God and Other Necessary Beings
It is commonly accepted that there are two sorts of existent entities: those that exist but could have failed to exist, and those that could not have failed to exist. Entities of the first sort are contingent beings; entities of the second sort are necessary beings. We will be concerned with the latter sort of entity in this article.
There are various entities which, if they exist, would be candidates for necessary beings: God, propositions, relations, properties, states of affairs, possible worlds, and numbers, among others. Note that the first entity in this list is a concrete entity, while the rest are abstract entities. Many interesting philosophical questions arise when one inquires about necessary beings: What makes it the case that they exist necessarily? Is there a grounding for their necessary existence? Do some of them depend on others? If so, how might one understand the dependence relation?
- 1. Stating the Question
- 2. Why Might Someone Believe God Grounds the Existence of Necessarily Existing Abstract Objects?
- 3. God’s Grounding Abstract Objects I: Views on Which Necessarily Existing Abstracta Are All Grounded in God
- 4. God’s Grounding Abstract Objects II: Views on Which There Aren’t Necessarily Existing Abstract Objects that All Are Grounded in God
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1. Stating the Question
The main question we will address in this article is: Does God ground the existence of necessarily existing abstract objects? It is perhaps a more general question than a question one might at first ask: Did God create necessarily existing abstracta? But it is the main question that philosophers who have written about the relation between God and abstract objects have sought to answer.
Over the last two decades, philosophers have done a great deal of work on the notion of grounding (see, e.g., Fine 2001, Rosen 2010, Audi 2012, Schaffer 2009 Koslicki 2012 and the Stanford Encyclopedia entry on grounding). It is thought by many currently working on issues in the metaphysics of grounding that grounding is a primitive, sui generis relation. In particular, it is not to be understood as a supervenience or causal relation. How are we then to understand what it is? Philosophers point to particular cases where it is instanced: Dispositional properties are grounded in categorical properties, the mental is grounded in the physical, the semantic is grounded in the non-semantic, features like smiles or surfaces are grounded in facts about bodies, and so on. To this point, one might think that grounding talk can be captured by our ordinary notion of supervenience. But Fine (2001) claims that Socrates’ singleton set is grounded in Socrates; yet, necessarily one exists just if the other does. Thus our ordinary modal notion of supervenience won’t capture this case of grounding. If we assume (as many in the grounding literature do) that the other cases of grounding are of the same sort as the Socrates-singleton case is, then our ordinary notion of supervenience won’t capture them either.
Our discussion of the question of God’s grounding the existence of necessarily existing abstracta bears on the general conversation about the nature of grounding. First, we can note that our divine grounding case stands alongside the Socrates-singleton case in showing that ordinary supervenience won’t capture the grounding relationship properly. For instance, suppose we say that God grounds the existence of the number 2. We then can note that, necessarily God exists just if 2 does (that is, each exist in every possible world). According to ordinary notions of supervenience, the number 2 supervenes on God, and conversely. But we are to think that God grounds the existence of 2, and not vice versa. Second, we have here in the case of divine grounding of abstracta a case where the grounding relationship is typically spelled out in other, familiar terms (and thus isn’t sui generis). As we will see, a number of different philosophers who think that God grounds the existence of necessarily existing abstract objects think that God does so in a causal manner. Others think that the grounding takes place in that necessarily existing abstracta are identical with divine mental states.
One might look at those who claim that God causes necessarily existing abstract objects or that they are identical with divine mental states as not asserting that God grounds the existence of necessarily existing abstracta. But as we will see, each of these sorts of theorists really is saying that God grounds the existence of necessarily existing abstract objects. Thus, it might be better to cast our lot with those who are skeptical that there is a sui generis grounding relationship that metaphysicians investigate. Or, if there is such a relationship in some cases of grounding, it isn’t present in all cases of grounding (it isn’t “univocal”—see Hofweber 2009 and Daly 2012 for discussion). After all, it is perfectly sensible to recast “Do necessarily existing abstract objects depend on God?” as “Are necessarily existing abstract objects grounded in God?”
However we think of the dependence relationship between God and necessarily existing abstract objects, we will want to insist that on it God is somehow more fundamental than necessarily existing abstract objects. Fundamentality (Stanford Encyclopedia entry) is an asymmetric relationship. Thus we will construe those who think that God grounds the existence of necessarily existing abstracta as claiming that God is more fundamental than necessarily existing abstracta, and not conversely.
2. Why Might Someone Believe God Grounds the Existence of Necessarily Existing Abstract Objects?
There are at least two sorts of reasons why someone might be inclined to think that God grounds the existence of necessarily existing abstract objects. The first sort of reason involves central religious texts in monotheistic faiths like Judaism, Christianity, and Islam. Roughly, this sort of reason consists in these texts’ assertions or suggestions that God has created everything. If God created everything, it must be that God has created necessarily existing abstract objects, as well. Thus, God grounds the existence of these abstract objects. For instance, there are statements in the Hebrew Bible such as Psalm 89:11: “The heavens are yours, the earth also is yours; the world and all that is in it—you have founded them”. Also in the Hebrew Bible is Nehemiah 9:6:
And Ezra said: “You are the Lord, you alone; you have made heaven, the heaven of heavens, with all their host, the earth and all that is on it, the seas and all that is in them. To all of them you give life, and the host of heaven worships you”.
In the New Testament, there are passages like John 1:1–1:4:
In the beginning was the Word, and the Word was with God, and the Word was God. He was in the beginning with God. All things came into being through him, and without him not one thing came into being. (The Word [logos in Greek] to which John refers is Jesus of Nazareth)
Paul states in Colossians 1:15–16,
He [Jesus] is the image of the invisible God, the firstborn of all creation; for in him all things in heaven and on earth were created, things visible and invisible, whether thrones or dominions or rulers or powers—all things have been created through him and for him.
One of the most important documents for Christian faith outside the Hebrew Bible and New Testament, the Nicene Creed of 325, says “We believe in one God, the Father almighty, maker of all things visible and invisible”. The Niceno-Constantinopolitan Creed of 381, a modification of the older Nicene Creed of 325 that is used by the western Church begins similarly, “We believe in one God, the Father almighty, maker of heaven and earth, of all things that are visible and invisible”.
According to the Qur’an, “God is the Creator of all things; He has charge of everything; the keys of the heavens and earth are His” (39:62–63). The Qur’an also says, “This is God, your Lord, there is no God but Him, the Creator of all things, so worship Him; He is in charge of everything ” (6:102).
These reasons from authoritative religious texts may not be taken to be conclusive, however. One may take these sorts of texts seriously as an adherent to faiths they define and still hold that God doesn’t have creative control over necessarily existing abstract objects. For instance, Peter van Inwagen (2009) argues that the universal quantifier in claims like that of the Nicene Creed “maker of all things visible and invisible” is implicitly restricted to include only those things that are capable of being created. Necessarily existing abstract objects cannot enter into causal relations and thus can’t be created. But it is worth noting that philosophers who think that if there are necessarily existing abstract objects, God must have some sort of control over them (e.g., Craig 2016) point to texts like those cited above for justification for this view.
There is a second sort of reasoning that may lead someone to think that God grounds the existence of necessarily existing abstract objects. That is by way of perfect being theology (see Morris 1987a, 1987b and Nagasawa 2017 for discussion). Perfect being theology is a way of theorizing a priori about God that goes back at least to Anselm of Canterbury. One begins with the claim that God is the greatest possible being, and from there one can derive attributes that God must have. This method is one way of arriving at God’s being omnipotent, omniscient, and perfectly good. Anselm himself famously thought that via perfect being theology he could conclude that God existed. For our purposes here, we are to imagine two conceptually possible beings: One being has grounds or explains the existence of necessarily existing abstract objects, and the other doesn’t. We are to see that the being that grounds these abstracta is greater than one who doesn’t, and thus we are to conclude that God (the greatest possible being) has control over necessarily existing abstract objects. Sometimes the intuition that the former being is greater than the latter is put in terms of God’s aseity, or independence from all other entities. A being with maximal aseity is greater than one without it (other things being equal); and if necessarily existing abstract objects don’t depend on God, God lacks maximal aseity.
There likely would be little objection to reasoning to divine grounding of necessarily existing abstracta in the above way, if it were thought that God could have control over these sorts of abstracta. However, someone might concur with van Inwagen that abstracta can’t enter into causal relations, and say that the only way that abstracta might be grounded in God is via causation. Or someone might think that the idea of a necessarily existing object depending on anything is incoherent. If one took either of these positions, one would deny that the being who grounds necessarily existing abstract objects was greater than the one who didn’t. (Just as she would deny that a being who can make a square circle is greater than one who can’t—there can’t be a being who can make a square circle.)
We have noted two sorts of reasons why a theist might think that God grounds the existence of necessarily existing abstract objects. We turn to a discussion of some different answers to our central question: Does God ground the existence of necessarily existing abstract objects? Each of the next two sections will begin with a list of views and will follow with considerations for and against each.
3. God’s Grounding Abstract Objects I: Views on Which Necessarily Existing Abstracta Are All Grounded in God
The views discussed in this section are as follows:
Necessarily existing abstracta are caused to exist by God’s will (or some other normally-contingent divine faculty). Example: Descartes.
Necessarily existing abstracta are caused to exist by some non-contingent divine faculty (e.g., the right sort of divine cognition). Example: Leibniz, Morris-Menzel (1986).
Theistic Mentalism (without Divine Simplicity):
Necessarily existing abstracta are identical with divine mental states, and God isn’t simple. Example: Welty (2014).
Theistic Mentalism (with Divine Simplicity):
Necessarily existing abstract are identical with divine mental states, and God is simple. Examples: Augustine, Aquinas.
3.1 Theistic Voluntarism
According to the theistic voluntarist, necessarily existing abstract objects depend on the divine will, or some other contingent feature of God. This is famously the view of Descartes. In a letter to Mersenne (27 May 1630), Descartes says:
You ask me by what kind of causality God established the eternal truths. I reply: by the same kind of causality as he created all things, that is to say, as their efficient and total cause. For it is certain that he is the author of the essence of created things no less than of their existence; and this essence is nothing other than the eternal truths. I do not conceive them as emanating from God like rays from the sun; but I know that God is the author of everything and that these truths are something and consequently that he is their author. (Descartes 1991: 25)
Descartes makes the same sorts of claims in his public writings, as well (e.g., in the reply to the Sixth Set of Objections (also from Mersenne)). This view seems to take seriously that God truly is maximally powerful; he even has volitional control over things like numbers, properties, and states of affairs. Indeed, even more than with views like theistic emanationism is God in control of abstracta on this view. According to the theistic voluntarist, God could have made different—or no—abstracta like propositions, properties, and states of affairs. God is in control of abstracta like God is in control of any other object: Their existence is subject to God’s will.
Of course, the seriousness with which the theistic voluntarist takes divine aseity and sovereignty is also the source of problems for the view. If God could have failed to make the number 2, in what sense is 2 a necessary being? One might try to weaken the voluntarist view, by claiming that 2 is only weakly necessary: God had to create it, but it is possibly…possible that it not exist. All worlds that are accessible to the actual world have 2 existing in them. But some of these worlds have a somewhat-different divine will relative to the existence of 2 (maybe God somewhat-reluctantly wills the existence of 2 in them). And possible relative to those sorts of worlds (or relative to worlds possible to those worlds, etc.) are worlds in which God doesn’t will that 2 exist. The key here is that the claim: Necessarily, 2 exists comes out true on this picture; 2 exists in every possible world relative to the world of evaluation (the actual world). But there are possibly…possible worlds in which God doesn’t will the existence of 2. The voluntarist can say that abstracta depend on the will of God, and yet really do exist necessarily (just don’t say in every possible world, full stop (see Plantinga 1980: 95 ff. for further discussion)).
Of course, this suggestion risks two sorts of problems. The first is that it doesn’t take divine sovereignty seriously enough. Imagine a being who could—in a world possible relative to the actual world—make it the case that 2 doesn’t exist. That being might be thought to be more powerful than a being that only possibly…possibly could do this. And Descartes (in places, at least) seems to have this intuition; and thus plumps for a God who could make it the case that 2 didn’t exist.
The second concern is that it abandons S5-type modal logic, in which anything that is necessary is necessarily necessary. This is thought by many to be the appropriate system of modal logic to describe the way actual modality is. So there are concerns from both sides for this reply to the objection to voluntarism. On the one hand, it might be thought not to take divine power seriously enough. On the other, it might not make abstracta “necessary enough”.
One reason why Descartes is famous for holding to theistic voluntarism view is because so few others in the history of theological thought hold to it. And perhaps the main reason why no one else holds to it is because many judge that the theistic voluntarist isn’t able to account for the absolute necessity of necessarily existing abstracta. These are objects that if they exist should exist in every possible world, full stop; and once one allows for that, it makes it very difficult to see how it could be up to God’s will that these exist. Rather, if they are up to God; one winds up with a view like theistic emanationism. We turn to it.
3.2 Theistic Emanationism
According to the theistic emanationist, necessarily existing abstract objects are caused to exist by some non-contingent feature of divine activity. The standard feature the emanationist appeals to is divine cognitive activity of some sort. So, the theistic emanationist will say something like that the number 2 exists because of God’s cognitive activity. She will go on to say (and this is how the view is distinct from a theistic voluntarist view) it is not possible (it’s true in no possible world, full stop) for God’s cognitive activity in this respect to be other than it is. Thus, the theistic emanationist can hold that abstracta really exist in every possible world, full stop (allowing that God does, too).
One example of a theistic emanationist is Leibniz. In his Monadology he says:
43. It is also true that God is not only the source of existences but also that of essences insofar as they are real, that is, the source of that which is real in possibility. This is because God’s understanding is the realm of eternal truths, or that of the ideas on which they depend; without him there would be nothing real in possibles, and not only would nothing exist, but also nothing would be possible.
44. For if there is a reality in essences or possibilities, or indeed in eternal truths, this reality must be grounded in something existent and actual, and consequently, it must be grounded in the existence of the necessary being, in whom essence involves existence, that is, in whom possible being is sufficient for actual being. (Leibniz 1714 [1989: 218])
Here Leibniz seems to suggest that necessarily existing abstracta are grounded in divine cognitive activity. It’s not clear exactly how to characterize the relation between the cognitive activity and the existence of the abstract objects, but saying that the former causes the latter to exist seems appropriate given his language.
Thomas Morris and Christopher Menzel (1986) also are theistic emanationists. They invoke explicitly causal language in setting out their view, which they call “theistic activism”.
So our suggestion is that the platonistic framework of reality arises out of a creatively efficacious intellective activity of God. It is in this sense that God is the creator of the framework. It depends on him. (1986: 356)
They continue later:
Let us refer to this view, the view that a divine intellectual activity is responsible for the framework of reality, as “theistic activism”. A theistic activist will hold God creatively responsible for the entire modal economy, for what is possible as well as what is necessary and what is impossible. The whole Platonic realm is thus seen as deriving from God. (1986: 356)
And on the next page:
God’s creation of the framework of reality…is an activity which is conscious, intentional, and neither constrained nor compelled by anything independent of God and his causally efficacious power. (1986: 357)
Theistic emanationism allows the theist to take seriously the claims of religious documents that God creates everything (indeed, the name of Morris/Menzel’s paper is “Absolute Creation”), and it avoids the problems that beset theistic voluntarism. It has virtues. But it has problems of its own. First, some philosophers claim that God already has to have critical properties in order to be able to cause abstracta to exist. The theistic emanationist claims that God causes properties such as being omniscient, being omnipotent, existing necessarily, being able to cause abstracta to exist, and having cognitive activity to exist. She also claims that God causes his own haecceity, being God, to exist. However, to claim this is to get the dependence relationship backwards, one might charge. Surely, God’s being able to cause abstract objects to exist must be posterior to his having properties like the ones mentioned above. And if God has these properties, they must exist. But, the proponent of this theory is committed to the existence of properties being posterior to God’s causing them to exist. Thus, the objection concludes, theistic emanationism is false (see Leftow 1990, Davison 1991, Davidson 1999, Bergmann and Brower 2006 for discussion of this sort of objection).
This sort of argument has seemed to many to be decisive. However, there is a response that the theistic emanationist can give at this point. It might be claimed that although God’s ability to cause abstracta to exist is logically dependent on his having certain properties, it is not causally dependent. The account would be problematically circular only if God’s ability to cause abstracta to exist were causally dependent on his having certain properties, and his having these properties were in turn causally dependent on his having caused these properties to exist. There is a circle of logical dependence here (as there is between any two necessary truths), but there is no circle of causal dependence (see Morris and Menzel for this sort of reply).
The opponent of theistic emanationism might make the following retort. Certainly, the above response is right in that if there is a problem of circularity, it is one of causal circularity. Earlier, we saw that there for the theistic emanationist is a one-way causal relationship between God’s cognitive activity and the existence of abstracta such as being the number two. We can say that the necessary existence of being the number two (or any abstract object) causally depends on God’s having the cognitive activity that he does. Or, perhaps we might say that the necessary existence of being the number two causally depends on God’s being omniscient, omnipotent and existing necessarily. However, the entities on which being the number two causally depends are themselves properties. On what do they causally depend? It seems that on the emanationist account they wind up causally depending on themselves. But this is incoherent, one might charge.
Even if the emanationist successfully replies to this first problem for the view, there is a second, and perhaps more serious objection to the view. We will call this objection “the bootstrapping objection” (see Leftow 1990, Davidson 1999, Bergmann and Brower 2006, and Gould 2014b for discussion of this sort of objection). We can put the concern this way (following Davidson 1999). To cause something to exist is to cause its essence (or, in the terminology of Plantinga 1980, its nature) to be exemplified. Suppose God creates a certain table which has as a part of its essence being red. Then God causes the property being red to be exemplified by the table when he creates it. Consider the property being omnipotent. The property being exemplified by God is contained in its essence. So, God causes the property being exemplified by God to be exemplified by being omnipotent in causing being omnipotent to exist. Similar to the manner with which God causes being red to be exemplified by the table in exemplifying the table’s essence, God causes being omnipotent to be exemplified by himself. But, surely God can’t cause the property being omnipotent to be exemplified by himself: How can God make himself omnipotent? Furthermore, one might think that God’s omnipotence should be causally prior to his causing properties to exist. However, on this occasion it is not. Then, if one does think that God’s omnipotence should be causally prior to his causing properties to exist, this would be an instance of causal circularity. This sort of argument will work for other properties like being omniscient or having divine cognitive activity (although the causal circle may be more difficult to establish with the former, and the implausibility of self-exemplification may be more difficult to establish with the latter).
Furthermore, consider God’s haecceity, the property being God. The property being necessarily exemplified is contained in the essence of this property. So, when God causes his haecceity to exist, he causes the property being necessarily exemplified to be exemplified by his haecceity. Just as God causes being red to be exemplified by the table when he causes it to exist, God causes being God to be exemplified necessarily. However, one might well think this incoherent. Indeed, it seems this is the divine causing his own existence: God is pulling himself up by his own bootstraps.
The theistic emanationist needs to address these sorts of concerns about bootstrapping, and it is not clear how that could be done.
3.3 Theistic Mentalism (without Divine Simplicity)
One sort of theistic mentalism is the view that necessarily existing abstract objects are divine mental states, and that God isn’t simple. On this view, God is distinct from his mental states, and abstracta are identical with these mental states. One proponent of this view is Welty (2014). He says
I maintain that [abstract objects] are constitutively dependent on God, for they are constituted by the divine ideas, which inhere in the divine mind and have no existence outside it…[Abstract objects] are necessarily existing, uncreated divine ideas that are distinct from God and dependent on God. (2014: 81)
Why might someone adopt theistic mentalism? One could make the following sort of case. Thoughts (e.g., sentences in the language of thought) are capable of representing the world as being a particular way. Propositions are capable of representing the world as being a particular way. Why do we need both of these sorts of intentional entities? We can simply identify propositions and thoughts, and we get a simpler ontology.
Of course, there is a problem here. If the thoughts we speak of here are human thoughts, there are continuum-many true propositions, and finitely many human thoughts. Also, there are propositions true in worlds where there are no human thoughts. So we can’t identify propositions and human thoughts. But we don’t have this problem with divine thoughts. God, we may grant, exists necessarily. And God has sufficiently many mental states to stand in for true propositions (see Plantinga 1980, 1982).
If we identify propositions with divine thoughts, we have enough of them in all possible situations. And one has one fewer kind of thing if one admits only thoughts (divine and otherwise) rather than thoughts and propositions. But there are reasons to think there are both thoughts and propositions and that the two shouldn’t be identified, even if one identifies propositions and divine thoughts. The most straightforward reason is that thoughts are a different kind of entity from propositions. The former are concrete, and the latter abstract. Furthermore, it’s worth noting the conceptual role propositions play. They are the sorts of things that can be affirmed, doubted, believed, and questioned. They can be true and false, necessary and possible. It is said by some that they are sets of possible worlds; and by others that they are composite entities, made up of properties and relations, and perhaps concrete individuals. It’s not at all clear that thoughts, especially divine thoughts, satisfy any of these conceptual roles.
We also should ask about other necessarily existing abstracta. What sorts of mental entities are they? Do they relate to one another, as concrete mental tokens, in the right sort of way such that they mirror the ways that Platonic states of affairs, propositions, properties, relations, and numbers relate to each other?
What these considerations suggest is that theistic mentalism may actually be a sort of nominalism about abstract objects, in the way that Plantinga (2003: ch. 10) says Lewis’ (1986) conception of possible worlds is a sort of nominalism about possible worlds. At best, we have concrete things that play the roles of necessarily existing abstract objects. (And the theistic mentalist has a great deal more work in specifying concrete divine mental particulars such that we have all the requisite role-players among the various sorts of necessarily existing abstract objects. It is presumably not enough to say that propositions are divine thoughts and leave it at that.)
Let us return to the initial motivation for theistic mentalism: There are two sorts of intentional objects (propositions and thoughts), and it would be a simpler metaphysic to identify tokens of the two sorts. To assess this, we must ask if the tokens of the two sorts are enough like each other to be identified. That is, simplicity isn’t the only consideration relevant here. After all, Spinoza’s metaphysic (necessarily there is one object that is exactly as it is in the actual world) is maximally simple, yet has few proponents within western philosophy. Furthermore, if we are able to explain the intentionality of one of these sorts of entities by its relation to the other, it will seem less mysterious that we have two classes of intentional entities. That is precisely what many want to say about the intentionality of thoughts vis-à-vis that of propositions: Thoughts derive their intentionality by standing in the right sort of relation to propositions. So, the reason why my thought is a thought that grass is green is because it has the propositional content that grass is green. The proposition that grass is green has its intentionality intrinsically.
3.4 Theistic Mentalism (with Divine Simplicity)
Theistic mentalism with divine simplicity is the view that necessarily existing abstracta are identical with divine mental states, and that God is simple. Because God is simple, each abstract object is identical with God and thus each other. This is a view held most famously by Augustine and Aquinas. Because this is a mentalist view, the criticisms leveled in the section on theistic mentalism without divine simplicity will apply here. In addition, the person who accepts divine simplicity alongside her divine mentalism also will face criticisms of divine simplicity. Plantinga (1980) is perhaps the locus classicus of contemporary criticism of divine simplicity. He argues that according to divine simplicity, God is identical with his attributes and has (all of) his attributes essentially. But, he argues, God isn’t an attribute; and God has many different attributes. (For discussion more sympathetic to divine simplicity, see Mann 1982; Stump and Kretzmann 1985; Leftow 1990; Stump 1997; Wolterstorff 1991; and Bergmann and Brower 2006.) The sorts of difficulties that Plantinga has raised have seemed decisive to many. (It is beyond the scope of this essay to evaluate them, however.) This isn’t to say that they can’t be met. But the theistic mentalist who accepts divine simplicity has, prima facie, a great number of difficulties with her view.
4. God’s Grounding Abstract Objects II: Views on Which There Aren’t Necessarily Existing Abstract Objects that All Are Grounded in God
- Theistic Platonism: There are necessarily existing abstract objects, and none of them are grounded in God. Example: van Inwagen (2009).
- Theistic Nominalism: There are no necessarily existing abstract objects. Example: Craig (2016).
- Mixed View 1: Mentalism-Platonism: Example: Gould and Davis (2014).
- Mixed View 2: Anti-Bootstrapping Emanationism: Any abstracta that create “bootstrapping” problems aren’t grounded in God. Theistic emanationism is true of the others.
4.1 Theistic Platonism
According to the theistic Platonist, there are at least some necessarily existing abstract objects (e.g., propositions, properties, relations, numbers, and states of affairs), and the existence of all of the necessarily existing abstracta is not grounded in God. Peter van Inwagen (2009) is a paradigm case of a theistic Platonist. As we saw earlier, van Inwagen argues that if necessarily existing abstract objects were grounded in God, they would be caused to exist by God. But necessarily existing abstracta can’t enter into causal relations. So they aren’t grounded in God. He says:
In the end, I can find no sense in the idea that God creates free abstract objects [things like propositions, relations, numbers, properties, etc.], no sense in the idea that the existence of free abstract objects in some way depends on the activities of God. (Recall that, although I believe that all abstract objects are free, that is not a position that I am concerned to defend in this chapter.) And that is because the existence of free abstract objects depends on nothing. Their existence has nothing to do with causation… Causation is simply irrelevant to the being (and the intrinsic properties) of abstract objects (2009: 18).
Van Inwagen takes his most serious challenge to be from religious texts that he, as a Christian, thinks are authoritative. He speaks particularly of the beginning of the Niceno-Constantinopolitan Creed, which begins, “I believe in one God, the Father almighty, maker of heaven and earth, of all that is seen and unseen”. He thinks here that the quantifier in “all that is seen and unseen” is restricted to things that are capable of entering into causal relations and thus are capable of being created. As van Inwagen points out, there are other authoritative Christian texts in which a universal quantifier is read in a restricted manner (e.g., Matthew 19:26 “for God all things are possible”; see also Luke 1:37, Mark 10:27). No such passage should be taken as a prooftext for a Cartesian view of omnipotence. Rather, the quantifier is read in a restricted manner. Similarly, the quantifier is restricted in the case of the beginning of the Niceno-Constantinopolitan Creed.
It is worth noting that van Inwagen’s argument here is slightly different from one that often occurs around these sorts of texts. Often, there is discussion as to whether the writers of the authoritative texts had in mind things like necessarily existing abstracta (e.g., Wolterstorff 1970: 293; Morris and Menzel 1986: 354). To the person who says that the writers of these texts didn’t have, say, structured propositions in mind when they claimed God created everything; it is pointed out that neither did they have in mind (clearly-created) things like quarks and bosons (e.g., Davidson 1999: 278–279). Rather, van Inwagen argues that a text like the beginning of the Niceno-Constantinopolitan Creed has to be read in a restricted manner if it is to avoid asserting impossible propositions. And this seems the right way to go for the theistic Platonist. It is very difficult to discern the scope of the universal quantifier in the usage of writers from nearly 2000 years ago. (This is apart from questions about the connection between intention and semantic content.)
Van Inwagen’s main focus is on authoritative texts like the Niceno-Constantinopolitan Creed. But we noted earlier a second sort of reason for adopting a view on which any necessarily existing abstract objects depend on God. That second sort of reason is perfect-being theology. Again, the line of reasoning is that a being who is such that necessarily existing abstracta depend on it is greater than a being on whom they don’t depend. And God is the greatest possible being. It is clear what van Inwagen would say at this point: It’s not possible for necessarily existing abstract objects to depend on anything. Thus, being an x such that necessarily existing abstracta depend on x is not a great-making property. That this isn’t a great-making property is the sort of thing the theistic Platonist needs to say to the perfect-being defender of divine grounding of necessarily existing abstracta. It must be that these things can’t depend on God or anyone else. (One may or may not adopt Inwagen’s particular argument that they can’t.)
Thus, if the theistic Platonist thinks there are good arguments that necessarily existing abstract objects can’t be grounded in God, she will have reason to do two things. First, she will have reason read the relevant universal quantifications in authoritative texts as restricted. Second, if she accepts the sort of reasoning in perfect being theology; she will have reason to insist that being an x such that necessarily existing abstracta depend on x is not a great-making property (any more than being able to create a square circle is).
4.2 Theistic Nominalism
The theistic nominalist doesn’t think there are necessarily existing abstract objects. She may or may not think if there were necessarily existing abstract objects, they would be grounded in God. For instance, William Lane Craig (2016) who is a theistic nominalist; thinks that were there necessarily existing abstracta, they would have to be grounded in God. (We presumably should count Craig as someone who thinks there are true counterpossibles.) But one can imagine someone who thinks that if things like numbers and properties did exist, theistic Platonism would be a plausible view to adopt. It is worth noting that very few—if any—of the realists about necessarily existing abstracta who are theists are themselves realists because they are theists. Rather, they are realists about necessarily existing abstracta for other sorts of reasons (e.g., indispensability arguments, arguments that we quantify over them with true sentences, or arguments that true sentences (e.g., that 2+3=5) require them as truthmakers (see Rodriguez-Pereyra (2005) for a defense of truthmakers). Van Inwagen himself believes in necessarily existing abstract objects because he thinks that we are committed to true existential quantifications over them (e.g., van Inwagen 2014: ch. 8). There is nothing in particular the theistic nominalist needs to say qua theist about the existence of necessarily existing abstracta that any other nominalist doesn’t need to say. One advantage of theistic nominalism is that it allows one to avoid some of the sorts of difficult maneuvers that those who believe God grounds the existence of necessarily existing abstract objects wind up performing. Another advantage of theistic nominalism is that it allows one, if she wishes, to avoid debates about the semantics of universal quantifiers in ancient religious texts. Of course, theistic nominalism is open only to those who find plausible nominalistic replies to standard arguments for realism about necessarily existing abstracta. Craig himself thinks that he can give replies to these standard arguments for realism (2016: ch. 3, 6, 7).
We turn now to two “mixed views”, views on which different types of abstracta stand in different grounding relations to God. Both of them try to bracket abstracta having to do with God (e.g., God’s own attributes), and to say that God doesn’t ground those. But God grounds all the other necessarily existing abstracta.
4.3 Mixed View 1: Mentalism-Platonism
On this view, propositions are identical with divine mental states; and properties and relations not exemplified by God are independent of God, a la theistic Platonism. This is the view of Gould and Davis (2014). They say, “Thus, abstract objects exist in two realms: the divine mind and Plato’s heaven ” (2014: 61). They decline to say in this particular essay whether mentalism or Platonism is true of other sorts of abstract objects (e.g., numbers, states of affairs, possible worlds). So what we have in Gould and Davis is an initial sketch of a proposal. They are motivated by bootstrapping worries for theistic activism (itself an emanationist view). They think that they can evade bootstrapping objections by having some abstracta be identical with divine mental states, and having the others not grounded in God. Their own name for this view is “modified theistic activism”.
It is perhaps strange that, having started with theistic activism (an emanationist view) and its bootstrapping worries, they wind up with a part-mentalist view. It would seem that they could have kept some abstracta causally grounded in God, and others independent of God (see Mixed View 2, below). Also, this first Mixed View will face objections of the sort faced by theistic Platonism; viz. that it doesn’t take divine aseity seriously enough, and that it must read the quantifiers in the relevant religious texts in a restricted manner. Furthermore, it is peculiar that propositions wind up as divine mental states, but properties and relations wind up independent of God. One natural understanding of propositions is that they are structured entities, made up of properties and relations. Another is that they are sets of possible worlds. The former understanding seems unavailable to Gould and Davis, and the latter would seem to involve having sui generis primitive possible worlds identical with divine mental states. But at that point, why not just be a thoroughgoing theistic mentalist? After all, bootstrapping isn’t a concern for the mentalist. Furthermore, bootstrapping worries arise with abstracta other than properties. For instance, consider the proposition God is omnipotent. In any possible world it exists, it is true. That is, it has being true as part of its essence. But then, if God causes it to exist, God causes it to be true. So we have the same sorts of bootstrapping concerns as we did with a property like being omnipotent.
4.4 Mixed View 2: Anti-Bootstrapping Emanationism
This is a view designed wholly to avoid bootstrapping worries that affect theistic emanationism. It really is a sort of modified theistic activism, and it may actually be the sort of view Gould and Davis (2014) would like to hold. The idea is this: Ascertain the necessarily existing abstracta that cause bootstrapping problems (e.g., being God, being omnipotent, etc.) for the emanationist. Those exist independently of God. All other necessarily existing abstracta are causally grounded in God in the way the theistic emanationist thinks abstracta are grounded in God.
So far as I can tell, no one holds this first mixed view. Perhaps the reader is thinking that that is because it is obviously ad hoc: The sole motivation for the two classes of abstracta in the theory is avoidance of bootstrapping worries. This is too strong, I think. There is a reason why certain abstracta create bootstrapping problem. That reason is that they have to do with God in a way that other abstracta that don’t cause bootstrapping problems don’t. So why not say that Leibniz or Menzel and Morris are right about all the non-God related abstracta? To put it another way, why not be an emanationist about all the abstracta one can be an emanationist about—those that don’t have to do with God?
That said, there is at least a whiff of ad-hocness here. The motivation for this theory presumably would be that of perfect being theology. For the proponent of this first mixed view must think that the quantifiers in relevant religious texts are actually restricted. They aren’t as restricted as the theistic Platonist thinks they are. But she will agree with the theistic Platonist that it’s false that all (read the quantifier wide open) entities are created by/depend on/grounded in God. It’s worth pointing out that it’s not clear how to delineate precisely those abstracta that lead to bootstrapping problems and those that don’t. The best one can do seems to be to say that those that cause bootstrapping problems don’t depend on God, and all others God causes to exist. But presumably for each necessarily existing abstract object, either it gives rise to bootstrapping problems, or it doesn’t. So there should be two non-overlapping classes of abstract objects at hand here, even if we’re not able to specify more descriptively which abstracta are in which class.
It would be better if the emanationist could find a cogent reply to bootstrapping concerns. But if she can’t, she may plump for being an emanationist about all abstracta save those having to do with God.
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Thanks to Edward Wierenga, Timothy Simmons, Anthony Macias, and an anonymous referee for comments on this version of this entry.