“Revelation” (lat. revelatio) is a translation of the Greek word apokalypsis, which means the removal of a veil so that something can be seen. Many religions appeal to purported divine revelations in order to explain and justify their characteristic beliefs about God, and revelation has usually been understood as an epistemic notion. Paradigmatically, it refers to alleged instances of divine speaking or special divine acts in history, although in a more general sense “revelation” can denote any means of divine self-disclosure, for example through nature. The topic of divine revelation has been a long-standing and central focus in theology, and philosophical discussions have often taken their cues from Christian theological debates. This entry will treat theological perspectives only in so far as they are relevant for philosophical questions about the purported nature and means of divine revelation and the justification of revelatory claims.
- 1. Conceptions of Divine Revelation
- 2.The Justification of Revelatory Claims
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1. Conceptions of Divine Revelation
Revelation, as commonly understood, has to do with the dispelling of ignorance. The counterpart of “the revealed”, therefore, is “the hidden” (Wolterstorff 1995: 23). However, the term has many meanings or uses—religious as well as non-religious—which are related to each other analogically. A distinction should be made, first, between the process and product meaning of the word. “Revelation” can either refer to the act/process of revealing something, or to the content that is revealed. Second, while in ordinary discourse one can “have a revelation” without there being a revealer (an agent that reveals), in religious contexts revelation is usually understood as a “person-to-person affair” (Helm 1982: 14; Mavrodes 1988: 96).
The following scheme (S) identifies the elements that are necessary for a revelatory claim (a claim that a revelation has occurred) to be true:
- m reveals a to n by means of (through, etc.) k (Mavrodes 1988: 88).
In addition to a revealer (m) and an audience (n), an act of revelation must have a content (a) that is made known or available to the audience through some means (k). Given this scheme, several areas of controversy can be pin-pointed. Since the topic is divine revelation, m is of course identified with God. However, in contemporary Christian thought, there is a debate about the nature of a. Is the content of divine revelation propositions about or related to God, or is it God himself, or both (O‘Collins 2016a: Ch. 1)? Many theologians emphasize that God reveals himself rather than propositions or “information”. This debate (to which we will return) must be understood against the background of the Christian doctrine of the incarnation, which claims that God “became flesh and lived among us” (John 1: 14).
Furthermore, there is a debate about whether n—the audience—includes only those who have actually acquired knowledge through the revelation, or if n can also include those who potentially could have acquired such knowledge, but in fact did not. In other words, is revelation a “success word” or does it cover cases where knowledge is merely made available? (For different views, see Sluys 2000; Blaauw 2009; Gunton 1995: 113; O’Collins 2016a: 76).
1.1 General/Natural and Special Revelation
A common distinction that relates to the audience (n) is between general and special (or particular) revelation, where the former refers to a revelation that is universally available, and the latter to a revelation made (directly or initially) to a limited group of people. Often, general revelation is identified with natural revelation, even though the latter concept has to do with the means of revelation (k) rather than the audience. The natural world, including human nature, is available to all, and would be the most plausible candidate as a means for a general revelation. However, it is conceivable that God could have made a general revelation by acting outside of the natural order, for example by making miracles visible to all (Helm 1982: 17). Strictly speaking, therefore, the counterpart to natural revelation—if there is a counterpart—is supernatural revelation rather than special revelation. “Supernatural”, in a theological context, refers to putative divine action that is not included in God’s ordinary activity of creating and sustaining the world. For the most part, however, “general revelation” and “natural revelation” are used interchangeably, as are their counterparts “special revelation” and “supernatural revelation” (for criticism of the distinction, see Downing 1964).
Some philosophers make a distinction between natural revelation and natural theology (e.g., King 2012; Helm 1982: 22–26; Wolterstorff 1995: 24–25). According to Helm, for something to qualify as divine revelation it must be immediate, and the human recipients must be passive. Since natural theology includes the activity of inferring knowledge of God from publicly available evidence, natural theology is not a species of natural revelation, Helm argues. It is unclear, however, why God could not reveal himself in a way that requires inferential activity on the part of the recipients, and many thinkers make no distinction between natural revelation and natural theology (Davies 2009: 36; O’Collins 2016b: 287). In the context of this entry, however, it is necessary to exclude traditional natural theology from treatment, and “natural revelation” will therefore be understood in accordance with Helm’s restrictive definition. The major focus, however, will be on special revelation.
The very idea of special revelation has often been viewed with suspicion since the Enlightenment (Abraham 2002). Why is not natural revelation enough? Why would God in addition need to reveal himself to certain people at certain points in history? A related critique takes issue with divine hiddenness. If God exists, why does he seem to be “hidden”, so that a revelation is necessary in the first place? Since objections of this kind concern the coherence of religious outlooks based on a purported “special” revelation, it is reasonable for defenders of revelation to appeal to the doctrines of their own religious tradition. Christian thinkers have traditionally explained divine hiddenness and the need for special revelation with reference to humanity’s fall into sin. Sin has cognitive effects, and revelation is typically seen as the epistemic aspect of salvation (O‘Collins 2011: 70–74). When God acts in history to save humanity, he reveals himself and what he is doing. Nevertheless, as a result of the Enlightenment critique, nineteenth century theologians started to downplay special revelation. Instead, they emphasized what could be ascertained about God on the basis of
rational argument, historical enquiry, analysis of the structures of human perception or moral motivation, or any combination of these. (Quash 2007: 328)
This “reduction” of special revelation to a vague form of general revelation, however, generated a counter-reaction in the twentieth century by theologians such as Karl Barth, who emphasized a unique divine revelation in Christ.
When it comes to the means (k) of revelation, philosophical reflection can either consider a priori possibilities for how revelation might proceed, or study ideas and claims about revelation found in a particular religious tradition, such as Christianity. Perhaps it is most fruitful to combine analysis of religious claims with conceptual or metaphysical reflection in order to map the possible means of divine revelation. Using this kind of method, William Abraham has described revelation as a “polymorphous concept” like “teach” and “farm” (Abraham 1997: 206). Just like one can teach by doing a variety of different concrete things (lecturing, using pictures or models, grading papers, etc.), so God could reveal by doing many different things, such as speaking, doing “might acts” in history, causing dreams, visions or other experiences, or “making Himself present and manifesting Himself” by means of an incarnation (Vatican II, Dei Verbum § 4).
1.2 Manifestational and Propositional Revelation
A useful distinction related to the means of revelation (k) is between manifestational and non-manifestational revelation (Wolterstorff 1995: 26). Manifestational revelation happens when somebody “shows” or in some other way makes some reality manifest, while non-manifestational revelation takes place when something is revealed without being shown or manifested—for example, by means of verbal communication. According to Wolterstorff, the essential difference between these two ways of revealing is that in the case of manifestational revelation, the means of revelation is a natural sign of the reality revealed (such as the reality itself, or a characteristic causal effect of it). In the case of non-manifestational revelation, the means is not a natural sign. Instead it can be conventional sign (e.g., a sentence), or some other entity, such as a belief implanted in somebody’s mind by God.
Mavrodes has subdivided non-manifestational varieties of revelation into two categories which he calls “the communication model” and “the causation model” (in addition to these, he suggests a “manifestation model”). In the communication model, revelation is understood as something analogous to speech and related linguistic activities. In the causation model, revelation happens by God causing beliefs in people, either from the beginning of a person’s existence, or at some later time (Mavrodes 1988: 73–74).
A concept that has figured importantly in debates about the means of revelation is “propositional revelation”. Wolterstorff claims that this is just another name for non-manifestational revelation. Since propositions are an essential part of the means (k) of non-manifestational revelations (as we will see), there seems to be good reason for this identification. However, in twentieth century theology, “propositional revelation” has received something of a bad reputation. A typical criticism is expressed by Hordern: “What God reveals is not propositions or information—what God reveals is God” (Hordern 1959: 61–62; see also Baillie 1956: 28; Kelsey 1975: 32; Schwöbel 1990: 34; Williams 2000: 131). In modern theology, “propositional” accounts of revelation are often said to have given way to a focus on divine “self-revelation”.
The locus of revelation is not propositions but events, and its content is not a body of truths about God, but “the living God” revealing himself in his actions toward man. (Hick 1967: 190)
In order to address this debate about the role of propositions in revelation, and to assess the theological critique, it is helpful to distinguish between two questions:
- How do propositions figure in the means of revelation (k)?
- How do propositions figure in the content of revelation (a)?
There is no consensus about the nature or even existence of propositions, but most philosophers would agree that propositions (if they exist) can be true or false, and that they are “sharable”. Many people can believe the same proposition at the same time, and many different sentences can express the same proposition (e.g., “Schnee is Weiss” and “Snow is white”). Assuming this view, there are at least two ways in which propositions could figure in the means (k) of revelation. First, if God speaks—in a literal sense of “speaks”, that is, if he uses sentences to communicate—then sentences would be the primary means of revelation. However, if propositions constitute the meaning of sentences, then propositions would figure importantly as well. Second, suppose that God does not speak in this literal sense, but instead directly causes certain people to have certain beliefs. In that case, the beliefs that God causes would be the primary means of revelation. However, since propositions constitute the cognitive contents of beliefs, propositions would figure importantly too.
In manifestational revelation, the means is (paradigmatically) a direct presentation or manifestation of the very reality that God wishes to reveal—for example himself. In this kind of “means”, propositions are not involved. God is not a proposition, obviously, and neither does God have a proposition as his “content”. Hence, a central difference between manifestational and propositional (non-manifestational) revelation seems to be, unsurprisingly, that propositions figure importantly in the means of the latter, but not in the means of the former.
However, and perhaps more surprisingly, when it comes to the content of revelation, the same does not seem to be true. Propositions must, arguably, figure as part of the content of manifestational revelations as well as in the content of propositional revelation. We can see this by the following example. Suppose a person reveals an object manifestationally by showing it to someone. This will not only reveal the object itself, but also some propositions about it. Otherwise, it is hard to see how the act could count as a revelation. Since revelation is an epistemic concept (or at least has an epistemic dimension), any act of revelation must make something known or knowable, and this means making at least some proposition known or knowable (Wahlberg 2014: 30–31).
In response, it can be argued that there is such a thing as “knowledge by acquaintance” that is not reducible to propositional knowledge. Or perhaps knowing a person is irreducible to knowing about that person (see, e.g., Stump 2010: Ch. 3–4). Even so, it is difficult to see how one could get acquaintance-knowledge or “personal” knowledge of a person (or of God) without also having a good deal of propositional knowledge about him. For example, how could one know somebody by acquaintance without at the same time knowing that this person exists (which is a piece of propositional knowledge)? (Wellington 2019: 166; Lamont 2004: 7–8).
This reasoning will not convince those who deny the existence of propositions (see, e.g., Westphal 1999 for an anti-realist critique). However, among those who accept propositions, many have taken the contrast that Hordern and others draw between revelation of propositions and divine self-revelation to be misconceived. God could not reveal himself without simultaneously revealing (making knowable) some propositions about himself. Propositions must figure in the content (a) of both propositional and manifestational revelations. In manifestational revelations, however, they do not figure as means (k).
Another important difference between propositional and manifestational revelation concerns the need for interpretation. In manifestational revelation, the audience is confronted with “raw reality”—for example “God himself”, or some spectacular historical event. Such media of revelation contain a wealth of information, and it is up to the recipient to decide which aspects of the manifestation to focus on. In propositional revelation, on the other hand, the audience is confronted with entities such as words and sentences that are specially designed to express a determinate message. Something similar is presumably true in cases of divine direct communication of knowledge to a person’s mind. Hence, even though interpretation is involved in the reception of both propositional and manifestational revelation, in the case of propositional revelation, less of it is needed (Wolterstorff 1995: 29). Arguably, it follows from this that if God wants to convey a fairly determinate cognitive content, he will have good reason to use some form of propositional revelation (perhaps in addition to manifestational revelation) (Mansini 2018: 260).
Why, then, are some theologians critical of propositional revelation? While here are different kinds of critique (Helm 1972; Gunton 1995: 7–13), the main objection has to do with how the notion of propositional revelation is thought to affect biblical interpretation. Standardly, the critics’ argument (made from a Christian perspective) goes something like this:
- If there is such a thing as propositional revelation, it is found in the Bible.
- If there is propositional revelation in the Bible, then it is communicated through literal language that straightforwardly expresses divinely revealed propositions (Dulles 1992: 48).
- However, it is very implausible that God communicates in this way, since the Bible often uses metaphor and narrative rather than literal language. Moreover, the Bible contains erroneous and problematic claims and views, and historical-critical scholarship has shown that the text is shaped by the contingent historical, cultural and political contexts of the human authors (Dulles 1992: 49).
- Hence, the Bible does not contain propositional revelation.
- Hence, there is no propositional revelation.
An “easy” response to this argument points out that it assumes that either the whole Bible constitutes propositional revelation, or else there is no propositional revelation in the Bible at all. However, it is possible that parts of the Bible record propositional revelations that were originally given to prophets, apostles and others. Moreover, some original divine communications of this kind might not even be recorded in the Bible but instead preserved and interpreted through an oral tradition, as traditional Catholic and Orthodox perspectives hold (however, see Ratzinger 1966: 46).
Many defenders of propositional revelation believe that this “easy” response concedes too much ground to the critics. They argue that the Bible as a whole can reasonably be believed to be “authored” by God and expressive of propositional revelation. Attacking premise 2, the defenders of divine authorship point out that propositions can be expressed by metaphorical and other non-literal forms of language. A propositional construal of biblical revelation does not mean that a narrowly literalistic approach to the Bible is necessary (Lamont 2004: Ch. 5; Wolterstorff 1995: Ch. 11–12; McCall 2009). Attacking premise 3, they furthermore argue that divine authorship is compatible with the text being shaped by the cultural and personal perspectives of the human authors. God could, for example, author the Bible by “appropriating” or “authorizing” human discourse, thereby making human utterances or speech-acts into vehicles of his own discourse. In a similar way as a president can authorize an ambassador to speak on her behalf, or a speaker can appropriate the utterances of others by quotation or paraphrase, so God could “borrow” human speech-acts without depriving the human authors of genuine authorship (Wolterstorff 1995: Ch. 3. For criticism, see Wisse 2002; Levine 1998). If this is what God has done, then biblical interpretation will require that we distinguish between the intentions and message of the human authors, and the intention and message of the divine, appropriating discourse. The former may contain erroneous or morally problematic views, which are not asserted by the divine author.
Another way of explaining how a medium of divine propositional revelation could possibly contain errors, is by distinguishing between the statements that are expressed through the medium (the biblical text), and the sometimes problematic cultural presuppositions in terms of which they are expressed (Swinburne 2007: Ch. 2). Since it is probably impossible to make statements that do not depend on the presuppositions of any particular culture, and since all cultures embody some false beliefs and problematic conceptions, it is to be expected, argues Swinburne, that a divine revelation will be expressed by means of presuppositions some of which are false (for criticism, see Stump 1994: 740–741).
The discussion about propositional revelation in the Bible or other sacred documents raises questions about God’s causal role in the production of the text. A common view is that the Bible (or the Qur’an) acquires its status as revelation and/or as being “authored” by God as a result of its being inspired by God. According to a common understanding, inspiration is a special divine influence on the writers of the biblical books. (Not all theologians accept this view of biblical inspiration, however, see, e.g., Trembath 1987: 5, 109–118; Burtchaell 1969: Ch. 5.) The divine influence could conceivably take different forms (Davies 2009: 41–44; Burtchaell 1969). According to theories of “verbal inspiration”, God provides a quite detailed guidance by controlling the authors’ choice of words. This theory does not necessarily entail divine “dictation”, however; dictation theories are best conceived as a subspecies of verbal inspiration. “Content theories” also come in different forms. Some involve a detailed divine guidance on the level of statements or propositions, while other versions portray inspiration as limited to the main ideas of the text. It is also possible to posit different degrees and modes of inspiration in different parts of the Bible (O’Collins 2016a: 160–161). Another, rather recent theory suggests that God, through his “middle-knowledge”, could providentially have controlled the human authors of the Bible without taking away their freedom (Craig 1999). Lastly, the theory of “social inspiration” (sometimes “ecclesial inspiration”) tries to account for the fact that the biblical books have a complex history of origin which involves, besides authors and redactors, processes of oral transmission in liturgical and other social contexts (Benoit 1965: 24–26; Barr 1983: 27; Farkasfalvy 2010: 211). Presumably, if God is to control the outcome of such a process, he must influence social groups over extended periods of time.
What is the relationship between divine inspiration and the idea of divine authorship of the Bible? According to Wolterstorff, these are quite distinct phenomena. Inspiration has to do with God’s superintendence over the production of a text, while divine authorship has to do with God’s authorization of a text (Wolterstorff 1995: 41–42). In principle, God could authorize or appropriate a certain text—making it his own by “signing” it, as it were—without having superintended or influenced its production in any way. Of course, God must do something in order for authorization to happen, for example influencing the process of canonization. For Wolterstorff, however, the Bible’s status as authored by God does not essentially depend on its being inspired. That said,
it would be bizarre to think of God as just finding these books lying about and deciding to appropriate them. (Wolterstorff 1995: 187)
Some kind of divine inspiration seems very probable also on Wolterstorff’s view. (For the justification of belief in inspiration, see Crisp 2009.)
According to traditional Christian perspectives, on the other hand, divine inspiration is an essential condition for divine authorship (see, e.g., Feingold 2016: 284). This is true of traditional Catholic as well as Protestant views, which both assume a pervasive divine guidance that extends to all parts of the biblical text and guarantees the aptness of the authors’ choice of words (without necessarily involving “dictation”). Traditional views also presume that inspiration entails inerrancy—that is, freedom from errors in all respects, not just with respect to essential contents (Burtchaell 1969: 1–2; for a critique of inerrancy, see Abraham 1981: Ch. 1).
Can a “strong” theory of inspiration of this sort be defended? Besides challenges from contemporary biblical criticism, such views also face the challenge to explain how inspiration is compatible with the freedom of the human authors (which few would want to deny) and their status as genuine authors rather than mere puppets. Perhaps the best shot at success belongs to those who defend a traditional view from the standpoint of a Thomistic understanding of divine causality. From such a perspective, God is the principal cause and the human authors of the Bible are secondary or instrumental causes (see Feingold 2016: 289–295; for criticism, see Rahner 1964). Instrumental causes are real causes, so the human authors are real authors. Moreover, God presumably does not choose instrumental causes arbitrarily, but with an eye to their aptness for the effects he has in mind (i.e., the texts). The diversity found in the Bible could hence be precisely what God aimed at in choosing people with different temperaments, skills, and experiences as his instruments. Still, since the effect of an instrumental cause transcends the power of that cause taken alone and manifests the power of the principal cause, it is appropriate to say that God is the principal author of the Bible. Moreover, according to the Thomistic view, God acts through instrumental causes in a way that respects their nature, and this is true also when God uses human free will as an instrument. The human authors, hence, are “living and free instruments” rather than puppets (Feingold 2016: 290).
A potential weakness of this account is that it presumes a controversial (and possibly incoherent) view about the compatibility of human freedom and divine causality. On the other hand, precisely by adopting this view, the account avoids the implausible conclusion that God and human authors are involved in a kind of “division of labor” (God being responsible for some aspects of the text, e.g., the ideas, and human authors for other aspects, e.g., the words). If divine and human causality are not related in the manner of a “zero-sum game”, both God and the human authors could be involved in shaping all aspects of the text. However, some authors claim that a “Molinistic” approach, based on God’s “middle knowledge”, could also account for the divine-human character of the Bible as a whole, while avoiding some problematic aspects of the Thomistic view (Craig 1999).
1.3 Models of Revelation
The distinction between propositional and manifestational revelation is very general, and a more fine-grained classification of conceivable means of revelation is desirable. We have already seen that propositional (or non-manifestational) revelation can be subdivided into “the causation model” and “the communication model”. Beyond this, the theologian Avery Dulles has suggested a typology useful for categorizing theories of manifestational revelation. He divides contemporary theological accounts of revelation into five major classes depending on “their central vision of how and where revelation occurs” (Dulles 1992: 27). Besides propositional revelation (which he calls “Revelation as Doctrine”), Dulles discerns four basic models for manifestational revelation.
Revelation as History. This model identifies revelation with God’s “great deeds” in salvation history. The Bible is seen as the record of these deeds, for example the Exodus or the resurrection of Jesus. The biblical text itself, however, is not part of revelation. Some representatives of this approach hold that revelation must include a supernatural cognitive assistance (illumination) so that the historical events can be interpreted correctly (Baillie 1956: 65). Others deny that this is necessary (Pannenberg 1968).
Revelation as Inner Experience. According to this model, revelation consists in some kind of “privileged interior experience of grace or communion with God” (Dulles 1992: 27). Some proponents claim that the interior experience is “pre-conceptual” and occurs at a depth-level of consciousness that transcends and embraces our ordinary experience of the world (Schleiermacher 1799 [1996: 25–26]; 1830 [1999: 16–17]; Rahner 1978: Ch. V). Others take the relevant experiences to be conceptually structured and more like perceptual experiences (Alston 1991; Pike 1992). The pre-conceptual view encounters epistemological puzzles about how non-conceptual inner occurrences can justify beliefs about God, or how the experiences can be about God in the first place (Proudfoot 1985).
Revelation as Dialectical Presence. This model intends to capture the thought of Karl Barth—who is one of the most influential figures of revelation-theology in the twentieth century—and his followers in the school of “dialectical theology”. For Barth, revelation is a “non-objectifiable” encounter with God himself in Christ, an event that is mediated by the Bible and the church’s proclamation about Christ. The Bible itself, however, is not revelation but merely the channel through which revelation “flows” whenever God wills this to happen. Moreover, since God is “Wholly Other” and as such unknowable for humans, revelation must be described in terms of a paradoxical dialectic of simultaneous “unveiling” and “veiling”. “Revelation”, says Barth, “means the self-unveiling, imparted to men, of the God who by nature cannot be unveiled to men” (Barth 1975: 320; see also Hart 2000). It is unclear whether this model manages to present a coherent account of divine revelation (for a sympathetic discussion, see McCormack 2008: 28–35). The intention behind the model, however, is to reconcile the claim that revelation provides real, objective knowledge of God with the claim that God radically transcends all human categories and all created media of revelation.
Revelation as New Awareness. According to this model, revelation means a transformation of human subjectivity, a “fulfillment of the inner drive of the human spirit toward fuller consciousness”. Revelation does not disclose God as an “object”, even though God might be “mysteriously present as the transcendent dimension of human engagement in creative tasks”. In essence, revelation is more about seeing the self and the world in a new light than about knowledge of God (Dulles 1992: 98, 99, 28).
Dulles’s models are theoretical constructions or “ideal-types”, and elements from different models can be combined. For example, theologians like Paul Tillich and Karl Rahner combine the “new awareness” model with experiential and historical elements (Tillich 1951: 111–118, 120–122; Rahner 1966). It has been argued, however, that none of the manifestational models presented above can provide—either separately or in combination—a reasonable account of how knowledge of God’s “theistic properties” (omnipotence, omniscience and infinite goodness) comes about. Such an account requires appeal to propositional revelation at some point, or at least to traditional natural theology (Wahlberg 2014: Ch. 3).
2.The Justification of Revelatory Claims
A revelatory claim is a claim to the effect that a certain divine revelation (propositional or manifestational) has taken place—that God has revealed x to P (Menssen & Sullivan 2007: 69). The existence of revelatory claims in different religions raises the question of epistemic justification: Could such claims be justified, and in that case, how? “Being justified” will here be understood in the very general sense of having “positive epistemic status” (the status of being “right, or proper, or acceptable, or approvable or up to standard” (Plantinga 1988: 1).
In the contemporary debate, there are both non-inferential and inferential (evidentialist) models of justification for revelatory claims. In addition, there are positions that some might characterize as fideistic, but that are perhaps better described as portraying the justification of revelation as “totally sui generis”. Below non-inferential, inferential and “sui generis” positions will be treated in turn. However, since the contemporary debates about justification draw inspiration from a long tradition of reflection within theology, it will be useful first to consider some historical background.
2.1 Traditional Views
In historical Christian thought, the concepts of (special) revelation and faith go together. Faith is the believing response to the divine revelation (Dulles 1992: 4). There has been a broad consensus that the act of faith requires grace in the sense of an internal, divine influence or assistance. However, classical Christian thinkers also agree that the act of faith is reasonable, and that Christian belief is epistemically justified to an eminent degree (Lamont 2004: 46). In modern parlance, “faith” is often understood as synonymous with “unsupported belief”, but this understanding is alien to the historical tradition, for which faith constitutes a form of knowledge. It is traditionally agreed, moreover, that faith has this rational status because it is based on the authority of God’s own testimony. In much pre-modern theology it is unclear, however, exactly how God’s testimony or speech is identified as such, and what warrants this identification.
Important church fathers such as Clement of Alexandria, Origen, Chrysostom and Augustine all held that there are good arguments from publicly accessible evidence for the veridicality of the Christian revelation—arguments that establish the claim that God has spoken beyond reasonable doubt. Patristic arguments typically appeal to fulfilled prophecies, miracles,
the extension and holiness of the Church, the transformative power of the Christian message and the independently establishable goodness and truth of Christian teaching. (Lamont 2004: 46, 38)
However, the major church fathers did not seem to view these apologetic arguments as necessary for proper faith, or as the epistemic basis for faith. Instead, the divine revelation itself—the word of God—is often portrayed as having the power to non-inferentially justify Christian beliefs. As Clement of Alexandria writes,
He who has believed in the divine Scriptures, with a firm judgement, receives as an irrefutable demonstration the voice of God who gave us those Scriptures. So faith is no longer something that is confirmed by demonstration. (Stromate II, 2, 9, quoted in Lamont 2004: 32)
Augustine, likewise, emphasized that Christian belief is produced by God working internally in the believer through grace.
In the Middle Ages, Thomas Aquinas affirms both the supernatural, grace-induced character of Christian belief and its rational warrant. Since Aquinas is a common reference point in contemporary discussions about faith and revelation, it will be helpful to consider his thought in a bit more detail. (For a comparison between Aquinas’s thought on revelation with Jewish and Islamic medieval perspectives, see Dobie 2019.) Aquinas believes that the Christian revelatory claim can be justified, at least to a significant degree, by inferential arguments (see, e.g., Summa Contra Gentiles I, Ch. 6). Sometimes he seems to suggest that arguments are necessary for rational assent to revelation (Summa Theologiae II-II, q. 2, a. 9, ad. 3). At other times, however, it appears that faith is justified without arguments (ST II-II, q. 27, a. 3, ad. 2. See also Niederbacher 2012: 342–343). Due to this tension, there are different interpretations of Aquinas. John Jenkins has helpfully distinguished between the Naturalist Interpretation, the Voluntarist Interpretation, and the Supernatural Externalist Interpretation (Jenkins 1997: Ch. 6). These interpretations emphasize different elements of Aquinas’s thought that are also found in traditional theology in general. As we will see in the following sections, similar elements recur in contemporary theories.
According to the Naturalist Interpretation, at least some persons assent to the articles of the Creed because, first, they accept a cluster of arguments from natural theology, second, they believe on the basis of human testimony and other evidence that miracles and other signs have occurred in biblical history and in the history of the church. From these considerations they conclude that God has made a revelation in history, which is contained, in its essence, in the Creed. The Christian revelatory claim is justified on this inferential basis. Grace and God’s supernatural influence has little epistemic significance in this process—grace just makes the believer accept God’s revelation without reluctance (Penelhum 1977: 146; see also Hick 1988: 11–31).
The Voluntarist Interpretation, on the other hand, claims that a consideration of the evidence is insufficient to elicit firm assent to revelation. What brings this forth, instead, is something like “wishful thinking” or utilitarian considerations. Aquinas says:
We are moved to believe the words of God insofar as the reward of eternal life is promised to us if we have believed; and this moves the will to assent. (De Veritate, q. 14, a. 1, quoted in Jenkins 1997: 176)
An act of the will compensates for the “gap in the evidence”. However, since the activity of the will—when it comes to belief in God—is part of a reliable belief-forming process put in place by grace, the beliefs that it produces are warranted. Aquinas, hence, was an epistemological reliabilist of sorts, according to this view (Ross 1985; Stump 1991).
The Supernatural Externalist Interpretation gives arguments from public evidence a role in preparing a person for the assent of faith. However, the actual assent is the product of a supernaturally infused cognitive habit. The supernatural “light of faith” makes it possible for a person immediately and non-inferentially to grasp the articles of the Creed as divinely revealed. Belief in the revelatory claim is hence a basic belief, and it is justified
because it was arrived at by the proper operation of a cognitive process which, though infused and not [natural], was nevertheless designed to attain the truth in this sphere. (Jenkins 1997: 190–191)
Most contemporary Aquinas scholars now reject the Naturalist Interpretation, which cannot do justice to the textual evidence. Hence, even though Aquinas indeed presents a collection of credibility arguments, he seems to have held that belief in divine revelation can be—and usually is—justified in some other, non-inferential way. It is therefore unfortunate that the view represented by the Naturalist Interpretation is sometimes taken to be “the traditional view” of how revelatory claims are justified (Penelhum 1997: 67–86).
Although Aquinas might not be a good fit for “the traditional view”, some later thinkers are. Starting with Duns Scotus, the role of inferential arguments in the rational acceptance of revelation was gradually expanded and made more precise in mainstream Christian thought. From the seventeenth century to the mid-twentieth century, most Catholic theologians saw “credibility arguments” as necessary for faith and as capable of establishing beyond reasonable doubt that God has revealed the Christian religion (Lamont 2004: 87–88). The act of faith was reduced to the drawing of the necessary inference from this insight to the conclusion that Christian beliefs are true. On the Protestant side, this development continued and culminated in thinkers such as William Chillingworth, John Tillotson and John Locke, whose views—ironically—are the closest matches to what Penelhum describes as the “traditional view”. As we have seen, however, the church fathers and Thomas Aquinas held more complex views in which elements of both inferential and non-inferential justification are found, and where supernatural grace and the will play important epistemic roles. Below we will encounter again these elements in the accounts of contemporary philosophers and theologians.
2.2 Non-Inferential Justification
A claim is non-inferentially justified when its positive epistemic status is a result of some form of direct cognition, as opposed to being achieved through a process of inference from evidence. The notion of “direct cognition” includes having a belief that is “properly basic”, but also having a belief that directly represents the content of a perceptual experience (assuming that experiences have conceptual content).
There are non-inferential views concerning both the justification of “natural” and “special” revelation. In this section, three varieties of non-inferential justification will be addressed: Perceptual models, Plantinga’s A/C-model, and testimonial models.
2.2.1 Perceptual Models
Some philosophers have suggested a perceptual interpretation of natural revelation, according to which “intentional design” is a property that can be directly perceived in nature as well as in human behavior and art. Since intentional design by definition entails a designer, this means that our experiences of nature could give us immediate knowledge of the existence of a creator (Ratzsch 2003; Wahlberg 2012; Plantinga 2011: Ch. 8). For related views, see Mullen 2004 and Evans 2010).
The putative plausibility of this hypothesis depends on the phenomenological observation that the appearance of design in nature is something that forcefully strikes most people, even atheists. As Hume lets Cleanthes say:
Consider, anatomize the eye … and tell me, from your own feeling, if the idea of a contriver does not immediately flow in upon you with a force like that of a sensation?. (Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, Part III, (p. 65))
Psychological research, moreover, indicates that teleological beliefs about nature come natural to humans. Some even argue that humans are “intuitive theists” (Kelemen 2004; Barrett 2012). A related consideration in favor of design-perception is that it could potentially explain why beliefs about design in nature are so widespread and often held so persistently, even though they have turned out to be hard to justify by argument (Ratzsch 2003: 135–136).
A standard move by those who claim that belief in revelation is non-inferentially justified, is to appeal to the “parity-argument” (first found in Thomas Reid [1710–1796], see Wolterstorff 2001: 197–206; see also Plantinga 1990: 271; Alston 1983). Adapted to the present context, the argument runs something like this: Since beliefs about intentional design in nature arise in a similar way as (ordinary) perceptual beliefs and memory beliefs, there is no reason to discriminate among these classes of beliefs with respect to their prima facie epistemic status. Hence, if we regard perceptual and memory beliefs as prima facie justified without argument, we should regard design-beliefs in the same way.
It could be objected that in order to have beliefs about design, a rather complex conceptual background is necessary. Design beliefs, therefore, cannot be understood as perceptual. However, the necessity of a conceptual background for having a certain kind of perceptual beliefs does not necessarily entail that those beliefs are inferentially derived from the background (McDowell 2004: 296; Wahlberg 2012: 128–130. See also McGrath 2008: Ch. 5). Even the most primitive perceptual beliefs (“red here now”) presuppose a network of concepts.
Is evolution a defeater for the idea of design-perception? (De Cruz and De Smedt 2014: 195). Perhaps not. The hypothesis that God creates indirectly, through the evolutionary process, entails that God exerts a certain control over the outcomes of that process. This means that God has intended at least certain features of the outcome, and these features would hence count as divinely designed. Since divine design in this sense seems to be compatible with evolution, design-perception might be as well (Wahlberg 2012: 172–190; Kojonen 2018).
Another objection proceeds from the claim that design-beliefs about nature are generated by mechanisms that are too unreliable to confer positive epistemic status. One version of this argument contends that the “hyperactiveness” of our HADD (“Hyper-Active Agency Detection Device”)—which is an evolutionary adaptation for detecting possibly dangerous agency in the natural environment—means that it produces too many false positives to be trusted when it “detects” design in natural structures. The debate about this is ongoing (Barrett 2004: 31; Visala 2011: Ch. 5; De Smedt and De Cruz 2020).
In the realm of special revelation, there are also theories of direct, perceptual justification. William Alston has argued for the possibility that God could be (nonsensorially) perceived, and that such “mystical perception” can justify beliefs about God (Alston 1991). Different religions have different, socially established “doxastic practices” (belief-forming habits) built on purported experiences of God. Appealing to the parity argument, Alston contends that such mystical practices can be on more or less equal footing, epistemically, with basic doxastic practices such as sense-perceptual and memory-based belief-forming. In general, basic doxastic practices cannot be shown to be reliable without circularity, but if they are socially established and their outputs are reasonably internally consistent and consistent with the outputs of other practices, they can be rationally engaged in. The case for the rationality of a doxastic practice is also strengthened if it generates significant “self-support”—for example by making predictions that are later confirmed.
Beliefs generated by rational doxastic practices can, however, be defeated by “over-rider”-systems internal to the practices themselves. In the case of “mystical perception”, the overrider-system includes a religion’s doctrinal teaching, by which the veridicality of purported mystical perceptions is tested. Alston argues that the “Christian mystical practice”, which generates significant self-support by the way it can “predict” or guide spiritual development, can be rationally engaged in, and hence produce beliefs about God that are prima facie justified. While mystical perceptions of the kind Alston deals with are often regarded as rare, Michael Rea has argued that experiences of God’s presence and of communication from God might be “widely available” (Rea 2018: Ch. 6–7). He suggests that the ability to experience God can be improved through spiritual practices and disciplines—an idea that is common in mystical traditions (see also Wynn 2013: 73–74).
The main problem for the idea of direct perceptual encounters with God is the fact of religious diversity and the seeming incompatibility between the outputs of rival mystical practices. One approach to this problem is to view the incompatibility as merely apparent. Building on Kant’s distinction between noumena and phenomena, Hick argues that God or ultimate reality is unknowable in itself, and that the different descriptions of this reality produced by different religions only apply within the realm of human experience (1989: Ch. 14. For critique of the Kantian picture, see Plantinga 2000b: Ch. 1–2; Menssen and Sullivan 2007: 22–30; Macdonald 2009b: Ch. 2). Nevertheless, those descriptions allow people to respond to and interact with the Real in ways that are conducive to salvation.
Hick’s solution to the problem of religious diversity is bought at the price of denying the incompatibility that religious believers themselves see between their religious beliefs and those of other religions. Finding this price too high, Alston takes the disagreements between religions to be real, and argues that there could be realms of reality
that are so difficult for us to discern that widespread agreement is extremely difficult or impossible to attain, even if some veridical cognition of that realm is achieved. (Alston 1991: 267)
A position that lies between Hick’s non-cognitivist pluralism and Alston’s cognitivist exclusivism is Keith Ward’s “open theology” that is attentive to the possibility of revelation in all religions. This possibility entails, for Ward, that believers must be prepared to critically question their own tradition in light of insights from other religions (Ward 1994: 339–340). Another option is Griffiths’ “open inclusivism”, based on the claim that “it is possible that alien religions teach truths of religious significance to the Church” (2001: 63).
Besides experiences that have God as their putative object, other kinds of religious experiences could be revelatory as well. Mark Wynn has drawn attention to the “materially mediated or sacramental character of much religious experience” and suggested that the experiential impact of certain “material contexts” (such as special places with an existentially charged history) could mediate an awareness of God (Wynn 2009: 147; see also Wynn 2013: Ch. 3).
2.2.2 The A/C-Model
Non-inferential justification of revelatory claims need not be construed as perceptual. Alvin Plantinga, while sympathetic to perceptual theories of natural revelation (2000b: 286–289; 2011: Ch. 8), has proposed a broader account involving both general and special revelation. He suggests that humans have a natural cognitive faculty which “in a wide variety of circumstances produces in us beliefs about God”. Those beliefs are “occasioned” by the circumstances—for example by the sight of a mighty scenery or a beautiful sunset—but they are not conclusions from them, not even “quick and sotto voce inferences”. However, the theistic beliefs thus caused could have positive epistemic status if the cognitive faculty that produces them is “functioning properly in a congenial epistemic environment according to a design plan successfully aimed at truth” (Plantinga 2000: 172, 175, 178). Beliefs generated by such a faculty—which Plantinga, following Calvin, calls a “sensus divinitatis”—would be “properly basic” in the sense that they are non-inferentially warranted as long as they are undefeated.
Plantinga’s model for the justification of natural revelation is externalist, and he does not claim to be able to demonstrate that it is true. His agenda, instead, is to defend theistic belief from the “de jure objection”, which attacks the rational status of theism while leaving open the question of its truth. Plantinga claims that this attack fails. If theism is true, it is very likely that there is a sensus divinitatis, and in that case, belief in God would be warranted.
Plantinga’s model also includes the justification of special revelation. In what he calls the “Extended A/C-model” (after Aquinas and Calvin), Plantinga posits, besides the natural sensus divinitatis, a supernatural belief-forming mechanism consisting mainly in the “internal instigation of the Holy Spirit”. This mechanism is part of God’s plan of salvation that also includes the divine teaching of the Scriptures, and the divine repair of the cognitive and affective damage caused by sin. When confronted with the teachings of Scripture, the Holy Spirit can instigate people to accept them as true by creating faith. Plantinga sees the beliefs accepted in this way as “revealed to our minds” (Plantinga 2000: 241). Even though this process is not an in-built part of human nature, it is (ex hypothesi) “a reliable belief-producing process”, and its deliverances will therefore be warranted and qualify as knowledge (Plantinga 2000: 257, 206).
The debate about Plantinga’s proposals is extensive, and critique comes from both theological and philosophical quarters (Baker 2005). Some criticize Plantinga’s model for being phenomenologically inadequate: Many believers seem to be looking for grounds for their faith and feel the need for partial support from other beliefs (Beilby 2005: 195–197). Other critics attack the very idea that religious beliefs can be properly basic, which Plantinga defends by means of a version of the parity-argument (see section 2.2.1). Grigg, for example, argues that a major difference between religious beliefs and ordinary perceptual beliefs is that people may have a bias in favor of religious beliefs, since there is a psychological benefit to be gained from believing that God exists (Grigg 1983: 126). In response, it has been argued that the same is true of some perceptual beliefs (e.g., seeing high numbers in one’s bank account) (McLeod 1987: 5).
A related critique is that more or less absurd belief-systems could claim to be based on properly basic beliefs. This is often referred to as the “Great Pumpkin Objection” (see DeRose 1999 in Other Internet Resources). Michael Martin, developing a version of it, claims that
Plantinga’s proposal would generate many different communities that could legitimately claim that their basic beliefs are rational,
such as voodoo or astrological communities (Martin 1990: 272). In response, Plantinga can point out that basic beliefs are defeasible, and that the basic beliefs of what we take to be obviously irrational belief systems might be easily defeated (Baker 2007: 88–89).
Closely related to the Great Pumpkin Objection is the objection from religious diversity, perhaps the greatest challenge for Plantinga’s as well as for Alston’s theories. Why could not proponents of other religions copy Plantinga’s epistemological moves and adapt them to their own religions? (Hill 2001). Helm, accordingly, suggests that Plantinga’s argument “leaves his defense of the rationality of Christian theism not so much open to refutation as to imitation” (Helm 2001: 1112). In response, it could be argued that if a religion is false, defeaters will probably arise.
Another type of objections focus on the epistemic consequences of religious disagreement. Some critics argue that if other religions “can make as good a case of being knowledge-if-true as Christianity”, it is hard to see why people should remain Christians in the absence of some religiously neutral grounds (Forrest 2002: 111.) Basinger suggests that religious believers who want to maximize truth and avoid error are “under a prima facie obligation to attempt to resolve significant epistemic peer conflict” (Basinger 2002: 11). However, it might not always be easy to determine when people are true “epistemic peers”, and the crucial question is what happens if the disagreement, despite efforts of resolution, remains (Plantinga 1997). Should disagreement be taken as a defeater of belief? Plantinga has claimed that this idea is a “philosophical tar baby”, since it would mean the defeat of the religious pluralist position as certainly as that of his own (2000a: 177; see also Alston 1988). Still, it could be argued that while disagreement is not a defeater of belief, it should lead people to believe with less confidence.
A different kind of charge against Plantinga’s model is that it leaves unaddressed the question of actual warrant (Baker 2007: 87–89).
There is … a monumental issue which Plantinga does not discuss, and which a lot of people will consider needs discussing. This is whether Christian beliefs do have warrant … He has shown that they do, if they are true; so we might hope for discussion of whether they are true. (Swinburne 2001: 206)
Maybe the sense of dissatisfaction expressed by Swinburne can be somewhat mitigated by attending to the distinction between “being rational in holding a theistic belief” and “showing that theistic belief is rational” (Sudduth 2003: 311).
2.2.3 Testimonial Models
The idea of divine testimony is at the core of traditional conceptions of revelation in both Jewish-Christian and Islamic thought (for the latter, see Adeel 2019: 30–35). However, testimony and the justification of testimonial beliefs can be understood in different ways. Within contemporary philosophy of testimony, there are two basic schools. Reductionists hold that beliefs acquired through testimony must be justified by an (implicit or explicit) argument from evidence that establishes the trustworthiness of the witness. Anti-reductionists deny this and regard testimony as a basic, sui generis source of epistemic justification, like perception and memory. Hence, for anti-reductionists, testimonial beliefs are non-inferentially justified. This view has interesting implications for the issue of belief in divine revelation.
Inspired by Aquinas as well as by contemporary anti-reductionism (especially John McDowell), Lamont argues that the ability to gain knowledge from truthful testimony is an intellectual virtue, together with perception and memory (Lamont 2004: Ch. 5). When a hearer H believes a speaker S testifying that p, the very fact that S knows p and sincerely testifies to p gives H knowledge of p, which entails that H has a knowledge-constituting justification for p. This justification is not reducible to H’s evidence for the trustworthiness of S.
Lamont argues, on theological grounds, that God speaks through the Church, and that the Bible is part of this divine speech (Lamont 2004: Ch. 7). When a person believes a biblical statement because it is spoken by God, what the person acquires is testimonial knowledge. This knowledge is justified and counts as knowledge by the very fact that it comes from God’s own testimony. However, a condition for believing a biblical statement because it is spoken by God, is that the hearer is able to recognize it as God’s speech. This recognition happens, according to Lamont, through the effects that the divine message has on the hearer. Following John Owen, Lamont appeals to the moral enlightenment and transformation of the hearer that result when the divine message is heard. These effects, argues Lamont, can only happen through divine power, and they are therefore clear signs that allow the hearer to recognize the divine identity of the speaker (Lamont 2004: 198–206). The hearer, hence, can believe God, and so acquire the satisfactory epistemic standing that God’s testimony provides.
It can be questioned whether there are moral transformations that prove the involvement of a divine power (King 2008: 74). However, supposing that the divine origin of the Christian message could really be established in this way, it seems to follow that Lamont’s anti-reductionist account of testimony has no important epistemic role to play in his analysis of revealed knowledge. If we can infer, from certain effects of the message, that it is God who has spoken, then we can also infer that the message is true (since God would not lie or be mistaken). This seems to make appeal to testimony as a basic source of knowledge/justification superfluous.
Wahlberg (2014) has attempted to formulate a consistently anti-reductionist theory of knowledge by divine testimony. He suggests that one can identify divine speech by relying on God’s own say-so. An example would be if a person believes Jesus when Jesus claims to speak for God (supposing that his claim is true). In such a scenario, one would acquire testimonial knowledge from God’s testimony (through Jesus) without (initially) knowing that it is God who speaks (Wahlberg 2014: Ch. 6; see also Lamont 1996).
However, wouldn’t it be irrational just to believe a guy who claims to speak for God? Wahlberg acknowledges that normally, it would. He argues that in order for a Hearer H to be able to absorb trustworthy testimony from a speaker S in such as way that knowledge ensues, H must exercise doxastic responsibility. This means that she must be sensitive to and on the lookout for evidence and considerations that speak against the trustworthiness of S. If H fails to display such sensitivity, she cannot acquire knowledge from anyone’s testimony, even if it happens to be true. Now, doxastic responsibility clearly demands that testimony that purports to come from God be approached with a healthy dose of skepticism. In order for a responsible hearer to be able to absorb such testimony in a way that yields knowledge (supposing that the testimony really transmits revelation), there must be some circumstance that defeats the natural reasons for mistrust (such as the possibility that a putative prophet lies or is deluded).
Wahlberg claims that a miracle can constitute such a circumstance. If Jesus in fact rose from the dead, his closest disciples who saw his post-mortem appearances would have been in a position to believe (without doxastic irresponsibility) Jesus’ claim to speak for God. This means that they could have known the truth of a revelatory claim on the basis of God’s own testimony.
But what about those people who do not witness a miracle? Wahlberg argues that knowledge of Jesus’ resurrection could be available, through the biblical testimony, to non-witnesses, for example to people who live today. The biblical testimony about the resurrection, in turn, can be believed without doxastic irresponsibility by people who live today due to the historical-critical evidence that supports it and defeats the natural reasons for skepticism. According to Wahlberg, knowledge of the resurrection gained in this way would be non-inferentially justified by testimony (as a basic or sui generis source of justification), rather than by inference from the available historical-critical evidence. The latter evidence is not good enough for knowledge, but only for enabling responsible belief.
Wahlberg’s case for doxastic responsibility depends on a controversial assessment of the strength of the historical-critical case for Jesus’ resurrection. Another potential problem is the fact that most Christians do not know the historical-critical evidence for the resurrection. Does it follow that most Christians do not believe in divine revelation responsibly? (Griffiths 2018). To address this difficulty, Wahlberg appeals to the social nature of knowledge, and argues that individuals can satisfy the requirements of doxastic responsibility in virtue of the epistemic competence inherent in the communities they belong to.
2.3 Inferential Justification
This section will continue, for a while, with the theme of divine testimony, but now from a reductionist perspective. The accounts studied so far work with an anti-reductionist (non-inferential) view of testimonial justification. However, it can be argued that when it comes to believing purportedly divine testimony, the stakes are too high for it to be rational to trust without positive evidence of trustworthiness (King 2008: 78).
According to King, rational belief in divine self-testimony requires that God gives us “sufficient evidence to trust in him” (King 2008: 176). We can know by a priori reasoning what kind of evidence God must provide in order to win our trust, and so we can anticipate that God (if he exists) will provide this kind of evidence. Importantly, a divine revelation must be “discrete” and available only to a few people at first, since a “major” revelation immediately apparent for a global audience would obscure God’s love with overwhelming power. King provides a list of possible evidences that satisfy the requirement of discreetness, including “a sense of [divine] presence”, “internal communication (including dreams, visions)”, “fulfilled prophecies, Resurrection, Incarnation”. Any conceivable revelation must choose its means from this list and hence conform to a necessary structure, which accommodates the cognitive limitations of human beings and makes it possible for them to trust in a rational way. King refers to his epistemological model as “trust-evidentialism” (2008: 174, 176).
Even though King’s account is ostensibly different from the non-inferential testimonial models presented above, the differences might be smaller than first appears. As we have seen, “doxastic responsibility” requires extensive reasoning from evidence in Wahlberg’s account, even though such reasoning is construed as defeater-deflecting rather than as trust-grounding.
As the example of King illustrates, inferential models for the justification of revelation can be construed as testimonial, if testimonial justification is understood in a reductionist way. John Locke is a classic example of this.
Faith … is the assent to any proposition … upon the credit of the proposer, as coming from God, in some extraordinary way of communication. This way of discovering truths to men we call Revelation. (Essay Concerning Human Understanding, IV, xviii, 2)
However, testimonial justification, for Locke, is reducible to argument from evidence.
2.3.1 A Probabilistic Argument
In order to see the general strengths and problems of inferential models of justification, it will be helpful to focus on a paradigmatic example in the tradition of Tillotson and Locke. Perhaps the most influential evidentialist account of the justification of revelatory claims is the one proposed by Richard Swinburne. His argument can be formalized using probability calculus and Bayes Theorem (Swinburne 2007: 345–356), but the discussion below will proceed informally. After a presentation of Swinburne’s argument, some critical and complementary perspectives will be addressed.
For Swinburne, rational acceptance of a revelatory claim must be based on evidence, and how strong the evidence needs to be depends on what background beliefs we have. If we have good reason to believe, independently of any purported revelation, that God exists and that a revelation from him is to be expected, then rational acceptance of a revelatory claim can be based on more modest evidence than would otherwise be the case. It is hence important for Swinburne to build a case for the existence of God based on natural theology, and then establish the likelihood of a revelation on the basis of a priori reasoning about what God is likely to do.
Swinburne thinks that natural theological arguments make God’s existence at least as probable as his non-existence, and that a priori reasoning about God leads to the conclusion that a revelation is to be expected. A God who has made rational creatures would want to interact with them, and for this to be possible, they would need to know more about God’s nature and character than what is naturally accessible to them. Furthermore, it would be good for humans to receive moral enlightenment from God, and encouragement to live morally good lives. Since God is good, these considerations make a revelation likely. Moreover, Swinburne argues that a good God would have reason to become incarnate in order to atone for sin and to identify with our suffering. If this is to be effectual, a revelation that tells us about the incarnation and atonement is necessary. It is also to be expected that a divine revelation would not come with overwhelming evidence in its favor but require some searching activity on the part of humans. This would encourage human cooperation and co-responsibility and strengthen desire for the goal of salvation. Since a revelation would have to be translated between different cultures and across time, there must also be included in the revelation some means of continuing guidance—a church that can ensure that interpretations and translations are correct (Swinburne 2007: 103–104. For a more fully developed perspective on the ecclesial mediation of revelation, see Levering 2014).
Armed with the purported background knowledge that a certain kind of revelation is likely, Swinburne suggests four “tests” or criteria for credible revelatory claims (Swinburne 2007: Ch. 6). The first criterion is that the content of a purported revelation concerns things that are important for our deepest well-being, and that this content is not very improbable on grounds independent of revelation. This “content test” must be complemented by a “miracle test”, which is the second criterion. If God wants us to be able to identify a divine revelation as such, he must deliver it in a way that only God could do. This requires a divine signature in the form of a confirming miracle, in the sense of a violation of a natural law. Third, if a revelation is to have a determinate content that is not endlessly open to interpretation, a genuine revelation must contain instructions for how an interpretive church is to be constituted, and the interpretations of this church must be plausible as interpretations of the original revelation. The fourth test is that the church’s interpretations of revelation must not be very implausible on other, independent grounds.
When applying these tests to the great world religions, Swinburne claims to find that the purported Christian revelation is the only serious candidate. No other religion can point to a reasonable amount of evidence for a foundational, authenticating miracle like the resurrection of Jesus, nor does any other religion satisfy the other three tests. This shows that the coincidence of the satisfaction of all four tests (even to a moderate degree) “is an extremely unlikely event in the normal course of things” (Swinburne 2007: 337). Since Christianity satisfies all four tests, according to Swinburne, it is very probable that its purported revelation is true. In order to show that Christianity satisfies the tests, Swinburne produces a complex argument based on evidence from many sources (for example, historical arguments about the acts and teachings of Jesus, evidence for the resurrection, arguments for the moral goodness of Christian teachings, etc.). It is the cumulative force of the total evidence that makes belief in the Christian revelatory claim justified.
A general criticism that can be directed against Swinburne’s account—as well as other inferential accounts (e.g., King 2008)—is that it seems to draw on the Christian religion as a kind of intuition-pump for what are supposed to be “a priori” features of any genuine revelation. For example, Swinburne argues that it is a priori likely that God will become incarnated and atone for human sin, and that this therefore is a part of the content-criterion by which to test purported revelations. Many would argue, however, that this reasoning is “ad hoc and post eventum” and biased in favor of the Christian tradition (Abraham 2006: 73. See also Stump 1994: 740; McLean 2013).
Swinburne’s argument invites detailed objections on practically every point, but he has also defended every step of the argument extensively in separate works about natural theology, the incarnation, atonement theory, and the resurrection (2004a; 1994; 1989; 2003). Especially the historical argument for a resurrection is crucial for Swinburne’s case. The debates generated by criticism of Swinburne’s historical claims and claims about natural theology cannot be addressed here. However, the very fact that Swinburne’s argument, in order to succeed, needs to establish many controversial propositions has been seen, by some, as a fatal weakness (Plantinga 2000b, 271–280; Hasker 2002: 256–257).
Appealing to a general “principle of dwindling probabilities”, Plantinga has argued that complex inferential cases for Christianity of the kind Swinburne presents must necessarily fail. Such complex arguments chain together a number of logically independent propositions, most of which are merely probable given the evidence. For every merely probable proposition that is needed to reach the conclusion, the probability of the hypothesis as a whole will decrease, since the probabilities at each stage of the argument must be multiplied. Plantinga argues that even if the probabilities of the individual propositions are given a very generous estimate—for example, if we assign the probability 0.9 to the proposition that God exists (on our background knowledge)—the overall conclusion about the Christian revelation will still have a probability well below 0.5. Plantinga, therefore, concludes that the inferential case for the Christian revelation
isn’t strong enough to produce warranted belief … at most, it could produce the warranted belief that the main lines of Christian teaching aren’t particularly improbable. (Plantinga 2000b: 271)
Plantinga’s argument seems to threaten the whole inferential project. In response, however, it can be argued that it proves too much. All historical arguments (even secular ones) link together propositions that are merely probable. If the principle of dwindling probabilities is valid and has the implications that Plantinga claims, it could be applied to all historical arguments, with the result that no historical argument could succeed. This, however, is a conclusion that many would be reluctant to draw (Swinburne 2004b: 540; 2007: 356).
Tim and Lydia McGrew have provided what many take to be a strong response to Plantinga’s argument from dwindling probabilities (McGrew 2004; McGrew and McGrew 2006). Basically, they argue that at least the steepness of the “dwindling” is an illusion created by the way Plantinga (mis)represents the inferential-historical case for a Christian revelation. Among other shortcomings, Plantinga’s construal fails to bring out how evidence for a proposition that is “downstream” in the argument (such as “God raised Jesus from the dead”) is relevant for assessing the probability of a proposition that is “upstream” (such as “God exists”). While Plantinga concedes ground to some of the critique (2006), he nevertheless stands by his general argument (2015: 262. For an overview of the debate, see Nickel 2015: 225–235 and Crisp 2009.)
Another response to the purported threat of dwindling probabilities is suggested by Menssen and Sullivan (2007). They defend a basically Swinburnian inferential project, but criticize Swinburne for being insufficiently holistic, in a sense to be explained below (2007: 55–56). With respect to the argument about dwindling probabilities, they acknowledge that a complex proposition cannot have a greater probability than any of its constituent claims. However, they argue that in certain cases, the complex proposition “could still be more believable” (2007: 61). For example, the claim that “there is a heavenly body beyond Uranus that is perturbing its orbit” is more complex than the weaker claim that “there is a heavenly body beyond Uranus”. Nevertheless, scientists did not first attempt to prove the weaker claim, and then went on to prove the stronger (more complex) claim. Instead, they established the truth of the weaker claim by establishing the truth of the stronger.
The lesson to learn from this, according to Menssen and Sullivan, is that the project of justifying revelatory claims should not await the establishing of God’s existence by means of traditional natural theology (as suggested by Swinburne 2004b: 538 and Mavrodes 1988: 102). Instead, revelatory claims should be investigated as part of the project of justifying theism—the only condition for such investigation being that the existence of a world-creator is not highly unlikely. In fact,
a negative conclusion concerning the existence of a good God is not justified unless the content of a reasonable number of leading revelatory claims has been seriously considered. (Menssen and Sullivan 2007: 63)
This is because the “problem of evil” counts as evidence against God’s existence. To exclude putative revelations from consideration before God’s existence has been established would be to refuse to “listen to the voice of the accused”. What if a putative revelation contains an acceptable explanation of evil, that blocks or weakens the atheistic arguments? Not to take this possibility into account would, arguably, be to handicap the evidentialist project by forcing it to proceed without a “full database” (Kwan 2011: 472). Hence, the “holistic” approach of Menssen and Sullivan might be seen as an improvement in relation to the more traditional, “layered” approach of Swinburne. (However, Swinburne’s distinction between “bare” and “ramified” natural theology point in a holistic direction, see 2004b: 533–535.)
Other critics of Swinburne point out that he ignores the role played by emotions, desires and the will in coming to faith (Hasker 2002: 257–258). Is belief in a divine revelation only a matter of Bayesian calculation of probabilities? This lacuna in Swinburne’s thought—as well as in much evidentialist reflection in general—has been addressed by Paul Moser, who introduces an existential-affective dimension in the inferential project. His central claim is that our access to evidence for God’s existence might depend on our volitional and affective states (2008; 2010. See also Wainwright 2006).
Moser believes that God is “hidden”, at least for some people some of the time, in the sense that his existence is not beyond reasonable doubt. This fact should not be taken as a reason for skepticism, however, since it is to be expected that a perfectly loving God would only make evidence of his existence available when this is likely to elicit the right human response. God does not reveal himself simply in order to slake our curiosity, but only with the purpose of accomplishing, in a non-coercive way, a moral transformation of humans to align their wills and character with God’s character and purposes. We should hence expect evidence for God to be purposively available.
Moser claims that his emphasis on the volitional element in our epistemic responses to divine revelation constitutes “a Copernican Revolution in cognitive matters about God’s existence” (2008: 4). However, it would be more accurate to say that he revives a classical theme, found in the church fathers and Aquinas (Macdonald 2009a: 137). For Aquinas, for example, it is the will that moves the intellect to the assent of faith (as emphasized by the “voluntarist interpretation”, see section 2.1 above).
Another philosopher who stresses the personal dimension of faith and its epistemic relevance is Abraham, who notes that revelation is a “threshold concept”. By accepting a revelatory claim, one’s perception of the world changes in a fundamental way. This is a “profoundly self-involving experience” and a “massive cognitive and spiritual revolution” (Abraham 2006: 87, 89).
Finally, it must be considered whether a “hybrid” approach to revelatory claims—combining inferential and non-inferential modes of justification—might be fruitful. Abraham (2006 and 1982) suggests that this is the case. Inspired by Plantinga’s theory of a sensus divinitatis, Abraham claims that we come equipped with an oculus contemplationis, “a spiritually discerning eye” that allows us to discern God’s presence and activity in nature and history through a “basic cognitive act” (2006: 69).
However, Abraham considers arguments from evidence to be “supplementary to the appeal to the oculus contemplationis”. Miracles, for example, have a genuine epistemic freight and the kind of data appealed to in evidentialist reasoning about revelation can
operate as corroborating evidence that coheres with and thus strengthens the initial beliefs legitimately formed independently of propositional evidence. (2006: 72, 77)
Abraham’s portrayal of revelation as a “threshold concept” also seems to open up the possibility of a kind of “retroactive” justification: Once a revelatory claim has been accepted, the new perspective one has gained will make one capable of seeing the cognitive errors of one’s previous position. Charles Taylor has described this kind of retroactive justification as a “supersession argument” (2005: 340–341).
2.4 Sui Generis Approaches
A possibility (or purported possibility) that has not been considered so far, is that belief in divine revelation could be justified in a way that is totally sui generis. Inspired by Kierkegaard, Karl Barth seems to suggest something like this. Human nature is not in any way adapted to receive knowledge of God, according to Barth, and hence there can be no philosophical explanation of how knowledge of God comes about. However, God himself could provide such knowledge without respecting the criteria of any epistemological canon. Barth writers:
To say “God with us” is to say something which has no basis or possibility outside itself, which can in no sense be explained in terms of man and man’s situation, but only as knowledge of God from God, as free and unmerited grace. As the Bible bears witness to God’s revelation and as Church proclamation takes up this witness in obedience, both renounce any foundation apart from that which God has given once and for all by speaking (Barth 1975: 119–120).
Critics have accused Barth of portraying revelation
as something having full authority over the insights of reason and sensibility, and as not in any way subject to them. (Quash 2007: 334)
According to Pannenberg, this is equivalent to fideism.
Barth’s apparently so lofty objectivity about God and God’s word turns out to rest on no more than the irrational subjectivity of a venture of faith with no justification outside itself. (1976: 273)
In response to this kind of criticism, theologians in the “postliberal” tradition (inspired by Barth) have argued that revelation is not an epistemological concept at all. The Christian doctrine of revelation does not purport to explain how Christina beliefs are justified. Instead, it provides an intra-theological explication of God’s prevenient grace (Thiemann 1985: 4). Some have even gone so far as to say that “the very idea that the Bible is revealed … is a claim that creates more trouble than it is worth” (Hauerwas 1981: 57). For postliberal theologians in general, Christian beliefs are justified by being part of a coherent web of beliefs (Marshall 2000).
However, perhaps a better way of defending Barth is suggested by Hans Urs von Balthasar. He shares Barth’s general view of revelation as epistemically self-authenticating and as providing its own warrant, independently of human preconceptions (Chapp 2004: 11). However, Balthasar attempts to make this view intelligible by suggesting an analogy with aesthetic experience. In Mozart’s Jupiter Symphony, for example, every note seems to be necessary in the sense that any change would make the symphony less beautiful. However, nobody (except Mozart himself) could have said in advance that precisely this combination of notes is necessary in order to produce such beauty. Hence, our recognition of the beauty or perfection of the symphony happens without reference to any criteria or rules that we could have stated independently of encountering the symphony itself. In a similar way, revelation possesses its own intrinsic credibility, rooted in the self-authenticating glory of God. “Divine love”, writes Balthasar,
can appear in such an overwhelming way that its glorious majesty throws one to the ground; it shines out as the last word and leaves one no choice but to respond in the mode of pure, blind obedience. (Balthasar 2004: 53, 57)
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Other Internet Resources
- DeRose, Keith, 1999, “Voodoo Epistemology”, text of comments on Alvin Plantinga’s book, Warranted Christian Belief, delivered to a meeting of the Society of Christian Philosophers on 27 December 1999.