problem”, Analysis, 73(3): 438–445.
- Beall, Jc, 2015, “Free of detachment: logic, rationality, and gluts”, Noûs, 49(2): 410–423.
- Beall, Jc and G. Priest, 2007, “Not so deep inconsistency: a reply to Eklund”, Australasian Journal of Logic, 5: 74–84. (A reply to Eklund 2002).
- Beall, Jc and G. Priest and Z. Weber, 2011, “Can u do that?”, Analysis, 71(2): 280–285.
- Berto, F., 2006, “Meaning, Metaphysics, and Contradiction”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 43: 283–97.
- Berto, F., 2012, “How to Rule Out Things with Words”, in G. Restall and G. Russell (eds.), New Waves in Philosophical Logic, New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2012, pp. 169–89.
- Berto, F., 2014, “Absolute Contradiction, Dialetheism, and Revenge”, Review of Symbolic Logic, 7(2):193–207.
- Denyer, N., 1989, “Dialetheism and Trivialisation”, Mind, 98: 259–63. (A critique of a dialetheic account of the paradoxes of self-reference.)
- Eklund, 2002, “Deep Inconsistency”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 80: 321–31. (Another critique of a dialetheic account of the paradoxes of self-reference.)
- Irvine, A.D., 1992, “Gaps, Gluts and Paradox”, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 18 (Supplementary Volume): 273–99. (A critique of a dialetheic account of the paradoxes of self-reference.)
- Littman, G., and K. Simmons, 2004, “A Critique of Dialetheism”, in Priest, Beall and Armour-Garb (eds.) 2004, pp. 314–35.
- McTaggart, J.M.E., 1922, Studies in the Hegelian Dialectic, 2nd edition, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Murzi, J., and M. Carrara, 2015, “Denial and Disagreement”, Topoi, 34(1): 109–119.
- Omori, H., and Weber, Z., 2019, “Just true? on the metatheory for paraconsistent truth”, Logique et Analyse, 248: 415–433.
- Parsons, T., 1990, “True Contradictions”, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 20: 335–53. (A critique of a dialetheic account of the paradoxes of self-reference.)
- Priest, G., 1989, “Denyer’s $ Not Backed by Sterling Arguments”, Mind, 98: 265–8. (A reply to Denyer, 1989.)
- Priest, G., 1995, “Gaps and Gluts: Reply to Parsons”, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 25: 57–66. (A reply to Parsons, 1990.)
- Priest, G., 1998a, “What’s So Bad About Contradictions?”, Journal of Philosophy, 95: 410–26. Reprinted in Priest, Beall and Armour-Garb (eds.) 2004, ch. 1. (A detailed discussion of some modern objections to dialetheism.)
- Priest, G., 1998b, “To Be and Not to Be: That Is the Answer. On Aristotle on the Law of Non-Contradiction”, Philosophiegeschichte und Logische Analyse, 1: 91–130. Reprinted as Chapter 1 of Priest 2006.
- Priest, G., 2003, “Inconsistent Arithmetic: Issues Technical and Philosophical”, in V. F. Hendricks and J. Malinowski (eds.), Trends in Logic, Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, pp. 273–99. Reprinted as Chapter 17 of the 2nd edition of Priest 1987. (A discussion of inconsistent arithmetics, including a reply to Shapiro, 2002.)
- Priest, G., 2017, “What if? The exploration of an idea”, Australasian Journal of Logic, 14 (Special Issue: Non-classicality: logic, mathematics, philosophy), edited by Z. Weber, P. Girard, and M. McKubre-Jordens.
- Priest, G., and T. Smiley, 1993,“Can Contradictions be True?”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 68 (Supplement): 17–54. (A debate on the issue of dialetheism.)
- Restall, G., 1993, “Deviant Logic and the Paradoxes of Self-Reference”, Philosophical Studies, 70: 279–303. (Includes a discussion of Quinean objections to non-classical accounts of negation.)
- Restall, G., 2010, “On t and u and what they can do”, Analysis, 70(4): 673–76.
- Rossberg, M., 2013, “Too good to be ‘Just True’”, Thought, 2: 1–8.
- Scharp, K., 2007, “Review of Doubt Truth to Be a Liar by Graham Priest”, Bulletin of Symbolic Logic, 13(4): 541–544.
- Scharp, K., 2018, “Shrieking in the face of vengeance”, Analysis, to appear.
- Shapiro, S., 2002, “Incompleteness and Inconsistency”, Mind, 111: 817–32. (A critique of the possibility of inconsistent arithmetic.)
- Shapiro, S., 2004, “Simple Truth, Contradiction and Consistency”, in Priest, Beall and Armour-Garb (eds.) 2004, pp. 336–54.
- Slater, H., 1995, “Paraconsistent Logics?”, Journal of Philosophical Logic, 24: 451–4.
- Weber, Z., G. Badia, and P. Girard, 2016, “What is an inconsistent truth table?”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 94(3): 533–548.
- Young, G., 2015, “Shrieking, Just False and Exclusion”, Thought, 4(4): 269–276.
- Zalta, E., 2004, “In Defense of the Law of Non-Contradiction”, in Priest, Beall and Armour-Garb (eds.) 2004, pp. 416–36.
Dialetheism and Rationality
- Andreas, H. and P. Verdée, 2016, Logical Studies of Paraconsistent Reasoning in Science and Mathematics, (Trends in Logic 45), Dordrecht: Springer. doi:10.1007/978-3-319-40220-8
- Beall, Jc and M. Colyvan, 2001, “Looking for Contradictions”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 79: 564–9. (On the spread of dialetheias in the empirical world).
- Berto, F., 2008, “Adynaton and Material Exclusion”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 86: 165–90.
- Bremer, M., 2008, “Why and How to Be a Dialetheist”, Studia Philosophica Estonica, 1: 208–27 (A discussion of the conditions on the rational believability of dialetheism).
- Dutilh Novaes, C., 2008, “Contradiction: the Real Challenge for Paraconsistent Logic”, in In J.Y. Béziau, W. Carnielli, and D. Gabbay (eds.), Handbook of Paraconsistency, London: College Publications. (A specification of the conditions for a non-question-begging debate between dialetheists and supporters of the LNC.)
- Girard, Patrick and Koji Tanaka, 2016, “Paraconsistent Dynamics”, Synthese, 193(1): 1–14. doi:10.1007/s11229-015-0740-2
- Hume, D., 1748, An Inquiry Concerning Human Understanding, C.W. Hendel (ed.), Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merril Company Inc., 1955.
- Jenny, M., 2017, “Classicality Lost: K3 and LP after the Fall”, Thought, 6(1): 43–53.
- Omori, H., 2016, “From paraconsistent logic to dialetheic logic”, in Andreas and Verdee, pp. 111–134.
- Priest, G., 2000a, “Could Everything Be True?”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 78: 189–95. Reprinted as Chapter 3 of Priest 2006.
- Priest, G., 2006, Doubt Truth to Be a Liar, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Restall, G., 2013, “Assertion, denial, and non-classical theories”, in Tanaka et al. 2013, pp. 81–100.
- Restall, G., 2015, “Assertion, Denial, Accepting, Rejecting, Symmetry and Paradox,”, in C. Caret and O. Hjortland, Foundations of Logical Consequence, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 310–321.
- Ripley, D., 2015a, “Embedding denial”, in C. Caret and O. Hjortland, Foundations of Logical Consequence, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 289–309.
Themes for Further Research
- Beall, Jc, 2000, “On Truthmakers for Negative Truths”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 78: 264–8. (A discussion of the connections between dialetheism, correspondence theory, and negative facts.)
- Beall, Jc, 2004, “True and False – As If”, in Priest, Beall and Armour-Garb (eds.) 2004, 197–216.
- Berto, F., 2007b, “Is Dialetheism an Idealism?”, Dialectica, 61: 235–63.
- Casati, F., 2021, Heidegger and the Contradiction of Being: An Analytic Interpretation of the Late Heidegger, Routledge.
- Grim, P., 2004, “What is a contradiction”, in Priest, Beall and Armour-Garb (eds.) 2004, 49–72.
- Kroon, F., 2004, “Realism and Dialetheism”, in Priest, Beall and Armour-Garb (eds.) 2004, 245–63.
- Mares, E., 2004, “Semantic Dialetheism”, in Priest, Beall and Armour-Garb (eds.) 2004, 264–75.
- Priest, G., 2000b, “Truth and Contradiction”, Philosophical Quarterly, 50: 305–19. Reprinted as Chapter 2 of Priest 2006.
- Priest, G., 2014, One: Being an Investigation into the Unity of Reality and of its Parts, including the Singular Object which is Nothingness, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Tahko, T., 2009, “The Law of Non-Contradiction as a Metaphysical Principle”, Australasian Journal of Logic, 7, available online. (A defense of the Law of Non-Contradiction as a metaphysical – as opposed to logical or semantic – principle).
- Wansing, H., 2022, “One Heresy and One Orthodoxy: On Dialetheism, Dimathematism, and the Non-normativity of Logic”. Erkenntnis available online.
- Woodbridge, R. and B. Armour-Garb, 2013, “Semantic Defectiveness and the Liar”, Philosophical Studies, 164(3): 845–863.
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- Inconsistent Mathematics, entry in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
- Paraconsistent Logic, entry in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
The authors would like to thank Jc Beall, Max Carrara, David Ripley, Koji Tanaka, and three anonymous referees, for providing helpful comments and suggestions.