Dolly the sheep, the first mammal cloned from a somatic (body) cell, came into the world innocent as a lamb. However, soon after the announcement of her birth in February 1997 (Wilmut et al., 1997) she caused panic and controversy. An important, and for many people troubling question arose: if the cloning of sheep is possible, will scientists soon start cloning humans as well; and if they did, would this be wrong or unwise?
For most people, Dolly was really a wolf in sheep’s clothing. She represented a first undesirable and dangerous step to applying reproductive cloning in humans, something that many agreed should never be done. Only a small minority thought it was permissible, or even morally obligatory to conduct further research into human reproductive cloning. Some had no strong objections to it, but did not see any reason to promote it either.
Dolly is now stuffed and set up for display in the National Museum of Scotland. Many countries or jurisdictions have legally banned human cloning or are in the process of doing so. In some countries, including France and Singapore, reproductive cloning of humans is a criminal offence. In 2005, UNESCO adopted a ‘Declaration on Human Cloning’, which calls for a universal ban on human cloning (for an examination of the human cloning debate at UNESCO since 2008, see Langlois, 2017). The debate on human reproductive cloning seems to have drawn to a close. However, since reproductive cloning of mammals has become routine in several countries, there is reason to believe that at some point in the future, humans will be cloned too. Moreover, even if reproductive cloning will not be possible in the near future, cloning for research and therapeutic purposes is likely to be.
This entry describes the most important areas of disagreement regarding the ethics of cloning. I will focus on human cloning (as opposed to animal cloning), since human cloning has been the focus of the cloning debate.
- 1. What is Cloning?
- 2. Cloning for Research and Therapy
- 3. Human Reproductive Cloning
- 4. Religious perspectives
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. What is Cloning?
Strictly speaking, cloning is the creation of a genetic copy of a sequence of DNA or of the entire genome of an organism. In the latter sense, cloning occurs naturally in the birth of identical twins and other multiples. But cloning can also be done artificially in the laboratory via embryo twinning or splitting: an early embryo is split in vitro so that both parts, when transferred to a uterus, can develop into individual organisms genetically identical to each other. In the cloning debate, however, the term ‘cloning’ typically refers to a technique called somatic cell nuclear transfer (SCNT). SCNT involves transferring the nucleus of a somatic cell into an oocyte from which the nucleus and thus most of the DNA has been removed. (The mitochondrial DNA in the cytoplasm is still present). The manipulated oocyte is then treated with an electric current in order to stimulate cell division, resulting in the formation of an embryo. The embryo is (virtually) genetically identical to, and thus a clone of the somatic cell donor.
Dolly was the first mammal to be brought into the world using SCNT. Ian Wilmut and his team at the Roslin Institute in Scotland replaced the nucleus from an oocyte taken from a Blackface ewe with the nucleus of a cell from the mammary gland of a six-year old Finn Dorset sheep (these sheep have a white face). They transferred the resulting embryo into the uterus of a surrogate ewe and approximately five months later Dolly was born. Dolly had a white face: she was genetically identical to the Finn Dorset ewe from which the somatic cell had been obtained.
Dolly, however, was not 100% genetically identical to the donor animal. Genetic material comes from two sources: the nucleus and the mitochondria of a cell. Mitochondria are organelles that serve as power sources to the cell. They contain short segments of DNA. In Dolly’s case, her nuclear DNA was the same as the donor animal; other of her genetic materials came from the mitochondria in the cytoplasm of the enucleated oocyte. For the clone and the donor animal to be exact genetic copies, the oocyte too would have to come from the donor animal (or from the same maternal line – mitochondria are passed on by oocytes).
Dolly’s birth was a real breakthrough, for it proved that something that had been considered biologically impossible could indeed be done. Before Dolly, scientists thought that cell differentiation was irreversible: they believed that, once a cell has differentiated into a specialized body cell, such as a skin or liver cell, the process cannot be reversed. What Dolly demonstrated was that it is possible to take a differentiated cell, turn back its biological clock, and make the cell behave as though it was a recently fertilized egg.
Nuclear transfer can also be done using a donor cell from an embryo instead of from an organism after birth. Cloning mammals using embryonic cells has been successful since the mid-1980s (for a history of cloning, see Wilmut et al. 2001). Another technique to produce genetically identical offspring or clones is embryo twinning or embryo splitting, in which an early embryo is split in vitro so that both parts, when implanted in the uterus, can develop into individual organisms genetically identical to each other. This process occurs naturally with identical twins.
However, what many people find disturbing is the idea of creating a genetic duplicate of an existing person, or a person who has existed. That is why the potential application of SCNT in humans set off a storm of controversy. Another way to produce a genetic duplicate from an existing person is by cryopreserving one of two genetically identical embryos created in vitro for several years or decades before using it to generate a pregnancy. Lastly, reproductive cloning of humans could, in theory, also be achieved by combining the induced pluripotent stem cell technique with tetraploid complementation. Several research teams have succeeded in cloning mice this way (see, for example, Boland et al. 2009). The technique involves injecting mouse iPS cells in tetraploid embryos, i.e. embryos with twice the normal number of chromosomes that cannot result in live offspring. The resulting mouse pups are derived solely from the iPS cells, which means that the tetraploid embryos only acted as a substitute trophectoderm, which forms the placenta and other nourishing membranes but which does not contribute to the ‘embryo proper’.
Dolly is a case of reproductive cloning, the aim of which is to create offspring. Reproductive cloning is to be distinguished from cloning for therapy and research, sometimes also referred to as ‘therapeutic cloning’. Both reproductive cloning and cloning for research and therapy involve SCNT, but their aims, as well as most of the ethical concerns they raise, differ. I will first discuss cloning for research and therapy and will then proceed to outline the ethical debate surrounding reproductive cloning.
2. Cloning for Research and Therapy
Cloning for research and therapy involves the creation of an embryo via SCNT, but instead of transferring the cloned embryo to the uterus in order to generate a pregnancy, it is used to obtain pluripotent stem cells. It is thus not the intention to use the embryo for reproductive purposes. Embryonic stem cells offer powerful tools for developing therapies for currently incurable diseases and conditions, for important biomedical research, and for drug discovery and toxicity testing (Cervera & Stojkovic 2007). For example, one therapeutic approach is to induce embryonic stem cells to differentiate into cardiomyocytes (heart muscle cells) to repair or replace damaged heart tissue, into insulin-producing cells to treat diabetes, or into neurons and their supporting tissues to repair spinal cord injuries.
A potential problem with embryonic stem cells is that they will normally not be genetically identical to the patient. Embryonic stem cells are typically derived from embryos donated for research after in vitro fertilization (IVF) treatment. Because these stem cells would have a genetic identity different from that of the recipient – the patient – they may, when used in therapy, be rejected by her immune system. Immunorejection can occur when the recipient’s body does not recognize the transplanted cells, tissues or organs as its own and as a defense mechanism attempts to destroy the graft. Another type of immunorejection involves a condition called graft-versus-host disease, in which immune cells contaminating the graft recognize the new host – the patient – as foreign and attack the host’s tissues and organs. Both types of immunorejection can result in loss of the graft or death of the patient. It is one of the most serious problems faced in transplant surgery.
Cloning for research and therapy could potentially offer a solution to this problem. An embryo produced via SNCT using the patient’s somatic cell as a donor cell would be virtually genetically identical to the patient. Stem cells obtained from that embryo would thus also be genetically identical to the patient, as would be their derivatives, and would be less likely to be rejected after transplantation. Though therapies using embryonic stem cells from SCNT embryos are not yet on the horizon for humans, scientists have provided proof of concept for these therapies in the mouse.
Embryonic stem cells from cloned embryos would also have significant advantages for biomedical research, and for drug discovery and toxicity testing. Embryonic stem cells genetically identical to the patient could provide valuable in vitro models to study disease, especially where animal models are not available, where the research cannot be done in patients themselves because it would be too invasive, or where there are too few patients to work with (as in the case of rare genetic diseases). Researchers could, for example, create large numbers of embryonic stem cells genetically identical to the patient and then experiment on these in order to understand the particular features of the disease in that person. The embryonic stem cells and their derivatives could also be used to test potential treatments. They could, for example, be used to test candidate drug therapies to predict their likely toxicity. This would avoid dangerous exposure of patients to sometimes highly experimental drugs.
Cloning for research and therapy is, however, still in its infancy stages. In 2011, a team of scientists from the New York Stem Cell Foundation Laboratory was the first to have succeeded in creating two embryonic stem cell lines from human embryos produced through SCNT (Noggle et al. 2011). Three years earlier, a small San Diego biotechnological company created human embryos (at the blastocyst stage) via SCNT but did not succeed in deriving embryonic stem cells from these cells (French et al. 2008). Cloning for research and therapy is thus not likely to bear fruit in the short term though progress is made (Tachibana et al. 2013; Zhang et al. 2020). Apart from unsolved technical difficulties, much more basic research in embryonic stem cell research is needed. The term ‘therapeutic cloning’ has been criticized precisely for this reason. It suggests that therapy using embryonic stem cells from cloned embryos is already reality. In the phase before clinical trials, critics say, it is only reasonable to refer to research on nuclear transfer as ‘research cloning’ or ‘cloning for biomedical research’ (PCBE, 2002).
Cloning for research and therapy holds great potential for future research and therapeutic applications, but it also raises various ethical concerns.
2.1 Creating and Killing Embryos for Stem Cells
Much of the debate about the ethics of cloning for research and therapy turns on a basic disagreement about how we should treat early human embryos. As it is currently done, the isolation of embryonic stem cells involves the destruction of embryos at the blastocyst stage (day five after fertilization, when the embryo consists of 125–225 cells). But cloning for research and therapy not only involves the destruction of embryos, it also involves the creation of embryos solely for the purpose of stem cell derivation. Views on whether and when it is permissible to create embryos solely to obtain stem cells differ profoundly.
Some believe that an embryo, from the moment of conception, has the same moral status, that is, the same set of basic moral rights, claims or interests as an ordinary adult human being. This view is sometimes expressed by saying that the early embryo is a person. On this view, creating and killing embryos for stem cells is a serious moral wrong. It is impermissible, even if it could save many lives (Deckers 2007). Others believe that the early embryo is merely a cluster of cells or human tissue lacking any moral status. A common view among those who hold this position is that, given its promising potential, embryonic stem cell and cloning research is a moral imperative (Devolder & Savulescu 2006). Many defend a view somewhere in between these opposing positions. They believe, for example, that the early embryo should be treated with respect because it has an intermediate moral status: a moral status lower than that of a person but higher than that of an ordinary body cell. A popular view amongst those who hold this position is that using embryos for research might sometimes be justified. Respect can be demonstrated, it is typically argued, by using embryos only for very important research that cannot be done using less controversial means, and by acknowledging the use of embryos for research with a sense of regret or loss (Robertson 1995; Steinbock 2001). One common view among those who hold the intermediate moral status view is that the use of discarded IVF embryos to obtain stem cells is compatible with the respect we owe to the embryo, whereas the creation and use of cloned embryos is not. An argument underlying this view is that, unlike IVF embryos, cloned embryos are created for instrumental use only; they are created and treated as a mere means, which some regard as incompatible with respectful treatment of the embryo (NBAC 1999). Others (both proponents and opponents of embryo research) have denied that there is a significant moral difference between using discarded IVF embryos and cloned embryos as a source of stem cells. They have argued that if killing embryos for research is wrong, it is wrong regardless of the embryo’s origin (Doerflinger 1999; Fitzpatrick 2003; Devolder 2005, 2015). Douglas and Savulescu (2009) have argued that it is permissible to destroy ‘unwanted’ embryos in research, that is, embryos that no one wishes to use for reproductive purposes. Since both discarded IVF embryos and cloned embryos created for the purpose of stem cell derivation are unwanted embryos in that sense, it is, on their view, permissible to use both types of embryos for research.
A less common view holds that obtaining stem cells from cloned embryos poses fewer ethical problems than obtaining stem cells from discarded IVF embryos. Hansen (2002) has advanced this view, arguing that embryos resulting from SCNT do not have the same moral status we normally accord to other embryos: he calls the combination of a somatic nucleus and an enucleated egg a “transnuclear egg”, which, he says, is a mere “artifact” with no “natural purpose” or potential “to evolve into an embryo and eventually a human being,” and therefore falls outside the category of human beings. McHugh (2004) and Kiessling (2001) advance a similar argument. On their view, obtaining stem cells from cloned embryos is less morally problematic because embryos resulting from SCNT cannot (yet) develop further, and are thus better thought of as tissue culture, whereas IVF represents instrumental support for human reproduction. Since creating offspring is not the goal, they argue, it is misleading to use the term ‘embryo’ or ‘zygote’ to refer to the product of SCNT. They suggest to instead use the terms ‘clonote’ (Mc Hugh) and ‘ovasome’ (Kiessling).
2.2 The Need for Oocytes
Cloning for research and therapy requires a large number of high-quality donor oocytes. Ethical issues arise regarding how these oocytes could be obtained. Oocyte donation involves various risks and discomforts (for a review of the risks, see Committee on Assessing the Medical Risks of Human Oocyte Donation for Stem Cell Research, 2007). Among the most pressing ethical issues raised by participating in such donation is what model of informed consent should be applied. Unlike women who are considering IVF, non-medical oocyte donors are not clinical patients. They do not stand to derive any reproductive or medical benefit themselves from the donation (though Kalfoglou & Gittelsohn, 2000, argue that they may derive a psychological benefit). Magnus and Cho (2005) have argued that donating women should not be classified as research subjects since, unlike in other research, the risks to the donor do not lie in the research itself but in the procurement of the materials required for the research. They suggest that a new category named ‘research donors’ be created for those who expose themselves to substantial risk only for the benefit of others (in this case unidentifiable people in the future) and where the risk is incurred not in the actual research but in the procurement of the materials for the research. Informed consent for altruistic organ donation by living donors to strangers has also been suggested as a model, since, in both cases, the benefits will be for strangers and not for the donor. Critics of this latter suggestion have pointed out, however, that there is a disanalogy between these two types of donation. The general ethical rule reflected in regulations concerning altruistic donation, namely that there must be a high chance of a good outcome for the patient, is violated in the case of oocyte donation for cloning research (George 2007).
Given the risks to the donor, the absence of direct medical benefit for the donor, and the uncertain potential of cloning research, it is not surprising that the number of altruistic oocyte donations for such research is very low. Financial incentives might be needed to increase the supply of oocytes for cloning research. In some countries, including the US, selling and buying oocytes is legal. Some object to these practices because they consider oocytes as integral to the body and think they should be kept out of the market: on their view, the value of the human body and its parts should not be expressed in terms of money or other fungible goods. Some also worry that, through commercialization of oocytes, women themselves may become objects of instrumental use (Alpers &Lo 1995). Many agree, however, that a concern for commodification does not justify a complete ban on payment of oocyte donors and that justice requires that they be financially compensated for the inconvenience, burden, and medical risk they endure, as is standard for other research subjects (Steinbock 2004; Mertes &Pennings 2007). A related concern is the effect of financial or other offers of compensation on the voluntariness of oocyte donation. Women, especially economically disadvantaged women from developing countries, might be unduly induced or even coerced into selling their oocytes (Dickinson 2002). Baylis and McLeod (2007) have highlighted how difficult it is concomitantly to avoid both undue inducement and exploitation: a price that is too low risks exploitation; a price that avoids exploitation risks undue inducement.
Concerns about exploitation are not limited to concerns about payment, as became clear in the ‘Hwang scandal’ (for a review, see Saunders & Savulescu 2008). In 2004, Woo-Suk-Hwang, a leading Korean stem cell scientist, claimed to be the first to clone human embryos using SCNT and to extract stem cells from these embryos. In addition to finding that Hwang had fabricated many of his research results, Korea’s National Bioethics Committee also found that Hwang had pressured junior members of his lab to donate oocytes for his cloning experiments.
Some authors have argued that a regulated market in oocytes could minimize ethical concerns raised by the commercialization of oocytes and could be consistent with respect for women (Resnik 2001; Gruen 2007). Researchers are also investigating the use of alternative sources of oocytes, including animal oocytes, fetal oocytes, oocytes from adult ovaries obtained post mortem or during operation, and stem cell-derived oocytes. Scientists have already succeeded in creating human oocytes from embryonic stem cells (Ma et al. 2017; Saitou & Miyauchi 2016). Finally, another option is ‘egg-sharing’ where couples who are undergoing IVF for reproductive purposes have the option to donate one or two of their oocytes in return for a reduced fee for their fertility treatment. The advantage of this system is that it avoids exposing women to extra risks – these women were undergoing IVF in any case (Roberts & Throsby 2008).
2.3 Social Justice Considerations
Personalized cloning therapies are likely to be labor intensive and expensive. This has raised social justice concerns. Perhaps cloning therapies will only be a realistic option for the very rich? Some have replied to this concern by pointing out that Cloning therapies may become cheaper, less labor intensive and more widely accessible after time. Moreover, cloning may cure diseases and not only treat symptoms. Regardless of the economic cost, it remains true of course that the cloning procedure is time consuming, rendering it inappropriate for certain clinical applications where urgent intervention is required (e.g., myocardial infarction, acute liver failure or traumatic or infectious spinal cord damage). If cloning for therapy became available, its application would thus likely be restricted to chronic conditions. Wilmut (1997), who cloned Dolly, has suggested that cloning treatments could be targeted to maximize benefit: an older person with heart disease could be treated with stem cells that are not a genetic match, take drugs to suppress her immune system for the rest of her life, and live with the side-effects; a younger person might benefit from stem cells from cloned embryos that match exactly. Devolder and Savulescu (2006) have argued that objections about economic cost are most forceful against ‘cloning for self-transplantation’ than, for example, against cloning for developing cellular models of human disease. The latter will enable research into human diseases and may result in affordable therapies and cures for a variety of common diseases, such as cancer and heart disease, which afflict people all over the world. Finally, some have pointed out that it is not clear whether cloning research is necessarily more labor intensive than experiments on cells and tissues now done in animals.
Some are skeptical about the claimed benefits of cloning for research and therapy. They stress that for many diseases in which cloned embryonic stem cells might offer a therapy, there are alternative treatments and/or preventive measures in development, including gene therapy, pharmacogenomical solutions and treatments based on nanotechnology. It is often claimed that other types of stem cells such as adult stem cells and stem cells from the umbilical cord blood might enable us to achieve the same aims as cloning. Especially induced pluripotent stem cells (iPSCs) have raised the hope that cloning research is superfluous (Rao & Condic 2008). iPSCs are created through genetic manipulation of a body cell. iPSCs are similar to embryonic stem cells, and in particular to embryonic stem cells from cloned embryos. However, iPSC research could provide tissue- and patient-specific cells without relying on the need for human oocytes or the creation and destruction of embryos. iPSC research could thus avoid the ethical issues raised by cloning. This promise notwithstanding, scientists have warned that it would be premature to stop cloning research as iPSCs are not identical to embryonic stem cells (Pera & Trounson 2013). Cloning research may teach us things that iPSC research cannot teach us. Moreover, iPSC research has been said to fail to completely avoid the issue of embryo destruction (Brown 2009, Devolder 2015).
2.4 A Slippery Slope to Reproductive Cloning
Slippery slope arguments express the worry that permitting a certain practice may place us on a slippery slope to a dangerous or otherwise unacceptable outcome. Several commentators have argued that accepting or allowing cloning research is the first step that would place us on a slippery slope to reproductive cloning. As Leon Kass (1998, 702) has put it: “once the genies put the cloned embryos into the bottles, who can strictly control where they go?”
Others are more skeptical about slippery slope arguments against cloning and think that effective legislation can prevent us from sliding down the slope (Savulescu 1999; Devolder & Savulescu 2006). If reproductive cloning is unacceptable, these critics say, it is reasonable to prohibit this specific technology rather than to ban non-reproductive applications of cloning. The UK and Belgium, for example, allow cloning research but prohibit the transfer of cloned embryos to the uterus.
Apart from the question of how slippery the slope might be, another question raised by such arguments concerns the feared development –reproductive cloning– and whether it is really ethically objectionable. Profound disagreement exists about the answer to this question.
3. Human Reproductive Cloning
The central argument in favor of reproductive cloning is expansion of opportunities for reproduction. Reproductive cloning could offer a new means for prospective parents to satisfy their reproductive goals or desires. Infertile individuals or couples could have a child that is genetically related to them. In addition, individuals, same sex couples, or couples who cannot together produce an embryo would no longer need donor gametes to reproduce if cloning were available (some might still need donor eggs for the cloning procedure, but these would be enucleated so that only the mitochondrial DNA remains). It would then be possible to avoid that one’s child shares half of her nuclear DNA with a gamete donor.
Using cloning to help infertile people to have a genetically related child, or a child that is only genetically related to them, has been defended on the grounds of human wellbeing, personal autonomy, and the satisfaction of the natural inclination to produce offspring (Häyry 2003; Strong 2008). Offering individuals or couples the possibility to reproduce using cloning technology has been said to be consistent with the right to reproductive freedom, which, according to some, implies the right to choose what kind of children we will have (Brock 1998, 145).
According to some, the main benefit of reproductive cloning is that it would enable prospective parents to control what genome their children will be endowed with (Fletcher 1988, Harris 1997, 2004; Pence 1998, 101–6; Tooley 1998). Cloning would enable parents to have a child with a genome identical to that of a person with good health and/or other desirable characteristics.
Another possible use of reproductive cloning is to create a child that is a tissue match for a sick sibling. The stem cells from the umbilical cord blood or from the bone marrow of the cloned child could be used to treat the diseased sibling. Such ‘saviour siblings’, have already been created through sexual reproduction or, more efficiently, through a combination of IVF, preimplantation genetic diagnosis and HLA testing.
Many people, however, have expressed concerns about human reproductive cloning. For some, these concerns are sufficient to reject human cloning. For others, these concerns should be weighed against reasons for reproductive cloning.
What follows is an outline of some of the main areas of concern and disagreement about human reproductive cloning.
3.1 Safety and Efficiency
Despite the successful creation of viable offspring via SCNT in various mammalian species, researchers still have limited understanding of how the technique works on the subcellular and molecular level. Although the overall efficiency and safety of reproductive cloning in mammals has significantly increased over the past fifteen years, it is not yet a safe process (Whitworth & Prather 2010). For example, the rate of abortions, stillbirths and developmental abnormalities remains high. Another source of concern is the risk of premature ageing because of shortened telomeres. Telomeres are repetitive DNA sequences at the tip of chromosomes that get shorter as an animal gets older. When the telomeres of a cell get so short that they disappear, the cell dies. The concern is that cloned animals may inherit the shortened telomeres from their older progenitor, with possibly premature aging and a shortened lifespan as a result.
For many, the fact that reproductive cloning is unsafe provides a sufficient reason not to pursue it. It has been argued that it would simply be wrong to impose such significant health risks on humans. The strongest version of this argument states that it would be wrong now to produce a child using SCNT because it would constitute a case of wrongful procreation. Some adopt a consent-based objection and condemn cloning because the person conceived cannot consent to being exposed to significant risks involved in the procedure (Kass 1998; PCBE 2002). Against this, it has been argued that even if reproductive cloning is unsafe, it may still be permissible if there are no safer means to bring that very same child into existence so long as the child is expected to have a life worth living (Strong 2005).
With the actual rate of advancement in cloning, one cannot exclude a future in which the safety and efficiency of SCNT will be comparable or superior to that of IVF or even sexual reproduction. A remaining question is, then, whether those who condemn cloning because of its experimental nature should continue to condemn it morally and legally. Some authors have reasoned that if, in the future, cloning becomes safer than sexual reproduction, we should even make it our reproductive method of choice (Fletcher 1988; Harris 2004, Ch. 4).
3.2 Harm to the Individual Conceived through Cloning
3.2.1 A Threat to Autonomy
Some fear that cloning threatens the identity and individuality of the clone, thus reducing her autonomy (Ramsey 1966; Kitcher 1997; Annas 1998; Kass 1998). This may be bad in itself, or bad because it might reduce the clone’s wellbeing. It may also be bad because it will severely restrict the array of life plans open to the clone, thus violating her ‘right to an open future’ (a concept developed in Feinberg 1980). In its report ‘Human Cloning and Human Dignity: An Ethical Inquiry’, the US President’s Council on Bioethics (2002) wrote that being genetically unique is “an emblem of independence and individuality” and allows us to go forward “with a relatively indeterminate future in front of us” (Ch. 5, Section c). Such concerns have formed the basis of strong opposition to cloning.
The concern that cloning threatens the clone’s identity and individuality has been criticized for relying on the mistaken belief that who and what we become is entirely determined by our genes. Such genetic determinism is clearly false. Though genes influence our personal development, so does the complex and irreproducible context in which our lives take place. We know this, among others, from studying monozygotic twins. Notwithstanding the fact that such twins are genetically identical to each other and, therefore, sometimes look very similar and often share many character traits, habits and preferences, they are different individuals, with different identities (Segal 2000). Thus, it is argued, having a genetic duplicate does not threaten one’s individuality, or one’s distinct identity.
Brock (2002) has pointed out that one could nevertheless argue that even though individuals created through cloning would be unique individuals with a distinct identity, they might not experience it that way. What is threatened by cloning then is not the individual’s identity or individuality, but her sense of identity and individuality, and this may reduce her autonomy. So even if a clone has a unique identity, she may experience more difficulties in establishing her identity than if she had not been a clone.
But here too critics have relied on the comparison with monozygotic twins. Harris (1997, 2004) and Tooley (1998), for example, have pointed out that each twin not only has a distinct identity, but generally also views him or herself as having a distinct identity, as do their relatives and friends. Moreover, so they argue, an individual created through cloning would likely be of a different age than her progenitor. There may even be several generations between them. A clone would thus in essence be a ‘delayed’ twin. Presumably this would make it even easier for the clone to view herself as distinct from the progenitor than if she had been genetically identical to someone her same age.
However, the reference to twins as a model to think about reproductive cloning has been criticized, for example, because it fails to reflect important aspects of the parent-child relationship that would incur if the child were a clone of one of the rearing parents (Jonas 1974; Levick 2004). Because of the dominance of the progenitor, the risk of reduced autonomy and confused identity may be greater in such a situation than in the case of ordinary twins. Moreover, just because the clone would be a delayed twin, she may have the feeling that her life has already been lived or that she is predetermined to do the same things as her progenitor (Levy & Lotz 2005). This problem may be exacerbated by others constantly comparing her life with that of the progenitor, and having problematic expectations based on these comparisons. The clone may feel under constant pressure to live up to these expectations (Kass 1998; Levick 2004, 101; Sandel 2007, 57–62), or may have the feeling she leads ‘a life in the shadow’ of the progenitor (Holm 1998; PCBE 2002, Ch.5). This may especially be the case if the clone was created as a ‘replacement’ for a deceased child. (Some private companies already offer to clone dead pets to create replacements pets.) The fear is that the ‘ghost of the dead child’ will get more attention and devotion than the replacement child. Parents may expect the clone to be like the lost child, or some idealized image of it, which could hamper the development of her identity and adversely affect her self-esteem (Levick 2004, 111–132). Finally, another reason why the clone’s autonomy may be reduced is because she would be involuntarily informed about her genetic predispositions. A clone who knows that her genetic parent developed a severe single gene disease at the age of forty will realise it is very likely that she will undergo the same fate. Unlike individuals who choose to have themselves genetically tested, clones who know their genetic parent’s medical history will be involuntarily informed.
These concerns have been challenged on several grounds. Some believe that it is plausible that, through adequate information, we could largely correct mistaken beliefs about the link between genetic and personal identity, and thus reduce the risk of problematic expectations toward the clone (Harris 1997, 2004; Tooley 1998, 84–5; Brock 1998, Pence 1998). Brock (1998) and Buchanan et al. (2000, 198) have argued that even if people persist in these mistaken beliefs and their attitudes or actions lead to cloned individuals believing they do not have an open future, this does not imply that the clone’s right to ignorance about one’s personal future or to an open future has actually been violated. Pence (1998, 138) has argued that having high expectations, even if based on false beliefs, is not necessarily a bad thing. Parents with high expectations often give their children the best chances to lead a happy and successful life. Brock (2002, 316) has argued that parents now also constantly restrict the array of available life plans open to their children, for example, by selecting their school or by raising them according to certain values. Though this may somewhat restrict the child’s autonomy, there will always be enough decisions to take for the child to be autonomous, and to realize this. According to Brock, it is not clear why this should be different in the case of cloning. He also points out that there may be advantages to being a ‘delayed twin’ (154). For example, one may acquire knowledge about the progenitor’s medical history and use this knowledge to live longer, or to increase one’s autonomy. One could, for example, use the information to reduce the risk of getting the disease or condition, or to at least postpone its onset, by behavioral changes, an appropriate diet and/or preventive medication. This would not be possible, however, if the disease is untreatable (for example, Huntington’s Disease). Harris (2004, Ch.1) has stressed that information about one’s genetic predispositions for certain diseases would also allow one to take better informed reproductive decisions. Cloning would allow us to give our child a ‘tried and tested’ genome, not one created by the genetic lottery of sexual reproduction and the random combination of chromosomes.
3.2.2 The clone will be treated as a means
Cloning arouses people’s imagination about the clone, but also about those who will choose to have a child through cloning. Often dubious motives are ascribed to them: they would want a child that is ‘just like so-and-so’ causing people to view children as objects or as commodities like a new car or a new house (Putnam 1997, 7–8). They would want an attractive child (a clone of Scarlett Johansson) or a child with tennis talent (a clone of Victoria Azarenka) purely to show off. Dictators would want armies of clones to achieve their political goals. People would clone themselves out of vanity. Parents would clone their existing child so that the clone can serve as an organ bank for that child, or would clone their deceased child to have a replacement child. The conclusion is then that cloning is wrong because the clone will be used as a mere means to others’ ends. These critiques have also been expressed with regard to other forms of assisted reproduction; but some worry that individuals created through cloning may be more likely to be viewed as commodities because their total genetic blueprint would be chosen – they would be “fully made and not begotten” (Ramsey 1966; Kass 1998; PCBE 2002, 107).
Strong (2008) has argued that these concerns are based on a fallacious inference. It is one thing to desire genetically related children, and something else to believe that one owns one’s children or that one considers one’s children as objects, he writes. Other commentators, however, have pointed out that even if parents themselves do not commodify their children, cloning might still have an impact on society as a whole, thereby increasing the tendency of others to do so (Levy & Lotz 2005; Sandel 2007). A related concern expressed by Levick (2004, 184–5) is that allowing cloning might result in a society where ‘production on demand’ clones are sold for adoption to people who are seeking to have children with special abilities – a clearer case of treating children as objects.
But suppose some people create a clone for instrumental reasons, for example, as a stem cell donor for a sick sibling. Does this imply that the clone will be treated merely as a means? Critics of this argument have pointed out that parents have children for all kinds of instrumental reasons, including the benefit for the husband-wife relationship, continuity of the family name, and the economic and psychological benefits children provide when their parents become old (Harris 2004, 41–2, Pence 1998). This is generally not considered problematic as long as the child is also valued in its own right. What is most important in a parent-child relationship is the love and care inherent in that relationship. They stress the fact that we judge people on their attitudes toward children, rather than on their motives for having them. They also deny that there is a strong link between one’s intention or motive to have a child, and the way one will treat the child.
3.2.3 Societal Prejudice and Respect for Clones
Another concern is that clones may be the victims of unjustified discrimination and will not be respected as persons (Deech 1999; Levick 2004, 185–187). Savulescu (2005, Other Internet Resources) has referred to such negative attitudes towards clones as ‘clonism’: a new form of discrimination against a group of humans who are different in a non-morally significant way. But does a fear for ‘clonism’ constitute a good reason for rejecting cloning? Savulescu and others have argued that, if it is, then we must conclude that racist attitudes and discriminatory behavior towards people with a certain ethnicity provides a good reason for people with that ethnicity not to procreate. This, according to these critics, is a morally objectionable way to solve the problem of racism. Instead of limiting people’s procreative liberty we should combat existing prejudices and discrimination. Likewise, it is argued, instead of prohibiting cloning out of concern for clonism, we should combat possible prejudices and discrimination against clones (see also Pence 1998, 46; Harris 2004, 92–93). Macintosh (2005, 119–21) has warned that by expressing certain concerns about cloning one may actually reinforce certain prejudices and misguided stereotypes about clones. For example, saying that a clone would not have a personal identity prejudges the clone as inferior or fraudulent (the idea that originals are more valuable than their copies) or even less than human (as individuality is seen as an essential characteristic of human nature).
3.2.4 Complex Family Relationships
Some worry that cloning will threaten traditional family structures; a fear that has come up in debates about gay people adopting children, IVF and other assisted reproduction techniques. But in cloning the situation would be more complex as it may blur generational boundaries (McGee 2000) and the clone would likely be confused about her kinship ties (Kass 1998; O’Neil 2002, 67–68). For example, a woman who has a child conceived through cloning would actually be the twin of her child and the woman’s mother would, genetically, be its mother, not grandmother. Some have argued against these concerns, replying that a cloned child would not necessarily be more confused about her family ties than other children. Many have four nurturing parents because of a divorce, never knew their genetic parents, have nurturing parents that are not their genetic parents, or think that their nurturing father is also their genetic father when in fact he is not. While these complex family relationships can be troubling for some children, they are not insurmountable, critics say. Harris (2004, 77–78) argues that there are many aspects about the situation one is born and raised in that may be troublesome. As with all children, the most important thing is the relation with people who nurture and educate them, and children usually know very well who these people are. There is no reason to believe that with cloning, this will be any different. Onora O’Neil (2002, 67–8) argues that such responses are misplaced. While she acknowledges that there are already children now with confused family relationships, she argues that it is very different when prospective parents seek such potentially confused relationships for their children from the start.
3.3 Harm to Others
Other concerns related to cloning focus on the potential harmful effects of cloning for others. Sometimes these concerns are related to those about the wellbeing of the clone. For example, McGee’s concern about confused family relationships not only bears on the clone but also on society as a whole. However, since I have already mentioned this concern, I will, in the remainder of this entry, focus on other arguments
3.3.1 Adoption and the Importance of Genetic Links
It is often claimed that the strongest reason for why reproductive cloning should be permissible, if safe, is that it will allow infertile people to have a genetically related child. This position relies on the view that having genetically related children is morally significant and valuable. This is a controversial view. For example, Levy and Lotz (2005) and Rulli (2016) have denied the importance of a genetic link between parents and their children. Moreover, they have argued that claiming that this link is important will give rise to bad consequences, such as reduced adoption rates (and, in Rulli’s case, a failure to fulfil one’s duty to adopt) and diminished resources for improving the life prospects of the disadvantaged, including those waiting to be adopted. Levick (2004, 185) and Ahlberg and Brighouse (2011) have also advanced this view. Since, according to these authors, these undesirable consequences would be magnified if we allowed human cloning, we have good reason to prohibit it. In response, Strong (2008) has argued that this effect is uncertain, and that there are other, probably more effective, ways to help such children or to prevent them from ending up in such a situation. Moreover, if cloning is banned, infertile couples may make use of donor embryos or gametes rather than adoption. Rob Sparrow (2006) has pointed out another potential problem for those who defend reproductive cloning for the reason that it will overcome infertility by providing a genetically related child. According to Sparrow, cloning just doesn’t provide the right sort of genetic relation to make those who use the technology the parents of the child.So, in order to justify reproductive cloning one then has to emphasise the importance of the intention with which the parents bring the cloned child into the world, rather than the genetic relationship with the child. And this emphasis works to undermine the justification for reproductive cloning in the first place.
3.3.2 Genetic Diversity
Another concern is that because cloning is an asexual way of reproducing it would decrease genetic variation among offspring and, in the long run, might even constitute a threat to the human race. The gene pool may narrow sufficiently to threaten humanity’s resistance to disease (AMA 1999, 6). In response, it has been argued that if cloning becomes possible, the number of people who will choose it as their mode of reproduction will very likely be too low to constitute a threat to genetic diversity. It would be unlikely to be higher than the rate of natural twinning, which, occurring at a rate of 3.5/1000 children, does not seriously impact on genetic diversity. Further, even if millions of people would create children through cloning, the same genomes will not be cloned over and over: each person would have a genetic copy of his or her genome, which means the result will still be a high diversity of genomes. Others argue that, even if genetic diversity were not diminished by cloning, a society that supports reproductive cloning might be taken to express the view that variety is not important. Conveying such a message, these authors say, could have harmful consequences for society.
Some see the increase in control of what kind of genome we want to pass on to our children as a positive development. A major concern, however, is that this shift ‘from chance to choice’ will lead to problematic eugenic practices.
One version of this concern states that cloning would, from the outset, constitute a problematic form of eugenics. However, critics have argued that this is implausible: the best explanations of what was wrong with immoral cases of eugenics, such as the Nazi eugenic programs, are that they involved coercion and were motivated by objectionable moral beliefs or false non-moral beliefs. This would not necessarily be the case were cloning to be implemented now (Agar 2004; Buchanan 2007). Unlike the coercive and state-directed eugenics of the past, new ‘liberal eugenics’ defends values such as autonomy, reproductive freedom, beneficence, empathy and the avoidance of harm (Agar, 2004). Enthusiasts of so-called ‘liberal eugenics’ are interested in helping individuals to prevent or diminish the suffering and increase the well-being of their children by endowing them with certain genes.
Another version of the eugenics concern points out the risk of a slippery slope: the claim is that cloning will lead to objectionable forms of eugenics—for example, coercive eugenics—in the future. After all, historical cases of immoral eugenics often developed from earlier well intentioned and less problematic practices (for a history of eugenics as well as an analysis of philosophical and political issues raised by eugenics, see Kevles 1985 and Paul 1995). According to Sandel (2007, Ch.5), for example, ‘liberal eugenics’ might imply more state compulsion than first appears: just as governments can force children to go to school, they could require people to use genetics to have ‘better’ children.
A related concern expressed by Sandel (2007, 52–7) is that cloning, and enhancement technologies in general, may result in a society in which parents will not accept their child for what it is, reinforcing an already existing trend of heavily managed, high-pressure child-rearing or ‘hyper-parenting’. Asch and Wasserman (2005, 202) have expressed a similar concern; arguing that having more control over what features a child has can pose an “affront to an ideal of unconditioned devotion”. Another concern, most often expressed by disability rights advocates, is that if cloning is used to have ‘better’ children, it may create a more intolerant climate towards those with a disability or a serious disease, and that such practices can express negative judgments about people with disabilities. This argument has also been advanced in the debate about selective abortion, prenatal testing, and preimplantation genetic diagnosis. Disagreement exists about whether these effects are likely. For example, Buchanan et al. (2002, 278) have argued that one can devalue disability while valuing existing disabled people and that trying to help parents who want to avoid having a disabled child does not imply that society should make no efforts to increase accessibility for existing people with disabilities.
3.4 Human Dignity
UNESCO’s Universal Declaration on the Human Genome and Human Rights (1997) was the first international instrument to condemn human reproductive cloning as a practice against human dignity. Article 11 of this Declaration states: “Practices which are contrary to human dignity, such as reproductive cloning of human beings, shall not be permitted…” This position is shared by the World Health Organization, the European Parliament and several other international instruments. Critics have pointed out that the reference to human dignity is problematic as it is rarely specified how human dignity is to be understood, whose dignity is at stake, and how dignity is relevant to the ethics of cloning (Harris 2004, Ch.2, Birnbacher 2005, McDougall 2008,). Some commentators state that it is the copying of a genome which violates human dignity (Kass 1998); others have pointed out that this interpretation could be experienced as an offence to genetically identical twins, and that we typically do not regard twins as a threat to human dignity (although some societies in the past did), nor do we prevent twins from coming into existence. On the contrary, IVF, which involves an increased ‘risk’ of having twins, is a widely accepted fertility treatment.
Human dignity is most often related to Kant’s second formulation of the Categorical Imperative, namely the idea that we should never use a person merely as a means to an end. I have, however, already discussed this concern in section 4.2.2.
4. Religious perspectives
No unified religious perspective on human cloning exists; indeed, there are a diversity of opinions within each individual religious tradition. For an overview of the evaluation of cloning by the main religious groups see, for example, Cole-Turner (1997) and Walters (2004). For a specifically Jewish perspective on cloning, see, for example, Lipschutz (1999), for an Islamic perspective, Sadeghi (2007) and for a Catholic perspective, Doerflinger (1999).
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Other Internet Resources
- UNESCO, “Universal Declaration on the Human Genome and Human Rights”, adopted 11 November 1997.