Doing vs. Allowing Harm

First published Tue May 14, 2002; substantive revision Wed Jul 7, 2021

Is there a moral difference between doing harm and merely[1] allowing harm? If not, there should be no moral objection to active euthanasia in circumstances where passive euthanasia is permissible; and there should be no objection to bombing innocent civilians where doing so will minimize the overall number of deaths in war. There should, however, be an objection—indeed, an outcry—at our failure to prevent the deaths of millions of children in the third world from malnutrition, dehydration, and measles.[2] Moreover, it seems that the question is pertinent to whether consequentialism is true, as consequentialists believe that doing harm is no worse than merely allowing harm while anti-consequentialists, almost universally, disagree. But is there a moral difference between doing harm and merely allowing harm? We might divide approaches to this question into two broad kinds. First, those that attempt to answer it without saying anything about the nature of the distinction either by use of examples (‘the contrast strategy’) or by appealing to considerations that are purportedly independent of the precise nature of distinction. And, second, those that analyze the distinction in depth and try to show that its underlying nature dictates an answer to the moral question.

1. The Contrast Strategy and Analysis-Independent Justifications

James Rachels (1975) provides a classic example of the contrast strategy.[3] He offers us a pair of cases—in one, Smith drowns his young cousin in the bathtub; in the other, Jones plans to drown his young cousin, but finds the boy already unconscious under water and refrains from saving him. The two cases are designed to be exactly alike except that the first is a killing and the second a letting die. Rachels invites us to agree that Smith’s behavior is no worse than Jones’s. He then concludes that killing per se is no worse than letting die per se, and that if typical killings are worse than typical lettings die that must be because of other factors.

Rachels’ argument depends on two claims: (1) the two cases are exactly alike except that one is a killing and the other a letting die; (2) that there is no moral difference between the cases. Both these claims have been challenged.

Scott Hills (2018) challenges (1). He argues that the cases are not properly equalised because Jones has the ability to either kill his cousin or to let him die, while Smith does not have the option to merely let his cousin die. Hills adds a third case in which the agent finds his cousin drowning and chooses to kill him rather than let him die. Hills argues that this behaviour is worse than both Jones’ letting die and Smith’s killing while lacking the option to let die. Hills argues that the best explanation for our intuitions about this third case is that killing is worse than letting die.

Although most people struggle to see a moral difference between Smith’s behavior and Jones’ behavior, Frances Kamm (2007) argues that the cases might not be intuitively morally equivalent. She suggests that we test the apparent moral equivalence by asking whether we could imposes the same losses on Jones and Smith, assuming these were necessary to bring the child back to life. Kamm claims that it would be permissible to kill Smith to bring the child back to life but impermissible to kill Jones for this reason (Kamm 2007, 17). If Kamm is right, then there is an intuitive difference between the two cases.[4]

Even if Rachels were correct that Smith’s and Jones’s behavior is morally equivalent, we may not be able to infer the moral equivalence of killing and letting die in general (where other things are equal) from this. Shelly Kagan argues that this inference assumes that “if a factor has genuine moral relevance, then for any pair of cases, where the given factor varies while others are held constant, the cases in that pair will differ in moral status” (Kagan 1988). He claims, moreover, that this assumes the Additive Assumption, the view that “the status of the act is the net balance or sum which is the result of adding up the separate positive and negative effects of the individual factors” (Kagan 1988, 259). He raises several objections to the Additive Assumption. Firstly, one might describe a pair of cases that are exactly alike except that one is a killing and the other a letting die, where the first intuitively seems far worse than the second. If this pair of cases is as good as Rachels’ pair, then either the inference is valid in both cases—to prove the contradiction that killing is both worse and not worse than letting die—or it is invalid in both cases. Secondly, one might raise the rhetorical question: why addition—rather than, say, multiplication or some other function? Similarly, Kamm (1996, 2007) defends a Principle of Contextual Interaction according to which a property can behave differently in one context than another.[5]

Quinn (1989) argues that would-be counterexamples like the Bathtub case involve a misunderstanding of the claim that the distinction between doing and allowing harm is morally significant. This claim should be understood as more about moral justification than about other forms of moral evaluation. Quinn thinks that the distinction between doing and allowing is morally significant not because there is some kind of intrinsic disvalue attached to doing harm, but because doing and allowing harm run up against different kinds of rights. On Quinn’s view, the right against doing harm is stronger in that it takes much more to defeat or over-ride it. Thus much stronger considerations are needed to justify doing harm than to justify merely allowing harm (other things being equal). Suppose doing harm is much harder to justify than merely allowing harm (other things being equal). An unjustified killing and an unjustified letting die may still be equally bad. Quinn illustrates this with an example: You have a right of privacy that the police not enter your home without your permission. This right is easier to defeat than your right that other ordinary citizens not enter your home without permission. Nonetheless, unjustified break-ins by the police are, if anything, morally worse than unjustified break-ins by ordinary citizens. Quinn claims that this is because “moral blame for the violation of a right depends very much more on motive and expected harm than on the degree to which the right is defeasible” (Quinn 1989, 290)

Samuel Scheffler (2004) also attempts to settle the moral significance of the distinction between doing and allowing without offering an account of the distinction. He argues that: “despite the lack of consensus about which candidate is to be preferred, our practice of treating one another as responsible agents requires us to make some distinction of this kind” (Scheffler 2004, 216). Scheffler’s paper is rich and correspondingly difficult to interpret. However, the main argument seems to consist of two parts. In the first part, Scheffler argues that to hold oneself and others to moral requirements, one must already (a) draw a distinction between what one does and what one merely allows (or some other similar distinction) and (b) treat this distinction as morally important. To hold oneself to moral requirements involves seeing oneself as having reason to act in one way rather than another. One must therefore see oneself as an agent who is charged with the task of regulating one’s conduct in accordance with reasons. However, regulating one’s behavior is something one does, not something one merely allows to happen. Thus to hold oneself to a moral requirement is to attach a special importance to, and accept special responsibility for, what one does (Scheffler 2004, 220–227). In the second part, Scheffler argues that this distinction in moral significance needs to be included in the moral requirements themselves: i.e. the set of requirements we hold each other to must draw a distinction between what the agent does and what she merely allows. Scheffler argues that holding oneself to a set of moral requirements which require one to make optimal use of our causal opportunities is unstable. Such a set of moral requirements would require a purely instrumental view of the agency of oneself and others: we assess conduct purely in terms of whether it produces the optimal available outcome. However, holding oneself and others to moral requirements involves adopting a non-instrumental view of agency: (1) The reasons one has to regulate one’s conduct must be non-instrumental; (2) Holding oneself and others to moral requirements involves seeing failure to live up to such requirements as meriting responses such as blame. Because whether blame is merited is not settled by whether it would produce the best outcome, this requires us to recognise non-instrumental reasons (Scheffler 2004, 227–236).[6]

Others have taken an account of the nature of the doing/allowing distinction to be a necessary starting point for assessing its moral relevance. On this view, we cannot assess whether the difference between doing and allowing is morally significant until we know what that distinction is. Before discussing some prominent approaches to the analysis of the doing/allowing distinction and related assessments of its moral relevance, we will clear the way by identifying some related distinctions that are sometimes confused with the doing/allowing distinction.

2. Distinguishing Distinctions

Suppose some upshot occurs and would not have occurred if the agent had behaved in some different way. The question of whether the agent counts as doing or allowing may be conflated with or distorted by questions that should be kept distinct from it, like the questions of (i) whether the agent intended the upshot, (ii) whether she could easily have prevented the upshot, (iii) whether she guaranteed the upshot or merely made it probable, and even (iv) whether the agent’s behavior was morally objectionable. It can easily be seen that these do not coincide with the distinction between doing and allowing.

(i) Consider the distinction between cases where an agent intends the upshot and cases where she does not. If you drive your car into someone’s body, without realizing it, or because you were trying to avoid killing a larger number, and she dies as a result, you undoubtedly killed her, even if you did not intend her death. Conversely, someone may intentionally allow a child to drown in order to inherit his fortune.

(ii) It tends to be easier to avoid killing than to avoid letting die, but this is only a tendency. Sometimes saving is easier than not killing. It is easy to throw a life preserver, and it may be difficult to refrain from killing someone who is threatening one or who has treated one appallingly. There are even cases where it is physically difficult to avoid killing; as for example, where one has to hold tight to a tree to prevent one’s (light) vehicle whose brakes have failed from running into a pedestrian.

(iii) Sometimes the terms ‘making’ and ‘allowing’ are used to suggest the difference between making certain and making possible or probable. For example, in discussions of the problem of evil, people sometimes say, “Well, God didn’t actually make the murder occur. He just allowed it to occur.” This is best understood as a distinction between raising the probability of murder to 1 from something less than 1, on the one hand, and raising the probability of murder from 0 to something higher but still less than 1. This is a morally significant distinction but it is not the distinction between doing and allowing. An agent can kill without guaranteeing death. For example, by adding small quantities of poison to her victim’s meals she may bring about the death, even though there was a 20% chance that the poison would not kill her. On the other hand, an agent might guarantee the demise of a plant by failing to water it in a situation where she is the only one who can do so.

(iv) Finally, the distinction between doing and allowing harm is sometimes thought to have, as part of its conceptual content, a moral element. This thought is rarely made explicit, but the way people are inclined to classify cases suggests that they are guided by it. There are two main difficulties with this way of drawing the line. Firstly, if it is true by definition that killing is worse than letting die, then the question of whether killing is worse than letting die is settled in a trivial, circular, uninteresting way. Secondly, there are obvious counterexamples to this crude account—morally appalling cases of letting die—failing to feed one’s children—and morally acceptable cases of killing. We have no hesitation talking of killing in self-defense.

A more controversial question is whether the doing/allowing distinction should be distinguished from another related distinction. Sometimes harms occurs because the agent performed some action: because she pressed a switch or pushed a rock. Sometimes the harm occurs because the agent did not perform some action: because she did not press a switch or did not push a rock. We will refer to this as the action/inaction distinction. There do appear to be cases where the action/inaction distinction and the doing/allowing distinction come apart. An actor might spoil a performance by failing to turn up (doing by inaction) (Foot 1978, 26). A potential benefactor might let a starving child die by ringing up her attorney to cancel a direct debit (allowing by action) (Bennett 1981, 91). However, the status of these cases is a matter of disagreement. The relationship between the doing/allowing distinction and the inaction/inaction distinction will be particularly relevant in discussion of ‘Safety Net’ Cases.

3. The Trolley Problem and the Doing/Allowing Distinction

At this point, it is worth discussing the relationship between the doing/allowing distinction and the famous Trolley Problem. The Trolley Problem dates back to Philippa Foot’s (1978) discussion of a pair of examples: In the first case, a judge must choose between framing and killing an innocent man and allowing five innocents to be killed in a riot. In the second, a trolley driver must choose between turning a trolley so that it runs over an innocent man attached to a track and allowing the trolley to run over and kill five innocent people. Foot, claimed that it was wrong to kill in the first case, but not wrong in the second. Foot noted that such cases might motivate someone to accept the Doctrine of Double Effect, which distinguishes between harm that is strictly intended and harm that is merely foreseen. However, Foot argues that the cases can be explained by the distinction between doing and allowing harm: the judge must choose between killing one and merely allowing five to die, while the trolley driver must choose between killing one and killing five. Judith Jarvis Thomson (1986) modified the case so that it was a bystander, not the driver, who had to make the choice. The difference was important, since the bystander is clearly choosing between killing and letting die and yet it still seems permissible to turn the trolley. This undermines Foot’s claim that the difference between doing and allowing explains our intuitions about these cases. So what made the difference? A considerable amount of ink has been spilled attempting to answer this question.

22 years after putting forward the bystander version of the trolley case, Thomson (2008) changed her mind and argued that the consensus that it is permissible for the bystander to turn the trolley was mistaken. She offers the reader a third option, of turning the trolley onto and killing oneself. Obviously, few of us would take that option. If so, she argues, we are not entitled to turn the trolley onto a stranger. Doing so would be like stealing someone’s wallet to give to charity. Thomson argues that it is still wrong to turn the trolley even without the option of turning it on oneself. Fitzpatrick (2009) has responded to Thomson by casting doubt on the analogy between stealing money to give to charity and turning the trolley on a stranger rather than oneself. We know that stealing is wrong except in exceptional cases — and the fact that the agent would prefer not to donate her own money doesn’t make it an exceptional case. The Trolley Case is exceptional, which is precisely why it has generated so much discussion. Fitzpatrick argues that it must be permissible to sacrifice others when we would not sacrifice ourselves: morality cannot demand such extreme self-sacrifice but nonetheless the reasons to minimise damage remain compelling.[7]

The bystander trolley case might seem to undermine the claim that the doing/allowing distinction is morally relevant. After all, it seems as if it is permissible for the bystander to do harm to one person rather than allow harm to five others. Derek Parfit (2017) uses the bystander trolley case in this way, arguing that considering such cases shows that the fact that a threat is heading towards one group of people rather than another gives no reason not to redirect the threat. However, as Kamm (2020) points out, even if the fact that a threat is heading to one group rather than another is not morally relevant in itself, it might supervene on other morally relevant features. Kamm asks us to consider a version of the trolley case where there are five people on each track. The bystander must choose between killing five and letting five die. If not harming had no priority over not aiding, then it would seem the bystander should be morally indifferent between these two options – but it is clear that they are morally required not to turn the trolley from five to five. As Kamm concludes, it seems that, if turning the trolley is permissible, it is not permissible because there are no differences between turning the trolley and not turning the trolley. Instead, it is permissible despite these differences.

Although the Trolley Problem is often associated with the doing/allowing distinction, the two should be kept separate. First, we must settle whether the doing/allowing distinction is morally significant. If it can be shown that the doing/allowing distinction is morally significant, the Trolley Problem should be understood as a further challenge. To respond to this challenge one must either (a) appeal to some additional distinction to explain why it is permissible for the bystander to turn the trolley towards five to save one, even though it is not normally permissible to kill one to save five or (b) show that we should abandon the intuition that it is permissible for the bystander to turn the trolley.

Let’s turn to some candidate accounts of the doing/allowing distinction, and where appropriate, the moral significance or insignificance of each account. In both doing and allowing, an agent is responsible for or relevant to a bad upshot—such as a death or injury—in the sense that she could have prevented it. The contrast is most naturally picked out by the terms ‘doing’ and ‘allowing’, or ‘making’ and ‘allowing’. We will in general use the former but due to occasional awkwardnesses in practice, we will sometimes use the terms “positively relevant to an upshot” and “negatively relevant to an upshot” for cases of “doing” and “allowing”, respectively.[8]

4. Causing and Not Causing Not to Occur

One natural suggestion is that the agent who does harm causes it to occur; whereas the agent who allows harm doesn’t cause it, but simply fails to prevent it where she could have done so.[9] This suggestion has immediate moral implications. It seems true by definition (almost) that you can be causally responsible only for upshots that you cause. And it is arguably true that you can be morally responsible only for what you are causally responsible for.

This argument gets into trouble when we reflect on the fact that we are often responsible for upshots we allow: the death of the houseplants or the child’s illiteracy. When we notice that, in these cases, the plants die or the child remains uneducated because of some failure on the agent’s part, it becomes clear that the agent does, in some sense, cause the upshots. Moreover, most widely accepted contemporary accounts of causation imply that some event or fact involving these agents causes the deaths or illiteracy. For example, the counterfactual account of causation—according to which (very roughly) event E causes F if and only if had E not occurred F would not have occurred either—implies that it was the agent’s failure to water the plants that caused the deaths.[10] John Mackie’s INUS condition[11]—according to which E causes F if and only if E is a(n insufficient but) necessary part of a(n unnecessary but) sufficient condition for F—implies that the fact that the agent failed to water the plants causes the plants to die.[12]

Reflecting on this may lead us to distinguish a wide sense of causation (where S causes X if and only if S is causally relevant to X) from a narrow sense of causation. Bronner (2018) argues that an agent causes an outcome in this narrower sense of causation just if his behaviour falls on the doing side of the doing/allowing distinction. He argues that recognising two notions of causations explains why we are inclined to assert both (a) the claim that the agent who merely allows harm does not cause harm and (b) claims that e.g. the agent caused the house plant to die by failing to water it. Unfortunately, these assertions are explained in a way that suggests that appeal to causation will not help us defend the moral relevance of the distinction between doing and allowing harm.

5. Counterfactual Accounts

We are concerned then with a contrast between two ways the behavior of agents is causally relevant to upshots. One suggestion is to say that when the agent is positively relevant to the upshot, the upshot would not have occurred if the agent had never existed. Suppose, for example, the victim dies because I push his head under water. He wouldn’t have died if I had never existed. On the other hand, suppose he is in deep water and cannot swim and I don’t save him. He would have drowned anyway if I had never existed. In these two cases, the counterfactual account draws the line in the intuitively correct way.

However, suppose that the youngest son of a King squanders his inheritance and begs his elder brother, the new King, for food. The new King refuses and the younger brother starves to death. If the elder brother had never existed, the younger brother would have inherited the throne and would not have starved to death. Yet, it is clear that the new King merely allows his brother to die and does not kill him (Kagan 1989, 96).

This may lead us to revise the counterfactual test and ask whether the upshot would have happened if the agent had not been present. Howard-Snyder (2002) argues that this narrower counterfactual also fails. She asks us to “suppose an SS officer, Franz, tortures someone to death. But this is standard practice in the Gestapo. If Franz had stayed home with a sore throat, or if Franz had never existed, his pal Hans would have done the torturing, in the same way, at the same time Franz did. If the counterfactual account is correct, then Franz is negatively relevant to the victim’s death by torture. That is, Franz merely allowed the death to occur” (Howard-Snyder 2002). Yet, it is very clear that Franz killed the victim. Moreover, as Howard-Snyder points out “the fact that Hans was waiting in the wings in no way diminishes Franz’s wrongdoing in this case.” (Howard-Snyder 2002).

Alan Donagan (1977) suggests a similar account of the distinction. To determine whether the agent is positively or negatively relevant to an upshot, we should consider what would have happened if the agent had not acted at the relevant moment, or what would have happened if the agent had ‘abstained from intervening in the course of nature’. It isn’t entirely clear what we are supposed to imagine when we imagine this but perhaps it’s that the agent is asleep or in a trance or in some other way unable to exercise her agency. Now—with respect to some behavior that led to some upshot, we might ask: would that upshot have occurred if the agent had abstained from intervening in the course of nature? If it would have, the agent allowed the upshot. If it would not have, then she did it (her relevance to the upshot is positive).

Bennett offers the following counterexample to Donagan’s account: Suppose that an alarm will go off if Henry pushes a button which requires a fairly specific movement. Henry is subject to a barely controllable muscular spasm which, if allowed to run its course, would jerk his hand up, hitting the button and setting off the alarm. Bennett argues that on Donagan’s account Henry counts as positively relevant to the alarms silence (as keeping it silent) whereas intuitively he seems to have merely refrained from setting the alarm off (Bennett 1995, p. 113).[13]

After discussing, and dismissing, a similar stream of counterfactual accounts, Kagan notes we may be tempted to refine the counterfactual test still further. We may want to say that an agent does harm when the harmful upshot would not have occurred if the given reaction had not occurred. However, on this account the distinction between doing and allowing simply disappears. For in the classic cases of merely allowing harm, the harm would not have occurred if the agent had acted differently. Suppose I watch Maude drown. If I had reacted differently, if I had not refused to save her, then she would not have drowned. Thus this revised test still fails to capture the intuitive distinction (Kagan 1989, pp. 97–98).

Counterfactual accounts may be used to support the claim that doing harm is worse than allowing harm on the grounds that, on such accounts, allowing harm is simply a matter of not interfering or letting nature take its course. The underlying thought seems to be this: if something bad happens when you do not exist (or are not present or are unable to exercise your agency) then you aren’t responsible for it. If we turn our attention to another world where you do exist (or are present or able to exercise your agency), but which is otherwise exactly like the first, it seems that your contribution to, and thus your responsibility for, the upshot is the same. Thus we should not hold you responsible in the second case either. Bennett (1995) argues that this is a mistake. If some bad upshot occurs when you do not exist or cannot exercise your agency, then you are not responsible for it. Your agency is not involved and the bad upshot’s occurrence implies nothing about the morality of your behaviour. But this is simply not true in the other cases. In these cases, you could have prevented the bad upshot and did not. The bad upshot is a consequence of how you exercised your agency and does have implications for the morality of your behaviour. “ Only a muddle could lead anyone to think that ‘I could have prevented it, but I did not’ is significantly like ‘I had nothing to do with it’” (Bennett 1995, 119).

6. Sequences, Action, Inaction and Positive and Negative Rights

Both Philippa Foot and Warren Quinn attempt to defend the moral relevance of the doing/allowing distinction by connecting it with a moral distinction between positive and negative rights.

Foot (1978, 1984, 1985) argues that the difference between doing and allowing harm is at heart a difference in the agent’s relationship to a harmful sequence. We are able to pick out the sequence leading to a harmful upshot. Foot distinguishes between initiating (setting the harmful sequence going); sustaining (keeping the harmful sequence going when it would otherwise have stopped); enabling (removing some barrier which would have brought the harmful sequence to a halt) and forbearing to prevent (failing to take some action which would have brought the sequence to a halt). Initiating and sustaining both count as doing harm; enabling and forbearing to prevent are ways of merely allowing harm. Foot is clear that, in her view, the doing/allowing distinction is not the same as the action/omission distinction. “[Forbearing to prevent] requires an omission but there is no other general correlation between omission and allowing, commission and bringing about or doing. An actor who fails to turn up for a performance will generally spoil it rather than allow it to be spoiled” (Foot, 1978, 26)

Foot (1978, 1984, 1985) argues that the moral relevance of the doing /allowing distinction rests on a distinction between positive and negative rights. Negative rights are rights against interference whereas positive rights are rights to aid or support. Negative rights are, in general, stronger than positive rights: it typically takes more to justify an interference than to justify the withholding of goods and services. Foot connects this to her analysis of the doing/allowing distinction by arguing that interference implies breaking into an existing sequence and initiating a new one and that therefore violation of a right of non-interference must involve doing, rather than merely allowing, harm (Foot, 1984, 284).

Warren Quinn (1989) shares Foot’s view that the doing/allowing distinction rests on the difference between positive and negative rights, but offers both an alternative analysis and a deeper defense of the claim that negative rights are stronger than positive rights. While Foot argues that these is no necessary connection between action and doing or inaction and mere allowing, Quinn treats the action/inaction distinction as fundamental to the analysis of the doing/allowing distinction. On Quinn’s view, an agent is positively relevant to a harmful upshot when his most direct contribution to the harm is an action, whether his own or that of some object.[14] His relevance is negative when his most direct contribution is an inaction, a failure to prevent the harm. An agent’s most direct contribution to a harmful upshot of his agency is the contribution that most directly explains the harm. One contribution explains harm more directly than another if the explanatory value of the second is exhausted in the way it explains the first.

The key difference for Quinn is between cases where the agent produces the result by an action and cases where she produces it by an inaction—pushing someone’s head under water or refraining from throwing a life preserver. Quinn holds that we do not need further analysis of the action/inaction distinction. However, Quinn adds a modification to his account which means that he does not treat the doing/allowing distinction and the action/inaction distinction as the same. Sometimes, Quinn says, your relevance to a death can be positive, you can kill, in other words, even though you don’t act. This happens, for example, when you are on a train headed towards some drowning victims you wish to save when you notice someone tied to the tracks ahead of you. You can stop the train but you choose not to in order to reach your destination. Quinn believes that you kill in this case, because the train acts as your agent, taking you where you want to go, and crushing the person tied to the tracks in the process. On the other hand, if you had chosen not to stop the train for some other reason but you would have not minded had someone else stopped the train, then your failure to stop the train would not have constituted a killing.

Like Foot, Quinn believes that the key here is the distinction between negative and positive rights.[15] Doing harm involves the violation of negative rights; merely allowing harm involves the violation of positive rights. Since negative rights are more stringent than positive rights, doing harm is harder to justify than merely allowing harm (ceteris paribus). Quinn agrees with Foot that negative rights are intuitively stronger than positive rights. However, Quinn seeks to provide further argument by linking the precedence of negative rights over positive rights with the conditions for a person’s body to genuinely belong to him:

[i]n such a morality [neutral vis á vis killing and letting die] the person trapped on the road has a moral say about whether his body may be destroyed only if what he stands to lose is greater than what others stand to gain. But then surely he has no real say at all. For, in cases where his loss would be greater than the gain to others, the fact that he could not be killed would be sufficiently explained not by his authority in the matter but simply by the balance of overall costs. And if this is how it is in general—if we may rightly injure or kill him whenever others stand to gain more than he stands to lose—then surely his body (one might say his person) is not in any interesting moral sense his. It seems rather to belong to the human community, to be dealt with according to its best overall interest…. Whether we are speaking of ownership or more fundamental forms of possession, something is, morally speaking, his only if his say over what may be done to it (and thereby to him) can override the greater needs of others (Quinn 1989, 308–309).

To say that one has a negative right against being harmed is to say that it is (at least, prima facie) wrong to harm one unless one wishes to be harmed. It is crucial that we add the phrase “unless one wishes to be harmed”, since without it, the precedence of negative rights wouldn’t give the victim any special say about his own body, because it would be just as wrong to harm him even if he asked to be harmed, and it would be wrong for him to harm himself. So, the crucial thing is that the victim has some sort of a say about what happens to himself(i.e., others are morally bound to respect his wishes with respect to his body to a certain extent). Quinn’s claim is that if there is no extent to which someone’s wishes with respect to his body, etc. are to be respected, then we’ve completely done away with the idea of ownership of one’s body, etc. One person’s wishes about what happens to her body do often clash with someone else’s wishes about what happen to his. For example, Susan wishes to marry Paul, but Paul doesn’t wish to marry Susan. Morality obviously cannot give all such wishes precedence. So, we need to give some subset of them precedence. Quinn argues that we cannot give positive rights precedence over negative rights without incoherence.[16] And, hence, he concludes that we must give negative rights precedence over positive rights.

Howard-Snyder(2002) has argued that Quinn’s defense does not show that we should endorse the distinction between doing and allowing rather than some alternative distinction: “...there are other ways to divide up rights than the division into positive and negative rights. We might divide them into the rights of children and the rights of adults, rights concerning the upper half of the body and rights concerning the lower half, etc. and then give precedence to one set over the other whenever they come into conflict. These seem arbitrary and wasteful, but their rationale seems no worse than Quinn’s. Quinn’s is a funny sort of defense of negative rights. Unless I’m missing something, it doesn’t pick out any special feature of negative rights that makes them specially worth respecting” (Howard-Snyder 2002).

Woollard (2013, 2015) attempts to fill this gap in Quinn’s argument, offering a new analysis of the doing/allowing distinction and using the notion of imposition to link the distinction, so analysed, to the conditions for genuine ownership.

Woollard returns to Foot’s (1978, 1984, 1985) sequence account. However, she argues that Foot’s account is incomplete because it does not tell us how to distinguish enabling from sustaining, why enabling is grouped with forbearing to prevent, or what sustaining and initiating have in common. On Woollard’s view, the key question is whether the relevant fact about the agent’s behavior is part of the sequence leading to harm. Woollard distinguishes between substantial and non-substantial facts. Substantial facts are by nature suitable to be part of a sequence. Non-substantial facts normally count as mere conditions for a sequence. Thus anything that is relevant to a sequence through a non-substantial fact will normally be a mere condition rather than part of the sequence. However, non-substantial facts can count as relatively substantial and part of a sequence under special circumstances, if for example, they are facts about the absence of a barrier that belongs to the victim.

This leaves Woollard with the following account: If an agent is merely relevant to a harm through a non-substantial fact about her body or belongings then her behavior will be merely a condition for, rather than part of, the harmful sequence. She will count as merely allowing harm. In contrast, if there is a complete sequence of substantial facts leading from the agent to an harmful affect on what belongs to the victim or a third party, her behavior will be part of the harmful sequence and she will count as doing harm. Woollard uses this analysis to connect the doing/allowing distinction and imposition. Imposition involves the needs or behavior of one person intruding upon the proper sphere of another. When an agent does harm, there is a sequence of substantial facts connecting her behavior to an unwanted effect on what belongs to this victim: this is a harmful causal imposition. When an agent is forbidden from allowing harm, she is required to make some substantial fact about her body or her belongings true for the sake of another. Finally, Woollard argues that for our bodies and other belongings to genuinely belong to us we require protection from both causal and normative imposition: we require constraints against doing harm and permissions to allow harm.

Like Quinn and Woollard, Frances Kamm (1996, 2007) also appeals to the idea of rights or entitlements. Kamm argues that letting die has two essential properties which can make letting die more acceptable than killing: (1) the victim only loses life that he would have had with the agent’s help at that time; (2) the alternative is for the agent to be interfered with. These features make a moral difference because the victim has a stronger claim (relative to the agent) to what he has independently of that agent’s current efforts. Kamm argues that these features are essential properties of a letting die, but may also be found in some cases of killing and such killings will be morally equivalent to merely letting die.

7. The ‘Most of the Things He Could have Done’ Account

Jonathan Bennett thinks that the fundamental distinction between doing and allowing is between cases where the upshot occurs because of one’s action and cases where the upshot occurs because of one’s inaction—although he prefers to replace “action/inaction” talk with “positive/negative fact” talk (Bennett 1967, 1981, 1993, 1995). When Bennett discusses the contrast between positive and negative relevance to harm, he is attempting to capture a deep, philosophically interesting distinction that underlies our talk of ‘doing and allowing’ ‘making and letting’,‘killing and letting die’. He acknowledges that the correspondence between his distinction and the distinctions we make in everyday life and language may be inexact. He says that my behavior is negatively relevant to an upshot if a negative fact about my behavior is the least informative fact that suffices to complete a causal explanation of it; whereas my behavior is positively relevant to that upshot if a positive fact about my behavior is the least informative fact about my conduct that suffices to complete a causal explanation of it. For example, if I jog while you drown, your drowning could be explained by the fact that I jogged, but it could also be explained by the less informative fact that I did not pull you out of the water.

In a nutshell, on Bennett’s view, an agent’s relevance to an upshot is positive if most of the ways she could have behaved at the time would not have led to the upshot; otherwise, it is negative.[17] For example, suppose I douse a slug with salt and it dies as a result. My relevance to its demise is positive, since most of the ways I could have behaved would not have led to the death. On the other hand, if it dies because I fail to move it from the path of a car, then most of the ways I could have behaved at the time would have led to its death, so my relevance to the death is negative.

Most people conclude that on this account doing harm is in itself no worse than allowing harm. If some upshot obtains because of the way you behaved, then the fact that there were many ways (rather than only a few) you could have behaved which would also have had that result may seem obviously morally insignificant.[18] This conclusion is surprising, even shocking. Bennett’s account, however, does offer an alternative explanation of why we tend to think of killing as worse than letting die. He claims, quite plausibly, that it is morally worse to be causally relevant to a bad upshot one could easily have avoided than a similarly bad upshot one could have avoided only with great difficulty. If most of the ways one could have behaved would have led to an upshot, then it was probably somewhat difficult or onerous to avoid the upshot; whereas if most of the ways one could have behaved would not have led to an upshot, then it was probably fairly easy to avoid the upshot. However, on Bennett’s view when killing and letting die are equally difficult to avoid, and all other factors are equal, then there is no moral difference between them. Thus the doing/allowing distinction is not itself morally relevant.

The two most persistent objections to Bennett’s accounts are the Immobility Objection and the Sassan Counterexample. There are two types of Immobility Counterexample:

Immobility 1: If Henry stays completely still, dust will settle and close a tiny electric circuit, setting off an explosion which will kill Bill. If Henry makes any move whatsoever, the dust will not settle and the circuit will not close (Quinn 1989, 295).

Immobility 2: If Henry makes any move whatsoever, he will set off a motion detector which will set off an explosion, killing Bill. If he stays completely still, the motion sensor will not go off and Bill will not die (Quinn 1989, 296).

Most ways Henry could move in Immobility 1 would not lead to Bill’s death. Thus on Bennett’s account, Henry counts as positively relevant to Bill’s death if he stays still and the dust settles on the circuit in Immobility 1. This conflicts with our intuition that Henry would merely allow Bill to die by staying still. On the other hand, most ways Henry could move in Immobility 2 would lead to Bill’s death. Thus on Bennett’s account Henry is negatively relevant to Bill’s death if he waves an arm and sets off the motion sensor in Immobility 2. Again, this conflicts with our intuitions: intuitively waving an arm and setting off the explosion would be killing Bill. As Quinn (1989, 296) notes, Bennett’s account also clashes with our moral intuitions. It seems permissible for Henry to stay still in Immobility 1 if this is necessary to save five other lives even if Bill will die, but impermissible for him to move to save five others in Immobility 2 if he would thereby set off the motion sensor and kill Bill.

Some philosophers[19] argue that such examples refute Bennett’s account because Bennett wrongly classifies immobility as positive and motion as negative. The suggestion is that immobility is incompatible with positive relevance to an upshot. Nifty slogan: ‘You cannot do anything by doing nothing.’

However, there are some cases which do intuitively involve doing harm by remaining still. In Bennett’s example, Agent finds himself sitting on Patient’s chest. If he makes any move, this will relieve the pressure enough for her to breathe, but if he stays still she will suffocate and die (Bennett 1995, 98).

Bennett attempts to explain away the intuition that immobility is negative by arguing that we are misled by the fact that in most actual states of affairs, for any upshot that we care about, staying still will be on “the roomy side of the line.” As Bennett notes: “It takes work to rig things so that keeping still is almost the only route to some interesting upshot. Perhaps this is why, when people confront a result that is produced by Agent’s immobility, they immediately and invalidly infer that this is a case of allowing” (Bennett 1995, 99).

Bennett also suggests that our intuitions about doing and allowing are responsive to two distinctions: his positive/negative distinction and the active/passive distinction identified by Alan Donagan (see the section on counterfactual accounts). An agent is active relative to an upshot if the upshot would not have occurred if the agent had temporarily lost the power of agency, i.e. had been temporarily asleep or unconscious. Bennett asks us to imagine that Henry finds it very difficult to stay still and he “sweats and strains” against bodily spasms to do so. He suggests that in this case, where both analyses agree, we will see Henry’s behaviour as doing. On the other hand, when the two distinctions disagree, the resulting uncertainty will allow our rule of thumb (rest equals allowing and motion equals doing) to prevail (Bennett 1995, 99, 113).

Howard-Snyder (2002) is responsible for the second persistent objection to Bennett’s account. In Howard-Snyder’s Sassan counterexample, “An assassin, A. Sassan, is preparing to assassinate Victor by shooting him. A second assassin, Baxter, is waiting across the street watching Sassan to ensure his success. If Sassan shows any signs of hesitation, Baxter will shoot Victor himself. Suppose Sassan knows about Baxter and his intentions and also knows that he can turn his gun on Baxter instead of on Victor if he so chooses. Although this thought crosses his mind, he quickly suppresses it, since he is committed to Victor’s annihilation. He shoots Victor and Victor dies instantly.” Most of the ways Sassan could have behaved would have led to the shooting and death of Victor (either by himself or by Baxter). So it looks like Bennett’s account will classify Sassan as negatively relevant to Victor’s death e.g. as merely letting Victor die. But as Howard-Snyder points out, “I just said that Sassan shot Victor. He pulled the trigger. The gun fired. A bullet flew out of the barrel and entered Victor’s body. Victor died from the bullet wound. A clearer case of killing is impossible to find” (Howard-Snyder 2002). Bennett might repeat the point that positive relevance to a death is not exactly the same as killing. Nevertheless, insofar as we have any pre-theoretical grip on (and interest in) the concept of positive relevance to a death, Sassan’s relevance to Victor’s death must strike us as positive rather than negative.[20] And yet Bennett’s account implies that it is negative.

In response, Bennett has pointed out that the upshot that concerns us is not the fact that Victor died (no-one could prevent that) but the fact that Victor died at T (or perhaps, the fact that Victor died no later than T).[21] He suggested that perhaps Sassan is positively relevant to that, since most of the ways he could have behaved would have resulted in Victor’s dying later than T. But we could, with minimal artifice, ensure that Baxter is disposed to kill Victor at exactly T if Sassan does not. For example, we could imagine that there is only a fraction of a second when Victor is vulnerable to a bullet and that Baxter is located closer to him (or has a faster acting gun) so that there is a moment T2 such that if Sassan does not shoot at T2, he will not succeed in killing Victor, but such that Baxter still has a chance to get a shot off at T1 with the result that Victor will die at T (Howard-Snyder 2002).

Howard-Snyder (2002) also explores responses which try to get the right result by narrowing the description of the upshot. Perhaps someone may try to argue that Sassan is positively relevant to something—the fact that Victor is killed with this bullet rather than that, or more simply the fact that Victor is killed by him rather than by Baxter. Howard-Snyder argues that the latter suggestion will not do, since it begs the question. Bennett cannot assume that his account implies that Sassan kills Victor, since that is the very claim at issue. Howard-Snyder (2002) also dismisses the suggestion that Sassan is positively relevant to Victor’s being killed with this bullet rather than that, for we can modify the story in such a way that if Sassan does not pull the trigger, Baxter can push a switch that will guarantee that the gun fires.T).[22]

8. ‘Safety Net’ Cases

When we first describe the doing/allowing distinction, it is tempting to use standard doings and standard allowings of harm as examples. In standard doings of harm, the agent performs some action, setting some physical forces in motion which then run to the victim: Bob pushes a boulder which rolls down the hill and crushes Victor to death; Bystander pulls a lever turning the trolley towards the one. In standard allowing, the agent does not perform some action, refusing to intervene in some harmful sequence.

What about cases where the agent removes a safety net from beneath a falling victim, unplugs a respirator, kicks a rock out of the path of the runaway vehicle, and other similar cases? In these cases, the agent performs some action but does not act on the victim directly. Instead, she removes some barrier to a harmful sequence. Such cases are now an important part of philosophical discussion of the doing/allowing distinction, in part because of the recognition that some apparently standard cases of doing in fact involve removing a barrier. As Jonathan Schaffer (2000) has argued, in many guns, pulling the trigger fires a bullet by essentially removing a barrier.

There are four main approaches to such ‘Safety Net’ Cases.

  1. Unified All Doings Accounts: The first approach treats all safety net cases as doings because the upshot occurs because the agent does something. This in effect, seems to treat the action/inaction distinction and the doing/allowing distinction as identical. Quinn (1989) and Bennett (1995) both endorse this approach to safety net cases.
  2. Unified All Allowings Accounts: The second approach treats all safety net cases as mere allowings. This approach is commonly seen as following Philippa Foot in holding that all safety net cases count as enabling harm (removing a barrier that would have prevented a harmful sequence).T).[23] For Foot, enabling is a species of allowing. Rickless (2011) endorses this approach.
  3. Non-Unified Accounts: Others, such as McMahan (1993) and Woollard (2015), argue that some safety-net cases should be treated as doings and others as merely allowings.
  4. 3rd Category Accounts: Finally, others such as Matthew Hanser (1999), Timothy Hall (2008) and Barry and Øverland (2016), argue that safety net cases cannot be classified alongside either standard doings of harm or standard allowings of harm. They fall into a third category.

Non-Unified Accounts may seem attractive because there are safety net cases that seem like clear cases of doing harm and others that seem very much like merely allowing harm. For example,

Impoverished Village: Having given one’s accountant full power of attorney one learns that because of a misunderstanding he is preparing to sign away 10% of one’s income to save the lives of people in a remote impoverished village. One phones to instruct him not to do it (McMahan 1993, 258).[24]

Hospital: A doctor has just plugged one person into a respirator. If the patient is moved or unplugged from the respirator, he will die. Five more patients arrive and will die unless plugged into the respirator. The doctor unplugs the first patient into order to save the five (Rickless 2011, 68).

Burning Building (Enemy): A person trapped atop a high burning building leaps off. Seeing this, a firefighter quickly stations a self-standing net underneath and then dashes off to assist with other work. The imperilled person’s enemy, however, is also present and, seeing his opportunity, swiftly removes the net so the imperilled person hits the ground and dies. (McMahan 1993, 254)

Gallows: A innocent man is standing on a gallows with a noose around his neck. The agent pulls the lever, releasing the trap door. As the innocent man falls through the trap door, the noose tightens around his neck, killing him. (See Vihvelin and Tomkow 2005, 194.)

Impoverished Village and Hospital seem like clear cases of merely allowing harm whereas Burning Building (Enemy) and Gallows seem like clear cases of doing harm. The challenge for Unified All Doings Accounts is to explain our intuitions in Impoverished Village and Hospital, either by arguing that our intuition that these cases count as allowings is misleading or by showing that these cases have some special feature which means they should not be seen as standard safety net cases. Unified All Allowings Accounts face an analogous challenge when it comes to Burning Building (Enemy) and Gallows. Non-Unified Accounts and 3rd Category Accounts must give a convincing account of the status of safety net cases which explains—or explains away—our intuitions about all such cases.

Rickless (2011) uses both the above-mentioned tactics to defend the Unified All Allowings Account. He argues that our intuitions in cases like Burning Building (Enemy) are distorted by the agent’s malicious intentions. He suggests that if we remove the distorting factor of malicious intentions, we will see the Burning Building case as morally equivalent to merely allowing harm (Rickless 2011, 71).[25] Thus, for example, in McMahan’s original Burning Building Case, when a firefighter removes a net from beneath one imperilled person in order to save five others, he counts as merely allowing harm (McMahan 1993, 262, Rickless 2011, 72). Rickless argues that this would also be true of a passerby who moved the net from beneath one to save five (Rickless 2011, 73). Instead of arguing that our intuitions are wrong about Gallows, Rickless argues that it differs from other safety net cases. In Gallows, there is no pre-existing threatening sequence. Gallows should be understood as the initiation of a harmful sequence, and thus as doing harm.

McMahan (1993) picks out three key factors which he claims affect whether withdrawal of a barrier counts as doing or allowing “...whether the person who terminates the aid or protection is the person who has provided it, whether the aid or protection is self-sustaining or requires more of the agent, and whether the aid or protection is operative or as yet inoperative” (McMahan 1993, 262). Withdrawal of a barrier counts as merely allowing harm if and only if the barrier was (a) provided by the agent and the barrier is either (b) not self-sustaining or (c) not yet operative. Thus McMahan’s account seems to correctly classify Impoverished Village and Hospital as merely allowing harm and Burning Building (Enemy) as doing harm. It may, however, counterintuitively classify Gallows as merely allowing harm if the trap door belongs to the agent. If the trap door belongs to the agent, the continued use of his resources is required to keep the barrier in place, so the barrier may not count as self-sustaining. McMahan also allows that sometimes one agent can act on behalf of another, or they can act as a team. This is supposed to explain the intuition that in the Burning Building case where the net is moved to catch five imperilled persons instead of one, it doesn’t matter whether it is the original firefighter or a second firefighter who does the moving.[26]

Matthew Hanser (1999), Timothy Hall (2008) and Barry and Øverland (2016) all argue that safety net cases should not be classified as either doing or merely allowing harm. They fall into a third category. Hanser argues that this third category is ‘preventing people from being saved’ and it is conceptually distinct from both doing and allowing harm, but morally equivalent to merely allowing harm, other things being equal. Other things are not equal i.e. preventing someone from being saved is worse than merely allowing harm if the resources the victim needs in order to survive do not belong to the agent. The moral implications of Hanser’s account are thus similar to those of McMahan’s account.

Hall argues that safety net cases belong to the category ‘denials of resources’ which are both conceptually and morally distinct from standard doings and standard allowings. Hall offers three main arguments. First, he argues that previous analyses have failed to show that allowing harm by denying resources has anything significant in common with allowing harm by failing to act. Second, he argues that the moral status of denials of resources depend to a large extent on which person has a right to the resource in question while the moral status of standard doings and standard allowings does not. Third, he argues that constraints against standard doings of harm and permissions for standard allowings of harm are rooted in pre-political personal rights but constraints and permissions regarding denials of resources are not.

On Barry and Øverland’s view, safety net cases count as enablings. When an agent enables harm, there is a ‘relevant action’ (“there is an answer to the question of how she was relevant to [the harm] that refers to something she did” – see Barry and Øverland 2016, 116) but the action is not connected to the harm through a complete causal process. Barry and Øverland argue that an agent can be expected to bear greater costs to avoid doing harm than to avoid enabling harm, but greater costs to avoid enabling harm than merely allowing harm.

9. Letting Yourself Do Harm

Recent work raises another important challenge for defenders of the Doctrine of Doing and Allowing (see Persson 2013 and Hanna 2014, 2015). The challenge is to provide an account of the moral status of allowing oneself to do or to have done harm. Consider:

Poisoner: Earlier this morning, Agent deposited a dose of lethal poison into a teapot from which one person drinks tea at the same time each afternoon. Unless Agent warns her potential victim now, he will drink the tea and die.[27]

Spasm: Agent feels the onset of a spasm in her finger. If she does not repress the spasm, her finger will contract around the trigger, setting off a gun, killing Vic (Persson 2013, 96).

As Hanna points out, failure to warn the potential poison victim would not be killing, instead Agent would be failing to prevent her past behavior from constituting killing (Hanna 2014, 679). She would be allowing herself to have killed. Similarly, failure to repress the spasm seems significantly different from normally killing. It is perhaps best characterized as letting oneself (non-intentionally) kill (Persson 2013, 96).

Persson suggests that deciding the moral status of allowing oneself to have done harm requires us to choose between a “present-self-focus”, which gives primary importance to what you do now, and a “self-other divide”, based on the difference between your own agency and agency that is external to you (Persson 2013, 102–103). He argues that the neither of these is satisfactory. The present-self focus is mysterious: “why should what we are doing at the present time have this special importance?” (110). The self-other divide has “an air of repulsive moral self-indulgence… why be especially concerned about your own rights violations rather than the rights-violations of all people, in proportion to the stringency of the rights violated?” (110).[28] Persson has similar worries about holding that letting yourself kill now is harder to justify than “merely” letting die, even when the killing would not be intentional under any description. We must place a lot of weight on whether a natural or non-intentional cause of death is external or internal to us. Persson challenges this idea: “The fact that a twitch is internal rather than external to us cannot make any moral difference” (Persson 2013, 105).

Hanna’s discussion of cases suggests that intuitively allowing oneself to have done harm is neither morally equivalent to doing harm nor morally equivalent to merely allowing harm. Normally, if we face a choice between merely allowing harm to one and merely allowing the same harm to five, we should allow harm to one. However, if Agent faces a choice between warning her potential poison victim and saving five others from drowning, then intuitively, she is morally required to save the one potential poison victim. This suggests that allowing oneself to have done harm is not morally equivalent to merely allowing harm (Hanna 2014, 678–9). If we face a choice between doing harm to one and doing the same harm to five, we should do harm to the one. But suppose that Agent can give her warning and prevent the poisoning only by driving down a narrow mountain path, which is blocked by the body of an innocent, unconscious person. It seems impermissible for her to do so even if there are five people about to drink from the poisoned teapot. This suggests that allowing oneself to have done harm is not morally equivalent to doing harm (Hanna 2014, 681). This exacerbates the challenge for defenders of the Doctrine of Doing and Allowing for they must find a justification for treating the fact that the Agent will be allowing herself to have done harm as somewhat morally significant but not as so morally significant that it renders her current behaviour morally equivalent to doing harm.[29] In Persson’s terms, we seem to need to defend both the self-other divide and the present-self-focus.

The cases from the literature on letting oneself do harm may seem contrived. This may lead one to think that accounting for such cases is not a central issue for an account of the doing /allowing distinction. Charlotte Franziska Unruh (2021) argues that such cases of letting oneself do harm are merely a subset of cases involving complicated causal chains where the agent is relevant to harm in more than one way. Moreover, she argues, such cases arise frequently in cases involving future generations, for example, when we must make decisions about whether to mitigate climate change resulting from our past carbon dioxide emissions.

10. X-Phi and the Doing/Allowing Distinction

The majority of work on the doing/allowing distinction has appealed to the author or reader’s own intuitions about cases. However, some work has used experimental data in relation to the doing/allowing distinction. This is part of a wider phenomenon of use of empirical data in philosophy known as ‘X-Phi’.

Kahneman and Tversky’s (1983) experiment asked respondents to choose between treatment plans for a deadly disease expected to kill 600 people. The first set of respondents must choose between:

  • Option (A): 200 people will be saved.
  • Option (B): There is a 1/3 probability that 600 people will be saved and a 2/3 probability that no one will be saved.

72% of people prefer (A) and 28% of people prefer (B). The second groups of respondents were asked to choose between:

  • Option (C): 400 people will die.
  • Option (D): There is a 1/3 probability that no one will die and a 2/3 probability that 600 people will die.

This time, 22% preferred C and 78% preferred D.

The results are striking because (A) is the same outcome as (C) and (B) is the same outcome as (D). The outcomes are simply described differently.

Kahneman and Tversky (1984) argue that such experiments show that we attached greater disvalue to a loss than to the absence of a gain (a no-gain). Different descriptions of the same outcome lead to different responses by changing the baseline, affecting whether the outcome is perceived as a loss or a no-gain. These results may seem to threaten the relevance of the doing/allowing distinction: first by suggesting that the intuitions that supported the doing/allowing distinction can be explained by the loss/no-gain preference; second, by undermining the reliability of these intuitions. See Sinnott-Armstrong (2008); Horowitz (1998).

However, as Kamm (2007) argues, the doing /allowing distinction seems to be intuitively morally relevant independently of the loss/no-gain distinction. Imagine I am driving five healthy people to hospital to receive anti-venom against the plague of poisonous snakes that will hit town and kill all unprotected people in a few hours; I will not reach the hospital in time unless I drive over the one healthy person who is blocking my road. It seems intuitively impermissible for me to kill the one to save the five – even though all victims face losses.

Kamm (2007) also argues that the correct application of the doing/allowing distinction is not affected by framing effects: except in cases of overdetermination, the correct baseline for the doing/allowing distinction is determined by what would happen if the agent did not intervene. Colombo (2018) argues that Kamm’s assurance depends upon prior acceptance of a particular account of the doing/allowing distinction. Nonetheless, Colombo argues, this need not undermine our appeal to intuitions in support of the doing/allowing distinction: our intuitions may be generally trustworthy even if borderline cases are subject to framing effects.

Cushman et al (2008) claim that their experimental data shows that moral appraisals affect classification of behaviour as doing or allowing. Cushman et al do not see this as presenting a special challenge for the doing/allowing distinction. They see these findings as adding to “a growing list of folk concepts influenced by moral appraisal, including causation and intentional action” concluding that: “the present finding favors the view that moral appraisal plays a pervasive role in shaping diverse cognitive representations across multiple domains” (Cushman et al 2008, 281).

Barry et al (2014) use empirical studies to support the 3rd category approach to safety net cases. They argue that empirical studies show that removing a barrier to harm (enabling) is treated as a distinct category, both morally and conceptually distinct from doing and allowing. Most philosophical work on the doing/allowing distinction seeks to reflect something that is claimed to be part of commonsense morality while noting that common intuitions about particular cases could be incorrect. Given this, there are interesting questions about how to respond to such empirical studies: does the fact that enabling is treated as a distinct category settle whether it is a distinct category for the purposes of the defender (or critic) of the doing/allowing distinction?

11. Conclusion

The early critics of the doing/allowing distinction focus on appealing to intuitions to cast doubt on the claim that commonsense morality attributes significance to the doing/allowing distinction. Rachels (1975) and Tooley (1972) offer contrast cases in which all other factors are held constant and killing and letting die seem morally equivalent. Kamm (2007) and Frowe (2007) respond by arguing that we do not treat these cases as morally equivalent, while Kagan (1988) and Quinn (1989) challenge the inference from the moral equivalence of the cases described to the general equivalence of doing and allowing in general.

The next wave of critics argues that no account could both provide an analysis of the distinction that matched our intuitive understanding of the distinction and was morally relevant (Bennett 1995, Kagan 1989). Quinn(1989), Woollard (2015) Kamm (1996), amongst many others, attempt to respond to this challenge.

Recent work has produced new challenges about how to account for the removal of barriers (McMahan 1993, Rickless 2011, Hanser 1999, Hall 2008), past behaviour (Persson 2013, Hanna 2014, 2015) and the significance of empirical research (Kahneman and Tversky 1983, Horowitz 1998, Sinnott-Armstrong 2008, Cushman et al 2008, Barry et al 2014).


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  • McGrath, Sarah, 2003, “Causation and the Making/Allowing Distinction,” Philosophical Studies, 114: 81–106.
  • McMahan, Jeff, 1993, “Killing, Letting Die and Withdrawing Aid,” Ethics, 103 (January): 250–279; reprinted in Steinbock and Norcross 1994, 383–419.
  • Munthe, Christian, 1999, “The Morality of Interference,” Theoria, 65 (1): 55–69.
  • Parfit, Derek, 2017, On What Matters (Volume Three), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Persson, Ingmar, 2013, From Morality to the End of Reason: An Essay on Rights, Reasons and Responsibility, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Persson, Ingmar, and J. Savulescu, 2005, “McMahan on the Withdrawal of Life-Prolonging Aid”, Philosophical Books, 46 (1): 11–22.
  • Purves, Duncan, 2011, “Still in Hot Water: Doing, Allowing, and Rachels’ Bathtub Case,” Southwest Philosophy Review, 27: 129–137.
  • Quinn, Warren S., 1989, “Actions, Intentions, and Consequences: The Doctrine of Doing and Allowing,” Philosophical Review, 98 (3): 287–312; reprinted in Steinbock and Norcross 1994, pp. 355–382.
  • Rachels, James, 1975, “Active and Passive Euthanasia,” New England Journal of Medicine, 292: 78–86.
  • Rickless, Samuel, 2011, “The Moral Status of Enabling Harm,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 92 (1): 66–86.
  • Schaffer, Jonathan, 2000, “Causation by Disconnection,” Philosophy of Science, 67 (2): 285–300.
  • Scheffler, Samuel, 1982, The Rejection of Consequentialism, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 2004, “Doing and Allowing,” Ethics, 114 (2): 215–239.
  • Singer, Peter, 1979, Practical Ethics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sinnott-Armstrong, Walter, 2008, “Framing Moral Intuitions,” in W. Sinnott-Armstrong (ed.), Moral Psychology: the cognitive science of morality: intuition and diversity, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, pp. 47–106.
  • Sinnott-Armstrong, Walter, Ron Mallon, Tom McCoy, and Jay G. Hull, 2008, “Intentions, Temporal Order and Moral Judgments,” Mind and Language, 23 (1): 90–106.
  • Smart, J.J.C, 1973, “An Outline of a System of Utilitarian Ethics,” in J.J.C. Smart and Bernard Williams, Utilitarianism For and Against, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 1–74.
  • Steinbock, Bonnie, and Alastair Norcross (eds.), 1994, Killing and Letting Die, 2nd edition, New York: Fordham University Press.
  • Strudler, Alan and David Wasserman, 1995, “The First Dogma of Deontology: the Doctrine of Doing and Allowing and the Notion of a Say,” Philosophical Studies, 80 (1): 51–67.
  • Thomson, Judith Jarvis, 1986, “Killing, Letting Die and the Trolley Problem,” in Rights, Restitution, and Risk: Essays in Moral Theory, W. Parent (ed.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, pp. 78–93.
  • –––, 1990, The Realm of Rights, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 2008, “Turning the Trolley,” Philosophy and Public Affairs, 36 (4): 359–374.
  • Tooley, Michael, 1972, “Abortion and Infanticide,” Philosophy and Public Affairs, 2 (1): 37–65.
  • Trammell, Richard, 1975, “Saving and Taking Life,” The Journal of Philosophy, 72: 131–137.
  • Unger, Peter, 1996, Living High and Letting Die, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Vihvelin, Kadri, and Terrance Tomkow, 2006, “The Dif,” The Journal of Philosophy, 103 (4): 183–205.
  • Williams, Bernard, 1973, “A Critique of Utilitarianism,” in J.J.C. Smart and Bernard Williams, Utilitarianism For and Against, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 75–150.
  • Woollard, Fiona, 2008, “Doing and Allowing, Threats and Sequences,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 89: 199–216.
  • –––, 2010, “Doing/Allowing and the Deliberative Requirement,” Ratio, 23 (June): 261–277.
  • –––, 2013, “If this is My Body...: a Defence of the Doctrine of Doing and Allowing,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 94: 315–341.
  • –––, 2015, Doing and Allowing Harm, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Further Reading

  • Anscombe, Elizabeth, 1981, “Modern Moral Philosophy,” in Ethics, Religion, and Politics (Collected Philosophical Papers: Volume III), Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, pp. 26–42.
  • Blair, Jacob, 2018, “Autonomy and the Moral Symmetry Principle: Reply to Frowe and Tooley,” Res Publica, 24 (4): 531–541.
  • Casey, John, 1980, “Killing and Letting Die: A Reply to Bennett,” in Killing and Letting Die, 1st edition, B. Steinbock (ed.), Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall, pp. 132–138.
  • Chan, David K., 2010, “A Reappraisal of the Doctrine of Doing and Allowing” in J. Campbell, M. O’Rourke and H. Silverstein (eds.) Action, Ethics, and Responsibility, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press/Bradford, pp. 25–45.
  • Chandler, John, 1990, “Killing and Letting Die—Putting the Debate in Context,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 68: 420–431.
  • Chappell, Timothy, 2002, “Two Distinctions That Do Make a Difference: The Action/Omission Distinction and the Principle of Double Effect, ” Philosophy, 77 (2): 211–233.
  • Clarke, Randolph, 2014, Omissions: Agency, Metaphysics, and Responsibility, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Conway, David, 1988, “Is Failing to Save Lives as Bad as Killing?” Journal of Applied Philosophy, 5: 109–112.
  • Draper, Kai, 2005, “Rights and the Doctrine of Doing and Allowing,” Philosophy and Public Affairs, 33 (3): 253–280.
  • Feinberg, Joel, 1970, Doing and Deserving, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Glover, Jonathan, 1977, Causing Death and Saving Lives, London: Penguin.
  • –––, 1975, “It Makes No Difference Whether or Not I Do It,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 49: 171–209.
  • Howard-Snyder, Frances, 1994, “The Heart of Consequentialism,” Philosophical Studies, 76 (1): 107–129.
  • Hurley, Paul, 2019, “Consequentialism and the New Doing-Allowing Distinction” in C. Seidel (ed.), Consequentialism: New Directions, New Problems, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 176–197.
  • Kamm, Frances Myrna, 1989, “Harming Some to Save Others,” Philosophical Studies, 57: 227–260.
  • –––, 1993, Morality, Mortality, Volume I, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Lichtenberg, Judith, 1982, “The Moral Equivalence of Action and Omission,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, Supplementary Volume, 8: 19–36.
  • Liu, Xiaofei, 2012, “A Robust Defence of the Doctrine of Doing and Allowing,” Utilitas, 24 (1): 63–81.
  • MacAskill, William, and Andreas Mogensen, 2019, “The Paralysis Argument,” GPI Working Paper No. 6–2019, Global Priorities Institute. [MacAskill and Mogensen 2019 available online.
  • McCarthy, David, 2000, “Harming and Allowing Harm,” Ethics, 110 (4): 749–779.
  • McMahan, Jeff, 2002, The Ethics of Killing: Problems at the Margins of Life, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • McMahon, Christopher, 1991, “The Paradox of Deontology,” Philosophy & Public Affairs, 20: 350–377.
  • Nagel, Thomas, 1986, The View from Nowhere, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Norcross, Alastair, 2003, “Killing and Letting Die,” in A Companion to Applied Ethics, R.G. Frey (ed.), Oxford: Blackwell, pp. 451–463.
  • Oddie, Graham, 1997, “Killing and Letting Die: Bare Differences and Clear Differences,” Philosophical Studies, 88 (3): 267–287.
  • Rickless, Samuel, 1997, “The Doctrine of Doing and Allowing,” Philosophical Review, 106 (4): 555–575.
  • Russell, Bruce, 1980, “On the Relative Strictness of Negative and Positive Duties,” in Killing and Letting Die (1st edition), B. Steinbock (ed.), Englewood, Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall, pp. 215–237.
  • Sartorio, Carolina, 2008, “Moral Inertia,” Philosophical Studies, 140 (1): 117–133.
  • Setiya, Kieran, 2018, “Must Consequentialists Kill?” Journal of Philosophy, 115 (2): 92–105.
  • Sneddon, Andrew, 2020, “Scottish Dentistry and Broken Promises: Woollard on Presuppositions and Substantial Negative Facts,” Analysis, first online 13 October 2020. doi:10.1093/analys/anaa040
  • Trammell, Richard, 1978, “The Presumption Against Taking Life,” The Journal of Medicine and Philosophy, 3: 53–67.
  • –––, 1979, “The Nonequivalency of Saving Life and Not Taking Life,” The Journal of Medicine and Philosophy, 4 (3): 251–262.
  • Tooley, Michael, 1994, “An Irrelevant Consideration: Killing Versus Letting Die,” reprinted in Steinbock and Norcross (eds.) 1994, pp. 103–111.
  • Walen, Alec, 1995, “Doing, Allowing and Disabling: Some principles governing deontological restrictions,” Philosophical Studies, 80 (2): 183–215.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


This entry is based on an earlier entry single-authored by Frances Howard-Snyder. Fiona Woollard has kept significant parts of Howard-Snyder’s work but has made substantial revisions.

Frances Howard-Snyder is grateful to Jonathan Bennett, Tom Downing, Dan Howard-Snyder, Hud Hudson, Phillip Montague, Alastair Norcross, John Hawthorne, Stuart Rachels and Kadri Vihvelin for comments on earlier drafts of the single-author entry on which this paper is based. She is also grateful to the Bureau for Faculty Research at Western Washington University for support while writing it.

Fiona Woollard is grateful to a very long list of people who have contributed to her understanding of the doing/allowing distinction. The list includes, but is not limited to, Brad Hooker, John Cottingham, Frances Howard-Snyder, Frances Kamm and Jeff McMahan. She would also like to thank Charlotte Franziska Unruh for suggestions for recent literature for the 2021 update.

The editors and authors thank Jack Painter for spotting and notifying us of several important typographical errors that changed the meaning of sentences.

Copyright © 2021 by
Fiona Woollard <>
Frances Howard-Snyder

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