Feminist Philosophy of Religion

First published Mon Mar 14, 2005; substantive revision Wed Mar 21, 2018

Philosophical reflection on religion is as old as Greek questions about Hebrew stories. Feminist philosophy of religion is a more recent development within Western philosophy that poses feminist questions about religious texts, traditions, and practices, often with the aim of critiquing, redefining, or reconstructing the entire field in light of gender studies. Feminist philosophy of religion is important to feminist and nonfeminist philosophy alike for providing a critical understanding of various religious concepts, beliefs, and rituals, as well as of religion as a cultural institution that defines, sanctions, and sometimes challenges gender roles and gender-inflected representations. It is equally important for feminist theory, which frequently neglects the academic study of religion, as for analytic philosophy of religion, which seldom takes into account gender or race or class. This entry considers the work of both critique and reconstruction as it has developed in feminist philosophies of religion over the last several decades.

In the present situation, most practitioners of feminist philosophy of religion and of feminist theology are agreed that their discipline cannot be limited simply to a sociological assessment or confessional narrative of what a particular religious group believes to be true, without consideration of the difference that gender makes. Because feminist philosophy of religion is philosophical, it can take as primary neither the datum of scriptures believed to be revealed and self-authenticating nor the self-privileging endeavor of intratextual theologies. Because it is philosophy of religion, a subject matter that encompasses a broad array of cross-cultural material, it cannot be concerned simply with themes or questions drawn from the Christian religion alone. And because it is feminist, it must promote the elimination of gender inequality and take into account the multiplicity of human bodies, desires, and differences that are mapped onto the site of religion. At the same time, it cannot presume that religion exists as some common universal underlying all the various traditions; only particular religions exist, and even the very concept of religion itself has come to be recognized as a modern and Western concept.

1. Introduction

To date, a much larger literature exists under the rubric of feminist theology than of feminist philosophy of religion. Four main reasons have been suggested for this (Frankenberry & Thie 1994: 2–4). First, from the seventeenth to the nineteenth century, the perspective of white European males dominated the formative period of philosophy of religion to such an extent that it was hard to see how the distortions of this long tradition might be overcome. Second, in the twentieth century, once philosophy of religion was professionalized and gerrymandered within Philosophy faculties at universities, it was insulated both from the old Theology faculties and the new Religious Studies faculties created in the 1960s and 1970s; therefore, feminists interested in pursuing a Ph.D. had to choose between Philosophy (where philosophy of religion was not regarded as “real” philosophy during the ascendancy of the analytic movement) or Religious Studies/Theology which took philosophical concerns seriously and thus provided a more welcoming location for feminist theorizing on religion. Third, many feminist philosophers themselves have harbored either a suspicion of religion or an impoverished understanding of it, and so have been slow to develop a significant body of scholarship in this area. Fourth, the entrenched bias and resistance to feminism within mainstream analytic philosophy of religion, combined with the myth that its methods, norms, and content are gender-neutral, has impeded recognition of the relevance of work appearing under the rubric of feminist philosophy of religion. Feminist theology, on the other hand, flourishes in an academic field that for over forty years has been hospitable to a variety of liberation theologies, death-of-god theologies, environmental theologies, postcolonialist theologies, and queer studies.[1]

The maturing of feminist philosophy of religion as a field distinct from feminist theology was evident at the end of the twentieth century. It could be seen in the appearance of two book-length studies: Pamela Anderson’s A Feminist Philosophy of Religion: The Rationality and Myths of Religious Belief (1998), and Grace Jantzen’s Becoming Divine: Towards a Feminist Philosophy of Religion (1999). Another measure of the vitality of this field was the publication of such collections as Feminist Interpretations of Mary Daly (Hoagland & Frye 2000), devoted to an assessment of one of the most original authors in the field, and Feminist Interpretations of Soren Kierkegaard (Leon & Walsh 1997), containing critical analyses by feminist philosophers of the “father of religious existentialism”. In addition, Volume 1 of Kluwer’s Handbook of Contemporary Philosophy of Religion (Long 2000), a major reference work covering 1900–2000, concluded with a chapter on feminist philosophy of religion as represented by Mary Daly, Sally McFague, Luce Irigaray, Julia Kristeva, Pamela Anderson, and Grace Jantzen. Finally, an anthology on Feminist Philosophy of Religion: Critical Readings (Anderson & Clack 2004) exhibited the methodological range of the field in terms of psychoanalytic, poststructuralist, postmetaphysical, and epistemological frameworks, and provided specialized treatments of such topics as divinity, embodiment, autonomy and spirituality, and religious practice.

In the second decade of the twenty-first century, fresh collections are appearing more frequently as essays by feminists bearing on the philosophy of religion become available (see Anderson 2010; Alcoff & Caputo 2011).

2. Feminist Critique of Traditional Philosophy of Religion

To Elizabeth Cady Stanton in 1885 it was evident that “History shows that the moral degradation of woman is due more to theological superstitions than to all other influences together” (1885: 389). To Luce Irigaray, writing one hundred years later, the becoming of women was premised on becoming divine, for

God alone can save us, keep us safe. The feeling or experience of a positive, objective, glorious existence, the feeling of subjectivity, is essential for us. Just like a God who helps us and leads us in the path of becoming, who keeps track of our limits and infinite possibilities—as women—who inspires our projects. (1987 [1993b: 67])

Scalding critiques like Stanton’s and reconstructive reflections like Irigaray’s have marked feminist philosophy of religion with a complex set of relations to the subject matter of religion, as well as to the discipline of philosophy. In the wake of a worldwide wave of religious resurgence at the beginning of the twenty-first century, many feminists find Stanton’s reasoning still persuasive: the Word of God is the word of man, used to keep women in subjection and to hinder their emancipation. For other feminists, especially those located within various communities of faith and resistance, gynocentric efforts to create a possible space for something “divine” hold considerable appeal.

As a form of critique, feminist philosophy of religion employs the practice described by Jeffner Allen and Iris Marion Young (1989) of showing the limits of a mode of thinking by forging an awareness of alternative, more liberating, ideas, symbols, and discourses. Feminist philosophy of religion suggests ways in which gender as an analytic category and gender studies as a body of knowledge can not only challenge but also enrich and inform the methodological and substantive assumptions of philosophy of religion. This does not mean that gender hierarchy comprises a simple or exclusive category of analysis. Nor does it necessarily invoke a distinction between gender and sex that would allow naturalized assumptions about the sexed body to go unquestioned. Given the interflowing streams of class, race, ethnicity, age, sexual orientation, ability, and nationality that shape the complex modalities of social experience, it is unlikely that gender or any other single factor could suffice as a single or unitary focal point. Women cannot be presumed to speak in a single voice or to share a uniform “experience”. Nevertheless, gender constitutes perhaps the most fundamental factor creating human difference, and it remains among the most ignored philosophically.

Gender bias as it operated in the history of the philosophy of religion shaped the ways in which the traditional problems and orientations of the field were constructed. Like the cultural phenomenon of religion itself, philosophy of religion not only originated in a male tradition of production and transmission, with a history of excluding and devaluing women, but it was also defined by many concepts and symbols marked as “masculine”, which stood in oppositional relation to those marked as “feminine”. Moreover, unlike the phenomenon of religion which was embedded in multiple cultural contexts, philosophy of religion was largely Eurocentric and Anglo-American in its orientation, such that in addition to gender bias, ethnocentrism constituted the second major weakness of the history of this field. For a long time, philosophy of religion was written from a standpoint not unlike that of Reverend Thwackum, the character in Henry Fielding’s novel Tom Jones, who announced:

When I mention religion, I mean the Christian religion; and not only the Christian religion, but the Protestant religion; and not only the Protestant religion, but the Church of England. (Fielding 1749: vol. 1, bk 3, ch. 3)

If not always the Church of England, it was for the most part Protestant Christianity that was conflated with “religion” in the modern period of philosophy of religion.

Undaunted by two such severe deficiencies—gender bias and ethnocentrism—the dominant Anglo-American analytic school of philosophy of religion proved surprisingly healthy in the last decades of the twentieth century. Whereas at the mid-point of the twentieth century philosophy of religion was virtually defined by the assumptions and methods of logical positivism and empiricism, in subsequent years new and technically rigorous contributions by religiously committed philosophers began to enliven old theistic arguments. After long decades of dormancy when logical positivism seemed to yield only negative conclusions in the philosophy of religion, a resurgence of interest in traditional theism occurred in mainstream philosophy of religion. Modal logic was used to formulate a more perspicacious version of the ontological argument, Bayesian models of probability breathed new life into inductive justifications of religious belief, rational choice theory ushered Pascal’s wager once again onto the philosophical stage, and language-game analysis offered a prima facie justification of religious language. Far from the days of wondering what Athens has to do with Jerusalem, philosophy and religion appeared to have entered a period of detente as comrades in arms. From the standpoint of feminist critique, however, analytic philosophy of religion has failed to engage the questions posed by feminist inquiry or to modify the androcentric elements of the traditional theistic model. Instead, in the work of such philosophers as Richard Swinburne, Alvin Plantinga, and William Alston, philosophy of religion was deployed in defense of the cogency of a standard form of western monotheism, in the service of a conception of “God” that was patriarchal, and in the vested interests of staunchly traditional forms of Christianity.

Feminists argue that philosophy of religion can hardly ignore questions of gender ideology when its very subject matter—religion—is riddled with misogyny and androcentrism. They point out that, historically, gender bias in religion has been neither accidental nor superficial. Elizabeth Johnson (1993) likens it to a buried continent whose subaqueous pull shaped all the visible landmass; androcentric bias has massively distorted every aspect of the terrain and rendered invisible, inconsequential, or nonexistent the experience and significance of half the human race. For philosophers studying the intellectual effects and belief systems of religions, the opportunity to critique and correct sexist and patriarchal constructions in this field is as ample as it is urgent, given the presence of gender ideology in all known religions. Not one of the religions of the world has been totally affirming of women’s personhood. Every one of them conforms to Heidi Hartmann’s definition of patriarchy as

relations between men, which have a material base, and which, though hierarchical, establish or create interdependence and solidarity among men that enable them to dominate women. (1981: 14)

All sacred literatures of the world display an unvarying ambivalence on the subject of women. For every text that places well-domesticated womanhood on a religious pedestal, another one announces that, if uncontrolled, women are the root of all evil. Religion has thus comprised a primary space in which and by means of which gender hierarchy has been culturally articulated, reinforced, and consolidated in institutionalized form. Religion is hardly the only such space, but it appears to have been a particularly effective way of undergirding and sanctifying gender hierarchy in the West.

Feminists charge that gender bias has permeated the way philosophy of religion has been written and has influenced how the field has been professionalized. They protest a series of common lapses: the dearth of female authors in the leading journals or standard textbooks; the almost complete absence of attention to feminist philosophy on the part of mainstream authors, male and female; the exclusively male-authored and monochromatic complexion of the standard anthologies of readings and editorial boards. They note that the use of inclusive language was remarkably slow in finding its way into the scholarly publications and conceptual patterns of this field. It is still not unusual to find articles that discuss concepts of justice and fairness at length, using throughout the male pronoun.

More difficult lacunae are located in the selection of the very topics, problems, and methods that have come to define mainstream philosophy of religion, chief among them the problem of God.

3. The Problem of God

Discussion of the problem of God is standard fare for all schools of philosophy of religion. Long a lynchpin holding up other structures of patriarchal rule, the concept of a male God has been judged by every major feminist thinker, including Mary Daly, Rosemary Radford Ruether, Naomi Goldenberg, Daphne Hampson, Judith Plaskow, Julia Kristeva, and Luce Irigaray, to be both humanly oppressive and, on the part of believers, religiously idolatrous according to the terms of their own theologies. Feminist philosophers of religion ask why a single set of male metaphors should be absolutized as though supremely fitting about the subject. Critical of the literary gesture of writers who hope to avoid sexist language by recourse to rhetorical disclaimers, feminist authors argue that it is not persuasive simply to declare that the concept of God transcends gender and, therefore, “he” is not literally male, and then to presume that all can go on as before. The problem remains that once the masculine is raised to the universal human, beyond gender, the feminine alone bears the burden of sexual difference.

3.1 Feminist Critique of Traditional Theism

Philosophers of religion have sometimes marked a distinction between the anthropomorphic language of myth and popular piety, on the one hand, and the conceptual and abstract categories of philosophy, on the other hand, as though when we repair to the metalevel of analysis we leave gender-inflected language behind. Feminist philosophy of religion points to all the ways the signifier “God” remains stubbornly gendered male in Western thought and subliminally envisioned as a male personage. Whether taken as real or unreal, inferred validly or invalidly, said to be experienced directly or only projected illusorily, the divine identity in classical theism and atheism is unmistakably male. This supreme, ruling, judging, and loving male God is envisioned as a single, absolute subject, is named Father, and is conceived as standing in a relation of hierarchical dominion over the world. In ways both implicit and explicit, this construct tends in turn to justify various social and political structures of patriarchy which exalt solitary human patriarchs at the head of pyramids of power. Drawn almost exclusively from the world of ruling class men, traditional theistic concepts and images legitimate social and intellectual structures that grant a theomorphic character to men who rule and relegate women, children, and other men to marginalized and subordinated areas. The discursive practices that have constructed the divine as male are intimately connected to the production of ideologies which devalue all that is not male; they have formed a constitutive element in the oppression of women and other “Others”.

The dominance of male signifiers for deity is only part of the problem of classical theism. Like a prism which refracts all the surrounding light, the gendering of God has skewed the way in which other problems in philosophy of religion have been traditionally constructed. The problem of religious language, for example, is frequently cast in terms of the meaning and use of metaphors and models, involving questions of reference and truth. But the metaphors and models employed by mainstream philosophers of religion often trade uncritically on intrinsically hierarchical patterns of relations. Metaphors such as father, king, lord, bridegroom, husband and God-“He” go unmarked. If an occasional female model or metaphor intrudes into this homosocial circle, it is immediately re-marked upon. Introducing female pronouns for God-“she” produces nervous laughter in most classrooms.

In the study of the so-called divine attributes, none has received more discussion in the literature than “omnipotence”, defined as some version of “perfect power”. Both the conceptualization of the nature of this power as well as descriptions of its effects embody sexism and androsexism. In twentieth century studies, the standard definition of perfect power ranged from “unilateral power to effect any conceivable state of affairs” to the more moderate notion of “self-limiting power”. But the kind of power in question was in principle one of domination, or power-over, as it has been persistently associated with the characteristics of ideal masculinity. In the eleventh century, Peter Damian could quote approvingly the biblical passage “O Lord, King Omnipotent, all things are placed in your power, and there is no one who is able to resist your will”, as he argued, contra St. Jerome, that divine omnipotence is even able to “cause a virgin to be restored after she has fallen” (1065 [1969: 143). Like the two favorite heroes of modern philosophy, the Cartesian cognitive subject and the Kantian autonomous will, an omnipotent deity reflects the mirror image of idealized masculinist qualities, according to feminist philosophers of religion. Among contemporary schools, only process philosophers of religion have explicitly argued against the attribute of omnipotence on the grounds that it is conceptually incoherent, scientifically superfluous, and morally offensive in its association of the divine with male controlling power (see, for example, Cobb & Griffin 1976; Suchocki 1988; Howell 1988).

Philosophical arguments on behalf of the concept of divine aseity or self-sufficiency reinforce the characteristic disparagement of reciprocal power relations found in other social and intellectual expressions of patriarchy. Divine existence is said to be completely self-sufficient and sovereign. It is what it is independently of any and all creatures, and its relations to these others are external relations only. But, according to feminist critics, in the absence of internal or constitutive relations that would affect or qualify the divine aseity, real relatedness to creatures is ruled out and a one-sided glorification of impassivity over change regulates the model of God and the world.

In a related way, the topic of theodicy has also been deeply shaped by male-defined constructions of power and interest. The very form of the question, How can an all-powerful deity permit evil? implies a meaning of “all-powerful” that is embedded in a discourse of domination. At the same time, the meaning of “all-good”, called into question by the power of evil, is defended by traditional theodicies in ways that either equivocate on the meaning of “goodness” or cast doubt on the moral attributes of the deity. Also exemplary are the types of evil simply overlooked in the many hypotheticals, counterexamples, and possible worlds that are generated in discussions of theodicy by male philosophers. Misogyny and rape rarely make the list of evils. The whole drift of theodicy as an intellectual exercise gravitates back to the question of God, and rarely to the world of cruelty and suffering (Thie 1994; for exceptions, see Farley 1990, and Sands 1994).

Philosophical debates on the topic of immortality have also been deeply shaped by androcentric interests—centering on self-perpetuation and individual, rather than collective, survival. Charlotte Perkins Gilman, arguably a foremother in feminist philosophy of religion, located an important gender difference in His Religion and Hers (1923). “Death-based” religion, she claimed, asks the question, “What is going to happen to me, after I am dead?”—a posthumous egoism. To this she juxtaposed a “birth-based” religion whose main question is “What is to be done for the child who is born?”—an immediate altruism. Many contemporary feminist philosophers of religion would find Gilman’s anthropology overly simple but her emphasis suggestive.

A still deeper critique involves the differentiation of embedded levels of bias and androcentrism in the crucial assumptions, methods, and norms of traditional philosophy of religion. Rooted in an ancient dualistic worldview whose philosophical inadequacy has been harder to detect until recently than its social and legalistic inequities, Western religious categories have been inextricably bound up with a certain metaphysical exigency. The metaphysical worldview that once supported the sacred canopy may have lost much of its cogency for the modern mind, along with the arguments of medieval scholastics that sailors cannot kiss their wives goodbye on Sundays, or hangmen go to heaven, but the dualisms associated with that worldview have continued to haunt the philosophical imagination. Beginning with Greek philosophy’s equation of the male principle with mind and reason and act, the female principle was associated with the contrasting identification in terms of matter, body, passion and potency. The subsequent history of Western philosophy, despite major conceptual shifts, displayed a characteristic logic and form. Taking the form of hierarchical opposition, the logic of binary structuring mutually opposed such elements as mind and body, reason and passion, object and subject, transcendental and empirical. As argued by any number of feminist philosophers, these hierarchical oppositions are typically gender-coded. Body, matter, emotions, instincts, and subjectivity are coded as feminine, while mind, reason, science, objectivity are coded as masculine (see Bordo 1987, Harding & Hintikka 1983, Irigaray 1977 [1985], Lloyd 1985). The specific link between this metaphysics and western conceptions of God is a complex chicken-and-egg question. Certainly it is fair to say that the Hellenizing of Christian theology from the second century C.E. on saddled classical theism with problematic philosophical valences. But classical theism in turn reinforced and sanctioned the philosophical valorization of mind, reason, and male over and against body, passion, and female. Some feminists would trace the cultural roots of this way of thinking to the phenomenon of “male bodily alienation” that arose in late classical antiquity’s asceticism (see Ruether 1983).

In any case, insofar as Western monotheism has constructed the meaning of “God” in relation to “world” around binary oppositions of mind/body, reason/passion, and male/female, traditional theism remains complicitous with the very system of gender constructs and symbolic structures that underlie women’s oppression. In the binary opposition between “God” and “world”, the term “God” occupies the privileged space and acts as the central principle, the One who confers identity to creatures to whom “He” stands in hierarchical relation. Oppositional pairing of God/world has served in turn to organize other categories, such as heaven and earth, sacred and profane. The widespread distinction between sacred and profane, employed by many authors, thus comes already encoded with the hierarchical oppositions of male/female and masculine/feminine onto which it is mapped, along with the structurally related pairs, white/black and heterosexual/homosexual. The first term in each pair is sacralized, while the second is rendered profane. This set of themes can be traced in connection with the classic work of Durkheim and Weber in their theorizations of religion (Erickson 1993).

Contemporary feminist philosophy of religion is also aware that the relation between symbolic structures, on the one hand, and gender constructions, on the other hand, cannot be specified in terms of a single explanatory model. The power of symbolic orders to invoke and reinscribe implicit gender understandings works in varied and complex ways, as shown in studies by Bynum (1986), Fulkerson (1994), and Hollywood (1995, 2002). Because religious symbols are polysemic and multivalent, they hold different meanings for different people at different times. It is never a simple matter of sheer reflection of the given social order. The relation between society and symbol, or between psyche and symbol, is recognized as open-ended. Relations of reversal or inversion of actual social structures may obtain, making it risky for the interpreter to posit a single unidirectional cause-effect relation between symbol and social setting. As Bynum points out, meaning is not so much imparted as it is appropriated “in a dialectical process whereby it becomes subjective reality for the one who uses the symbol”, allowing for the possibility that “those with different gender experiences will appropriate symbols in different ways” (1986: 9).

It follows that no necessary correlation can be assumed between goddess-worshipping cultures and actual egalitarian social structures in the lives of females and males of that culture. Similarly, the male Father God may open up a range of different interpretative possibilities for both women and men. In culturally specific and historically unstable ways, religious symbols even of the male Father God have been useful in resisting and subverting the social order, not only reflecting and reinforcing it. In light of these considerations, most feminist philosophers of religions regard it as risky to generalize across cultures, religious traditions, or historical periods with respect to the different ways in which males and females appropriate or construct religious symbolism.

3.2 From Images and Symbols to Concepts and Ontology

Mainstream philosophers of religion have so far failed to take explicit account of the gendered dynamics of religious thought, but for forty years a variety of other scholars, including biblical exegetes, theologians, ethicists, and feminist philosophers of religion, have produced an extraordinary explosion of research resulting in feminist thealogies, critical hermeneutics of suspicion, and woman-affirming writings on spirituality. In these, the problem of God appears as a crucial site of reconstruction.

The medieval theologian Hildegard of Bingen struggled to capture her vision of the Spirit of God with a cascade of vivid images and a mélange of metaphors. As rendered by Elizabeth Johnson in the following passage, Hildegard’s vision encompassed many of the themes that appear in the writing of twentieth century feminist writers. The divine spirit, Hildegard wrote, is the very life of the life of all creatures; the way in which everything is penetrated with connectedness and relatedness; a burning fire who sparks, ignites, inflames, kindles hearts; a guide in the fog; a balm for wounds; a shining serenity; an overflowing fountain that spreads to all sides.

She is life, movement, color, radiance, restorative stillness in the din. Her power makes all withered sticks and souls green again with the juice of life. She purifies, absolves, strengthens, heals, gathers the perplexed, seeks the lost. She pours the juice of contrition into hardened hearts. She plays music in the soul, being herself the melody of praise and joy. She awakens mighty hope, blowing everywhere the winds of renewal in creation. (paraphrase in Johnson 1992: 127–128)

This, for Hildegard in the 12th century, is the mystery of the God in whom humans live and move and have their being.

Eight centuries later, Paula Gunn Allen wrote in similarly provocative language of the spirit that pervades her Laguna Pueblo/Sioux peoples:

There is a spirit that pervades everything, that is capable of powerful song and radiant movement, and that moves in and out of the mind. The colors of this spirit are multitudinous, a glowing, pulsing rainbow. Old Spider Woman is one name for this quintessential spirit, and Serpent Woman is another…and what they together have made is called Creation, Earth, creatures, plants and light. (1986: 22)

In Ntozake Shange’s well-known play, a tall black woman rose from despair and cried out, “i found god in myself and i loved her, i loved her fiercely” (1976: 63).

In a frequently cited passage in The Color Purple, Alice Walker voiced a similar note as Shug recounted to Celie the epiphany that came over her when she learned to get the old white man off her eyeball:

It? I ast.
Yeah, It. God ain’t a he or a she, but a It.
But what do it look like? I ast.
Don’t look like nothing, she say. It ain’t a picture show. It ain’t something you can look at apart from anything else, including yourself. I believe God is everything, say Shug. Everything that is or ever will be. And when you can feel that, and be happy to feel that, you’ve found It (1982: 177–78).

In theological constructions, Rosemary Ruether (1983 [1993]) has worked with the unpronounceable written symbol “God/ess” to connote the “encompassing matrix of our being” that transcends patriarchal limitations and signals redemptive experience for women as well as for men. Modelling God for a nuclear age, Sallie McFague (1987) has experimented with metaphors of God as Mother, Lover, and Friend of the world, with the world conceived of as God’s own body. Correlating Paul Tillich’s notion of the power of being with the empowerment women know in freeing themselves from patriarchy, the early Mary Daly (1973 [1985]) posited God as “Verb”, a dynamic becoming process that energizes all things. Using process philosophy’s categories, Marjorie Suchocki (1982, 1988) has given new resonance to the meaning of Whitehead’s metaphors of God as “the lure for feeling” whose “power of persuasion” aims to effect justice and peace. Blurring the lines between psychological, somatic, and religious experiences, Ruether (1983 [1993]) has projected an image of “the feminine divine” grounded in the morphology of women’s bodies in all their multiplicity and fluidity.

In all these cases, contemporary feminist articulations of a relation between God and the world, or God and female subjectivity, depicts the divine as continuous with the world rather than radically transcendent ontologically or metaphysically. Divine transcendence is seen to consist either in total immanence or else in some dialectic between horizontal transcendence and immanence.

But images and metaphors are not philosophical concepts, and the reference range of “the divine” as it appears in these and other feminist writings is not always clear. While theologians are frequently satisfied to work imaginatively with symbols, images, and metaphors, without regard to the question what the symbols are symbolic of, philosophers of religion normally seek more precision and conceptual clarification.

4. Feminist Reconstructions of Transcendence

4.1 A Process Feminist Proposal

On the question of the meaning and reference of God-talk, two contemporary schools of philosophy of religion stand out as apparent resources for feminist reconstruction. Both (1) the tradition that employs the classical ontology of being, extending from Thomas Aquinas to Paul Tillich and the early Mary Daly, and (2) the tradition that employs an ontology of becoming, extending from Alfred North Whitehead to Charles Hartshorne, John Cobb, Jr., David Griffin, Marjorie Suchocki, and Catherine Keller, afford systematic conceptual schemes for explicating the metaphors that appear in various contemporary writings concerning “the divine” and any of its variants, such as “the sacred”, “spirit”, “God”, “transcendence”, or “higher power”. Both traditions can be modified, moreover, according to qualifications suggested in this section. They can then be understood as converging in a single conceptual model, rendered as “creativity” in Whitehead’s system and as “being” (esse) in Aquinas’s. This model can be seen as a coherent way of reconciling the Whiteheadian and the Thomistic accounts, while also providing a conceptual alternative to anthropomorphic images of God as Loving Father, Cosmic Monarch, Creator and Intervener, and so forth.

The school of thought known as process philosophy rewrites philosophy of religion in a radically revisionist mode that accents evolution, organismic connectedness, and the primacy of becoming. Its theism is termed “panentheism”, or all-in-god. Process philosophers of religion were preeminent among those who labored in the twentieth century to construct a coherent philosophy of God that would also be consistent with scientific cosmology and evolutionary theory. They produced, in addition, a model relatively free of sexism and androcentrism. The underlying values of the process worldview are organic, relational, dynamic, and embodied. Whitehead’s elaboration of the idea that “it is as true to say that God creates the World, as that the World creates God” (1929 [1978: 348]) anticipated the themes of interrelatedness and mutual conditioning that feminist philosophy has developed in multiple ways in recent decades.

In the process paradigm everything comes into being by grasping or “prehending” antecedently actualized things to integrate them into a new actualized thing, its own self. Supplanting substance philosophy’s idea that it takes an agent to act, process philosophy proposes a model whereby agents are the results of acts and subjects are constituted out of relations. Throughout the entire universe, at both macrocosmic and microcosmic levels, quantum units of becoming achieve momentary unity out of a given multiplicity in a never-ending rhythm of creative process whereby “the many become one and are increased by one” (1929 [1978: 21]).

Creativity within each occasion is spontaneous, the mark of actuality, and free, within the limits determined by its antecedent causes. Creativity unifies any many and is creative of a new unifying perspective which then becomes one among the many. In a process ontology, creativity is ultimate reality not in the sense of something more ultimate behind, above, or beyond reality, but in the sense of something ultimately descriptive of all reality, or what the biologist Charles Birch and the theologian John B. Cobb, Jr. have called “the Life Process” (1982). As a category, creativity is the “ultimate of ultimates” in Whitehead’s words, but as such it is an abstraction, the formal character of any actual occasion. Creativity as concrete, however, signifies a dynamism which is the very actuality of things, their act of being there at all. Everything exists in virtue of creativity, but creativity is not any thing, according to process feminist philosophers of religion.

The idea that the category of the divine or transcendence can be correlated with the category of creativity in Whitehead’s philosophy marks a departure from Whitehead’s own notion of God as an actual entity in process of becoming at the same time that it joins with the Thomistic tradition that has employed the language of being, rather than becoming, to explicate the meaning of the divine. In its classical medieval synthesis in Aquinas, this tradition conceptualized the divine as esse ipsum, and held that in God essence and existence are one; that is, God’s very nature is esse, to be. Everything that exists was thought to do so through participation in divine being, or being itself. For Aquinas and classical thinkers, being was already concretized in a single source that was supremely actual. It is this crucial assumption, Frankenberry has argued, that undergoes modification in the shift from a substance metaphysics to one in which processive-relational categories are taken as ultimate (1993). The result is radical. De-substantialized and freed from static fixity in neo-scholastic metaphysics, being signifies the source and power of all that exists. Dynamized and pluralized according to the process paradigm, being does not repose in an originary source antecedent to every event; rather, it constitutes the very act of be-ing, of liv-ing, of ex-isting in the present moment as a new one emergent from an antecedent many. As such, being or creativity is inherently relational and processive. It is immanent within each momentary event as its spontaneous power; and it is also transcendent to that event of becoming in the sense that it is never exhausted by the forms in which it is found, but is always potentially a “more” that is “not yet” actualized. As long as being, like creativity, is not construed as something a being has but rather as what it means to be at all, the long identification of God with being in Western thought can be understood to point to sheer livingness or that which energizes all things to exist. Although no-thing particular in its own right, being is the very actuality of things, their act of being there at all. Nevertheless, Being-itself should not be construed as a particular being, thus ruling out pictorial theism’s anthropomorphism. Neither is it the sum of all beings, thus ruling out simple aggregation or totality. It is not a property of things nor an accidental quality, not a substance, and not a class of things. Instead, the religious symbol “God” can be understood to pertain to the creative ground of all that is—that which energizes all things—conceived as dynamic, immanent, and plural.

The philosophical concepts of creativity (as explicated by Whitehead) and of esse (as explicated dynamically) are useful for any feminist philosophy of religion that seeks to interpret the meaning of “divine reality”, “holy mystery”, “empowering spirit”, and a variety of other metaphors and symbols that abound in feminist theology. The concept of God as esse refers to the utter actuality of things, an act common to all things. Dynamic and living, be-ing is yet elusive. It signifies the moment to moment reality in virtue of which everything exists, a process that Whitehead’s category of creativity describes as the many becoming one, and as increased by one. Be-ing is no more real or unitary than beings, just as creativity in process philosophy is only actual in virtue of its accidents. As a model for feminist work, this notion of transcendence is dialectically related to immanence, neither dissolved into it as identical, nor divorced from it as wholly other.

4.2 Projecting a Feminine Divine

A distinct alternative to the above appears in the feminist philosophies of religion of Luce Irigaray and Mary Daly. Both seek to project a “female divine” that would be fully immanental in and for the female Self (capitalized by Daly) and would provide what Irigaray calls a “sensible transcendental”. The different rhetorical strategies and cultural contexts of these two gynocentric philosophers sometimes conceal the similarity of their philosophies of religion. Both argue that the Father God is an idealized projection of masculine identity and that the process of women’s becoming divine is imperative. For Daly, the “divine spark” within the female Self is the ontological ballast needed by the feminist movement; similarly for Irigaray, the creation of a “female divine” is a condition of female subjectivity. Both Daly and Irigaray urge nothing less than an overturning of the symbolic order and of language itself. Both are first and foremost philosophers of the passions, seeking to encompass the elements of earth, air, fire, and water within their visions. Each in her own way has helped to forge a radical feminist consensus that spirituality is to be exalted above doctrine, and that patriarchal conceptions of God as any kind of objective reality must be deconstructed so that female subjectivity might become more expansive and free. Both reject reformist moves in the philosophy of religion as remaining inscribed within a phallocentric economy that evokes a god whose self-giving love is only accessible through fathers and sons and their representatives. In theorizing religion, both adopt a projection theory, classically rooted in Feuerbach’s claim that “theology is anthropology” and “God” a projection made in the image of “man”. However, far from relegating religion to the category of illusion, each issues an invitation to “make believe”.

4.2.1 In the American Context

The early Daly carved out a philosophy of religion largely consonant with the position cited in 4.1 above, as found in her Beyond God the Father: Towards a Philosophy of Women’s Liberation (1973 [1985]). Ultimate reality is conceptualized not only as Verb, expressed in the present participle “Be-ing”, but as an “intransitive Verb” in which all being participates (Daly 1973 [1985]: 34; 1978: 23; 1984: 423). In these terms, Daly provides an ontological analysis of the urge toward transcendence, or participation in be-ing. Here the urge to transcendence is raised to the cosmic scale, and the vision of peace, justice, and ecological harmony that Daly projects bears a close resemblance to prophetic biblical texts. “Quintessence” expresses another metaphor for the be-ing in which we live, love, create, are. Daly says that Quintessence

is that which has been drawn on in my writing and searching. The quest for Quintessence is the most Desperate response I know to the call of the Wild. It means throwing one’s life as far as it will go. (1998: 4)

She analyzes Quintessence as the highest essence, above the four elements of fire, air, water, and earth; it is what permeates all nature, the Spirit that gives life and vitality to the whole universe. Although it can be blocked or partly destroyed by violence and pornography, poverty, racism, medical and scientific exploitation, and the threat of ecological and nuclear destruction, its apparent invincibility imparts an important measure of transcendence.

The later Daly’s trilogy developed a modified, more immanent, theory of the divine, beginning with Gyn/Ecology: The Metaethics of Radical Feminism (1978), and continuing through Pure Lust: Elemental Feminist Philosophy (1984) and most of Quintessence—Realizing the Archaic Future (1998). Here the dialectic shifts subtly from the earlier balance maintained between immanence and transcendence, and tips in favor of a divine that is purely immanent within the female Self. Rather than being the divine milieu within which the self lives, the divine is only alive within the self. In GynEcology the emphasis is on the power “to spin” meaning out of women’s own divine orbs and to find the power of being within one’s self. By the time of Pure Lust, Daly has further modified the “power of being” to the pluralized “Powers of Be-ing”, a move that resolves the problem of the one and the many in favor of the many. Given Daly’s separatist ideology, the “divine” in question can only be wholly incarnate in the “many” female divine Selves. The gynocentric emphasis of Daly’s later writings will open her to the same critical questions posed about Irigaray’s woman-centered writings. Can they do justice to differences that figure in discussions of race, class, ethnic origins, and so forth? Do they reinstall sexual difference with old stereotypes left intact, trapping women once more within the parameters of their sexuality and physicality? Have they romanticized difference rather than theorizing it?

Daly’s intent was to create a trans-cultural, i.e., metapatriarchal, myth, but her thinking was deeply indebted to one particular strain in the Western intellectual tradition. Using the words of the Marxist Ernst Bloch, one could call this strain “revolutionary Prometheanism” (Block 1956–1959 [1986] passim). It goes back at least as far as the Stoic logos spermatikos, the “seed” that links every person with the divine reason. It is closely connected with the medieval mystic’s talk of a “scintilla animae”, the “spark of the soul”, frequently echoed in Daly’s books (e.g., 1978: 183: “the divine spark of be-ing in women”). Meister Eckhart could write:

I have said that at times there is a power in the soul which alone is free…. It is free from all names, and altogether unimpeded, untrammelled, and free from all modes, as God is free and untrammelled in Himself. (c. 1300 [1957: 137 as quoted in Pietsch 1979])

For the radical medieval mystic like Eckhart the knowledge revealed in the experience of this divine spark is utterly self-authenticating. Therefore, it need not be subjected to the judgment of an institutional church. So too Daly writes: “she knows that only she can judge her self” (1978: 378). Also important in this strain of thought is the theme of the dispossession/repossession of the true, divine self. It is a powerful theme in Hegel (who was influenced by medieval mysticism) and in Feuerbach, and it also pervades Daly’s philosophy of religion. Hegel decries human beings who let themselves be “robbed of freedom, their spirit, their eternal and absolute element” (1795 [1948: 162]) and who then take “flight to deity” (1795 [1948: 163]). He insists that now (ca. 1800) is the time for persons to “repossess the treasures formerly squandered on heaven” (1795 [1948: 159]). Feuerbach takes up this same motif and makes it the dominant theme of his whole critique of religion. Daly refers to “Stolen female energy” (1978: 367), to “our stolen original divinity” (1978: 41) and urges repossession. She does not say what this leaves for men, who have been living off women, the “generators of energy” (1978: 319). Finally, along with Feuerbach, Daly says simply “we are divinity”.

Daly’s philosophy of religion was plugged into the Promethean myth, but she also added an original contribution. She explicitly expanded it to include women. Then she performed a reversal, and restricted it to women—although this reversal, too, has deep roots in the Western tradition, specifically, Iranian and biblical apocalypticism. Daly conveys the impression that only a few women are able to undertake the “Journey” (1978) or to achieve “Quintessence” (1998). This is not because she was pessimistic about the female Self, which has “immeasurable unique potentialities” (1978: 382), but because she was acutely sensitive to the power of evil, that is, to the power of the male patriarchy to successfully co-opt women. At the same time, Daly could be rapturously optimistic about those women who do escape male power and begin to search and spin. These will find the “real source”, the “deep Background”, the “power of the self’s be-ing”, “the Wild Self”, and spin into a “new time/space”, a “new creation”, and will glimpse a “Paradise that is beyond the boundaries of patriarchal paradise” (1978: 13, 24, 49, 283, 423).

4.2.2 In the Continental Context

More than Daly, Luce Irigaray’s writings have proved to be a provocative stimulus for a number of feminist philosophers of religion (Anderson 1998; Deutscher 1994, 1997; Hollywood 1994, 1998; Jantzen 1999). Both a philosopher and a psychoanalyst, Irigaray aims to recuperate the repressed feminine. Her chief themes are (1) the “sensible transcendental”, which performs a similar function as Derrida’s “finite infinite”, (2) sexual difference as paradigmatic of difference in itself, and (3) divinity and spirituality as significant feminist requirements to ground female subjectivity. Irigaray conceptualises the female divine as a “sensible transcendental” that is both flesh and word (Irigaray 1984 [1993a: 115, 129]). Reversing traditional incarnational doctrine, she speaks of flesh made word instead of word made flesh.

But if the Word was made flesh in this way, and to this extent, it can only have been to make me (become) God in my jouissance, which can at last be recognized. (1977 [1985: 199–200])

Perhaps the best way to read Irigaray’s notion of the “sensible transcendental” is in terms of Mary Daly’s description of her own project: “The philosophy here unfolded”, Daly explained, “is material/physical as well as spiritual, mending/transcending this deceptive dichotomy” (1984: 7). Imagining both sexual difference and divine otherness, Irigaray coins the sensible transcendental to overcome the split between transcendence (mind or spirit) and sensibility (body). Unlike Daly, however, Irigaray argues that a spiritual relationship between women and men, understood as progressive energy transmission, can enable a harmonization of the human and divine dimensions separated under patriarchal distortions. A love that welcomes difference will be capable of recognizing the other as transcendent to the self. Each partner will be allowed access to her or his own divinization.

In “Divine Women” (1993b [first published 1987]) and “Belief Itself” (1993b [first presented 1980]) Irigaray’s approach to the topic of divinity is profoundly immanentalizing, compared to traditional theology and philosophy of religion, even as her interest appears concentrated on the meaning of (women’s) transcendence. Her reconstruction requires two dialectical movements. First, she must nullify the radical alterity of the Wholly Other God, arguing that this is a god produced by and for the masculine imaginary and therefore not suitable to women’s becoming. Second, she must elevate “woman” to the status of the divine, negating Simone de Beauvoir’s view that woman remains always within the dimension of immanence, incapable of transcendence. Mediated by a “god of her sex”, woman’s becoming (divine) is thus possible, and in turn makes possible for the first time an ethics that defines a genuine relationship between two subjects, male and female, who do not simply differ, but differ differently. In the final analysis, by “the divine” Irigaray means “sexual difference” itself, that is, a new form of ethical relationship that can exist between women and men, or, by extension, between women and any others, once women have attained their own subjectivity.

Shorn of his anthropocentrism, Irigaray’s philosophy of religion recalls the twofold ambition of Feuerbach’s philosophy of religion in 1841: to elevate “man” to the level of “God” in order to display the true essence of the species-being; and to dissolve “God” into the human essence more unequivocally than Hegel, who did not fully anthropologize the divine. Her relation to Feuerbach (and Hegel) is apparent in her account of the sensible transcendental as marking the fundamental materiality of spirit. Debates concerning Irigaray’s possible “essentialism” and “utopianism” also recall Marx’s critique of Feuerbach’s “species-being”, and repeated charges of the utopian quality of Marx’s own idea of unalienated humanity. Some feminists rebut the utopian charge by finding in Irigaray’s reflections on the element of air in the work of Heidegger a tangible example of materiality that transcends the limitations of embodiment without being any less material (Armour 2003). Others read Irigaray’s notion of a sensible transcendental as relying too heavily on western models of autonomy and self-determination (M. Keller 2003). Recently, Irigaray’s explorations of the meaning of spirit/breath as the elemental force of life have put her in touch with eastern religious traditions such as Hinduism (Irigaray 1999 [2002]).

A major question some feminists have raised about the “feminine divine” is whether the language of transcendence can be retained plausibly as a poetic probe when the object of belief is assumed to be unreal. Amy Hollywood’s analysis discloses why acceptance of a Feuerbachian projection theory of religion, in which God is the projection of human wishes, attributes, and desires, complicates any effort to construct a new “feminine divine”. Belief works, Hollywood says, only as long as the underlying dynamics that fund it remain hidden.

What Irigaray appears to forget is Feuerbach’s central claim (and the grounds for his hope that the hold of religion might be broken): for religious projection to function, its mechanism must be hidden so that its object might inspire belief. (Hollywood 1994: 175)

Irigaray recognizes that the “exposure” of this mechanism has not destroyed religion for many, and hence asserts the importance of adequate projections. But how is such projection possible or meaningful for those, like Irigaray herself, who assume that the object of belief is unreal? If Irigaray maintains a Feuerbachian human referent for her own projection of religious discourse in terms of female representations of the divine, the feminine divine, too, would seem to facilitate its own destruction. What possibilities does this leave for female transcendence? Can belief be simultaneously posited and deconstructed? Can the strong female subjectivity created in and by a mystic such as Teresa of Avila become available to women without Teresa’s acceptance of a transcendent Other who is the divine (Hollywood 1994: 176)? Because transcendence for Irigaray is associated with the “male” and a sacrificial economy, it is not clear how women are expected to claim the new subjectivity that she thinks religion, reconstituted, can offer. It may be the case that Irigaray herself is ambivalent about belief and transcendence, and this leads her “immediately to deconstruct the very deities she invokes” (1994: 176). It may further be the case that the gynocentric project in philosophy of religion creates distinctive tensions, leading even sympathetic critics to inquire

how far the immanent can be re-inscribed as the site of transcendence without returning to the logic of sacrifice and bodily suffering seemingly endemic to the incarnational theologies of Christianity. (Hollywood 1994: 177)

There is also the related question as to “whether belief can be mimed without re-inscribing women into a logic of the same such as that which Irigaray sees underlying Christianity” (Hollywood 1994: 177).

Irigaray can be interpreted as striving to create a religious language that leads neither to theism nor to atheism but rather to a dialectic of immanence and transcendence that does not in any way assume an “object of belief” along hierarchical lines of verticality (see Hollywood 2002: chap. 7). In comparison to traditional theological accounts of such a dialectic, however, the emphasis of Irigaray’s philosophy of religion is oriented to affirming immanence, rather than to escaping finitude, embodiment, and materiality. The divine is to be found in the space between two (human) beings who encounter each other face to face in the recognition of sexual difference. Transcendence for women hinges on the possibility of this radical, and relational, immanentizing of the meaning of divinity.

5. Immanental Themes and Methods

While revisionist, de-patriarchalized philosophies of God/ess continue to engage some feminist philosophers of religion, others are willing to see even that topic cease to be center stage. As new waves of historicism and anti-essentialism register among the generation of post-analytic philosophers of religion, dissatisfaction has begun to develop with the traditional topics. Traditionally, for nonfeminist philosophers, the tendency to assimilate questions about religion to questions about “belief in the existence of God” has led down a slippery slope that transformed philosophical reflection about religion into reflection on the existence of God, the rationality of belief, the validity of the proofs, and the coherence of the divine attributes. This slide was historically understandable in terms of the influence of natural theology on philosophy of religion in the West, but the real issue, as noted by Michael McGhee, “is whether such preoccupations should remain central to the philosophy of religion, and, if not, what should replace them” (1992: 1). This section samples several emerging directions that signal the new preoccupations of feminist philosophers of religion.

5.1 Feminist Standpoint Epistemology

Epistemological questions constitute an important part of the agenda for feminist philosophies of religion. What has the status of knowledge in various religious traditions? What gets valorized as worth knowing? What are the criteria evoked? Who has the authority to establish religious meaning? Is religious meaning something distinct from or independent of ordinary linguistic meanings of words? Who is the presumed subject of religious belief? How does the social position of the subject affect the content of religious belief? What is the impact upon religious life of the subject’s sexed body? What do we learn by examining the relations between power, on the one hand, and what counts as evidence, foundations, modes of discourse, forms of apprehension and transmission, on the other? In view of the intimate connection of power/knowledge, how do we handle the inevitable occlusion that attends all knowledge production? What particular processes constitute the normative cultural subject as masculine in its philosophical and religious dimensions?

The work of feminist philosopher of religion Pamela Sue Anderson offers a good example of the feminist standpoint theory approach to religion and gender, unadulterated by any loyalty to Christianity. In the first book-length study to be entitled A Feminist Philosophy of Religion (1998) Anderson set out to revise and reform philosophy of religion by using feminist standpoint epistemology as developed by Sandra Harding in philosophy of science. A feminist standpoint is not the same as a woman’s experiences, situation, or perspective but is rather an achievement of an epistemically informed perspective resulting from struggle by or on behalf of women and men who have been dominated, exploited, or oppressed. Applied to philosophy of religion, feminist standpoint epistemology involves thinking from the perspective of women who have been oppressed by specific monotheistic religious beliefs. Anderson challenges both the privileged model of God as a disembodied person and the related model of reason as neutral, objective, and free of bias and desire. Spinning new myths or devising new conceptions of a divine reality are not part of this agenda. There is only the double imperative: “to think from the lives of others” and “to reinvent ourselves as other”.

However, adequate understanding of the religious beliefs of embodied persons, according to Anderson, requires a deeper analysis of the multiple intertwinings between reason and desire than philosophy of religion normally shows.

But how are feminists to talk about the material content of female desire? At just this point feminist standpoint epistemology yields to poststructuralist insights and Anderson finds in the work of Irigaray, Kristeva, and bell hooks themes that are missing in mainstream epistemology and some feminist epistemology. She articulates her philosophy of religion around “yearning” as a cognitive act of a creative and just memory. As used by bell hooks (1990), yearning is a positive act that motivates struggle in the search for personal and communal justice. It shapes a spirituality. According to Anderson, yearning is the vital reality of human life which gives rise to religious belief. Therefore, philosophical analysis of and feminist concern with reason combined with desire, as found in expressions of yearning for truth whether epistemological, ethical (justice), or aesthetic (love or beauty), need to supplement standard approaches to philosophy of religion.

One must be careful, Anderson says, not to conflate yearning with only a disguised form of the philosophical aspiration to be infinite. Her analysis of the concept of the infinite reveals a corrupt striving to become infinite or “all there is” at work in both masculinist and feminist philosophy of religion. In place of this Anderson calls for an approach that would allow instantiating the regulative ideals of truth, love, goodness, and justice as conditions for any incorrupt craving for infinitude. Humans can yearn for truth or crave infinitude while at the same time acknowledging self-consciously held and embodied locations (Anderson 2001). This means that, as other philosophers have pointed out, there is no “God’s eye view”, no actual infinite (Aquinas’s “actus purus”); the notion of infinity pertains only to abstract potentiality, whereas concrete actuality is incurably finite.

Questions of the justifiability of religious belief have previously been center stage in philosophy of religion. Anderson does not consider this question per se, but instead analyzes the prior question of the rational construction of belief and the production of knowledge. She considers the ways in which an exclusive focus on justification of dominant beliefs excluded women’s beliefs and women’s role in reasoning by assuming that only certain privileged beliefs should be assessed for their truth. At the same time she argues against any swift dismissal of justificatory questions, as well as against a strict focus on the justification of theistic beliefs. The myths of Mirabai, the legendary Hindu poetess-saint, and Antigone, the mythical figure of insurgence in Greek tragedy, are useful in understanding the notion of yearning as a rational passion linked to bodily experiences (1998: chap. 5). Anderson finds the disruptive mimings of these myths helpful for challenging the narrow parameters of empirical realist forms of theism.

5.2 Further Psychoanalytic Perspectives on the Female Symbolic

Grace Jantzen issues a radical challenge to other feminist philosophers who would make epistemology, rather than psychoanalytic theory, their point of departure in studying religion and its repressed underside. (Jantzen 1999, 2004). She argues that questions about truth and the justification of religious belief can be dismissed as categories of the masculine symbolic. Going beyond Luce Irigaray, Jantzen’s body of work at the time of her death in 2006 proposed nothing less than a new imaginary of religion, a feminist symbolic of “natality and flourishing” as an alternative to the category of mortality, verging on necrophilia/necrophobia, with which the western tradition has been saturated. Influenced by Hannah Arendt’s work on natality and Adriana Cavarero’s feminist reading of Plato, Jantzen believed that a preoccupation with death and violence subtends the masculinist imaginary. If feminist philosophy of religion is ever to transform the symbolic order which inscribes this imaginary, it is necessary to change the imaginary. For this purpose, a model of transformative change drawn from psychoanalysis and Continental philosophy of religion is more useful than a model drawn from Anglo-American adversarial modes of argumentation (Jantzen 1999: 78).

To demonstrate the extent to which the Western symbolic is saturated with violence and death, epitomized in the crucified Christ, Jantzen situated her philosophy of religion in relation to the psychoanalytic theory of both Julia Kristeva and Luce Irigaray. Their account offers a theory of one of the most important features of any religion: sacrifice. Sacrificial codes involve a forgetting/erasure of the complex role of the maternal, amounting to a “matricide” (Kristeva) at the foundation of religious practice. According to Irigaray in “Belief Itself”, the central figure of the western cultural imaginary is the unmourned and unacknowledged sacrifice of the (m)other’s body that Christianity masks under the Eucharistic sacrifice of the son. According to Kristeva (1977 [1987]) in “Stabat Mater”, the real symbolic association is not between women and birth, but between women and death, setting up men as cultural masters over and above mortality and its intimations in the bodies of women.

Jantzen corrected the matricidal assertion of Kristevan theory; she argued against thinking that the child’s need to separate from the mother in order to become an individual is what initiates a logic of sacrifice and violence in the western symbolic. There is no imperative to sacrifice the mother in order to commence formation of the self in the cultural realm. However important separation and individuation are in subject formation, they are not proportional to death and violence. If we were to attend to natality instead, Jantzen wrote, we would be better able to create a new imaginary based on birth, life, and potentiality (Jantzen 2003). Feminist philosophy of religion should try to follow the path of desire to/for the divine, and forego the preoccupation with the rational justification of beliefs and the evaluation of truth-claims. Feminist philosophy of religion can attend better to the symbolic impact of birth rather than death as a strategy for creating a new imaginary construct that emphasizes flourishing of life rather than sacrifice of it. The norms of moral or political adequacy replace those of epistemic adequacy (Jantzen 2004).

If one asks what the ontological status of the divine is for Jantzen, one could say that it is pantheistic (see Jantzen 1999, chap. 11). As the horizon of human becoming, the divine is transcendent in the sense of the other of the world, non-reducible to statements about the world’s physical characteristics. As immanent, the divine is this world; there is no other. What previously had been seen as a set of polarities now opens out into a play of diversities, bringing the divine to life through us.

Foundations of Violence, Jantzen’s final publication, synthesizes her analysis of the psychoanalytic, religious, and philosophical dimensions of death and violence in Western culture, culminating in a constructive alternative (a feminine symbolic) that celebrates beauty, desire, and the creative impulse. Thanatos, a death drive, far from being a universal of human nature, as Freud believed, is a gendered construction of Western modernity, according to Jantzen, with precursors in Christendom and classical antiquity. Homer, Sophocles, Plato and Aristotle provide the genealogy of violence in Western thought that Jantzen critiques here, while Plotinus stands in for all those other-worldly seekers who gesture toward release in another world. What was to be a six-volumed study on Death and the Displacement of Beauty in the western tradition can be comprehended in incipient form in Jantzen 1999.

Pushing with and against Lacanian and Freudian theories, Jantzen (2002), Armour (2002), and Hollywood (2002, 2004) offer three important readings of Irigaray’s essay “Belief Itself” (1980 [1993b]). These feminist readings rely on critical appropriations of psychoanalysis and Derridean reading practices to re-assess a topic that stands at the center of much modern philosophy of religion. Belief and its formation, they show, is implicated in the formation of the subject and sexual difference, as well as related issues of embodiment and presence and absence. The argument is not only the familiar feminist one that the object of belief is male-defined, but the more radical claim that the structure and discourse of belief itself is masculinist and in need of deconstruction. That is to say that the constitution of the normative (Western, bourgeois) subject of religion and philosophy depends on the association of the body with the mother and femininity and an always incomplete and ambivalent mastering, concealment, or denial of the mother’s body. Freud’s own account of the fort/da game (“gone”-“there”) played by his grandson, Ernst, exposes the relationship between belief and the little boy’s mastery of the mother’s presence and absence, concealedness and unconcealedness. Despite her apparent absence, she is there, the boy comes to believe, and in so believing he experiences his own power. For Irigaray (1993b), God, as the Father and the source of meaning, emerges as the object of a belief first articulated in the (male child’s) attempt to master the mother’s absence; the dismantling of the subject as master, then, implies a concomitant deconstruction of the object of belief. For Armour (2002), the implications of this reading on the other side of ontotheology entail a challenge to any narrow definition of ontotheology or too-easy hope that it might swing free of logocentrism and phallocentrism. The wound at the heart of normative masculine subjectivity, evident in Derrida’s display of his dying mother’s body in his essay “Circumfession”, is an effect of the current sacrificial economy on the mother/son relationship. As Armour suggests,

working from the recognition of a primordial maternal sacrifice (rather than belief in a transcendent Father God) requires confrontation with pain and loss, not compensation for them. (Armour 2002: 223)

For Hollywood, a further implication concerns the renewed attention to the place of ritual and practice in religion. Not only do religious rituals, bodily practices, and discursive performatives construct gender but they also construct the very objects of religious belief. Her proposal that, as constituted, gender and the objects of religious belief have a similar ontological status re-opens a crucial question that many feminist philosophers of religion have finessed. The ontological status of objects of belief, especially deliberately projected ones, cannot be fully understood without bringing back into the picture the body, emotion, and desire as shaped by ritual practices (Hollywood, 2004).

5.3 Corporeal Subjectivity

The body, a recurrent theme in a variety of recent interdisciplinary studies, figures as the material or symbolic basis for much feminist philosophy of religion, in contrast to the fiction of disembodied subjectivity that marks mainstream modern epistemology.

One such body-based study, Howard Eilberg-Schwartz’s work, God’s Phallus and Other Problems for Men and Monotheism (1994), is indicative of a new alliance of philosophy of religion with gender studies and social theory, rather than with natural theology and speculative metaphysics. Dozens of feminist studies have explored the way in which male deities authorize male domination and undermine female experience in the social order. Left unconsidered was the question whether a male divinity generates certain dilemmas and tensions for the conception of masculinity, rendering its meaning unstable. Pursuing this question, Eilberg-Schwartz overturns the conventional assumption that Jewish monotheism centered on an invisible, disembodied deity. His analysis of numerous myths shows that ancient Israel did image God in human form, while at the same time veiling the divine phallus.

Two consequences in particular arise for masculinity in a religious system that imagines a male deity with a phallus. First, the dilemma of homoerotic desire is posed when men worship a male God in a culture based on heterosexual complementarity. Although the expression of divine-human intimacy is couched in the language of male-female complementarity, it is males, not females, who enter into the covenantal marriage with the deity. Collectively, Israelite men were constituted discursively as “she”, and said to be “whoring” when they strayed from monotheism (monogamy) into idolatry (adultery). Suppression of the homoerotic impulse in the divine-human relationship, however, could take several forms: hiding and veiling the body of God through prohibitions against depicting God; feminizing Israelite males so that they could assume the role of God’s wife; and exaggerating the way in which women are “other” so as to minimize the ways in which men are made into others of God.

The solution of imagining Israel as a metaphorical woman, in an exclusive relation to the divine maleness, may have solved the first dilemma of homoerotic desire only by generating another. The second major dilemma for masculinity, according to Eilberg-Schwartz, is posed by being made in the image of a sexless Father God in a culture defined by patrilineal descent. The sexlessness of a Creator Father God sets up major tensions for men who must pro-create. In contrast to the Christian religion, whose different logic of a God fathering a Son could render a human father irrelevant, Hebrew logic placed great importance on the human father, generating tension around a Father God who was thought to be sexless and therefore without a son. When the dilemma of homoerotic desire is posed later for Christian men in relation to a male Christ’s body, it, too, is avoided by speaking collectively of the Christian community as a woman.

Feminist philosophy of religion has yet to explore fully the question of how a male God is problematic for men’s conceptions of self, according to Eilberg-Schwartz. It has also left unthought the difference between God as male and God as Father. Strict focus on the ways in which a masculine image of God undermines female experience tends to conflate human and divine masculinities into one undifferentiated symbol. Eilberg-Schwartz differentiates between images of male deities and images of father deities, contending that the maleness of God may have different implications than the fatherliness of God. Fatherly images of God can and should be used, he argues, “but only if equally powerful female images are also celebrated” (1994: 239). Repudiating the incorporeal, distant God that helped to generate the hierarchical associations of masculinity and femininity, he favors an image of “a tender loving Father who faces and embraces the child”, in the apparent expectation that a loving and embodied God may support a different kind of masculinity, one more capable of intimacy and tenderness (1994: 240).

5.4 The Webbed Relations of Language, Experience, Power, and Discourse

Poststructuralist criticism as it studies the webbed relations of language, experience, power, and discourse still leaves some open and untheorized space in the links among these terms. Mary McClintock Fulkerson’s Changing the Subject: Women’s Discourses and Feminist Theology (1994), fills those gaps and challenges three inadequate notions of language, gender, and power: (1) the idea that linguistic signs re-present the thing; (2) the Cartesian assumption of the subjective consciousness as the origin of meaning; and (3) the understanding of power only in terms of external, unidirectional, and negative oppression. Poststructuralist method also critiques the liberal logic of inclusion that appeals to “women’s experience” or “women’s religious experience” as though it is an unproblematic or uncoded content of some kind. All such strategies and methods, Fulkerson shows, fail to recognize and account for the multiplicity of differences among myriad subject positions. In contrast to the liberal humanist goal of accommodating as many “different voices” as possible, discourse analysis seeks a more radical reading of the ways “voice” itself is produced and knowledge is power. Taking into account the inextricable and multiplicative character of the link between knowledge and the social relations out of which knowledge emerges changes the question, as well as the subject, according to Fulkerson. The question is not, for example, whether a given religious belief system is oppressive or liberating to women. Such generic and wholesale frames need to be replaced by more complex appreciation of the construction of multiple identities according to different locations in the social formation of patriarchal capitalism.

Fleshing out the multiple orderings that create differences in women’s positions should result in a clarification of what is at stake in appeals to “women’s experience”, often taken as a “source” and/or “norm” for feminist thought in an earlier generation of texts. Rather than as a “content” that is representative of a natural realm of women’s consciousness, religious or otherwise, “women’s experience” should be understood as constructed from “converging discourses, their constitution by differential networks, and their production of certain pleasures and subjugations” (Fulkerson, 115) Experience is not the origin of (feminist) philosophy of religion in the sense of offering evidence for its claims, but the very reality that needs to be explained. Similarly, in theorizing the link, for example, between the maleness of divine imagery and the legitimation of male dominance, what needs to be explained is how the maleness of divine imagery gets distributed and interrelated with material realities, and how the discourse itself carries out the oppression of women.

Once the false universal of “women’s experience” or “human experience” is replaced with an “analytic of women’s discourses”, feminist philosophers of religion can begin to consider the specific productions of positions for women, asking such questions as:

What discourses construct the middle-class white churchwoman’s positions? The poor Pentecostal woman preacher’s? The liberal academic liberation feminist’s?

In her investigations of Appalachian Pentecostal women preachers’ discourse and of the discourse of Presbyterian women’s groups, Fulkerson sees two very diverse women’s subject positions wrestling with a religious tradition in ways both liberating and constraining. Approaching the world of faith as a system of discourses, rather than as representational interpretations or cognitive belief claims, she displays how women’s faith positions can be constitutive of their emancipatory practices. The call stories and worship performances of poor Pentecostal women ministers, accompanied by ecstatic and bodily displays of joy, produce particular forms of resistance to patriarchal constraints, just as the faith practices of middle class Presbyterian housewives produce other possibilities for transgression, pleasure, and desire.

One merit of this methodology for feminist philosophy of religion is its exposure of the complexity of gender discourse, the constraints and resistances found in faith practices, and the social conditions of signification. It creates space in which it is possible to ask what philosophy of religion has occluded from its angle of vision by virtue of the abstract and distanced discourse that has characterized it.

One drawback of poststructuralist accounts of discourse, according to some feminists, is that it rules out the possibility that claims can be validated outside of particular communities and their languages. Fulkerson appeals to nonfoundationalism, the position that eschews the search for justifying beliefs or experiences that can in turn support other beliefs derived from them. She says that she does not find it necessary to offer reasoned arguments for the faith claims she invokes. The pertinent discursive practices she analyzes are those of resistance, survival, agape, and hope—practices, she freely admits, that assume the existence of God rather than problematize it. What remains an open question for this avenue of feminist philosophy of religion is how far discourse analysis can go toward ever subverting the belief structures of Pentecostal women ministers or Presbyterian housewives, indeed, how it could even be theoretically possible for it to do so.

5.5 Pragmatizing Feminist Philosophy of Religion

In the North American context, a convergence of feminist and pragmatist agendas has emerged, with important implications for feminist philosophy of religion. Indebted to the pioneering work of Charlene Haddock Seigfried (1996), and recent studies by McKenna (2001) and Sullivan (2001), pragmatist-feminist philosophy of religion is distinguished by several features. First, on its philosophical side, both pragmatist philosophy and feminism share a strong critique of scientistic positivism; resistance to fact-value dichotomies; reclamation of the experiential and epistemic import of aesthetics; analyses of dominant discourses in light of forms of social domination; linkage of theory and practice; interest in the theoretical primacy of concrete experience; repudiation of the spectator stance of philosophical indifference; and an interrogation of the social-political effects of the social sciences. Second, on its religious side, the pragmatist tradition offers untapped resources for feminist reconstruction, ranging from the explicit philosophies of religion in the classical writings of Peirce, James, Dewey, Santayana, and Mead, to the implicit ones in the current revival of pragmatism on both sides of the Atlantic. The religious import of American pragmatism in its first millennium is best understood as a naturalization of traditional notions of transcendence and spirituality rather than, as its critics charge, an abdication of any hopes of transcendence at all. According to one interpreter (Stuhr 2003), pragmatism has relocated traditional notions of transcendence within immanence, relocated spirit within nature, relocated absolutes within inquiry, relocated affirmation within negation, and relocated salvation within community, a description that applies equally to the relocation effort performed in feminist philosophies of religion. The end result of these combined naturalization processes should yield something new to philosophy of religion:

truth without the problems of certainty; justification without the problems of foundations; nature and access to it without the problems of supernaturalism or solipsism; values without the problems of absolutism or arbitrariness; and distinctively religious or spiritual experience without idealism, dualism, or institutional religion. (Stuhr 2003: 194)

6. Conclusion

Feminist scholarship in general has had a hard time with religion. And mainstream philosophy of religion until recently has had a hard time with feminist scholarship.

Going forward in the twenty-first century, three particular questions stand out. The most significant question on the agenda for future reflection concerns religious pluralism and the need to overcome the extreme ethnocentrism of Anglo-American philosophy of religion. Insofar as the field faces the challenge of encounter with traditions expressing practices and beliefs that are not predominantly associated with European, white, or male modes of understanding, it will be required to elaborate new models of interpretation, a broader theory of evidence, a cross-culturally adequate conception of human rationality, and a more complex appraisal of the norms applicable to cases of divergent, rival religious claims and disagreements. Insofar as feminist philosophy of religion studies the strictly intellectual interpretations of any religious tradition, it will encounter beliefs, symbols, and ideas that are embedded in specific socio-cultural power relations. New work is now needed that reflects on the dynamics of power relations, analyzes inherited oppressions, searches for alternative wisdom and suppressed symbolism, and risks new accounts of the tricky truth and justification questions in light of religious pluralism.

Taking seriously the striking plurality of human forms of religious life leads to a second significant question. What theorizations of religion are most adequate for feminists to work with? Before this question can be addressed with all the philosophical rigor its complexity demands, feminists must face up to the fact that religion is a potent dimension of the lives and desires of contemporary women around the world; therefore, philosophizing it away as superstition, reactionary ideology, false consciousness, irrational belief, or premodern, outmoded hangover simply calls into question, not the phenomenon of religion, but the grasp of feminist philosophy itself on its subject matter. In our time, the elementary forms of religious life cannot be critiqued along the same old lines that Western secular modernity has taken for granted. In the past, Marxians and Freudians could provide theoretical fuel for the critique of religion for generations of readers, but their general theory of religion as a function of projection (of class interests or of the father-image) is severely outdated. Since we cannot divide reality into what is “really there” and what is “humanly projected”, and since there is no clear distinction to be drawn between the properties things have “in themselves” and the properties that are “in us”, projection theories of religion (or of anything else) rest on a purely suppositional basis. They lack explanatory value.

Finally, theorization of the meaning of “religion” in feminist philosophy of religion in a pluralistic age leads to a third area of unploughed feminist ground. In addition to thinking about the philosophy in religion, feminists need to think more deeply about the religion in philosophy. What is the significance to feminists of the “return to religion” found, for example, in Emmanuel Levinas or Gianni Vattimo? Theological conceptions abound also in the work of Martin Heidegger, Iris Murdoch, Stanley Cavell, Charles Taylor, and Martha Nussbaum. The deconstructionist writings of Jacques Derrida offer another instance of secular writing in a religious key whose feminist relevance needs to be assessed. Although some outstanding and suggestive work has been done by Fergus Kerr (1997), John Caputo (1997), and Hent de Vries (1999) on the religion in recent philosophy, the feminist corner of the triangle religion-philosophy-feminism remains to be more completely configured.


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