Notes to Disability and Justice

1. Moreover, proportionality is not an absolute requirement of justice—in some contexts (though probably not parking), the opportunity costs of achieving proportionality might be too great, taking resources that were more urgently required elsewhere to redress or reduce injustice.

2. The appearance of a closer connection between causation and justice may reflect the use of the same moral baseline for determining both, i.e., the view that a disadvantage is caused by a social arrangement if and only if it would not have existed under a morally-privileged baseline—e.g., a state of nature or a collectivist utopia. If causation is assessed by the latter baseline, then any disadvantage caused by an existing social arrangement will be an injustice. But the use of such a baseline for determining causation or justice needs to be justified. (See note 9.)

3. For a distinction between several ways in which social institutions can causally contribute to the distribution of advantage, and an argument that these distinctions are morally relevant to the assessment of justice claims, see Pogge 2004a,b.

4. The term “stimming” is short for self-stimulatory behavior, sometimes also called “stereotypic” behavior. In a person with autism, stimming usually refers to specific behaviors such as flapping, rocking, spinning, or repetition of words and phrases.

5. Profound intellectual and psychiatric impairments may also pose serious challenges for the medical model, in that many of those impairments may be difficult to understand as biomedical dysfunction or disease or to treat with biomedical interventions.

6. One case that appears to present a clear contrast involved the installation of a ramp for a White Mountain hut in New Hampshire. The hut was accessible only by trails that appeared too rough and steep for wheelchair users. Proponents of the ramp did not argue for the reconstruction of the rugged trails, but for the symbolic value of the ramp as welcoming visitors who “mobilized” in varying ways. Critics argued that given the trails’ inaccessibility, the ramp’s “welcome” was an idle, even disingenuous, gesture of recognition. A distributive aspect was introduced, however, when several wheelchair users reached the hut by trail, with considerable assistance from other hikers, and availed themselves of the ramp. Despite their achievement, it is difficult to justify the ramp as a distributive measure, since the companions needed to help the wheelchair users up the steep trail could surely have helped them up the small set of steps leading to a hut, as could a high-tech trail-mastering wheelchair. But requiring such a final effort would have been a deficient welcome—the hut is supposed to be a place where hikers can rest and lay down their loads, not a site for further exertion. The ramp’s significance as recognition, as opposed to redistribution, might thus have been strengthened by the occasional appearance of wheelchair users.

7. It may be tempting to respond to such claims by invoking a state of nature as a baseline for assessing which disadvantages are natural. The thought is that if we “subtract away” society’s contribution to disadvantage, which is man-made, then we are left with the contribution of impairment alone, which is “natural.” But states of nature are artificial constructs, and the conclusions yielded by their examination largely depend on the features built into them. Proponents of a medical model of disability might invoke a Hobbesian state of nature, wherein people who are missing limbs or senses would be at a fatal disadvantage in the war of all against all. It should be apparent that such a state of nature is not merely a fiction, but an implausible one: any human environment contains pervasive artifice, technology, some social order, and an implicit or explicit system of entitlements. There is no obvious reason for relying on a hypothetical state of affairs lacking these features as a baseline for assessing the causal role of impairments, or the advantages conferred on people with impairments in moving to a political state. In contrast, some disability activists appear to invoke an environment of limitless resources and technologically-assisted access. Although the reliance on such an environment as a baseline may seem utopian, it can more reasonably be seen as a corrective for the tendency to take the present environment as fixed or past environments as nasty and brutish (Gliedman and Roth 1980: 13–15; Wasserman 2001). Some philosophers have attempted to make the distinction between artificial and natural disadvantages without recourse to a state of nature (see Lippert-Rasmussen 2004 and Nagel 1997). But in the absence of an accepted basis for making the distinction, what counts as “natural” for humanity remains a contentious normative judgment.

8. A second, related, way in which distributive justice theorists have approached social and cultural identity is as a commitment that gives rise to inefficiencies in the conversion of resources into welfare. A culture with elaborate traditions of celebration and gift giving may be more expensive to maintain than one emphasizing simplicity and austerity, though no less central to its participants’ well being. But even if a culture is not inherently expensive, it may be costly to sustain if only a small number or proportion of the population participates in it (Heath 1998; Kymlicka 1989). This view of culture is similar to the conventional view of disability in distributive justice—an unchosen circumstance that makes it harder to convert resources into welfare. Though culture may be more voluntary than disability, both are subject to varying identification—an individual may repudiate or embrace a culture, or regard a disability as a burden to be alleviated or an identity to be affirmed. To the extent that either is regarded as more of a choice than a circumstance—to employ a standard distinction in distributive justice—it might appear that its additional costs should not be collectively borne. But to the extent that those additional costs arise not from anything inherent in the culture or disability, but from its minority status, there is a stronger case for collective support—its cost is attributable to bad demographic luck (Kymlicka 1989). In treating the disadvantages of people with disabilities as due in significant part to their position as a statistical minority, this view of disability has interesting affinities with the human variation model.

9. Appiah also notes that individual identity may have features that do not form the basis of a collective identity and for which there is no corresponding social category. These features may be in a sense social, but they differ from features like race, religion, or sex in that there are no societal expectations for how people who share those features ought to behave. Thus, for example freelance workers are creating group spaces to work, to give them community despite their deliberately independent styles of work. But there are at present no societal expectations governing their behavior. Admittedly, the line between an individual’s personal and the collective dimensions of individual identity is somewhat fuzzy, but the distinction is helpful when we move on to consider whether disability status is or should be an aspect of individual identity.

10. The sentence in the text reflects a distinction between “Deaf” as a culture and “deaf” as a lack of hearing.

11. Deaf culture necessarily lacks this enveloping and insular quality in part because of the epidemiology of deafness: most deaf children are raised by hearing parents, and vice-versa, and except for occasional concentrations, (like Martha’s Vineyard in the nineteenth century), deaf people are geographically dispersed.

Copyright © 2019 by
Daniel Putnam <>
David Wasserman <>
Jeffrey Blustein <>
Adrienne Asch

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