Supplement to Ibn Bâjja [Avempace]
Annex 1: Sources for His Biography
The sources for his biography are few and short, and autobiographic references are even scarcer. The longest contemporary notice was written by a foe, Abu Nasr al-Fath Ibn Muhammad Ibn Khaqan (d. 1134?) in a poetry anthology (1966: 346–353) (1989: 934-947).
According to Ibn Khaqan, Avempace “investigated the celestial bodies, the boundaries of the earth climates and rejected the Book of Allah”. He did not believe in the resurrection, affirmed the eternity of time, and that man is a plant; he had fun playing music. Al-Fath reproduces various poems of Avempace, one is a long panegyric to the Almoravid Prince Abu Bakr ibn Ibrahim as-Sahrawi better known as Ibn Tifilwit “governor of the frontier and of the West [of al-Andalus]”. M. Asín Palacios (1900) and Nemesio Morata (1924) already doubted the truth of Ibn Khaqan’s accusations against Ibn Bâjja whom he had praised in former times.
Another source of information is three letters of Ibn Sid al-Batalyawsi (d. 1127) mentioned by N. Morata (1924) in the Escorial manuscript 488, ff. 35vº–37rº in which he complains about the arrogant behavior of Ibn Bâjja. They have been published by H. Mu’nis (2000: 34–37). Further D.M. Dunlop (1957b: 188–196) described the notice on Ibn Bâjja written by a contemporary of Avempace called Ibn Bashrun in his work al-Mukhtar min an-nazr wa-n-nathr and transmitted by Sibt Ibn al-Jawzi (d. 1257) in Mir’at az-zaman (1952: 172–173).
The notice is full of praise for Avempace who authored books on mathematics, logic and geometry. The text observes that Avempace was, for 20 years, a vizier in the service of Yahyà ibn Yusuf Ibn Tashfin and that he was a victim of envious physicians who poisoned him. Ibn Bashrun says that Avempace died in 533/1139, but he does not say how old he was.
Later biographies are based on these two authors. ‛Imad ad-Din Katib al-Isfahani (1125–1201) mentions Ibn Bashrun as his source (1971: nº 94, pp. 332–334). The notice in Ibn al-Qifti (d. 1248) is very short: it praises Avempace; says that he was vizier of Yahyà ibn Tashfin for twenty and that he was poisoned by envious physicians. Ibn al-Qifti claims that al-Fath ibn Khaqan had asked Avempace for his poetry to include it in the anthology, and that he fooled Avempace, because he used it to make a negative entry of him (1903, 406; Qifti 2005: 299).
Ibn Abu ‛Usaybi’a (d. 1269–70) remarks that Avempace died “young” and includes a list of his works; his biography is in very positive tones (1886: 62–64; 2001: 3: 271–277). Ibn Khallikan (1211–1282) gives the month of his death as Ramadan 533/ May 1139 and adds that “it is said that he died in 535 poisoned with an eggplant in Fez” (1998: nº 670, pp. 222–225). Ibn Khallikan mentions also that “Bâjja in the language of the Francs of the West means silver”, and the meaning can be related to Sa’igh, “silversmith” as his Arabic surname was “son of the silversmith”. There is however the Latin term pacta “bride”, in Arabic ‛arus, with a similar sound because ct becomes ch in Romance, and Ibn al-‛Arus was a frequent surname, or nisba.
Adh-Dhahabi (d. 1348) mentions Ibn al-Imam, Ibn Bâjja’s disciple, Alyasa‛ Ibn ‛Isà Ibn Hazm—the historian born in Valencia and deceased in Alexandria or Damascus in 1179, and Ibn Khallikan as his sources (Dhahabi 1995: 36: 331–332 § 163). Lisan ad-Din Ibn al-Khatib (d. 1374) referenced Avempace in his entry on the Almoravid emir Abu Bakr as-Sahrawi Ibn Tifilwit (1958: 412–417), the protector of Avempace. Ahmad al-Maqqari (d. 1631), drew on Ibn Khaqan as well as on Lisan ad-Din Ibn al-Khatib for his extensive entry on Avempace reproducing many of his poems, not yet translated (1968: 7: 17–25 and 27–30).