Ibn Taymiyya

First published Wed May 22, 2024

Ibn Taymiyya (1263–1328) of Damascus was a prominent Sunnī religious scholar, activist, and reformer who sought to root out religious innovation and return Islam to the Qurʾān, the practice (sunna) of the Prophet Muḥammad, and the interpretations of the early Muslims (salaf). Ibn Taymiyya is best known today as a major inspiration to the global Salafism movement (Meijer 2009). A few modern scholars have heralded him as a philosopher on account of his nominalism, empiricism, and similarities with the philosopher Ibn Rushd (Averroes, d. 1198) (Ajhar 2014; Tamer 2013 provides a survey of such views). Others have denigrated him for slavish traditionalism, literalism, and hatred of reason thanks to his refutation of Aristotelian logic and his call for revelation-based reform (e.g., Fakhry 2004: 326–9; Walbridge 2011: 5, 115). Ibn Taymiyya was in fact very well read in the philosophical and theological literature of his day (Michot 2000b: 599), and he deployed extensive hermeneutical reflection and rational argumentation to defend his interpretation of Islamic revelation as fully congruent with reason. While it may go too far to call Ibn Taymiyya a philosopher (Tamer 2013: 373), he was certainly an apologist for the rationality of Islamic revelation, and there is much of philosophical interest in his writings. Ibn Taymiyya’s approach has thus been called philosophical theology (Hoover 2004: 295) and Qurʾānic rational theology (Özervarli 2010: 78).

1. Life and Works

Mongol invasions shaped Ibn Taymiyya’s childhood and early career. The Mongols conquered Baghdad in 1258 and established the Ilkhānid Mongol Empire in Iraq and Persia, one of the four major Mongol empires that together controlled the vast expanse of territory from eastern Europe to the Korean peninsula. In 1260 the Mamlūk rulers of Egypt and Syria halted the Ilkhānid Mongol advance from the northeast at the Battle of ʿAyn Jālūt in Palestine. Ahmad Ibn Taymiyya was born in 1263 (661 in the Islamic calendar) in Ḥarrān which is located today in southeastern Turkey. The Mamlūks controlled Ḥarrān at the time, but later in 1269 Ibn Taymiyya’s family fled a Mongol incursion and settled in Damascus. His father was a Ḥanbalī religious scholar who became head of the Sukkariyya madrasa. Ibn Taymiyya excelled at the religious sciences and took over as head of the Sukkariyya in 1284 when his father died. Ibn Taymiyya found himself in theological difficulty in 1298 for writing against the Ashʿarī kalām theology of God’s attributes. He was charged with ascribing a body to God (tajsīm), interrogated, and then released. The issue of theological corporealism would reemerge several years later. In the meantime, the Mongols invaded Syria three times between 1299 and 1303. The Ilkhānid Mongols had converted to Islam in 1295, which raised the ethical problem of Muslims fighting Muslims. Ibn Taymiyya argued that the Mamlūks must defend Islam against the Mongols because the latter did not adhere to all the laws of Islam and were motivated by their own interests rather than the interests of religion. The Mamlūks eventually repelled the Mongols and enjoyed an extended period of peace and economic prosperity.

With the passing of the Mongol threat, Ibn Taymiyya agitated against Sufi theology and popular religious practices that he believed deviated from Islam and weakened Muslim society. In response, his enemies among the religious scholars gained the support of the Mamlūk political authorities to have him tried again for theological corporealism. Three trials held in Damascus in January and February 1306 were inconclusive. He was then summoned to Cairo, the Mamluk capital, where he was convicted of corporealism and related issues in April 1306 and imprisoned for 18 months. In April 1308 he was imprisoned again in Cairo for another 16 months following a disturbance with Sufis. He was transferred to Alexandria in August 1309 and placed under house arrest for eight more months. Ibn Taymiyya then enjoyed three years of calm in Cairo. In 1313 he returned to Damascus where he spent the rest of his life writing and teaching a small circle of disciples. This period was punctuated by disputes with religious scholars that led to Mamluk state intervention. In 1318 he was imprisoned for five and one-half months for issuing unorthodox opinions about divorce oaths. He suffered further imprisonment in 1326 for teaching against undertaking travel to graves to seek intercession through the dead. He remained in prison until his death in September 1328 (728 in the Islamic calendar).

Ibn Taymiyya did not write systematic works of theology or philosophy. He instead left a vast corpus of refutations and fatwas of widely varying lengths and degrees of organization. It is difficult to date Ibn Taymiyya’s writings, and it is for this reason challenging to trace development in his thought. Nonetheless, it is possible to sequence his three largest theological tomes. Ibn Taymiyya wrote Explication of the Deceit of the Jahmiyya (Bayān talbīs al-Jahmiyya), a refutation of Ashʿarī incorporealism, during his first 12 months in prison in Egypt, that is, between April 1306 and April 1307. He composed his masterwork Averting the Conflict between Reason and Revealed Tradition (Darʾ taʿāruḍ al-ʿaql wa-l-naql) sometime after 1313 followed by his refutation of Twelver Shīʿism The Way of the Prophetic Sunna (Minhāj al-sunna al-nabawiyya). These three works take up ten, eleven, and nine volumes, respectively, in their modern Arabic critical editions. Ibn Taymiyya also wrote large works on law, prophecy, and Christianity. Of special philosophical interest is his Refutation of the Logicians (al-Radd ʿalā al-manṭiqiyyīn), which he started while under house arrest in Alexandria in 1309–1310 and completed later in Damascus. Also of interest is Ibn Taymiyya’s work on political theology Law-Guided Public Policy (al-Siyāsa al-Sharʿiyya), which appears to have been drafted around 1310 and then completed upon his return to Damascus. While Ibn Taymiyya’s large works have been published separately, a great many of his small and medium length writings have been published in collections, the most cited of which is the 37 volume Majmūʿ fatāwā first published 1961–7 (Murad 1979; Bori 2009, 2010, 2021; Hoover 2019b: 1–39).

2. Ontology

Contrary to the dominant currents of post-classical Islamic thought, Ibn Taymiyya’s ontology is physicalist or materialist. All existents, including God, are concrete particulars capable of being perceived (maḥṣūṣ) by at least one of the five senses of sight, hearing, smell, taste, and touch. Whatever is not susceptible to perception by the senses does not exist. Even existents in the unseen world (ʿālam al-ghayb) are accessible to sense perception under certain conditions. The unseen, according to Ibn Taymiyya, is not an intellectual world or a world of immaterial images. Instead, the unseen world, like the seen, consists of concrete particulars with temporal and spatial dimensions that may be perceived by the senses when unimpeded. Among other things, the unseen includes God, angels, the afterlife, and the human soul, which is distinct from the human body but not immaterial. Some things in the unseen world have already been perceived in this life by prophets in visions and dreams, and believers will see God in front of them with their eyes in the hereafter. God is in fact more seeable than any other existent because God’s existence is more perfect than the existence of anything else. Conversely, according to Ibn Taymiyya, the incorporeal God of kalām theology and philosophers like Ibn Sīnā (Avicenna, d. 1037) and Ibn Rushd is tantamount to a nonexistent. That God is no more than a concept in the mind (Moustafa 2017; Suleiman 2019: 98–102; El-Tobgui 2020: 230–5, 251–2; Hoover 2022: 647–8).

Parallel to this physicalism, Ibn Taymiyya denies that universals exist in extramental reality. He rejects universals existing independently of particulars (Platonic realism) or as shared essences or quiddities (māhiyyāt) within particulars that the mind abstracts as universals (Aristotelian and Avicennan moderate realism). Shared meanings and universal notions abstracted from concrete particulars in the extramental world exist only in the mind. There is for example no extramental “absolute human” in which concrete and particular humans participate or of which they are instantiations, and there is no real quiddity “human” that exists in every human. There are only ontologically distinct existents that a mind groups together under a shared meaning or mental universal called “human”. Ibn Taymiyya’s rejection of real universals is often called “nominalism” (e.g., Hallaq 1993: xvi–xxiv), but it has also been argued that “conceptualism” is the better label. Conceptualism acknowledges the existence of universals in the mind whereas nominalism may imply rejection of that as well (Suleiman 2019: 106–19).

For Ibn Taymiyya, extramental existents do share in the fact of existing and in the fact of having unique essences and quiddities:

Between any two existents is something that they share and something that distinguishes them. They must share in being two existents that subsist and obtain, and in each one having a reality (ḥaqīqa), which is its essence (dhāt), its identify (nafs) and its quiddity, even if the two existents are obviously different as in the case of black and white. (Darʾ taʿāruḍ 5:83–4)

It is then the unique essences that distinguish existents from each other and render them all completely unique individuals. The essence of something is in fact its very existence along with its attributes (El-Tobgui 2020: 246–50). Ibn Taymiyya’s views on universals are not entirely unique within post-classical Islam; he is part of a wider drift toward nominalism or conceptualism found in earlier figures such as Shihāb al-Dīn al-Suhrawardī (d. 1191) (Adamson & Benevich 2023: 189–256).

Ibn Taymiyya also maintains that certain rational principles obtain universally, both in the mind and in extramental reality. These principles accord with his physicalist ontology, and they include logical axioms like the law of noncontradiction and the law of the excluded middle. It is not possible, for example, that something exist and not exist at the same time or that something exist neither inside the world nor outside of it. Likewise, one of two existents cannot be neither suffused within the other nor distinct from it. Ibn Taymiyya also affirms the division of existents into two fundamental types. Every existent is either eternal or originated, necessary or possible, and self-subsisting or subsisting in another. He insists on the universal applicability of efficient causality as well. Nothing possible or temporal can come into existence without a sufficient cause. Everything originated requires an originator (muḥdith), and everything preponderated needs a preponderator (murajjīḥ). It is for this reason, Ibn Taymiyya maintains, that normally functioning human beings perceive directly from their own existence that there must be a God who created them (El-Tobgui 2020: 255–60, 283).

3. Epistemology

3.1 Ways of Knowing

Ibn Taymiyya’s epistemology is based on sense perception (ḥiss), report (khabar), reason (ʿaql), and the human natural constitution (fiṭra). Sense perception is both outer and inner. Outer sense perception comes through the five senses. It perceives the particulars of the visible world in this life, and it perceives God in the hereafter. Inner sense perception is of hunger, thirst, joy, pain, the existence of one’s own soul, and the existence of God. Sense perception, according to Ibn Taymiyya, is immediate and necessary in the sense that it cannot be denied.

Report is related to sense perception insofar as it derives from the sense perceptions of others who have experienced what they report. Reports may be of particulars and universals and of the seen and the unseen. Much of what we know comes from reports because our own sense perception is limited in range. Divine revelation constitutes a special category of reports providing knowledge about the unseen world and the hereafter. Reports provide certain knowledge only if they are so abundantly transmitted as to preclude collusion and forgery. Muslims consider the Qurʾān and some reports from the Prophet Muḥammad to be abundantly transmitted (mutawātur). Ibn Taymiyya regards some reports of the early Muslims, the salaf, to be abundantly transmitted as well (El-Tobgui 2020: 227–9, 235–41).

Reason for Ibn Taymiyya is both a rational faculty and a kind of immediate (badīhī) and necessary (ḍarūrī) knowledge. The latter includes logical axioms like those noted above (e.g., the law of excluded middle and the law of non-contradiction) and basic moral intuitions (e.g., that God must be the only object of worship and that what is beneficial is good). The functions of reason as a faculty include forming universals in the mind from the extramental concrete particulars known through the senses and carrying out rational inferences (El-Tobgui 2020: 253–60).

The fiṭra frames Ibn Taymiyya’s epistemological outlook as the “original normative disposition” (El-Tobgui 2020: 260) or “natural constitution” (Hoover 2007: 39) of the human being to believe in and worship God alone just as an infant instinctively seeks to drink its mother’s milk. God creates human beings with a Godward orientation, and this includes many things known by reason such as the basic rules of thought and fundamental moral intuitions. Corrupting influences and incorrect kalam and philosophical reasoning may divert the fiṭra from its proper ends. The role of prophecy and divine revelation then is to perfect the fiṭra by removing sources of corruption, providing correct arguments, and revealing aspects of the divine law not known through natural means (Holtzman 2010: 165–78; Anjum 2012: 215–27; Kazi 2013: 232–313; Vasalou 2016: 77–92; El-Tobgui 2020: 260–4; Candiard 2023: 309–28).

Apart from prophecy, Ibn Taymiyya also appeals to the collective fiṭra of humankind to secure the reliability of sensory knowledge and rational axioms against the corrupt reasoning of kalām theologians and philosophers. For example, the axiom that one of two existents is either suffused within the other or distinct from it is so abundantly transmitted from ordinary people of sound fiṭra as to preclude collusion and error. This unmasks the faulty reasoning of theologians of corrupted fiṭra who posit a third type of existent that is neither suffused within another existent nor distinct from it (i.e., God). With this, abundant transmission (tawāṭur) guarantees for Ibn Taymiyya not only the authenticity of divine revelation but also the certainty of knowledge that accords with logical axioms and sense perception (El-Tobgui 2018a; El-Tobgui 2020: 267–75).

3.2 Refutation of Aristotelian Logic

Ibn Taymiyya devotes his Refutation of the Logicians (al-Radd ʿalā al-manṭiyyīn) to Aristotelian logic as reformulated by Ibn Sīnā. The Avicennan logical system is foundationalist. New knowledge is built up from primary knowledge through discursive reasoning. Otherwise, without a foundation of primary knowledge, rational inferences would regress infinitely. Avicennan logic furthermore divides knowledge (ʿilm) into conceptualization (taṣawwur) and assent (taṣdīq). Conceptualization is the formation of a notion or concept in the mind. Some concepts like “thing” and “existent” are primary; they are known immediately without discursive reasoning (naẓar). Other concepts are acquired by formation of a real definition (ḥadd), which indicates the essence or quiddity (māhiyya) of a species by specifying its genus and specific difference. For example, the definition of “human” as “rational animal” is acquired through reflection on prior knowledge of the species “animal” and the specific difference “rational”. The definition generates a concept in the mind that corresponds to the quiddity of the existing thing in extramental reality. Assent, the second division of Avicennan logic, affirms the truthfulness of a proposition. Assents are also primary or acquired, and they may be either certain (yaqīn) or probable. Primary assents that are certain include, among other things, primary truths (e.g., the whole is greater than the part); sense perceptions (e.g., seeing that the sun is shining), and abundantly transmitted reports (e.g., of the existence of a given city). Probable primary assents include beliefs about human customs and laws. Acquired assents are derived through induction, analogy, and syllogism. Induction and analogy impart no more than probability, but a valid categorical syllogism with certain premises provides apodictic certainty. Such a syllogism is called a demonstration (burhān) (Inati 1984; Hallaq 1993: xiv–xvii, xxvii–xxviii, 4–5 n. 4; Ahmed 2011; Black 2013).

Ibn Taymiyya falls within a tradition going back to the twelfth century that subjected Ibn Sīnā’s Aristotelian notion of real definition to skeptical critique. He rejects the ontology underpinning Avicennan definitions: definitions do not delineate real Avicennan quiddities shared by multiple existents outside the mind, and the attributes of extramental realities are not divided into those which are quiddative or essential and those which are not. Ibn Taymiyya maintains instead that definitions are matters of linguistic convention. They simply name and identify what is defined, and they distinguish one thing from another. This is the view of definitions common among kalām theologians. Following on from this, Ibn Taymiyya asserts that Aristotelian definitions are not needed to form concepts and that in fact, as the Ashʿarī theologian Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī (d. 606/1210) argued earlier, real definitions cannot lead to the acquisition of conceptualizations at all. Conceptualizations are all primary and empirical in character; they arise from experience and the senses, both external (e.g., sight and hearing) and internal (e.g., hunger, pain, love). Aristotelian definitions do not impart knowledge not already known. Those who hear definitions will not understand them unless they have previously conceptualized and understood the terms used to form the definitions themselves. The definition of human as rational animal for example is merely an assertion of the person who defines it. A hearer who knows this to be true will know it based on prior knowledge and not from the definition. A hearer who does not know it to be true cannot be sure that the testimony of this one person who defined it is correct without further corroboration (Manṭiqiyyīn 7–87/49–129; Hallaq 1993: xvii–xx, xlvi–xlvii; von Kügelgen 2005: 179–204; Rayan 2009, 2010, 2011b; on earlier critiques of definition, including al-Rāzī’s, see Jacobsen Ben Hammed 2020; Griffel 2021: 312–3, 336–87; Benevich 2022).

Ibn Taymiyya also denounces the logicians’ demonstrative syllogism as unnecessary and useless for acquiring certain knowledge. He does affirm that a categorical syllogism is formally productive. It yields certainty if its premises are certain:

If the subject matter of the syllogistic form is known [with certainty], then there is no doubt that it yields certainty. If it is said that every A is B and every B is C, and the two premises are known [with certainty], then there is no doubt that this combination yields [certain] knowledge that every A is C. This is not disputed. (Manṭiqiyyīn 293/339; cf. Hallaq 1993: 141)

However, Ibn Taymiyya belittles the Aristotelian and Avicennan elaboration of syllogistic figures and conditions as unduly complex and of little worth:

The upshot of the multiplicity of these figures and conditions is prolixity of little use and much weariness. They are lean camel meat on a rugged mountain peak that is not easy to climb, and [the meat] not ample enough to be worth carrying down. (Manṭiqiyyīn 296/342–3; cf. Hallaq 1993: 141)

More substantively, Ibn Taymiyya argues that certain knowledge may be acquired without a categorical syllogism. Different people come to certainty in different ways. What is acquired knowledge for some may be immediate knowledge for others. Some need the middle term of a syllogism to acquire certain knowledge while others do not. A rational inference producing certainty also need not be composed of exactly two premises, counter to what logicians require for a demonstrative syllogism. The number of premises varies according to the ability of the one seeking knowledge, and some inferences require only one premise, that is, a single indicant (dalīl) with its necessarily entailment (luzūm). As an example, Ibn Taymiyya notes that every created thing known with certainty to exist entails the existence of the Creator necessarily. The argument does not need to be reformulated into a categorical syllogism to provide certainty, and to require the syllogistic form is mere pedantry. Moreover, and following on from Ibn Taymiyya’s empiricist outlook, the universal proposition in a demonstrative syllogism is in fact superfluous in matters pertaining to the extramental world because knowledge of that world is rooted in particulars. For example, to determine whether the universal, “All flames burn”, is true in the world outside the mind, one would need to examine all flames to see whether they all burn. In this attempt at complete induction, one would discover along the way that a particular flame burns. There would then be no need to construct a demonstrative syllogism with the universal premise, “All flames burn”, to attain certainty that that one flame burns. It has already been ascertained that it burns. Additionally, in view of the difficulty of achieving complete induction of particulars, acquired knowledge of the extramental world will be merely probable, not certain (Manṭiqiyyīn 113–4/155, 250–3/294–7; Hallaq 1993: xxvii–xxxv, 30–42, 134–7; von Kügelgen 2005: 204–9; Rayan 2011a, 2012).

Ibn Taymiyya also claims in his Refutation of the Logicians that the categorical syllogism is equivalent to analogy:

Analogy (qiyās al-tamthīl) and the categorical syllogism (qiyās al-shumūl) are equivalent. Certainty (yaqīn) and probability (ẓann) differ only according to the subject matter [of the premises]. If the specific subject matter is certain in one, it is certain in the other, and, if it is probable in one, it is probable in the other. (Manṭiqiyyīn 116/157, cf. 6/48, 200–1/244)

According to Aristotelian and Avicennan logic, an analogy can never impart certain knowledge because it only compares one particular with another. An analogy transfers a judgement or property found in one particular to the second particular by virtue of a characteristic shared between the two. The cause (ʿilla) of this shared characteristic can never be ascertained with complete certainty, and so an analogy can never impart certain knowledge.

Contrary to this, Ibn Taymiyya contends that the middle term of the categorical syllogism is identical to the cause in analogy and that an analogy can be reformulated as the first figure of a categorical syllogism. He illustrates with the famous juristic case of date wine (nabīdh). Date wine is forbidden by analogy to grape wine because both intoxicate. Intoxication is the cause of forbiddance in both the original and the assimilated cases. Likewise, date wine is forbidden by the following demonstration: every date wine is an intoxicant; every intoxicant is forbidden; therefore, date wine is forbidden. Ibn Taymiyya acknowledges that the greatest question concerning analogy is how to ascertain that the characteristic shared by the original and assimilated cases (e.g., intoxication) causes or necessitates the ruling (e.g., forbiddance). However, he explains, that is no different from the equally difficult problem of identifying the middle term in a categorical syllogism. If the middle term is certainly the cause and the premises are certain, that forms a demonstration. Otherwise, the major premise in the syllogism will be only probable, and the conclusion will likewise be only probable. As noted above, Ibn Taymiyya maintains that it is not possible to acquire certain knowledge of universal propositions in extramental reality (e.g., that all flames burn), and so he effectively reduces the categorical syllogism to the epistemic level of analogy as a tool for acquiring new knowledge of the world outside the mind.

Ibn Taymiyya furthermore explains that once the necessitating cause in an analogy has been identified (e.g., intoxication as the cause of forbiddance), it becomes a universal, and the original case in the analogical argument is no longer needed. Whenever the cause obtains, the ruling follows necessarily. Yet, Ibn Taymiyya continues, a universal only exists with respect to a particular case, and specifying the original case is how the universal comes to be known (Manṭiqiyyīn 116–8/158–60). For Ibn Taymiyya, it is divine revelation that makes the cause of a ruling known. In the case of date wine, it is known from the consensus of the Muslim community and unambiguous revealed texts that every intoxicant is forbidden. Among unambiguous texts are two statements of the Prophet Muḥammad in the hadith collection of Muslim: “Every intoxicant is wine (khamr), and every intoxicant is forbidden”, and, “Every intoxicant is wine, and every wine is forbidden” (Manṭiqiyyīn 111–2/152–3; Heer 1988; Hallaq 1993: xxxv–xxxviii, 43–51, 159–64; von Kügelgen 2005: 209–12; von Kügelgen 2013: 313–22). Divine revelation can provide certain knowledge of the world outside the mind even if empirical observation of extramental particulars cannot. This leads Hallaq to call Ibn Taymiyya “an ardent sceptic, but a sceptic saved by religion” (Hallaq 1993: xxxix). However, Hallaq’s comment is apt only to a point because, as will be seen below, Ibn Taymiyya maintains that knowledge about God may be derived through rational inferences as well.

Ibn Taymiyya’s Refutation of the Logicians received very little attention from logicians in his own day or in the following centuries (von Kügelgen 2013: 270–3). One possible reason for this is that he does not take the later logical tradition into account. Arab logicians from the twelfth century onward are not uniformly committed to the existence of extramental universals, as noted above, nor to the Avicennan claim that definitions and demonstrative syllogisms are the only means to acquire certain knowledge through rational reflection (Spevack 2010). Another possible reason is that Ibn Taymiyya is sometimes imprecise. For example, he reports baldly that the logicians claim, “No assents are known except by means of the syllogism” (Manṭiqiyyīn 88/130). As a few modern scholars have noted, this is not true when taken at face value; Avicennan logicians also recognize a variety of primary assents, as well as probable assents acquired through induction or analogy (Hallaq 1993: 30; El-Rouayheb 2016: 418). Ibn Taymiyya is aware of this wider teaching about assent (Manṭiqiyyīn 4–7/46–8), and it becomes apparent during his Refutation that he is addressing the more limited claim that no acquired, certain assents are known except by means of the categorical syllogism. In sum Ibn Taymiyya’s imprecision and the fact that he gives later logical developments minimal attention may help explain why pre-modern logicians did not interact with his criticism (El-Rouayheb 2016: 417–22).

4. Philosophical Theology

4.1 Theological Language

As a theological traditionalist within the Ḥanbalī school of Sunnī Islam, Ibn Taymiyya affirms that God must be described as the Qurʾān and the Prophet Muḥammad describe Him, both negatively and positively, in accord with the Qurʾānic verse, “There is nothing like Him, and He is All-Hearing, All-Seeing” (Q. 42:11). On the one hand, God’s revealed names and attributes are incomparable (tanzīh), and they must not be likened (tamthīl) or assimilated (tashbīh) to creatures. On the other, attributes like God’s hearing and seeing must be affirmed in their plain sense (ẓāhir) according to the interpretation (tafsīr) of the salaf and not distorted (taḥrīf) or stripped away (taʿṭīl).

The polemic against likening and stripping away is aimed at two broad trends. First, according to Ibn Taymiyya, Muʿtazilī and post-classical Ashʿarī kalām theologians liken God’s attributes to those of creatures. Then, they strip God of those attributes that imply anthropomorphism and corporealism and sometimes reinterpret them. God cannot have a literal “hand”, for example, and so the literal sense must be denied and perhaps reinterpreted non-literally as God’s “power”. Likewise, it must be denied that God’s “sitting” has anything to do with motion, place, or space, and it may perhaps be reinterpreted as God’s “possessing”. Ibn Taymiyya rejects the kalām approach and insists that all God’s attributes must be affirmed equally as uniquely befitting God. Divine attributes that could imply corporeality may not be denied while other attributes are affirmed (Hoover 2007: 48–52).

The second target of Ibn Taymiyya’s polemic is the esotericism of Ismāʿīlī Shīʿīs, philosophers in the Neoplatonic and Aristotelian traditions, al-Ghazālī (d. 1111), and the Sufi theorist Ibn al-ʿArabī (d. 1240) and his followers. Esotericism affirms two meanings for revelation, one for the commoners and another for an elite. The philosophers Ibn Sīnā and Ibn Rushd, for example, understand the corporeal imagery of exoteric revelation as pious fiction for the commoners. The commoners should not be told what the philosophers know to be true, namely, that God and the hereafter are incorporeal. That would too easily suggest to commoners that God and the hereafter do not exist at all and so undermine their faith. Ibn Taymiyya welcomes the philosophers’ rejection of kalām reinterpretation at the exoteric level, but he fiercely condemns their esoteric interpretations confined to an elite. The revelation that is accessible to all is true for all in its plain sense (Michot 2003a, 2008, 2012a, 2015, 2019; von Kügelgen 2004).

A major stream of theological traditionalism prohibits debating with kalām theologians and shuns all attempts to understand God’s attributes. This traditionalist noncognitivism deems the meaning (maʿnā) and the condition or modality (kayfiyya) of the attributes to be entirely inaccessible to human comprehension. While the verbal forms of “hearing” and “hand” are the same when applied to God and creatures, the meanings of these words when applied to God are unknowable and must not be probed (Hoover with Mahajneh 2018: 43–7).

Ibn Taymiyya retains the unknowability of the modality of God’s attributes, as well as their ultimate reality (ḥaqīqa), but he rejects traditionalist noncognitivism. He also rejects the literalism of kalām theology. Words like “hand” and “sitting” do not have literal meanings that must be denied and perhaps replaced with other terms when applied to God. Rather, Ibn Taymiyya affirms, the plain senses of God’s attributes are accessible to human cognition and shaped by their theological context. Ibn Taymiyya’s theory of meaning is contextual and pragmatic. Words have no meanings apart from context, and their meanings are modulated according to contextual indicators (Ali 2000: 87–114; Belhaj 2008; Mustafa 2018). Names and attributes applied to both God and creatures have meanings in the human mind, but they apply to God and creatures in different ways according to the precedence of God over creatures. Universal meanings occur only in the mind, and there are no real universals outside the mind. Yet, the mind identifies features in the particulars of extramental reality that can be said to be shared, albeit differently in the particulars that are God and creatures because God is necessary while creatures are merely contingent or possible. Adapting distinctions developed by Ibn Sīnā and his successors, Ibn Taymiyya construes the relation between the meanings of terms applied to both God and humans as neither equivocal nor purely univocal but analogical or modulated (mushakkik). Ibn Taymiyya elaborates in a passage from his Refutation of the Logicians:

The names applied [both] to [God] and others are applied by way of modulation (tashkīk), which is a kind of general univocity (al-tawāṭuʾ al-ʿāmm). It is neither a matter of equivocity, nor a matter of univocity in which the individuals to which it applies are alike. Rather, it is a matter of univocity in which the individuals to which it applies take precedence over each other. For example, the word “white” or “black” is applied to what is intense, like the whiteness of snow, and to what is less [intense], like the whiteness of ivory. Likewise, the word “existence” is applied to [both] the necessary and the possible….Modulated names must have a shared universal meaning, even if that occurs only in the mind….The fact that the existence of the necessary is more perfect than the existence of the possible does not prevent what is called “existence” from being a universal meaning shared between the two of them. This is likewise the case with regard to the other names and attributes applied to the Creator and the creature, like the names Living, Knowing, Powerful, Hearing, and Seeing, and likewise with His attributes, like His knowledge, His power, His mercy, His good pleasure, His anger, and His joy, and the rest of His names and His attributes that the messengers applied to Him. (Manṭiqiyyīn 155/198; see further Ali 2000: 114–25; Suleiman 2019: 145–77; El-Tobgui 2020: 193–206, 285–8; on the Avicennan background, see Janos 2022; Adamson & Benovich 2023: 109–37)

Ibn Taymiyya willingness to discuss the meanings of God’s attributes opens the door to theological explanation and argumentation. With his traditionalist sensibility, he often reminds readers that the modality and reality of God’s names and attributes cannot be known. He also prefers to speak of God only in words found in revealed texts. Nonetheless, he permits engaging the terminologies of theological opponents as needed to clarify the meanings of the revelation, and he justifies this by analogy to the permission to translate the Qurʾān into other languages to convey its message. He condemns the kalām theologians for introducing innovated and non-scriptural technical terms like substance (jawhar), accident (ʿaraḍ), body (jism), and spatial extension (taḥayyuz) into theological discourse, but he permits using such terms when necessary to translate the revelation into the idiom of the day (Hoover with Mahajneh 2018).

4.2 Reason and Revelation

It is also Ibn Taymiyya’s conviction that much of what is known about God through revelation is known equally and primally from reason and the human natural constitution (fiṭra). Prophets complete and perfect what humans already know, and revelation reiterates rational proofs relevant to religion and exposes incorrect reasoning for what it is. There is therefore no conflict between true revelation and correct reason, and this is the main claim to which Ibn Taymiyya’s devotes his masterwork Averting the Conflict (Darʾ taʿāruḍ). Ibn Taymiyya condemns philosophers and post-classical kalām theologians like the Ashʿarī Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī for demoting the Qurʾān to mere information and subjecting it to alien and erroneous regimes of reason that lead to stripping God of his rightful attributes. Ibn Taymiyya’s apologetic aim is to take the rational high ground away from philosophers and kalām theologians by showing that his theology is what both reason and the texts of revelation indicate (Abrahamov 1992; Michot 1994; Kazi 2013; Zouggar 2014; Griffel 2018; Hoover with Mahajneh 2018; El-Tobgui 2020; Candiard 2023). What follows here and in the following subsections will focus more on clarifying Ibn Taymiyya’s theological concepts than on their textual indicants. We begin with the basics of his natural theology.

As noted above, Ibn Taymiyya affirms that everything originated requires a cause for its existence, and creatures thereby know immediately that God exists by virtue of their need for a creator. There is no need for the prolix reasoning of the kalām cosmological argument for the existence of God from atoms and accidents. Ibn Taymiyya furthermore upholds causal priority: a cause is more perfect than its effect, and the cause is the source of the effect’s perfections. Likewise, the Creator is more perfect than creatures, and it is from the Creator that creatures derive their perfections. The perfections of God may therefore be inferred from the perfections of creatures, apart from revelation. However, Ibn Taymiyya does not permit inferring God’s attributes from the attributes of creatures with an analogy or categorical syllogism because that would involve comparing God and creatures on equal terms. Instead, a fortiori argumentation must be used to respect God’s incomparability. An a fortiori argument (qiyās al-awlā) transfers the judgment of one case to a second case that is all the more worthy of that judgment than the first. Applied to theology, God is all the worthier of whatever perfections are found in creatures than are the creatures themselves, and so perfections found in creatures must be all the more so ascribed to God. Ibn Taymiyya explains:

It is not permissible that God—Exalted is He—and another be included in a categorical syllogism whose terms are on the same level or in an analogy in which the judgment of the original case and that of the assimilated case are on the same level. Indeed, God—Exalted is He—there is nothing like Him, neither in His essence which is mentioned through His names, nor in His attributes, nor in His acts. However, the a fortiori argument is followed with respect to Him. As He said, “And to God is the highest similitude (al-mathal al-aʿlā)” (Q. 16:60). With respect to every perfection and attribute praiseworthy in itself and devoid of imperfection that belongs to some created, originated existents, it is known that the Lord, Creator, Self-Subsistent, Everlasting, Eternal and Necessary Existent in Himself is all the worthier of it, and [with respect to] every imperfection and defect from which some originated, possible creatures must be exonerated, the Lord, Creator, Holy, Peace, Eternal, Necessary of Existence in Himself is all the worthier of being exonerated from it. (Sharḥ al-Iṣbahāniyya 456–7; trans. adapted from Hoover 2007: 59)

On these grounds, Ibn Taymiyya reasons that God must be living, knowing, powerful, seeing, hearing, and speaking. Otherwise, God would be dead, ignorant, impotent, blind, deaf, and mute, respectively, and He would be less perfect than living creatures that He has created. Moreover, God must be moving and not immovable. Otherwise, God would be inferior to inanimate objects, which can at least be moved by something else. In similar fashion, God has hands because having the ability to choose to act with hands is more perfect than not having that ability. God also has the attributes of laughter and joy to exclude crying and sadness which imply weakness. God furthermore loves perfection and hates imperfection because it is more perfect to distinguish perfection and imperfection through love and hate than not to do so. However, God does not eat and drink because eating and drinking imply need whereas having no need is more perfect than being in need. Moreover, Ibn Taymiyya contends that it is in God’s perfection to be qualified by attributes of perfection such that He is unlike created things (Hoover 2007: 56–67; Suleiman 2019: 225–59).

4.3 God and Space

Ibn Taymiyya rationalizes a strand of traditionalism found in earlier figures such as ʿUthmān b. Saʿīd al-Dārimī (d. between 280/893 and 282/895) that distinguishes God above from the world below spatially. Ibn Taymiyya deems it a necessary truth of reason and the natural constitution (fiṭra) that God is located above and distinct from the universe in a spatial sense. God is above the sky and not found anywhere within the created world. Ibn Taymiyya also regards this as the plain witness of revelation, as in the Qur’anic verses, “They fear their Lord above them” (Q. 16:50), and “The All-Merciful sat over the Throne” (Q. 20:5). He works out the implications of God’s spatial aboveness most fully in Explicating the Deception, a refutation of Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī’s Taʾsīs al-taqdīs (Establishing Sanctification). According to al-Rāzī, God is not accessible to the senses, and God is not spatial (mutaḥayyiz) or subject to location (jiha). God is also neither inside the world nor outside of it. God is a non-spatial entity accessible only to the intellect. Al-Rāzī provides several arguments for his position, which Ibn Taymiyya refutes in turn and thereby clarifies his own view.

Al-Rāzī argues that a God located in space would need that space. Al-Rāzī here adopts a Platonic conception of space that subsists independently of the objects it contains (Adamson 2017). A space occupying God is thus dependent on the space in which He is located, and this impugns His self-sufficiency. Ibn Taymiyya denies the existence of space that subsists independently of other existents. He takes inspiration from Ibn Rushd who denies the existence of void space and defines place (makān) in Aristotelian terms as the inner surface of the body surrounding and containing it. The place of one celestial sphere, for example, is the inner surface of the celestial sphere surrounding it, but the universe has no place because it is not surrounded by anything at all, not even void space. Ibn Taymiyya likewise affirms that there is no void space. Space (ḥayyiz) is the boundary of an object inside of which the object extends and obtains. The boundaries are part of the object and do not exist apart from it. Without the object, no space exists. To put it differently, existents do not occupy space; instead, existents are spatially extended (mutaḥayyiz). So, nothing exists except God and the world below. There is nothing above the world except God, and there is no space above God that God could be said to occupy.

Along with kalām theology more generally, al-Rāzī contends that a spatial God would be divisible and composite, which would violate God’s unity. Ibn Taymiyya agrees that God cannot be divided into parts or composed out of them, but he does not concede that spatiality implies divisibility and composition in the case of God. God can be both indivisible and very big. Ibn Taymiyya affirms that God is so immense that no one can measure God truly, but he also explains that God’s size is finite because an infinite spatial extension is impossible.

Al-Rāzī argues furthermore that a God located above in a spatial sense would lie above people standing on one side of the spherical earth but below those on the opposite side, which is absurd. Ibn Taymiyya replies that the sky is above the earth no matter where one stands on the earth. Likewise, God is always located above from any point on the earth. God in fact surrounds the universe:

The Creator of all things is above all things and surrounds them from His location that surrounds all of [the celestial spheres] (an yakūna khāliq al-jamīʿ fawq al-jamīʿ wa-muḥīṭan bi-hi min jihati-hi al-muḥīṭa jamīʿi-hā). (Bayān Talbīs 4: 52; trans. Hoover 2022: 664)

The notion of God’s spatial extension easily suggests that God is a body. Ibn Taymiyya is, however, reticent to speak of God as a body (jism) because the revealed texts and the early Muslims (salaf) do not affirm or deny this term of God. He is also wary of the term because kalām theologians understand the very definition of “body” to involve divisibility and composition. Yet, Ibn Taymiyya does allow calling God a body so long as it is completely clear that God is indivisible.

To sum up Ibn Taymiyya’s views on God and space, God is a huge indivisible, spatially extended existent that surrounds the entire universe. God is not an existent in space, nor does God transcend space. Rather, God is spatial in God’s essence. There is no void space, and no space exists apart from God and the universe that God has created (Holtzman 2018: 457–63; Suleiman 2019: 119–25; Hoover 2022).

4.4 God, Creation and Time

According to Ibn Taymiyya, God’s perfection entails perpetual dynamism and not timeless eternity as in kalām theology and Avicennan philosophy. Ibn Taymiyya’s understanding of time, much like his interpretation of space, is Aristotelian in tenor. God does not transcend time, but God does not exist within time either. Rather, time derives from God’s internal dynamism and God’s perpetual creation of the world. Furthermore, there has always been time. The genus of time is eternal because God has been doing one thing after another from eternity. However, time does not subsist as an eternal entity independently of God. Time has no independent existence apart from the movement from which it derives (Suleiman 2019: 125–8).

Ibn Taymiyya’s understanding of God’s internal dynamism is similar to views held earlier by the philosopher Abū Barakāt al-Baghdādī (d. ca. 1165) and the Karrāmī theologians who thrived in what is today Iran and Afghanistan. He also acknowledges that his position is tantamount to what kalām theologians identify as temporally originating events (ḥawādith) subsisting in God’s essence. However, Ibn Taymiyya prefers to avoid the non-scriptural term ḥawādith and speak instead of God’s dynamism in terms of God’s voluntary attributes (al-ṣifāt al-ikhtiyāriyya). God’s voluntary attributes include God’s creation, love, mercy, wrath, justice, sitting and descending. These attributes subsist in God’s essence, and God exercises them by means of His will and power. Ibn Taymiyya contrasts his view with those of the Ashʿarīs and Muʿtazilīs, taking speech as a prime example. The Ashʿarīs maintain along with Ibn Taymiyya that God’s speech, will, and power subsist in God’s essence, but they insist that these attributes are timelessly eternal to avert temporality in the essence of God. Ibn Taymiyya counters that the Ashʿarīs thereby abolish the instrumentality between God’s will and power on the one hand and God’s speech on the other. They impugn God’s perfection by making it impossible for God to speak by means of His will and power. Additionally, Ibn Taymiyya does not believe that it is possible to correlate a timelessly eternal attribute of speech with temporal events in the world. The Muʿtazilīs for their part do affirm that God speaks by His will, but they seek to safeguard God’s timeless eternity by understanding God’s speech to be something created in a substrate disjoined from God’s essence. Ibn Taymiyya responds that such speech is no longer God’s own because it does not subsist within Him. For Ibn Taymiyya, the correct view, the view of the salaf, is that God has been speaking by His will and power from eternity with individual acts of speech subsisting in His essence. These divine speech acts are not themselves eternal, but neither are they created because created things do not subsist in the essence of God. Ibn Taymiyya breaks the kalām identity of the temporal with the created and the timelessly eternal with the uncreated. God’s internal dynamism is temporal in character but not created. God’s uncreated speech acts are temporal and can address temporal events in the world (Hoover 2004: 296–9; Hoover 2010: 58–60; Suleiman 2019: 298–312).

Creation in Ibn Taymiyya’s theology is a voluntary attribute like speech. God’s perfection entails that God perpetually create created things by His will and power from eternity without beginning (min al-azal). While each created thing in the world had a beginning and no created thing is eternal alongside God, there has always been one created thing or another. This present world that God created in six days was created out of prior materials that God had created previously out of prior created things and so on ad infinitum into the past. Ibn Taymiyya speaks of the genus or species of created things being eternal since there have always been created things, but he denies that this genus as such has an extramental existence. In a history of creation that has no beginning and no end, only created things with beginnings exist in extramental reality.

Ibn Taymiyya’s view of creation is closer to the philosophers Ibn Sīnā and Ibn Rushd than to the kalām theologians. He follows both philosophers in affirming that God’s perfection entails the production of the world, but like Ibn Rushd, he rejects Ibn Sīnā’s emanation scheme in favor of God’s continuous creation of the world. Ibn Taymiyya may well have been inspired by Ibn Rushd since we know that he read the philosopher’s texts. Ibn Taymiyya also adopts Ibn Sīnā’s and Ibn Rushd’s criticism of the kalām theologians’ account of creation ex nihilo. If the world had had a beginning, as the kalām theologians argue, God would have been imperfect before creating it and subject to change when He began the creation process. A preponderator (murajjiḥ) or efficient cause would need to have arisen to cause God to start originating. The kalām theologians counter that it is was in the very nature of God’s will to begin originating the world, and no additional preponderator was needed to cause God to begin creating. Ibn Taymiyya rejects this as positing something impossible, namely, preponderance without a preponderator (Hoover 2004; Abu AbdurRahman 2023).

4.5 Causality and Theodicy

Ibn Taymiyya affirms that God’s activity is rational. God creates on account of a cause (ʿilla) or wise purpose (ḥikma), and, given that God has been creating from eternity, the wise purposes of God’s creative acts regress infinitely into the past within God’s essence. Moreover, God’s rationality is not purely altruistic. God acts for benefits that redound not only to creatures but also to God Himself. For Ibn Taymiyya it is neither rational nor praiseworthy for agents to commit acts that are of no benefit to themselves. Ashʿarī theologians object that a God who acts for wise purposes must be needy and dependent on those acts to attain perfection. Ibn Taymiyya counters that it is rational for agents to be perfected by their acts and that it is a greater perfection to create things for wise purposes at the right times than to create without purpose. God is self-sufficient, not in the sense of being free to act or not act without reason—the Ashʿarī view—but in needing no help in the act of creation. Furthermore, God’s love for the love and obedience of His servants does not derive from God’s need for love. Rather, it follows on from God’s love of God’s self. God’s self-love is primary, and from God’s self-love flows God’s love for human beings and the creation of everything that they do, including their love for God and obedience to Him. God does not act to acquire perfection. Instead, God’s creative acts, and with them the created world, are necessary concomitants of the perfection of God’s essence. Ibn Taymiyya’s resolution to the problem of God’s self-sufficiency is Neoplatonic, and the notion of God’s self-love giving rise to the world as a necessary concomitant is found in the Neoplatonism of Ibn Sīnā (Bell 1979: 71–3; Hoover 2007: 70–102; Vasalou 2016: 167–79).

Ibn Taymiyya uses the language of secondary causes (sg. sabab) in instrumental and material senses to describe the process of God’s creation of things in the world. For example, God creates the human act by means of the human will and power; God makes plants grow by means of clouds and rain; and God causes illness and death by means of poison. In general, God creates everything out of and by means of previously existing materials and powers. Secondary causality looks natural from the human perspective, even though God has the power to interrupt it, but from the divine perspective, it is purely instrumental.

God’s creation of all human acts raises the question of human responsibility. The Muʿtazlilī kalām theologians maintain that humans are responsible for their acts because humans themselves create them. Ibn Taymiyya rejects the Muʿtazilī formulation as compromising God’s exclusive creative power. Instead, in what may be earlier texts, he affirms that humans are the agents of their acts and therefore liable to reward and punishment because God creates their acts in them and not in Himself. In what may be later texts, Ibn Taymiyya also roots the origin of human moral failure in nonexistence to absolve God completely of creating it. Humans are liable to punishment for omitting to do the deeds that they were created to perform. This omission is a privation; it does not exist, and so it cannot be attributed to God.

As with Ibn Taymiyya’s approach to God’s self-sufficiency, Avicennan Neoplatonic inclinations color his theodicy as well. God creates all things, including evils, for wise purposes that are ultimately good. Pure or absolute evil does not exist. Evil is only evil relative to those afflicted by it. Ibn Taymiyya sometimes says that God’s wise purposes in evil cannot be known. At other times, however, he indicates that God’s wise purposes have to do with nurturing religious virtues such as repentance, humility, and patience. Ibn Taymiyya ultimately affirms that everything God creates is good and that this world is the best of all possible worlds. To avoid the charge that this limits God’s power, Ibn Taymiyya asserts that God could create other than this world. However, God creates the world that He does out of His perfection and wise purpose (Hoover 2007: 146–65, 177–228).

5. Theory of Religion

Ibn Taymiyya’s theory of religion (dīn) is decidedly naturalistic and sociological, at least in its foundations, and, as will be noted further below, it draws on Ibn Sīnā’s analysis of final causality to point to God as religion’s proper object of worship. For Ibn Taymiyya, humans are dynamic and goal-oriented beings who necessarily will, love, worship, and obey something. So, they cannot help but be religious. Moreover, human beings are social, and every human group requires a religion to unite it and guide it in attaining benefit and warding off harm. Religion consists of inner and outer acts of obedience, worship, and ethical character, and it is what people love in common to attain mutual benefit. Religion then has two fundamental aspects: 1) the object of love and worship and 2) the means by which that object is loved and worshipped. The divinely revealed and most beneficial religion is worship and love of God alone by means of the prescriptions of Islam. Ibn Taymiyya elaborates as follows:

Every living being must have an object of love, which is the goal of its love and its will and towards which its inner and outer movements are directed. That is its god. That [love, will, and movement] is of no benefit unless it is for God alone, without giving Him an associate. Everything other than Islam is worthless.…Every religion, obedience, and love must have two things. The first is the object of religion, love, and obedience. This is the object of intention and the object of will. The second is the form of the deeds by which [that object] is obeyed and worshipped. This is the way, the path, the law, the method, and the means of access.…Religion encompasses two things: the object of worship and the worship. The object of worship is the one God. Worship is obeying Him and obeying His Messenger. This is the religion of God with which He is well pleased. As He said, “I am well pleased with Islam as a religion for you” (Qurʾān 5:3). (Qāʾida fī al-maḥabba 39–40; trans. Hoover 2019b: 43–4; see further Abbasi 2021: 64–70)

Ibn Taymiyya frequently signifies God’s unique worthiness of worship with the terms ulūhiyya and ilāhiyya. Both mean “divinity” in the sense of that which is worshipped, and he compounds them with the term tawḥīd (confessing the oneness or exclusivity of God) to denote the act of taking God as the sole object of worship and obedience (tawḥīd al-ulūhiyya and tawḥīd al-ilāhiyya). Ibn Taymiyya also uses the terms rubūbiyya and rabbāniyya (lordship) to denote God’s role as creator, sustainer, and source. The confession that God is the one and only Lord of the universe (tawḥīd al-rubūbiyya or tawḥīd al-rabbāniyya) means that God is creator of everything that exists, all human acts included. Ibn Taymiyya often complains that the Ashʿarī kalām theologians give primacy to confessing the exclusiveness of God’s lordship (tawḥīd al-rubūbiyya) and lose sight of God’s sole right to worship. Instead, he argues, the Qurʾān gives priority to devoting worship to God alone (tawḥīd al-ulūhiyya), as in the invocation in the first chapter of the Qurʾān, “You alone we worship; You alone we ask for help” (Qurʾān 1:5). “You alone we worship” comes first as an expression of tawḥīd al-ulūhiyya and is then followed by “You alone we ask for help” as a confession that God is the sole source of sustenance, an expression of tawḥīd al-rubūbiyya (Hoover 2007: 26–9, 120–2; Michot 2012b: 123–68).

Ibn Taymiyya further elucidates the priority of God’s worthiness of worship with the Aristotelian causal analysis of Ibn Sīnā. For Ibn Sīnā, the final cause is the end for which something comes into existence and the efficient cause is that which brings the thing into existence. Additionally, the final cause is the efficient cause of the efficient cause insofar as it motivates the action of the efficient cause. In the following discussion of Qurʾān 1:5, Ibn Taymiyya links final causality to divinity and efficient causality to lordship and underlines the primacy of divinity by identifying it as the efficient cause of the efficient cause lordship.

The God (al-ilāh) is the one worshipped and asking for help is linked to His lordship. The Lord of the servants is He who lords over them. This entails that He is Creator of everything that is in them and from them. The divinity is the final cause, and lordship is the efficient cause. The final [cause] is that which is aimed at, and it is the efficient cause of the efficient cause. Therefore, He made “You alone we worship” precede “You alone we ask for help”. Confessing the exclusiveness of the divinity (tawḥīd al-ilāhiyya) includes confessing the exclusiveness of the lordship (tawḥīḍ al-rubūbiyya). Included in worshipping only God is not confessing the lordship of any other. (Bayān talbīs al-Jahmiyya 4: 533, trans. Hoover 2007:28–9)

In Ibn Taymiyya’s view, the means of worship most pleasing to God and most beneficial to humankind is the law (sharīʿa) revealed to the Prophet Muḥammad. This law encompasses everything that God loves for human beings to believe and do, and it includes religious ritual, theological doctrines, contractual and moral obligations toward others, and religious virtues like patience and gratitude. Ibn Taymiyya maintains as well that the law of Islam is coextensive with justice and maximum human benefit (maṣlaḥa) in much the same way that he claims that reason and revelation coincide in matters of theology. Ibn Taymiyya is as much an apologist for the rationality of the divine law as he is for the rationality of his theological doctrines. The two terms “law” and “justice” are for him interchangeable, and he goes so far as to say that God will give victory to a just state that is not Muslim over a Muslim state that is not just. Furthermore, there is nothing outside the revealed law whose benefit outweighs its detriment. The religious law never neglects a benefit, and Muslim jurists who imagine that some acts not mentioned in the law are beneficial are mistaken. Al-Ghazālī had developed a process for authorizing unstated benefits (al-maṣāliḥ al-mursala) by identifying five fundamental purposes of the law: the preservation of religion, intellect, life, progeny and property. Benefits not found directly in the revealed law may be legitimized as part of that law by aligning them with the main purposes of the law. Ibn Taymiyya criticizes this strategy for adding rulings to the law that God did not legislate. Additionally, according to Ibn Taymiyya, al-Ghazālī’s five purposes are too narrowly focused on worldly affairs, and they do not take sufficient account of benefits found in legislated worship rituals like the ritual prayer (ṣalāh). For Ibn Taymiyya, innovated religious rituals, like commemorating the Prophet’s birthday, and other acts not found within the law may yield some benefit for those who perform them, but the detriments always outweigh the benefits. Ibn Taymiyya therefore condemns such acts and urges abandoning them if possible (Opwis 2010: 181–199; Rapoport 2010; Ukeles 2010; Vasalou 2016: 197–210; Mustafa 2023).

Religion for Ibn Taymiyya cannot do without temporal power, and he criticizes two errors in this regard. One is avoiding power and wealth so as not to sully religion with the compromises of temporal affairs, and the other is deploying power and wealth for personal gain instead of advancing religion. To avert these errors, Ibn Taymiyya seeks to infuse public authority with the ethical impulses of the revealed law in his book Law-Guided Public Policy (al-Siyāsa al-Sharʿiyya). The purpose of the public authorities, whether they be political, military, judicial or scholarly, is “to reform the religion of the people” in order “that religion is entirely for God and that the word of God is most high” (Siyāsa 30, 33). Rulers are to further the cause of religion and enable worship of God alone within whatever political structures happen to be in place. While Ibn Taymiyya speaks to the appointment of public officials, the distribution of public wealth, the conduct of war, the provision of public services, and criminal and personal status law among other things, he does not outline a blueprint for a perfect Islamic state. He instead exhorts public officials to work toward religious reform to the best of their abilities within the circumstances, using force as deemed prudent (Khan 1992: 23–64, 98–170; Johanson 2008; Anjum 2012; Belhaj 2013; Michot 2014; Bori 2021).

6. Metaethics

It has been observed that Ibn Taymiyya’s ethics of God’s creative and commanding activity follows the utilitarian maxim of the greatest happiness for the greatest number (Vasalou 2016: 172). This is readily apparent in Ibn Taymiyya’s theodicy: God continuously produces the greatest possible benefit for the greatest number by creating the best-of-all-possible-worlds. Ibn Taymiyya’s metaethical theory on the human plane mirrors this divine utilitarianism. He rejects the moral rationalism of the Muʿtazilī kalām theologians who argue that acts are objectively good or bad in themselves such that God commands an act because it is good or forbids an act because it is bad. He also rebuffs classical Ashʿarī divine command theory in which the moral values of acts are determined solely by God’s will such that an act is good only because God commands it. Ibn Taymiyya instead follows the consequentialist inclinations of post-classical Ashʿarīs like Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī. The moral values of acts depend on the outcomes of those acts, whether they produce pleasure or pain, benefit or detriment, profit or harm. The goodness of an act depends on the degree to which it is advantageous to the actor or wider society, and rational human communities should seek to maximize their overall benefit. The role of God’s law then is to point humankind to what is of ultimate benefit in both this life and the hereafter, namely, worshipping God alone according to God’s law (Hoover 2007: 34–9; Vasalou 2016: 11–136).

Like other post-classical Muslim jurists, Ibn Taymiyya sometimes overrides explicit legal prohibitions on the grounds of benefit and necessity. For example, Islamic law forbids eating carrion, but Ibn Taymiya permits eating it if necessary to avoid starvation. More generally, Ibn Taymiyya maintains the revealed law as his guiding ideal, but he insists that the benefits and detriments of actions must be weighed up carefully when human weakness or sin make following the law difficult or impossible or when the law is not fully known. His reflection on the caliphate is a poignant example of such utilitarian calculation. Ibn Taymiyya maintains that the “caliphate of prophecy”, the normative caliphate of the first four Sunnī caliphs following the death of the Prophet Muḥammad, is an obligation for the Muslim community. Morally inferior “kingship”, which predominated in Muslim lands after the first four Sunnī caliphs, is only permissible in case of need. Nonetheless, Ibn Taymiyya maintains, kingship is only a minor sin, and Muslims should weigh up the benefits and detriments in the circumstances to attain the greatest possible benefit for religion. It might be beneficial, for example, to indulge a king’s wine drinking if calling upon him to stop would lead to the greater detriment of his apostasy from Islam. Moreover, Ibn Taymiyya explains, such weighing up of benefits and detriments is the way of the Prophet (Michot 2006: 14–7, 20, 50–3, 85–100; Hoover 2019a).


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