Notes to God and Other Necessary Beings

1. The sort of necessity referenced here and throughout is necessity of the metaphysical or broadly logical sort (see Plantinga 1974).

2. There are philosophers who use terms like “proposition”, “property”, “relations”, and “states of affairs” in ways such that these, or some of these, are contingent entities. (For instance, those who think that there are Russellian singular propositions or Armstrongian states of affairs with immanent universals as constituents probably would think some of these contingently existing.) Here we will think of propositions and states affairs in the way Plantinga (1974, 2003) conceives of them, and properties and relations the way van Inwagen (2014) conceives of them.

3. Where A-like facts supervene on B-like facts just if necessarily, if a particular set of B-like facts obtain, the set of A-like facts obtain.

4. All references to the Hebrew Bible and New Testament are from the New Revised Standard Version of the Bible.

5. References to the The Qur’an are from the translation by M. A. S. Haleem Abdel, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2004.

6. For instance, they might think that if A depends on B; then if B didn't exist, then A wouldn't exist and not conversely. But according to the Lewis semantics for counterfactuals, if A and B exist necessarily; then if A didn't exist, neither would B, and conversely. See Wierenga 1998, Vander Laan 2004, Mares 1997, Nolan 1997 for alternative semantics for counterfactuals with necessarily false antecedents (“counterpossibles”).

7. Brian Leftow’s (2012) God and Necessity is an important recent book in philosophical theology. He adopts a mixed voluntarist/mentalist account in it. But it is a voluntarist/mentalist account of modality rather than grounding of abstract objects. These are distinct issues. One could, e.g., be a nominalist and claim there are no abstract objects, and further think that God plays some important role in grounding modality.

8. Some of the terminology in these next two sections is stipulative in an attempt to help clarify the philosophical terrain.

9. There are those who demur, though. See, e.g., Chandler 1976 and Salmon 1981, Appendix 1.

10. This view is sometimes called “divine conceptualism,” but often on this view divine mental states other than concepts are pointed to as being identical with abstracta. For this reason we will use the term “mentalism” rather than “conceptualism.”

11. For Augustine's mentalism, see On Ideas, Q 46. For Augustine on divine simplicity, see City of God XI, 10. For Aquinas' mentalism, see Disputed Questions on Truth Q3 Art 1 and ST 1 Q15. For Aquinas on divine simplicity, see ST 1.3, and Disputed Questions I.7.6.

12. It is beyond the scope of this essay to assess the standard arguments for realism about necessarily existing abstract objects, standard nominalist replies to them, or Craig's own replies to them. As a way of helping the reader of this article, I simply note the relevance of these parts of the abstract object debate.

Copyright © 2019 by
Matthew Davidson <>

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