Ibn Bâjja [Avempace]

First published Fri Sep 28, 2007; substantive revision Sun Jan 29, 2023

Philosophy in Al-Andalus developed later than in the East; it grew among Muslims and Jews, since both communities were nurtured by a common Arabic. The Muslim community was much larger and it defined the cultural space, a significant part of which was made by Arabic translations of Greek scientifical and philosophical works.

The earliest Arab philosopher al-Kindi (d. c. 853) was possibly known in Al-Andalus by Ibn Masarra (d. 931) since he criticized his views (Bellver 2020), and by the end of the 10th century CE, materials related to the circle of the Brethren of Purity were probably known there. Ibn Hazm (d. 1064), a theologian of Zahirite proclivity, polemized against Greek and Arab philosophers whose text he must have read in a direct or indirect way. But philosophy in its proper sense is first found in Shelomo Ibn Gabirol or Avicebron (1021–1058). The great figure of Medieval Judaism who was born in Malaga, but was active in Saragossa for most of his life, before moving to Granada and then to Valencia, where he died, was also a talented philosopher. He preceded, by over two generations, the first Muslim philosophers of Al-Andalus: Abu Muhammad Ibn al-Sīd al-Batalyusi (d. 1127), Abu s-Salt Umayya ibn ʽAbd al-ʽAziz ibn Abi s-Salt ad-Dani (d. 1134) and Ibn Bâjja, or Avempace (d. 1139), the latter being active also in that northern town of Saragossa.

The reasons for the later development of philosophy in Muslim Al-Andalus, therefore, cannot be explained only by the fact that the country was situated far away from that nurturing source. The cause is likely that philosophy was never central to the Islamic intellectual constellation and that it flourished in peripheral areas, geographical as well as doctrinal. The greatest evidence is Ibn Sina (d. 1037) who lived in the Iranian provinces, never visited Baghdad and enjoyed the patronage of princes friendly to the Shiʻa. Al-Andalus was peripheral in geographical, but not in doctrinal, terms. The country followed Sunni orthodoxy and the Malekite school of law prevailed while Ash‛arite theology was weakly cultivated. When Abu l-Qasim Saʽid Ibn Saʽid (d. 1070) devoted a chapter of his world history of the sciences and philosophy to Al-Andalus, his information about philosophy was significantly scarce (Saʽid 1998: 96–108; 1991: 58–78).

From 1009 through 1031, Al-Andalus lived the fitna period, that ended with the abolition of the Cordovan caliphate in 1031. Saragossa was in the periphery and its kingdom welcomed poets, scholars and scientists migrating from Cordova and other places. In spite of the circumstances retarding its development, philosophy in Al-Andalus blossomed into maturity with Ibn Bajja.

C.E. dates are used in the entry unless an Anno Hegirae date is also written; in this case they are separate by a slash—A.H. is set before and C.E. after it. No transliteration characters are used and the name Avempace is used thorugout the chapter once the author introduced.

1. Life and Circle

Abu Bakr Muhammad Ibn Yahyà ibn as-Sa’igh at-Tujibi Ibn Bajja was known to the Latin philosophers as Avempace. We can assume that he was born in Saragossa some years before 1085, when the city was the capital of the Taifa kingdom of the Banu Hud. Yusuf al-Mu’tamin Ibn Hud reigned from 1081–1085; he was outstanding in all the sciences including mathematics (Rashed 2012, 721–766) and he largely contributed to the development of the city as a cultural center. His successor al-Mustaʻin II reigned until the year 1110 when he was killed in the battle of Valtierra that Alfonso the Christian King of Aragon won. Avempace had been in the service of al-Musta‛in II Ibn Hud because he praised him in his poems showing familiarity with the emir (Maqqari-N: vol. 7, p. 25) (Ibn Khaqan 1989, p. 943). Al-Musta‛in II Ibn Hud was followed by ʻImad ad-Dawla Ibn Hud who stayed in power only for a few months. In the same year, 1110, he was overthrown by the Almoravid Sultan ʽAli ibn Yusuf Ibn Tashfin (ruled 1107–1143), who sent Abu ‛Abd Allah Muhammad Ibn al-Hajj, governor of Valencia (and the East province), with the Almoravid army to conquer Saragossa. ʽImad ad-Dawla had to leave the town and retire to Rueda, a fortress located some distance from Saragossa.

After Ibn al-Hajj’s death in 1114, the Almoravid Sultan appointed his brother-in-law Abu Bakr ʽAli ibn Ibrahim as-Sahrawi, known as Ibn Tifilwit, as the governor of the province.[1] The connection of Avempace to Ibn Tifilwit is well attested by al-Maqqari, Ibn al-Khatib (Ibn al-Khatib 1973, 412–417) and Ibn Khaqan. Avempace composed panegyrics for Ibn Tifilwit who rewarded him lavishly. The emir was living in the fortified palace of Al-Ja’fariyya and the construction was reminiscent of the castles in the Arabian desert, so that in a long poem Avempace refers to their days spent in Al-Mushaqqar, one of the fortresses often mentioned in pre-Islamic poetry (Ibn Khaqan 1989, 934–935). Avempace also wrote poems of the muwasshaha kind that pleased him, and they both enjoyed music and wine. Abu Bakr Ibn Tifilwit had nominated Avempace his vizier, and Avempace went to meet the deposed ‛Imad ad-Dawla Ibn Hud King in his castle apparently in a diplomatic mission, but he ended up in his jail for some months. Ibn Tifilwit died in 1116 in an operation against the Christians and Avempace composed moving elegies in his memory (Ibn Khaqan 1989: 937, 943).

King Alfonso the Battler conquered Saragossa from the Almoravids on December 18, 1118, after a long blockade. It is not clear whether Avempace then left town or had already left. We know that he looked for shelter in Xàtiba in the court of Abu Ishaq Ibrahim ibn Yusuf Ibn Tashufin, known as Ibn Taʽyasht because Ta‛yasht was the name of his Berber mother. Ibrahim was a brother of the Sultan ‛Ali Ibn Yusuf Ibn Tashfin (d. 1143), and governor of Murcia and the Eastern part of al-Andalus. Avempace was again imprisoned and we may guess the causes. Abu Marwan ‛Abd Malik bn Abi l-‛Ala’ Zuhr (d. 1161) was a famous physician in the service of Ibrahim (he wrote for him the Kitab al-Iqtisad), and al-Maqqari informs us that there was an extreme enmity between Avempace and the father of ‛Abd al-Malik, also a physician, named Abu l-‛Ala’ Zuhr (d. 1130) (Maqqari-N: vol. 3, pp. 432–434). Even worse for him, Abu Nasr al-Fath Ibn Muhammad Ibn Khaqan (d. 1134?) was also a courtier of Ibn Ta‛yasht, to whom he devoted the Qala’id al-iqyan[2] a poetry anthology where he contemptuously put Avempace in last place (Ibn Khaqan 1989: 931–947), and where he also disqualified him as a poet, accusing him of plagiarism. The court of Ibrahim ibn Yusuf was not a welcoming place for him.

In spite of the incident, Avempace remained within the Almoravid circle for the rest of his life and for approximately twenty years served as vizier of the mentioned Yahyà ibn Yusuf Ibn Tashfin, another brother of the Sultan ‛Ali Ibn Yusuf Ibn Tashufin in the Maghrib (Maqqari-N: vol.3, p. 28). Vincent Lagardère has done the most extended research on the Almoravids in recent times and provided us with information on all the children of Yusuf Ibn Tashfin (Lagardère 1989: 80 and 174–178). Nevertheless, Lagardère has not found any information on Yahyà other than he was a son of Yusuf and his wife Zaynab, and that he was born around 1084. Thus, he was of a similar age to Avempace.

From around 1118 until 1136, we have no further information on Avempace’s life. In 1136, he was in Seville and his disciple Abu l-Hasan Ibn al-Imam was in his company (IB-coll-alawi: 87). He mentions in one of his writings that he is moving to Oran (IB-coll-genequand: 202 §60), maybe in his planned trip to Egypt (IB-coll-genequand: 90 §1). Nevertheless, three years later, in Ramadan 533/ May 1139, Avempace died in Fez.

As for the causes of his death, several sources point to poisoning. Al-Maqqari recounts that Ibn Ma‛yub was a servant of the physician Abu l-‛Ala’ Ibn Zuhr, his enemy, and that Ibn Ma‛yub was suspected of poisoning him with an eggplant (Maqqari-N: vol. 4, pp. 12–13), but Abu l-‛Ala’ Zuhr (not Ibn Zuhr) had already died in 1130 at Cordova, and lived in Seville most of his life. The rivalry between the two was widely known and M. Forcada has exhaustively analyzed it on the base of some satirical verses ascribed to them (Forcada 2021) but the enmity should not be so extreme to cross the limit of poisoning. The general impression is that Yahyà ibn Yusuf Ibn Tashfin did not support Avempace any longer.

The Almoravids bestowed their support on Avempace and other non religious scholars in spite of being very reverential to the Malikite jurists. Abu ‛Abd Allah Malik ibn Yahyà Ibn Wuhayb al-Azdi (1061–1130) (Dunlop 1955b) cultivated all sciences including philosophy but none of his works is extant. Nevertheless, the Amir al-Mu’minin ‛Ali ibn Yusuf Ibn Tashfin made him his vizier and his friend. Al-Maqqari informs us that ‛Ali called him from Seville to Marrakech and appointed him qadi of Marrakech. He ordered him to discuss religious matters with Ibn Tumart, the intellectual founder of the Almohad movement (Maqqari-N: vol. 3, pp. 479–480). Al-Maqqari says that Avempace supported him, but we do not know anything more about their relationship (Maqqari-N: 3: 434).

We are better informed about his friends Abu Ja‛far Yusuf ibn Hasday[3] and Abu l-Hasan ‛Ali ibn ‛Abd al-‛Aziz Ibn al-Imam al-Ansari.[4] Ibn al-Imam was from Saragossa too and was vizier of Abu Tahir Tamim Ibn Yusuf Ibn Tashfin al-Mu‛izz, (1072–1126) the eldest son of Yusuf Ibn Tashfin, brother of the ruling Sultan and governor of Granada and later of the whole al-Andalus. Tamim was a hero, being the winner in the battle of Uclés in 1108.

Ibn al-Imam and Avempace were friends for years; we have several letters that Avempace wrote to him on philosophical issues. Dunlop translated the beginning of an incomplete letter of Avempace to Ibn al-Imam in which Avempace refers to a treatise he composed during his second imprisonment.[5] As Ibn Khaqan reported, Avempace was imprisoned by Abu Ishaq Ibrahim ibn Yusuf Ibn Tashfin for a second time, after 1118 (Ibn Khaqan, 1989, p. 941).

Avempace’s works are mainly preserved in following manuscripts:

  • Oxford Bodleian, Pococke 206,
  • Berlin, Ahlwardt 5060 WE87 (now Kraków, Biblioteka Jagiellonska),
  • Tashkent, 2385/92,
  • Escorial, Derenbourg 612,
  • Cairo, Dar al-kutub, Akhlaq 290,
  • Istanbul, Carullah 1279,
  • Ankara, Library of the Faculty of History and Geography, Ismail Saib I 1696 (Taylor 1982).

The copyist of manuscript Pococke 206 wrote on folio 120a that he copied his text from an original that included the handwriting of Ibn al-Imam. “The vizier finished the reading of this section under him [Avempace] on the 15th of Ramadan 530” (June 17, 1136) and the place was Seville (IB-coll-alawi: 87). Ibn al-Imam was governor (‛amil) of the town and in charge of the poll-tax, the copyist added.

When Ibn al-Imam decided to move to the East, Avempace composed the Epistle of the Farewell Message as a spiritual companion for the travel. Since Avempace died in May 1139, Ibn al-Imam should have left al-Andalus between 1136 and 1139, after he finished copying many texts of Avempace which he took with him. From his manuscript another one, the mentioned Pococke 206, was copied in Qus, in the upper Egypt in 547/1152 by al-Hasan ibn Muhammad ibn Muhammad ibn Muhammad Ibn an-Nadr when Ibn al-Imam was alive. Thus, 1152 is the earliest date for Ibn al-Imam’s death.

Abu Ja‛far Yusuf ibn Hasday is also the recipient of a letter from Avempace in which he refers to the astronomer az-Zarqalluh, Azarquiel (d. ca. 1000), and also writes about his own order of learning.[6] Abu Ja‛far (d. 1123) was the great-great-grandson of the famous Jewish scholar and statesman Hasday Ibn Shaprut (ca. 910–ca. 970; Stroumsa 2016). Ibn Abi Usaybi‛a includes in Abu Ja‛far’s biography his history of physicians,[7] and reports his friendship with Avempace. Sa‛id Ibn Sa‛id gives a biography of probably his grandfather, Abu l-Fadl Hasday ibn Yusuf (fl. 485/1092), “of the city of Saragossa and of the Jewish nobility in al-Andalus” who was first to read Aristotle’s Physics and De caelo in al-Andalus.[8]

Abu Ja‛far Yusuf ibn Hasday moved to the East and from 1121 to 1125 he worked for al-Ma’mun al-Bata’ihi, a vizier of the Fatimid Caliph al-Amir. He wrote for him commentaries on Hippocrates and was involved in building an observatory at Cairo known as the Ma’muni Observatory (Maqrizi 1913: 174–176). The observatory was demolished when the vizier fell into disgrace in 1125. Dunlop added a few names to the circle of Avempace, like Abu l-Hasan Ibn Judi, a younger friend, but Malik Ibn Wuhayb, ‛Ali Ibn al-Imam and Abu Ja‛far Ibn Hasday are the outstanding figures in his circle. See Annex 1 for a discussion of sources on his life.

2. Foundation and Organization of the Sciences

Ibn al-Imam (IB-coll-fakhry: 177–178) produced the first list of Avempace’s writings, which was followed by Ibn Abi Usaybi‛a in his bio-bibliography (mentioned above, 1886, 2001). A scholarly account was first made by the late Jamal ad-Din al-‛Alawi (1983) who not only described manuscripts and printings, but also tried to determine which works ascribed to Avempace are authentic, as well as to establish the chronology of his writings and, on this basis, to draw a developmental account of his thought.

Al-‛Alawi based his chronology on the before mentioned letter which Avempace sent to his friend Abu Ja‛far Yusuf ibn Hasday in which he explained that he first learned about mathematical sciences, music and astronomy. He went on to study logic using the books of Alfarabi and later devoted himself to physics, the philosophy of nature. We understand that Avempace had not worked with metaphysics yet. J. Al-‛Alawi distinguished three stages in Avempace’s development and classified his writings according to these stages. His writings on music, astronomy and logic belong to the first stage; those on natural philosophy to the second; and those most representative of his thinking—the Rule of the Solitary, the Epistle of Conjunction and the Farewell Message—to the third and last stage.

Avempace himself tells us how these sciences are organized. He followed other Andalusians in turning to Abu Nasr al-Farabi, Alfarabi (d. ca. 950), for instruction in logic and in classifying the sciences. Alfarabi is the author of a treatise “enumerating” the sciences (Farabi 1952) and some books of the introductory genre: Epistle with which the book on logic begins (Dunlop 1957a), Sections containing all what needs the beginner in logic (Dunlop 1955), and the Book of the Eisagoge or Introduction (Dunlop 1956).

Avempace wrote commentaries on many of them, beginning with his annotations on the Chapters, or Sections, and on the Eisagoge, mixed with ones on the Categories. His annotations are preserved in two manuscripts: Oxford Pococke 206 and, to a larger extent, Escorial Derenbourg 612. These annotations on the books belonging to the introductory genre are often intermingled and may offer different versions (‛Alawi 1983: 80–83). We are changing the order of the Escorial manuscript and analyzing Avempace’s annotations on the Five Sections before those on the Eisagoge as they are adressed to one who intends to learn logic, and the sciences, in general.

The five sections of Alfarabi (Alfarabi, 1985–1987, v. 1, pp. 63–74) (Dunlop, 1955) contain general indications on how to proceed with the study of logic; they are propaedeutic guidelines (Kleven, 2013–2014). Avempace feels the need for an explanation why these indications are given and begins his annotations with it:

Since all knowledge in every art is “conceptualization” (tasawwur) of the meanings of the art and it is “assent” (tasdiq) to what is conceptualized, everyone who learns an art logically (bi-qawl), when he learns this science, he intends to conceptualize its meanings (maʻná) and to give assent to what he has conceptualized, and no one can acquire any science unless he has the two (IB-taaliq: 64).

The term taṣawwur is sometimes translated as ‘concept’, ‘conception,’ ‘conceptualization’, the grasping of an idea; taṣdīq is ‘assent’, ‘belief’, internal motion, ‘adhésion de l’esprit à un jugement, assentiment’ (Goichon 1939). Since Harry A. Wolfson wrote about taṣawwur and taṣdīq and suggested their Stoic origins (Wolfson 1943), considerable research has been done; I refer to the recent article of M. Forcada on Avempace for a detailed state of the art (Forcada 2014: 104).

In the first section Alfarabi pleads for having a specific technical language in each discipline. He refers to expressions that have different meanings in the colloquial and in the technical language. When the grammarian hears raf‛, he understands the vowel of the nominative case, and not ‘lifting a weight’ as the unlearned man does.

Avempace points to the distinction between term (sound, lafẓ) and meaning (ma‛nà): man listens to a sound, and gets the meaning that he conceptualized. He may have conceptualized a first meaning but he must learn that the term has more than one meaning and how the various meanings are derivate. This learning happens by means either of a strong mind or of instruction and Avempace blames the mental deficiency of a student for not being capable of grasping the derived meaning of the term.

The second section deals with issues raised in Aristotle’s Topics. Alfarabi classifies knowledge into argumentative and intuitive knowledge. Demonstration (istidlal), cogitation (fikr), deliberation (ru’ya), and deduction (instinbat) are four kinds of argumentative knowledge. Cogitation and deliberaation belong to the Aristotelian tradition (dianoia, boulê), but demonstration and deduction are found in Islamic theology and other Islamic sciences. Intuitive knowledge comprises accepted opinions, things generally known, sense perceptions, and first intelligibles.

Avempace does not pay any attention to these important issues. On the contrary, he focusses on the classes of assent, he complains that many people lack the distinction between the degrees of assent “and maybe the most difficult is the most powerful in them” (IB-taaliq: 65). It is important that the learner of a discipline knows its degrees, he insists.

The third section is related to Aristotle’s Categories but it deals only with the difference between the essential and the accidental. The opposition between ‘essential-accidental’ lies in the background of Avempace’s annotations too, but, in addition, he aims at conceptualization and assent; concerning the former he writes:

What exists in something either exists in it by itself, and it is that which is intended by the conceptualization, or it exists in it accidentally, and is that which is not intended but it is flung away (IB-taaliq: 65).

Philosophers as well as the practitioners of any discipline have to conceptualize what is essential, although he points out that the accidental and the essential often coincide in one subject. The Alfarabian fourth section describes the five ways of anterior and posterior: in time, by nature, in precedence, in excellence, as cause to effect and his division echoes that of Aristotle in the book of Categories. Avempace sees the distinction as the way to understand equivocity — primary and derivative sense, and focuses on three senses of anterior and posterior: in precedence, in excellence, as cause, because the three kinds concern conceptualization and assent.

Priority in precedence “is of great avail for the conceptualization , for the assent, and for the easiness to keep that which one conceptualizes and that to which one gives assent” (IB-taaliq: 69). Priority in cause means that essential things precede other essential things and the concept has to abide by this priority. Priority in excellence means that essential is more excellent than accidental and the concept has to show it. Priority in cause and in excellence are “degrees” that are applied to the matching concepts in the soul. The benefit of priority and posteriority regarding the cause and the perfection, or excellence, results from the fact that

Man understands the grades of assent while conceptualizing so that it may grasp the received (maqbul) where it is needed, the generally admitted (mashhur) where it is needed, and the intelligible (maʻqul) likewise (IB-taaliq: 69).

The sequence ‘received,’ ‘generally admitted’, and ‘intelligible’ corresponds to degrees of certainty for Avempace. The ‘received’ seems to be so from an authority of belief, the ‘generally admitted’ is that which qualifies the premisses of dialectical syllogisms, and the ‘intelligible’ is the direct apprehension of an object. The highest grade of assent belongs to the ‘received’, the ‘generally known’ to the intermediate degree, and the ‘intelligible’ to the lowest grade.

Alfarabi’s fifth section is related to Aristotle’s De interpretatione. He distinguishes between simple and composite expressions; the simple expresssions are three: name, vocable (kalimah) and instrument. “The vocable, the Arab grammarians know it as the verb (fiʻl), and the instrument they call it the particle (ḥarf)” (Dunlop 1955, 278). Avempace immediately links the classification of terms with the construction of science and he justifies the section saying:

Any learner of a logical art must have an ability to distinguish the signs (dalal) of the terms in order to conceptualize the meanings of this art in his mind; he obtains the meanings from the terms pointing to them (IB-taaliq: 71. 9–11).

His idea of science can be defined as obtaining concepts from meanings and producing them in his mind, as opposite to memorization. Learning by heart all the terms would never be a science and Avempace adds that understanding “everything written in a book” implies understanding the meanings of the terms contained in it. The ability to discern (mayz) the signs of the terms is the key condition to learn any theoretical art. Although the ability exists in most people, the vast majority stifle it from a very young age and Avempace blames this behavior as the main cause for the ignorance, and not the natural lack of ability to discern.

Avempace sees a hierarchy in the three simple expressions: The name precedes the verb, and this, the instrument. Verbs are either existential or non-existential. By contrast to Alfarabi, the basic function of existential verbs is connective, and it is shared with the particle. The difference between the particle and the eanxistential verb is that time inheres to the existential verb, but it is absent in the particles (IB-taaliq: 73. 11–15).

Finally, he deals with the “composite expressions” (alfaz murakkabah) of two or three simple expressions. Alfarabi had classified them into declaratory, conditional, particularizing, and restrictive. Avempace comments on this and expresses his particular view about what conditional is:

The expression ‘condition’ is appropriately predicated of the composition of the meanings that are appropriate to universal things without the mind apprehending their universality, but the mind assumes that they are attributes in the thing (IB-taaliq: 75. 20–23).

Avempace does not understand conditional in the ordinary sense of protasis, the conditional sentence, opposite to apodosis, the main sentence. He thinks in terms of opposition between universal and particular and categories of genus and species.

Although for Alfarabi each of the five sections are propedeutical, Avempace sees in them some instruments needed for the construction of science in general, namely, conceptualization and assent, grades of certainty, and the integration of composite expressions into the categories of genus and species, something that leads us to his interpretation of the Eisagoge.

Porphyry’s Eisagoge was translated into Arabic by Abu ‛Uthman Ya‛qub ad-Dimashqi (fl. 914) and his translation was used by Alfarabi in his Book of the Eisagoge (Isaghuji) or Introduction (Madkhal). In his Eisagoge, Porphyry established five universal “meanings”: genus, species, differentia, property, and accident, as the foundations of logic, the first element of a chain, the highest development of which is the syllogism. Alfarabi opened his Introduction with the following statement:

Our purpose in this book is the enumeration of the things of which judgments are composed and into which they are divided, i.e., the parts of parts of the syllogistic expressions employed in general in all the syllogistic arts. (Eisagoge [Dunlop 1956: 127, {Arabic 118.3–4}])

Avempace comments on his words but when he comes to “in all the syllogistic arts”, he moves to another treatise of Alfarabi (Risalah [Dunlop 1957a: Arabic, pp. 225–225, English transl. 230–231]), and seizes the opportunity to expound on their common classification of the syllogistic arts. There are five: “philosophy and the [four] arts”. The four arts are dialectic, sophistic, rhetoric, and poetry. He uses Alfarabi’s words and explains what makes them syllogistic: “It is in the nature of the syllogistic arts to be employed [for their own sake] once they are assembled and completed, and not to have an action as their end”.[9]

Philosophy embraces all beings “insofar as it knows them with certain science” (Ibn Bajja, Fakhry 1994: 27). Thus, two requirements are to be fulfilled: certainty of knowledge and universality of scope, and these requirements hold only for the five divisions of philosophy: metaphysics, physics, practical philosophy, mathematics, and logic.

Metaphysics aims at those beings which are the ultimate causes; they are neither a body nor in a body. Physics or natural science aims at the natural bodies, the existence of which does not depend on human will at all. Practical philosophy—which Avempace calls “voluntary science”—aims at beings produced by the human will and choice.

Mathematics deals with beings abstract from their matters, although endowed with number and measure, and is divided into arithmetic, geometry, optics, astronomy, music, mechanics or the science of weights, and the “science of devices,” which studies:

How to bring into existence many of the things proved theoretically in mathematics, where the worth of the device consists of removing hindrances that, perhaps, hindered their existence. There are numerical devices—like the algebra, geometrical ones—like those for measuring the surface of bodies which are impossible to access, astronomical devices, optical—like the art of mirrors— musical, and mechanical. (Alwuzad 1988: 253. 7–11; IB-taaliq: 28. 9–11)

We shall soon see that astronomy occupies a particular place in the system because its subject results from optical observation. Logic is the fifth and last division of philosophy and focuses on properties that beings acquire in the human mind; “because of such properties and their knowledge [logic] becomes an instrument for apprehending the right and the truth in beings” (IB-taaliq: 28. 13–14). Avempace remarks that for this reason some people consider logic to be only an instrument and not a part of philosophy, but insofar as these properties have real existence, logic can be integrated into philosophy. He concludes that logic is both part and instrument of philosophy.

Since a distinguishing feature of philosophy is the use of the apodictic syllogism (burhan) because it is the only one that yields certain knowledge, not all syllogistic sciences can be considered parts of philosophy by Avempace. He enumerates four such non-philosophical arts: Dialectic relies only on opinion and negates or asserts something through methods of general acceptance. Sophistry aims at beings insofar as it misrepresents them and deceives us: it makes the false look true, and the true, false. And following the tradition initiated by the Greek commentators on Aristotle, Avempace includes Rhetoric and Poetics in logic (IB-taaliq: 28–29). These four arts use other kinds of syllogism but only to convince another, not to infer the truth, whereas philosophy causes man to convince another and to infer the truth for himself.[10]

The classification of the sciences, indeed, is not complete because the aforementioned arts are all theoretical and arts like medicine or agriculture have not been considered. Alfarabi distinguished, at the beginning of his Risala, between syllogistic and non-syllogistic arts and aligned medicine, agriculture, carpentry with the second. They were non-syllogistic because, once their parts were assembled they resulted in doing something, not in employing a syllogism (Dunlop 1957a: 225). He admitted, nevertheless, that some parts of these non-syllogistic arts were brought out by syllogisms, and he mentioned medicine, agriculture and navigation. Avempace was not as systematic as Alfarabi but he picked up the forgotten non-syllogistic arts, changed them into “practical arts”, and wrote:

If some of them [the practical arts] employ syllogisms as medicine and agriculture do, they are not called syllogistic because their purpose is not [to convince another] nor to employ syllogisms, but to do some activity. (IB-taaliq: 29. 17–20)

Avempace composed nine medical treatises (Forcada 2011: 113–114). Forcada has edited, studied, and translated one of them, his “Commentary on Aphorisms”, a supercommentary on Galen’s commentary on Hippocrates’ Aphorisms which illustrates Avempace’s view about medicine. Medical syllogisms have their premises specifically obtained by means of experience. Experience is obtained on its turn by means of perception through one’s life time. Avempace defines tajriba, experience, as an intentional human activity:

3. Experience consists in man’s intentional perception of the particulars [juz’iyyat] of some matter in order to acquire knowledge from this perception.

4. Experience is said in general and in particular. If it is said in general, it indicates the intentional perception of the particulars of a matter, from which a universal proposition results. These individual [instances] may result either from man’s will or by nature. (Forcada 2011: 146)

Therefore, only general experience is useful to science, but Avempace ranks experience not as high in certitude as the first intelligible but second to it, although he makes it essential part of medicine, insofar as it can yield universal propositions. Avempace occupied himself again with the issue of the classification of sciences in his introduction to the Book of Animals (IB-BA). He placed the science of animals within natural philosophy, which falls again within theoretical philosophy.

Every theoretical science is composed of principles and problems. The results may be called problems (masa’il). The principles can be concepts (tasawwur) and they are uttered by spoken sounds that are individual in potency or in actions. The principles can be given assent to (tasdiq) and they are uttered by sentences that are statement-making and necessary. There are sciences like geometry where the principles are more general and anterior. By “principles”, I mean these concepts (tasawwurat): the triangle is anterior to the equilateral triangle and to other kinds of triangles. (IB-BA: 65.5–11)

Ibn Bâjja employs the term tasawwur in a broad sense, since tasawwur in its proper sense does not express statements as it here does, but concepts. He is employing also “problems” in a rare sense since he means here “statements”, he goes on and says:

Anteriority can be either in itself or in relation to us because of our assent that objects equal to a third one are equal is anterior to our assent that the sides of the triangle the vertex of which lays above equal angles are equal. In these examples, the predicates in the principles are the causes of the predicates in the problems, and they are anterior in both aspects. (IB-BA: 65.16–66.4)

Geometry and arithmetic do not employ the senses at all but mechanics and optics do; although their subject matters are sensible beings, they are in “remote common sensibles”. Mechanics and optics differ from astronomy because the subject of astronomy is sensible; it needs examination and the astronomer has to try to find out the causes. Therefore, astronomy follows mechanics and optics, and the latter follow geometry and arithmetic in the order of particular to general knowledge.

Both approaches are complementary. In the Book of Animals, Avempace does not insist on the syllogism as the tool with which sciences are built but he points to the elements, principles or problems, employed in the propositions that can be part of any syllogism.

3. Logic

Avempace inserted his classification of the sciences into the Eisagoge, a treatise whose aim is to discover the simple universal categories underlying the parts of the sentences. His master Alfarabi added the chapters on definition, borrowed from the Aristotelian Analytica Posteriora. Alfarabi had also introduced, at the beginning and in his enumeration of the parts of the sentence, the distinction between “sound” (lafẓ) and “meaning” (ma‛nà) and said:

Every predicate and every subject is either a sound signifying a meaning or a meaning signified by a certain sound, and every meaning signified by a sound is either universal or individual. (Eisagoge, Dunlop 1956: 119.1–2)

Avempace observes that “subject” and “predicate” are ambiguous terms because they may refer to meanings as well as to sounds, and what Alfarabi considers in this book are the meanings, not the sounds (IB-taaliq: 30. 6–8). According to their meaning, both parts of the sentence are either universal or individual. Avempace then follows Alfarabi and divides universal parts into simple and composite: simple parts of the sentence are genus, species, specific difference, property, and accident. Composite parts are the definition, the description, and “an expression the composition of which is restricted, and is neither a definition nor a description” (IB-taaliq: 30. 16–17). Avempace’s meaning here can only be understood by reading Alfarabi’s Eisagoge. Alfarabi defined it as an expression which

is made up of species and an accident, as when we say of Zayd that he is a white man and sometimes it is made up of accidents, as when we say of Zayd that he is an excellent secretary. (Eisagoge, Dunlop 1956, translation p. 137)[11]

The nine categories or sorts are parts of the syllogisms (IB-taaliq: 30. 18–19), according to Avempace and his observations on “subject” and “predicate” are linked to the sciences which are built on syllogisms. The philosophical sciences, dialectic and sophistry, have universal subjects and predicates. Poetry and rhetoric have individual subjects and universal predicates. Rhetoric employs one or more individual subjects as well as predicates in cases in which the syllogism resorts to an image or to corroboration[12].

Avempace knew the difficulties of bringing together the Porphyrian Eisagoge with the Aristotelian corpus as well as the need to classify and organize the sciences. He did not leave us a systematic treatise, but only wrote comments on Alfarabi’s writings. In spite of it, we can perceive a model that starts with the division of “meaning” into individual and universal, continues with the distinction between simple and composite universals, inserts the doctrine of the categories, moves toward the construction of syllogisms, and develops into the variety of sciences according to their syllogistic nature or not. Let us deal with the place of the categories.

The Oxford manuscript marks a new chapter in the text with the heading “Of his discourse at the beginning of the Eisagoge”. Here Avempace divides “meanings” into two kinds: intelligibles (ma‛qulat) and individuals (IB-taaliq: 42. 7). Intelligibles can exist either in the mind or in something outside of it and they are associated mainly with the universals. Avempace quotes Aristotle’s definition of the universal: “That which is by its nature predicated of more than one thing” (De interp. 17a 39) but he borrows the quotation from Alfarabi who commented on the sentence (Eisagoge, Dunlop 1956: 119. 4–13). Avempace has two interpretations for the passage. The first says: “that which is by its nature” refers to an actual resemblance so that universals contain similar individuals “at one and the same time”. By contrast, the second interpretation does not limit the universals to any moment, and Avempace writes:

[Aristotle] intended with the expression “that which is by its nature” the natural [character of the universal] and its disposition to resemble more than one, which does not imply that the resemblance exists in its actualization. For it is not impossible for the eclipse, insofar it is intelligible, to have a resemblance; further it is not impossible for the eclipse to be predicated of many. (IB-taaliq: 46. 4–6)

The concepts of possibility and impossibility come into action and the universal is defined as having the possibility to resemble more than one, “the possibility inhering in the meaning insofar as it is intelligible” (IB-taaliq: 46. 10–11). On the contrary, the individual lacks such possibility; rather, it is impossible for the individual to resemble more than one.

Any relation, i.e., the Aristotelian category, in order to exist needs two possibilities, one for each subject of the relation in contrast to the other nine categories, in which one possibility in one subject is sufficient. Resemblance is a relation, since it is to be predicated on two, and both are properties of the classes of intelligibles as well as of their individuals. The intelligible relations exist in the categories, not because of their own essence. To sum up, only the intelligibles possess the possibility of resembling more than one and are predicted to possess many.

For Avempace, the main purpose of the Eisagoge is to explain the concepts that underlie the ten Aristotelian categories. The first interpretation of “that which is by its nature” is more appropriate to this purpose because the second interpretation affects all beings, but the categories do not affect all beings and they deal with existents insofar as the mind acquires them. These concepts are of two kinds: simple and composite. The simple ones are the five universals and the three composite are the definition, the description and the aforementioned “restricted composition”.

Avempace affirms that the five predicables are not primitive concepts, but constitute correlations between two universals falling within the rules of individuals and classes. He says: “Genus, species, property and accident are correlates (iḍafa) which are inherent to the intelligibles regarding the quantity of their subjects” (IB-taaliq: 50). Genus, species and property are essences inhering in a shared subject; by contrast, the accident is not an essence and exists outside the subject. The specific difference is related only to the individual and may be grasped without reference to the universal.

Avempace’s annotations to Alfarabi’s Kitab al-Madkhal are more innovative than they might seem at first sight. He points out that the Eisagoge should not be limited to the exposition of the five “sounds”—maybe six, if the individual is added[13]—and that a particular science was needed to lay the foundations for the Organon. He conceives this science as a formal theory of individuals and classes that is followed by the theory of definition and description.

Avempace wrote annotations on other logical books of Alfarabi that were edited by M. T. Danishpazhuh (1989) and by Majid Fakhry (IB-taaliq), whose edition is complete. The Center of Averroic Studies in Fes, Morocco, had started the publication of some of them (Alwozad, 1988) and completed them in 1997–2006 (Avempace, Alwozad, 1997).

Alfarabi’s books on the Aristotelian Categories, De interpretatione, and the First Analytics, were also interpreted by Avempace. Alfarabi had “completed” the latter with a Book of the Analysis and Avempace made an “exercitation” on it, Al-Irtiyad fi kitab at-Tahlil. His annotation on the First Analytics contains his views on Aristotle’s purpose in introducing the syllogism:

The purpose of Aristotle in his book “Analytics” is to discourse on the syllogistic potency (al-quwa al-qiyasiyya) because he considered that, if he discoursed on the action of the syllogistic potency, he had to do it on the syllogism, just as when he discoursed on the natural potency, he had to do it on medicine, that is its art. (IB-taaliq: 184. 7–9)

Avempace explains what he understands under “syllogistic potency”: Aristotle sometimes would say that many conclusions result from one syllogism, and sometimes not only one, and this possibility is interpreted as “syllogistic potency”. According to Avempace, when Aristotle argues: Every man is an animal and every animal is sensible, thus every man is sensible,[14] he means that by action of the syllogistic potency the conclusion ‘a certain animal is a man’ follows from the assertion ‘every man is an animal’.

Avempace links the inversion to the introduction of the fourth figure of the syllogism in which the middle term is the predicate of the premise containing the predicate of the conclusion and the subject of the other premise. “Since [Aristotle] discourses on the action of the syllogistic potency, he keeps perceiving the fourth figure that Galen thought he had ignored” (IB-taaliq: 184. 20–21).

The fourth figure is not rejected by Avempace, who tries to safeguard it by using potency in a specific sense, “syllogistic potency”. He creates a wider framework in which he places the “five sections” while the core belongs to the standard syllogistic doctrine.

To this wider framework it belongs Avempace’s use of the syllogism in his book on Coming-to-be and Passing-away. When man argues, he accomplishes a kind of mental movement and the movers are the premises of the syllogism. Avempace illustrates it with an example: A man takes our money and travels with it towards Cairo. We go after him and we have to stop over in the different places of his way up to when we reach the final point, Cairo. Avempace explains us the story:

Since the existence of the final aim depends on the accomplishment of a desire, to grasp it is pleasant, and since no other desire accompanies it, it is pleasant with such a delight that no pain interferes it, neither essentially nor accidentally. In all intermediate degrees there is pleasure and pain, and in the first degree, that is first matter, only pain. That final aim is permanent pleasure and first matter is permanent pain. The desired thing is the first mover and the final aim, so that it is both efficient and final cause.The arrangement of the premises is similar to that of motion, while the concept (tasawwur) is similar to first matter, and the existence of the final aim is the accomplishment. (IB GC 1995: 35. 7–36. 3)

The reference to the syllogism, its premises and its conclusion is far distant, but the topic how man can attain his perfection, and therefore his happiness is present here as it is in most of Avempace’s writings as we will see.

The exercitation on the Analysis (Alwuzad 2006) relates to a particular work by Alfarabi concerning the premises of the syllogism (Mallet 1994). Alfarabi placed it between the First and the Second Analytics considering that it provided us with the laws ruling the formation of the premises, something which became necessary after the syllogism had been described. Alfarabi linked the theory of the premises to the topoi “places” as they are understood in the Aristotelian treatise with the same title, the Topics. He defined topoi, Arabic mawadiʿ in these terms:

They are the universal premises the particular ones of which are employed as major premises in every syllogism and every discipline. Each topos is employed in many particular premises, some of them are employed in dialectics, others in rhetoric, others in the sciences, yet others in the rest of intellectual disciplines (Alfarabi, 1986, pp. 95. 5–8).

According to Mallet, Alfarabi understood the topoi as the universal matrices of all possible major premises (Mallet, 1992, pp. vol. 1, p. 127). Mallet does not define ‘matrix’ in the context, but its use shows that the term designates that within which, and from which, a major premise originates.

Avempace understands it in the same way and comments on the topoi at length. His doctrine of conceptualization (tasawwur) is present here also and shows his original approach.

If the topoi are conceptualized by that which their definition completely gives and by the fact that the major premise is a major premise taken over from the topoi, the definition of the topos is perfect (IB-taaliq: 195. 3–5).

Topos results from conceptualization and does not exist outside the soul. Topos is immaterial, and something general (ʻamm). ‘General’ has its own meaning in Avempace: it comprises universals (kulliyat) and particulars, as well as the specific difference, the definition and its parts, the description and its parts, properties, accidents, and concomitants, etc. ‘General’ helps to elevate the theory of the topoi to a comprehensive theory of syllogisms as vehicles of knowledge in all disciplines.

4. Mathematical Sciences

Al-’Alawi’s exposition of three steps in the intellectual development of Avempace does not conflict with Avempace’s view of the sciences. In fact, Alfarabi was active in the three fields in addition to the preparatory logic. The first of the three syllogistic sciences is mathematics that deals with objects deprived of matter but endowed with number and measure. Mathematics contains various sciences, among them music and astronomy.

The biographical sources are informed by Avempace’s expertise as a musician and as a composer of muwashshaha poetry. In addition, he has left us a brief composition on the melodies[15]. Avempace expounds on the therapeutic effect of playing the ‛ud, lute, on the basis of universal harmony existing between the heavenly spheres and the bodily nature, the humors. Each chord of the lute is related to one of the four elements: fire, air, earth, water, and each chord has a beneficial influence on each disease caused by one of the humors. The chord called zir acts on the bile, the chord mathnà on the blood, the chord mathlat on the black bile, and the chord bam on the phlegm. Avempace instructs the player how to place the lute on his body and which finger plays which chord. If the musician plays the lute in the right way, his day will be most beautiful.

In his letter to Abu Ja‛far Yusuf Ibn Hasday (IB-coll-alawi: 77–81), Avempace blames the astronomer az-Zarqalluh for not having properly understood astronomy and attacks him for his “Treatise to refute the method employed by Ptolemy to calculate the apogee of Mercury”. This work of az-Zarkalluh is not extant. J. Samsó informs us that Ptolemy’s calculation of the apogee was wrong by approximately 30º and that az-Zarkalluh calculated the apogee in another work only with an error of 10º (Samsó 1993–1994: 676–677). Avempace, however, criticizes the method that az-Zarkalluh employed.

Avempace wrote a letter to Abu Zayd ‛Abd ar-Rahman Ibn Sayyid al-Muhandis (IB-coll-alawi: 84–87) about a preliminary question from the first book of the Conic Sections of Apollonius of Perga (ca. 200 BC). In another letter to his disciple ‛Ali Ibn al-Imam (IB-coll-alawi: 88–96) Avempace mentions Ibn Sayyid as the discoverer of new procedures in geometry. In addition to this letter, one passage in his Commentary on the Physics[16] and another in the Book of animals (IB-BA: 74) deal with the Conic Sections in a sketchy way. Ahmed Djebbar studied Ibn Sayyid and Avempace and gathered that both Andalusians were innovative in their study of warped surfaces resulting from the intersection of conic and non-conic surfaces[17].

5. Natural Philosophy and Necessity

Avempace commented very freely on the Aristotelian works and wrote independent articles on various subjects of personal interest. We are not always sure which source he read and whether it was the complete translation or an abridgment. In the case of his commentary on the Meteorology,[18] we know from Paul Lettinck’s edition and translation of the commentary. Lettinck proved that Avempace read the altered version of the Meteorology made by Yahyà Ibn al-Bitriq (d. ca. 830; Petraitis 1967).

The Aristotelian treatises dealing mainly with natural philosophy are the Physics, Coming-to-be and Passing-away, On the Heavens, and Meteorology. This is the traditional order of their arrangement within the corpus, and the books on the Animals are last. Avempace followed the order for his reading of the corpus, wrote his commentaries accordingly and therefore we should first consider his commentary on the Physics.[19]

Avempace defines this science as theoretical, the subject of which is the natural body and says that most of its subject is known by the senses (IB-SS-fakhry: 15.7–9). Physics works on the basis of principles insofar as it is theoretical and searches for causes as its demonstrative science. We should not leave aside the long discussion on the essence and position of physics in Avempace’s introduction to his Book of Animals.

There we learned that the matter of physics is strenuous.

This science must employ all the potencies [capacities] developed previously in mathematics and logical and it employs them only insofar they belong to a common genus. (IB-BA: 69. 5–7)

Avempace finally affirms that natural science has various kinds of principles and problems, and that it contains objects that are not sensible at all, like the intellect.

Avempace makes clear that natural science or physics is a theoretical science which requires mastering other sciences. It is not a science like geometry the objects of which are anterior, both in knowledge and in reality. Its objects are posterior in knowledge, but Avempace remarks that some are not related to the senses.

Motion is one of the main issues in the Physics and Avempace had original views on the issue. Book VII of the Aristotelian Physics does not fit into the sequence of Books V, VI and VIII and its chapters deal with subjects not related to each other. One of them mentions that every movable or mobile is moved by a mover different from itself (Phys. VII.1, 241b 24). Avempace considers the tenet that everything is moved by something else, and says:

It is evident that the rest of the whole caused by the rest of one of its parts takes place in so far as the movable is other than the mover, and when the influence (athar) of the latter ends, it comes to rest. Its influence ends because the mover ceases to act either on its own or because something else exerts resistance on it. Whenever the mover ceases to act on its own, this happens due either to its destruction, or to exhaustion (kalal) of the power of the mover, or because the cause disappears, or because the motion is complete, since the movable has reached the end toward which it was moving. (IB-SS-fakhry: 99.16–20. Lettinck 1994: 532–533)

“Influence” is not a technical term, but the words following the quoted text clarify it. Motion necessarily takes place if a moving power exists in such a condition that enables it to cause motion and if no contrary moving power exerts resistance. If the moving power ceases, its influence does too.

The movements involved here are so-called “violent” movements, as opposed to “natural” ones discussed below. Avempace sketches a theory of dynamics based on a notion of “power” different from the Aristotelian notion of dynamis: they are mechanical forces which can join another force or counteract it by offering resistance. Shlomoh Pines introduced the term “dynamics”[20] to define his views, which no doubt were influenced by the tradition linked to John Philoponus (d. ca. 566).[21] There is a minimum amount of moving power for each movable. For instance, to move a boat a minimum of power is needed, otherwise “one grain of sand could move the boat” (IB-SS-fakhry: 112.27).

When two opposing powers are equal, there is no motion, and when one power “overcomes” the other, the body moves until it suffers “exhaustion” (kalal), because any body moved “violently” creates a contrary power stronger than the one imposed by the mover, and also because the imposed force becomes “exhausted”. The moving power is also subject to time and distance factors and the mobile can offer almost no resistance, so that the absolute terms of proportionality do not apply.

Another contribution is related to motion in the void. Avempace analyzes “natural” movements such as a stone’s falling through air and water. They are the movements of the four elemental bodies: fire, air, water and earth. These movables need a moving power capable not only of moving them, but also of displacing the medium through which they pass. Dust particles stay suspended in the air because, although they possess enough power to go down, their power is insufficient to displace the air.

Aristotle rejected the possibility of motion in the void because the medium was essential to natural movement at finite speed (Phys. IV.8). John Philoponus had already expressed the view that the medium is not a necessary condition, but only provides resistance. The different velocities with which the stone passes through the air or the water is only caused by the different density of the medium; it is not connatural to the medium. As a proof that motion without any medium, namely, through a void, is possible, Avempace adduces the movement of the spheres:

[In the heavens] there are no elements of violent motion, because nothing bends their movement, the place of the sphere remains the same and no new place is taken by it. Therefore, circular movement should be instantaneous, but we observe that some spheres move slowly—such as the sphere of fixed stars—and others fast—the daily movement—and that there is neither violence nor resistance among them. The cause for the different velocities is the difference in nobility (sharf) between mover and movable. (IB-SS-fakhry: 116.13–17)

The role of the medium is not essential, but is only a kind of resistance, and thus motion in the void is both theoretically possible and confirmed by the observation of the spheres. Avempace contradicts Aristotle and advances a doctrine that Galileo will later prove to be right.[22] The similarity with Philoponus’ doctrine is clear, but an influence is not certain (Lettinck 1994: 549). Said El Bousklaoui shares the view that Avempace’s doctrine although similar to Philoponus’s it is not inherited from it (Bouskaloui 2020). Bousklaoui links the impetus theory to movement by itself, “spontaneously”, but this view needs further development.

The treatise On the Heavens followed next in the Aristotelian order but no commentary of Avempace has reached us, and the following extant commentary is on Coming-to-be and Passing-away (IB-GC). Avempace coincided with Philoponus in a preliminary remark observing that Aristotle proved in his book On the Heavens the existence of four elementary bodies: fire, air, water, earth. Since one of the subjects of Coming-to-be and Passing-away is the mutual generation of these bodies, it is the logical continuation. Thus, Avempace’s lost commentary On the Heavens likely comes after the one on Physics and before the one on Coming-to-be and Passing-away.

This commentary runs parallel to the Aristotelian text. After explaining changes in quality, Avempace suddenly starts a discourse on force or power (quwwa) and on the moving power (quwwa muharrika; IB-GC: 26–40). The four elementary bodies are defined by the four possible binary combinations of cold/warm with heavy/light. Some of them can be also moving powers:

If the causes of the qualities exist primarily in their subjects and belong to the same species, the qualities are movers […] Absolute actuality is the existence of this moving power as moving and this is only the case because of the existence of the movable being in motion, and this is coherent if we assume the movable power to exist. (IB-GC: 26. 1–7)

For Wirmer the passage is one of the pillars, on which he develops the ontological system based on “Potenz” in Avempace (Wirmer 2014: 346–352) and, as expected, most of the passages where the term quwwa comes out, are found in his book On the Soul.

Avempace does not extend in the issue of elementary qualities as moving powers, and focuses on the soul as a moving power (elemental bodies do not have souls; instead, they have natures). The case of the human soul interests him most and he wants to explain how intellectual apprehension moves man in reasoning and action. Avempace will deal, in a more satisfactory way, with the issue of rank of ideas and forms in relation to human activity in other works.

Avempace’s reflections on absolute coming-to-be and passing-away start with a linguistic analysis of the term kawn “coming-to-be” which echoes Alfarabi’s method and itself is a novelty (IB-GC: 41–44). Avempace stresses that coming-to-be is only possible if the metaphysical structure of act and potency are admitted (IB-GC: 46–47).

At the beginning of his treatise of Meteorology, Aristotle summarizes his preceding research: he has established the four causes of nature and dealt with all natural motion in Physics. He has investigated the ordered movement of the stars in the heavens in De caelo, and changes of the four elements into one another, growth, and perishing in De generatione et corruptione. What still has to be investigated is that which takes place “in the region nearest to the motion of the stars such as the Milky Way” (Meteo. 338b 3–4).

Avempace’s commentary presents his own theory of the Milky Way. Aristotle explained it as the ignition of the fiery exhalation of some stars which were large, numerous and close together. The ignition takes place in the upper part of the atmosphere, in the region of the world which is continuous with the heavenly motions (Meteo. 346b 11–12). The version transmitted by Ibn al-Bitriq diverges and considers the Milky Way to be a phenomenon exclusively of the heavenly spheres, not of the upper part of the atmosphere. The light of those stars makes a visible patch because they are so close.

Avempace considers the Milky Way to be a phenomenon both of the spheres above the moon and of the sublunar region. The Milky Way is the light of many stars which almost touch one another. Their light forms a “continuous image” (khayal muttasil) on the surface of the body which is like a “tent” (takhawwum) under the fierily element and over the air which it covers.[23] Avempace defines the continuous image as the result of refraction (in‛ikas) and supports its explanation with an observation of a conjunction of two planets, Jupiter and Mars which took place in 500/1106–7. He watched the conjunction and “saw them having an elongate figure” (Lettinck 1999: 434) although their figure is circular.

Avempace wrote a treatise on animals related to the Aristotelian books Generation of Animals, Parts of the animals, and Description of the animals, and another one on plants (Asín Palacios 1940) and probably a third one on minerals, all following the Pseudo-Aristotelian corpus.[24]

The Book of Animals was edited by Jawad al-‛Imarati (IB-BA). As said above, Avempace begins his book situating it in the context of the theoretical sciences, and then within natural science. The science of the living animals is a species of the natural philosophy (IB-BA: 71). Avempace wonders whether the relationship of its subject, the animal, is similar to the relationship of arithmetic to numbers. Arithmetic is a discipline where the pattern of genus and species applies smoothly: It establishes ten units, and then it combines them and gives them accidents like being odd or a pair, etc. Since numbers are made one of another “ten is made of the five multiplied by the two” and they are “simple forms” which can be continuously incremented (IB-BA: 73) and animals have a completely different existence, Avempace denies the relationship.

Geometrical objects are similar to numbers, but they differ insofar as their species are infinite. Avempace mentions infinite figures “resulting from [intersecting] the straight line with the circle, either cylinder or conic”. Primary genera of geometry are the line, the surface and the body, and Avempace denies any parallelism to the swimming, walking and flying characteristics of animals—he uses the term tanasub, ‘proportional’, opposite to tawatu’, ‘univocal’ (IB-BA: 74. 16–20).

As for a possible similarity to the numbers, numerical specific differences are anterior and actively dividing, not divisible. On the contrary, according to Avempace, the science of the animals goes another way:

We must take the first contrariety inherent to the animals and by which they are divisible, and whether it belongs to the essential universal opposite accidents by which the primary species come to stand. (IB-BA: 75. 1–3)

Avempace inquiries further about these basic contrarieties to establish the furthermost species and make possible a demonstrative science.

We predicate of the animals contrary specific differences, like having blood or not, and then we can prove it. If we talk about man and about bull, we cannot make any specific distinction. (IB-BA: 76. 7–9)

Aristotle, according to Avempace, classified the science of animals into four sections: 1) properties of the sensible parts of animals, 2) properties of their limbs, 3) properties of their homogeneous sensible parts, and 4) properties of their non-homogeneous sensible parts (IB-BA: 76).

If we go into the material content of the book, we find some remarkable contributions of Avempace. Remke Kruk points to his description of the copulation of insects and to the male and female role in the procreative process (Kruk 1997: 172–175).

However, the theoretic endeavor of Avempace in his Book of animals seems to be more relevant. Avempace wants to draw a theoretic system embracing all reality. Reality is plenty of forms, and their perfection consists of motion and action (IB-BA: 79). He divides forms into natural and artificial. The specific difference is that natural forms possess a power (quwwa) which moves bodies and by which bodies move themselves while artifacts only move accidentally).

Art (sina‛a) is the elaborated form abstracted from matter; it is abstracted from its matter. The artificial form which exists in its matter does not have any power to move that which is in it nor to move something else. This is the difference between artificial and natural forms. (IB-BA: 79. 1–4)

Natural powers are obviously nobler than artificial ones. Avempace also takes modal factors into account for his design and introduces necessity in his discourse. Necessity is predicated of immovable forms in its primary sense, and metaphysics deals with them. The natural scientist deals with forms subject to motion and, for this reason, necessity can be predicated “by design” bi-l-wad‛. Avempace gives the following example that clarifies what he means with “by design”:

If there is a house, there is a foundation by necessity, and this kind of necessity is a relationship between the causes of the existing [object] and the final [cause]. If [the final cause] is described, the various kinds of the causes follow it by necessity, and the form acts in a similar way.

If the form is the final [cause] of a motion, motion follows it by necessity, and it is something evident because, if there is building activity, there will be a house, and if there is building, there is the art of construction, but if there is only the art of construction, there will be no building. If [form] is acquired ‘by design,’ the other causes result in a well kept way from the final cause by necessity. (IB-BA: 81. 6–10)

‘Design’ is the human involvement in the example. In natural philosophy, necessity can be predicated also in another sense. Avempace mentions the case of the carpenter who choses an iron hatchet because of the hardness of its iron; the hatchet as formal cause cannot carry its function unless its matter is iron or an alike material. He sees here another kind of necessity, intrinsec necessity because of matter. Following the example, iron melts by the application of fire or it rusts in the soil. Melting and rusting take place by necessity and “not because the smith intends it” (IB-BA: 81. 16).

By contrast absolute necessity reigns in the heavenly spheres, Therefore, Avempace reckons three kinds of necessity: absolute, “by design”, and material. Interestingly, Avempace turns now to the lunar eclipses: they happen with absolute necessity in a determined period of time (IB-BA: 82). As he goes on and discusses possibility, Avempace admits possibility in relation to the eclipses, but combined with necessity—he literally says that “possibility shares necessity”. Possibility is present insofar as no specific limits determine the periods of time in which the eclipse exists potentially from those in which it exists actually. Necessity shows when it does not exist in a given time because of opposed motions caused by opposed unmoved movers.

Avempace considers then the four elements, in which necessity is only existent because the temporal determination. Avempace’s lengthy and twisted arguments end with the conclusion:

Since the celestial bodies do not have any contrary form, there is absolutely no potentiality (quwwa), and if there is no possibility (imkan) in them, there is no coming-to-be nor passing-away. (IB-BA: 83. 13–16)

As Avempace’s natural philosophy goes beyond the analysis of motion, matter, time and place, it extends to metaphysical principles of necessity and possibility which eventually concern human behavor.

6. Soul and Knowledge

We have read above that physics aims not only at sensible objects (above,), but also spiritual ones—which allows us to introduce Avempace’s book on the Soul. The book was edited (IB-S1a) and translated by Muhammad Saghir Hasan al-Ma‛sumi (IB-S1e) who unfortunately could use only the Oxford manuscript; the Berlin manuscript is longer although its composition is less coherent. In 2007 J. Lomba Fuentes used both manuscripts for his Spanish translation (IB-S-lomba) as D. Wirmer has done for his German version (IB-S-Wirmer).

When Avempace starts the book, he proceeds in a similar way to the one on animals, namely with a comprehensive framing of the subject. Bodies are either natural or artificial; all they have in common the presence of matter and form; and form is their perfection. Natural bodies have their mover inside the whole body, because the natural body is composed of mover and moved.

Most of the artificial bodies are moved by an external mover, although automats or machines have their motor inside, and Avempace adds “I have explained it in the science of Politics” (which is lost) (IB-S1a: 25. 4; IB-S1e: 15). The mover is identical with the form. He distinguishes two kinds of perfecting forms, namely forms moving by means of an instrument or not (IB-S1a: 28; IB-S1e: 17). The first kind is nature, the second, the soul.

To define the soul as operating through an instrument, i.e., the body “in an ambiguous sense”, as Avempace does (IB-S1a: 29. 2), implies it is autonomous. Avempace defines the soul also as first entelechy (istikmal), as opposed to the last entelechy of the geometer, i.e., its being geometer in act. Soul appears as an incorporeal substance, of highest rank. The science of soul is considered by Avempace as superior to physics and mathematics, only inferior to metaphysics. Avempace is not disturbed by Aristotle’s hylemorphic view of the soul which he may have known. He affirms that all philosophers agreed that the soul is a substance and portrays Plato as the adequate source:

Since it was clear to Plato that the soul is assigned to substance, and that substance is predicated on the form and matter which is body, and that the soul cannot be said to be a body, he fervently defined the soul in its particular aspect. Since he had established that the forms of spheres are souls, he looked for the commonality of all [souls], and found that sense perception is particular to animals, [but] that movement is particular to all, and therefore he defined the soul as “something which moves itself”. (IB-S1a: 40. 5–41; IB-S1e: 26)

Aristotle’s treatise is relevant for Avempace in its description of the various powers of the soul, i.e., nutritive, sense-perceptive, imaginative, rational faculties, although Avempace may have not had any Arabic translation of Aristotle’s De anima.[25] Avempace often digresses into general reflections; for instance, at the beginning of his chapter on the nutritive faculty he talks about possibility and impossibility. But, in other places, there are some references to Aristotle, for instance, when it comes to the imaginative faculty. Avempace writes that “The imaginative faculty is the faculty by which the ‘reasons’ (ma‛ani) of the sensibles are apprehended” (IB-S1a: 133. 3; IB-S1e: 106).

Ma‛nà can translate various Greek words, and the Stoic lektón “meaning” is the most relevant. The Arab grammarians used the term ma‛nà, plural ma‛ani to point to the content of the word, to its semantic component, in contrast to lafẓ, its phonic part; the pair ma‛nà / lafẓ is already found in Sibawayhi (d. ca. 796). Ma‛nà was frequently used by Islamic theologians too, to express the concrete cause or “reason” of a thing. The Latin intentio of medieval philosophy is used to translate ma‛nà, and the concept of intentio appears close to that intended by Avempace since ma‛nà has two characteristics: it is some form or figure dissociated from matter but having reference to the thing the figure of form of which it is (Blaustein 1986: 207).

Imagination apprehends the internal contents of the sensations and animals operate with them. “It is the most noble faculty in irrational animals, and through it animals move, have many arts, and look after their progeny”. Avempace gives as examples ants and bees, which are exactly the kind of animals to which Aristotle denies the faculty! (IB-S1a: 140; IB-S1e: 111).

Avempace begins his chapter on the rational faculty by asking whether this faculty is always actual or sometimes potential and actual. He answers that it is sometimes potential and sometimes actual (IB-S1a: 145–146; IB-S1e: 117–118). It is just a note without continuation.

The main activity of the reasoning faculty is to enquire and to learn. Avempace introduces here the discursive faculty (al-quwwa al-mufakkira) which binds subject and predicate. The text is confusing and the Oxford manuscript ends inconclusively. The Berlin-Krakow manuscript has a few more pages (176rº–179rº) that Joaquín Lomba included in his Spanish translation, as well as Wirmer in his German (IB-S-Wirmer, 720–727). At the end of the fragment, the unknown editor writes that Avempace’s discourse on the soul is followed by a treatise on the intellect, i.e., the Epistle of Conjunction of it with man.

The intellect, Avempace affirms, apprehends the essence of something, not something material and individual. The essence of any object is its “reason” (ma‛nà) which corresponds to its form linked to matter in this case. If we go back to a former passage of the same book, we read how the distinction is:

The difference between the reason and form is that form and matter become one thing without existing separately, whereas the reason of the thing perceived is a form separated from matter. So the reason is the form separated from matter. (IB-S1a: 94. 11–13)

Then the intellect apprehends it in such a way that they both—essence and intellect—are “one in the subject and two in expression”. The speculative intellect searches for the essences of material beings, but it is not satisfied with their apprehension. It realizes that they are material intelligibles which need further foundation and Avempace contends that the intellect knows that there are superior intelligibles which found them and strives for them (Mss. Berlin 176 vº). The fragment contains these and other notes which are difficult to bring together although they are in harmony with other writings of Avempace. We may refer to his exposition of the “spiritual forms” in the Rule of the Solitary as more relevant.

Finally, we should mention his text in defense of Alfarabi, accused of denying survival after death.[26] There, Avempace argues that since man has knowledge of intelligibles beyond sense-perception and since it occurs by means of introspection, it is a divine gift to man who has no need for the matter to survive after death.

7. Ethics and Metaphysics

Avempace illustrated for us his views on how knowledge is organized and how the world of nature is structured, but we have not yet expounded on his proper ideas on metaphysics, nor on the sciences that aim at beings produced by the human will and choice, namely, ethics and politics.

Avempace’s most representative works are the Rule of the Solitary,[27] the epistle of the Farewell Message,[28] and the Epistle of Conjunction of Intellect with Man.[29] The latter work contains references to Rule of the Solitary and to the epistle of the Farewell Message (as well as to his book on the Soul).

Alfarabi’s major work is Book of the opinions of the inhabitants of the righteous city[30]. It is an exposition of a Neo-Platonist emanationist system as well of the different kinds of societies. Alfarabi wanted a perfect city, ruled by a righteous man parallel to the rule of the universe by the perfect One. His connecting cosmogenic explanations and political plans were known to Avempace who did not follow him. Avempace does not quote this or other works by Alfarabi which have a similar content. He quotes Plato but follows the opposite way. While Plato in the Republic would take the human soul as the model for the perfect city, so that the perfect organization inside it tells how the city has to be organized, Avempace starts from the ideal city and wants to transfer its organization to the individual (Abbès 2011: 86).

Avempace echoes Plato and mentions his division of cities, or societies, into a perfect one and others which are corrupted (IB-RS-AP: 5–6; IB-coll-genequand: 123; IB-RS-berman: 125). One assumes that Avempace is referring to the four imperfect cities, namely, timocracy, oligarchy, democracy, and tyranny (Republic, viii-ix) although Asín Palacios interpreted them as the four imperfect cities cited in Alfarabi’s works (IB-RS-AP: 37, note 6), and Genequand accepts both possibilities (IB-coll-genequand: 256 §13)

The virtuous city is the only that can make its inhabitants happy because they achieve their perfection. It is characterized by the absence of the art of medicine and the art of adjudication. Avempace follows Plato, but his version is also characterized by the absence of weeds (IB-RS-AP: 10. 16–18; IB-RS-berman: 126; IB-coll-genequand: 126 §32). Avempace explains that in imperfect cities there are false opinions, but that the majority of inhabitants accept them as right, or that there are contradictory positions and that there is no way to know which one is true.

Now the people who discover a right action or learn a true science that does not exist in the city belong to a class that has no generic name. As for the ones who stumble upon a true opinion that does not exist in the city or the opposite of which is believed in the city, they are called weeds. (IB-RS-AP: 10. 8–11; IB-coll-genequand: 126, §31; IB-RS-berman: 127)

E.I.J. Rosenthal already pointed to the different evaluation of the “weeds” by Alfarabi and Avempace (Rosenthal 1951). Avempace borrows the concept from Alfarabi who saw these men as a danger in the imperfect as well as the perfect city. Avempace saw the virtuous city free of weeds, because it is free from false opinions. Weed-men spring up only in the imperfect cities, and they can help in correcting their views. However, he realized that they were strangers in the cities or societies of his time, which all belonged to the corrupted types, and he did not believe that these societies could be rehabilitated; he abandoned Alfarabi at this point and addressed the “weed-men”.

Avempace wrote a book of a genre similar to that which physicians write to preserve and acquire health, the so called tadbir as-sihha. He referred to Galen and what Galen wrote in the Preservation of Health as a model for his Rule of the Solitary. To preserve physical health requires knowledge of the natural science about delivering justice, for example, and knowledge of political science. Avempace concluded that since his treatise aims at acquiring and preserving spiritual health, “it reverts to the natural and political science” (IB-RS-AP: 12.15–16; IB-RS-berman: 129; IB-coll-genequand: 128 §38). What binds natural and political science? Forms, insofar as men have similar and different forms, and forms are related to nature.

“Form” acquires a broad sense for Avempace who distinguishes various kinds of it. Forms are known as the intelligible essences of objects. Avempace accepts this meaning. For him, however, forms have something in common, namely, moving power, and forms are integrated into a participating hierarchy. Avempace’s doctrine of the forms is no doubt original, although antecedents are found in the Neo-Platonist tradition. He once quotes a treatise “On the Spiritual Forms” misattributed to Alexander of Aphrodisias (IB-coll-fakhry: 166. 16–17; IB-CIM: 18) which S. Pines (1955) demonstrated to belong to Proclus. Alfarabi’s Risala fi l-‛aql (1938) and other of his works contain the principles of the participating hierarchy of intellects and intelligibles (cf. Davidson 1992; Ramón Guerrero 1992).

Thus, man’s actions belong to different levels according to the different forms found in man: physical, animal and spiritual. The latter are specific to man; we can know which actions are most appropriate to man only if we know what is his essence, namely, his most excellent form. Therefore, Avempace accompanies his Regimen sanitatis with a following Treatise on the spiritual forms, lengthier than the former. Steven Harvey already insisted that his epistemology allows us to understand his attitude about politics, and that is not something accidental (Harvey 1992: 212). Avempace assigns the term “spiritual” to the soul insofar as it is “a moving soul”. This may be too broad a definition, but he then specifies the various kinds of “spiritual forms”—all having the capacity to move:

The spiritual forms are of various kinds: the first are the forms of the circular [i.e., heavenly] bodies, the second are the active intellect and the acquired intellect, the third are the material intelligibles (ma‛qulat), the fourth are the “reasons” (ma‛ani) existent in the faculties of the soul, i.e., existent in common sense, in the imaginative faculty and in the memory. (IB-RS-AP: 19.2–5; IB-coll-fakhry: 49.16–19; IB-coll-genequand: 132 §58)

The heavenly bodies are not only immaterial for Avempace and the long Aristotelian tradition, but they are also the most spiritual and are followed in rank by the class of the active intellect and the acquired intellect. The active intellect is immaterial, but the acquired intellect has some connection to matter “because it perfects (mutammim) the material intelligibles” (IB-RS-AP: 19. 10; IB-coll-genequand: 133 §59: “il actualize”). The latter are “not spiritual per se because their existence takes place in prime matter” (IB-RS-AP: 19. 7–8; IB-coll-genequand: 132 §59), and we assume that they are the internal counterpart of the substantial forms. We see that spiritual forms differ from similar forms which are joined to matter and determine the substances.

Avempace does not give us any instance of “material intelligibles”, but we may well think of the idea of a tree or a horse in our mind. In his later treatise on the Conjunction of Intellect with Man, Avempace differentiates between intelligibles of real existing beings such as the horse, and intelligibles of non-existent beings, such as a one-legged man, and he further differentiates between intelligibles of real existing beings which one has seen, and intelligibles of existing being which one has not seen. For Avempace, the latter are intelligibles in a derivative sense or by analogy (IB-CIM: 15; IB-coll-fakhry: 163; IB-coll-genequand: 191 §27). “Material intelligibles” should contain both categories.

The objects of common sense, imagination, and of memory are not intelligibles; they are ma‘ani, “reasons”. The term is ambiguous, but it is clear that a “reason” is the cognitive product of any of these three faculties and it is also clear that “reason” is some spiritual form.

According to Avempace, spiritual forms divide into universal and particular forms: universal forms are found in the active intellect and the individual intellect apprehends them too. Particular forms are found in common sense, and Avempace gives the instance of a certain mount in Arabia. The “spiritual” content of the forms in the common sense is lower than in the forms of the imagination, and that of the latter ones is lower than in the forms of the memory insofar as their content is more and more “corporeal”. The forms of the rational faculty—we may say, the material intelligibles—are not corporeal (IB-RS-AP: 21. 2–3; IB-coll-fakhry: 50; IB-coll-genequand: 132 §61). Avempace seems to be aware of the difficulties of his explanation, and later on the same treatise he summarizes the views:

We say: The form of any generated corruptible being has three grades of existence, the first is that of the universal spiritual form which is the intelligible form and is the species, the second is that of the particular spiritual form, and the third that of bodily form.

The particular spiritual form has again three grades, the first is that of the “reason” existing in the memory, the second is that of the picture (rasm) existing in the imaginative faculty, and the third is the image (sanam) or the common sense. (IB-RS-AP: 31.13–32.1; IB-coll-fakhry: 58.10–15; IB-coll-genequand: 141–142, §90)

Particular spiritual forms may be true or false; if they have come to us through the common sense, they are mostly true. Spiritual forms play a role in every aspect of human life, even in the prophetic revelation. The inspiration received by the prophets belongs to the category of particular spiritual forms, which do not pass through the common sense, but are received directly from the active intellect. Avempace wrongly refers to Aristotle in support of his view and view and ends by saying “These instances go beyond the natural world, they are divine gifts” (IB-RS-AP: 24. 7; IB-coll-fakhry: 53; IB-coll-genequand: 136 §71).

As for the Sufis, their experiences belong to the level of the particular spiritual forms, where common sense, imagination and memory are active, but they mistake them for universal spiritual forms, and wrongly believe that the coincidence of the three faculties is the source of supreme happiness (IB-RS-AP: 26–27; IB-coll-fakhry: 55).

Man has to organize his various faculties—from the rational to the nutritive—and there are categories of men according to the prevalence of each of the three faculties. In some of them, corporeality prevails; in a select few, spirituality does. Avempace counts some ascetics and Sufis among the latter—but for most, the situation is mixed. Man is moved by spiritual forms that may be as basic as clothing, housing or food. Clothing, for instance, acts on two levels, the protective and the ornamental. Virtues are attached to the spiritual forms found in the imaginative faculty because the purpose of virtuous actions is generating positive feelings and admiration in the souls of those who see them. The spirituality of most men is, however, limited to particular forms. Only philosophers attain the highest degree of spirituality, the immaterial and universal intelligibles. Although philosophers have to take due care of the corporeal and particular spiritual forms in order to live, and live honorably, their main concern is the universal separated forms:

Spiritual acts render him nobler, and the intellectual acts render him divine and virtuous. The man of wisdom is therefore necessarily a man who is virtuous and divine. Of every kind of activity, he takes up the best only. He shares with every class of men the best states that characterize them. But he stands alone as the one who performs the most excellent and the noblest of actions. When he achieves the highest end—that is, when he apprehends simple substantial intelligences (‛uqul) that are mentioned in the [Aristotelian] Metaphysics, the book On the Soul, and On Sense and the Sensible—he then becomes one of these intelligences. It would be right to call him simply divine, and he will be free from the mortal sensible qualities, as well from the [particular] spiritual qualities. (IB-RS-AP: 61.11–18; IB-coll-fakhry: 77; IB-RS-berman: 131–132; IB-coll-genequand: 163–164, §164–165)

In his later treatise Conjunction of Intellect with Man, Avempace reformulated his theory. He addressed the treatise to his disciple Ibn al-Imam and complained about lack of time because of his numerous occupations. For this reason he chose a non technical way to describe how man first acquires the spiritual forms, then he apprehends the intelligibles, and by means of the latter he approaches the final intelligence, whose intelligible is itself. He calls it the natural way: each man has a material intellect which receives them and the intelligibles are relative to each material intellect (IB-CIM: 17; IB-coll-fakhry: 164; IB-coll-genequand: 193 §32).

He distinguished three stages, the first is that of the common people and their intelligibles are linked to the material objects; the second is that of the natural scientists or philosophers, and their intelligibles are linked to the spiritual forms. (IB-CIM: 18; IB-coll-fakhry: 167; IB-coll-genequand: 196 §41). The third is that of the blessed. Avempace knew Plato’s Republic and the allegory of the cavern, he recalls it in order to exemplify these stages:

The condition of the common people regarding the intelligibles is similar to the condition of the vision of people who are in a cave where the sun does not rise: they look, and they see all the colors in the shadow (IB-CIM:19; IB-coll-fakhry: 168; IB-coll-genequand: 198 §47).

Avempace does not talk about Ideas but intelligibles and he groups the prisoners in Plato’s allegory with the common people, while he distinguishes two categories among those who have gone out of the cavern: The theoreticians (naẓariyyin, philosophers) and the blessed (suʻada’). For Plato, those who have gone out of the cavern are the educated citizens who master the art of dialectic, but Avempace is not satisfied with an indirect approach to the last intelligence and wants to reach and acquire the absolute intelligibles, free of any relation to the material intellects and free of any spiritual form (particular or universal): it is the third and final stage that has no equivalence in Plato’s two categories of men.

We are informed that absolute intelligibles are the true existence and that they merge into the one last intelligence. Avempace never says that God is the last intelligence, which he compares with the sun and its light. The felicitous person who succeeds in reaching the highest step of knowledge becomes light himself (IB-CIM: 19; IB-coll-fakhry: 168; IB-coll-genequand: 198 §46). But, in this stage, he abandons any articulated scientific knowledge and dips into a wordless mystical experience.

By contrast, practical intelligibles play a minor role in spite of the import they have in ethics and politics. Avempace includes among them the ruling of the city or of the armies and considers them “intermediate forms”. They exist in the solitary only for the sake of one of the three spiritual forms, corporeal, particular spiritual and universal spiritual (IB-coll-fakhry: 91; IB-coll-genequand: 179 §210).

As we said above, Avempace presented his Rule of the Solitary (Tadbir al-mutawahhid) as a Regimen sanitatis in order to acquire and preserve spiritual health, which obviously equals to happiness (IB-RS-AP: 11; IB-coll-fakhry: 43; IB-RS-berman: 128). The companion he gave to Ibn al-Imam for his travel, the Epistle of Farewell, was intended to help him attain spiritual happiness. Avempace enumerates the different degrees of pleasure, the highest being science. Man suffers from ignorance and when he reaches the truth, pain goes away and pleasure seizes him. However, intellectual pleasure is also caused by the very fact of knowing.

But when we strive for knowledge, we do it not because of pleasure but pleasure is some profit (ribh) we gain as it follows the existence of the truth, because every pleasure is like the shadow of something else. (IB-CIM: 23. 5–7; IB-coll-fakhry: 123. 2–4; IB-coll-genequand: 98 §29)

Avempace enquires further on the issue of pleasure and knowledge, and we can abbreviate it by saying that the highest form of pleasure requires continuity and that continuous pleasure is attained not only by intellectual knowledge but also by knowledge of an eternal object. Metaphysical knowledge is man’s uppermost stage and source of highest pleasure. Averroes (d. 1198), however, would express doubts whether man’s uppermost stage is a natural perfection or divine gift for Avempace, an issue which Alexander Altmann researched (1965). Altmann concluded that Avempace defended the uppermost stage as a mystical experience, similar to that preached by the Sufis, and in any case we can agree that Avempace saw the uppermost stage as a divine gift.

Avempace concluded his enquiry moving out of the rational and leaving many loose ends. He was a busy man. When he finished his treatise On the Conjunction of Man with Intellect he apologized for not having been able to produce a demonstrative argument, burhan, on the issue and uttered his hope that the addressee of the epistle would be able to grasp its sense and meaning (IB-CIM: 22–23; IB-coll-fakhry: 172–173; IB-coll-genequand: 203 §60). Still, the outlines of his system are visible.

Inspired by the Porphyrian division of the five voices, knowledge starts with the opposition universal/individual, and develops into syllogistic and non-syllogistic sciences which can explain all aspects of reality. Reality consists of matter and forms, but form differentiates into a stairway of forms, according to their distance from matter. Forms are essences as well as active potencies, and any form is a mover. In addition, the ascension of spiritual forms inside man runs parallel to the ascension of forms in nature. They both unite in separate substances, pure intelligibles, and true beings, and at the summit, man merges into the Active Intellect. Avempace’s intention appears clear, but whether the conjunction is possible and how it occurs remains obscure.

Even if no metaphysical interpretation of Avempace’s thought would be accepted, his ethical doctrine would remain indisputable. Avempace was clearly concerned by man’s fragile nature and the ever-threatening presence of death (Alwuzad 1994) but he was convinced that man could master his destiny with the sole means of his intellectual capacity and resolve.


For more information about the sources for (Ibn Bâjja) Avempace’s biography, see the supplement on “Sources for Ibn Bâjja’s Biography.”

For more information on Aristotle’s on the Soul in the Arabic tradition see the supplement on “Aristotle’s On the Soul in the Arabic tradition. ”

For a complementing bibliography, see Rashaq 2016.

A. Primary Literature

1. Cited Works by Ibn Bâjja

  • [IB-coll-fakhry] Rasa’il Ibn Bâjja al-ilahiyya, Majid Fakhry (ed.), Beirut: Dar an-nahar li-n-nashr, 1968.
  • [IB-coll-alawi] Rasa’il falsafiyya li-Abi Bakr Ibn Bâjja, J. al-‛Alawi (ed.), Beirut-Casablanca: Dar ath-Thaqafa – Dar an-Nashr al-Maghribiyya, 1983.
  • [IB-coll-genequand] Ibn Bāğğa (Avempace): La conduite de l’isolé et deux autres épitres (Epître de l’adieu ; Conjonction de l’intellect). Introduction, édition critique du texte arabe, traduction et commentaire par Charles Genequand. Paris: Vrin, 2010.
  • [IB-coll-lettinck] Lettinck, Paul, Aristotle’s Physics and its reception in the Arabic world with an edition of the unpublished parts of Ibn Bâjja’s “Commentary on the Physics”, (Aristoteles Semitico-Latinus, 7), Leiden: Brill, 1994,
Rule of the Solitary
  • [IB-RS-dunlop] Dunlop, D.M., 1945, “Ibn Bâjjah’s Tadbiru’l-Mutawaḥḥid (Rule of the solitary)”, Journal of the Royal Asiatic Society, 77(1–2): 61–81. doi:10.1017/S0035869X00099305
  • [IB-RS-AP] Tadbir al-mutawahhid, Edited and Spanish translation by M. Asín Palacios, El régimen del solitario, Madrid-Granada: CSIC, 1946. Reprinted in Publications of the Institute for the History of Arabic and Islamic Science. Islamic Philosophy 77, Frankfurt am Main, 1999.
  • [IB-RS-berman] Tadbir al-mutawahhid, Partial English translation by Lawrence Berman as The Governance of the Solitary in Ralph Lerner and Muhsin Mahdi, Medieval Political Philosophy, A Source Book, Toronto: The Free Press of Glencoe, 1963, pp. 122–133.
  • [IB-RS-lomba] Avempace: El régimen del solitario (Tadbir al-mutawaḥḥid). Introducción, trad. y notas de J. Lomba. Madrid: Trotta, 1997.
  • [IB-RS-campanini] Tadbir al-mutawahhid, bilingual edition, Arabic and Italian, by Massimo Campanini, Il regime del solitario, Rome, 2002.
  • IB-coll-fakhry: 37–96
  • IB-coll-genequand: 121–182
Farewell Message
  • IB-coll-fakhry: 113–143
  • Asín Palacios, Miguel, 1943, “La Carta de adiós de Avempace”, Al-Andalus, 8: 1–87.
Epistle of Conjunction of Intellect with Man
  • [IB-CIM] Asín Palacios, Miguel, 1942, “Tratado de Avempace sobre la unión del intelecto con el hombre”, Al-Andalus, 7: 1–47.
  • [IB-CIM-lagardere] Lagardère, Vincent, 1981, « L’Épître d’Ibn Bâjja sur la conjunction de l’intellect avec l’esprit humain », Revue des Études Islamiques, 49: 175–196.
  • IB-coll-fakhry: 153–173.
  • IB-coll-genequand: 183–203
Coming-to-be and Passing-away
  • [IB-GC] Avempace. Libro de la generación y la corrupción, (Pensamiento islámico, 4), editor and Spanish translator, Josep Puig Montada, Madrid: Consejo Superior de Investigaciones Cientf̕icas, 1995.
Book of Animals
  • [IB-BA], Kitab al-hayawan, J. al-‛Imarati (ed.), Beirut-Casablanca: Al-markaz ath-thaqafi al-‛arabi, 2000.
  • [IB-S1a] Kitab an-nafs, Muhammad Saghir Hasan al-Ma‛sumi (ed.), Damascus: al-Majma‛ al-‛ilmi al-‛arabi, 1379/1960. First published in the journal of the Arabic Academy: Majallat Majma‛ al-Lugha al-‛Arabiyya, vols. 33 (1958) 96–111; 278–301; 424–442; 609–632. 34 (1959) 112–126; 332–344; 490–506; 634–645; 35 (1960) 114–122.
  • [IB-S1e] ‛Ilm al-nafs, English translation and notes, (Pakistan Historical Society, 26), Muhammad Saghir Hasan al-Ma‛sumi (ed.), Karachi: Pakistan Historical Society, 1961. Reprinted together with “Ibn Bâjja 1960” by F. Sezgin in Publications of the Institute for the History of Arabic and Islamic Science. Islamic Philosophy 75, Franfkurt am Main, 1999.
  • [IB-S-wirmer] Wirmer, David, “Deutsche Übersetzung des Kitāb an-nafs”, in Wirmer 2014: 657–727.
  • [IB-S-lomba] Kitab al-nafs. Libro sobre el alma. Spanish translation by Joaquín Lomba. Madrid: Trotta, 2007.
Physics commentary
  • [IB-SS-fakhry] Sharh as-sama‛ at-tabi‛i li-Aristutalis, Majid Fakhry (ed.), Beirut: Dar an-nahar, 1973.
  • IB-SS-ziyada] Shuruhat as-Sama῾at-tabi῾i, Ma‛an Ziyada (ed.), Beirut: Dar al-Kindi – Dar al-Fikr. New edition: Cairo: Ru’ya li-n-nashr wa-li-t-tawzi‛, 1978a.
  • IB-coll-lettinick: 676–769.
Meteorology commentary
  • Lettinck 1999: 383–481.
Annotations on other Logical Books of Alfarabi
  • Al-Mantiqiyyat li-l-Farabi, Muhammad Taqi Danishpazhuh (ed.), Vol. 3 (Qum, 1410/1989–90), 3 vols. Qum: Manshurat Maktabat Ayatollah al-‛Uthmà al-Mar‛ashi, 1989.
    • Fusul , pp. 3–15;
    • Isaghuji, pp. 16–39;
    • Gharaḍ Isaghuji, pp. 40–51;
    • Maqulat, pp. 52–127 and 128–149.
    • ‛Ibara, pp. 158–252.
    • Qiyas, pp. 255–266.
  • [IB-taaliq] Ta‛aliq Ibn Bâjja ‛alà mantiq al-Farabi, Majid Fakhry (ed.), Beirut: Dar al-Mashreq, 1994.
    • Isaguji, pp. 26–51.
    • Gharaḍ Abi Nasr fi Isaghuji , pp. 52–62.
    • Al-fusul al-khamsa, pp. 63–76.
    • Maqulat, pp. 77–135.
    • ‛Ibara , pp. 140–172.
    • Mulhaq, 1: pp. 173–174; 2: p. 175.
    • Qiyas, pp.180–194.
    • Irtiyad fi kitab at-tahlil , pp. 195–226.
  • Alwozad, Muhammad Ibrahim (ed.), 1988, “At-ta‛aliq al-mantiqiyya li-Bni Bajja”, Majallat Kulliyyat al-Adab bi-Fas, Numéro spécial, 3: 241–297.
  • –––, (ed.), 1997, At-Taaliq al-manṭiqiyyah, Tripolis, Libia ; Tunis, Ad-Dar al-‛Arabiyyah li-l-Kitab.
  • Alwozad, Muhammad Ibrahim; Rachak, Jamal, et.al. (eds.), 2006, Al-Irtiyad fi kitab at-tahlil, Fez, Centre d’études Ibn Rushd.
  • Asín Palacios, Miguel, 1940, “Avempace botánico”, Al-Andalus, 5: 255–299.

2. Other Works by Ibn Bâjja: in Books

  • –––, 1976, Ta‛liqat fi Kitab Bari Arminiyas wa min Kitab al-‛Ibara li-Abi Nasr al-Farabi, Muhammad Salim Salim (ed.), Cairo: al-Hay’a al-Misriyya al-‛Amma li-l-Kitab.
  • –––, 1978b, Kitab tadbir al-mutawahhid, Ma‛an Ziyada (ed.), Beirut: Dar al-Fikr al-Islami – Dar al-Fikr.
  • –––, 1987, Ta‛aliq Ibn Bâjja ‛alà l-burhan, in Al-Mantiq ‛ind al-Farabi, Majid Fakhry (ed.), Beirut: Dar al-Mashreq.
  • –––, 1999a, Sharh al-Athar al-῾Ulwiyya li-Bn Bâjja, Muhammad Musa῾id (ed.), Fez. Dafatir majmu῾at al-bahth fi l-falsafa al-islamiyya 5, pp. 9–85.
  • –––, 1999b, Kitab an-Nafs, Jamal Rashaq (ed.), Fez. Dafatir majmu῾at al-bahth fi l-falsafa al-islamiyya 5, pp. 86–211.
  • –––, 2006a, Risalat al-widaʿ. Carta del adiós y otros tratados filosóficos, Spanish translation by Joaquín Lomba. Madrid: Trotta.
  • –––, 2006b, Irtiyaḍ fi Kitab at-Tahlil, Muhammad Alwuzad, ῾Abd al-῾Aziz Lam῾ul, Muhammad Musa῾id, Jamal Rashaq (eds.), Dafatir majmu῾at al-bahth fi l-falsafa al-islamiyya 5.
  • –––, 2009, Kalam fì l-qiyas, Muhammad Musa῾id, Muhammad Abu Hafs, Jamal Rashaq. Fez (eds), Dafatir majmu῾at al-bahth fi l-falsafa al-islamiyya 6.
  • –––, 2021, Commentary on Aristotle’s On generation and corruption. Critical edition and translation with an introduction and glossaries by Corrado la Martire, Berlin : De Gruyter.

3. Other Works by Ibn Bâjja: in Articles or Chapters

  • Ahwani, Ahmad Fu’ad, 1951, “Risalat al-ittisal li-Abi Bakr ibn as-Sa’igh”, in Talkhis kitab an-nafs li-Abi l-Walid Ibn Rushd wa-arba‛ rasa’il, Cairo: Maktabat an-Nahḍa al-Misriyya, pp. 102–118.
  • Druart, Thérèse-Anne, 1980, “Le traité d’Avempace sur « Les choses au moyen desquelles on peut connaître l’intellect agent »” Bulletin de Philosophie Médiévale, 22: 73–77. doi:10.1484/J.BPM.3.258
  • –––, 1981, “La fin humaine selon Ibn Bājjah (Avempace)”, Bulletin de Philosophie Médiévale, 23: 59–64. doi:10.1484/J.BPM.3.271
  • Dunlop, D.M., 1984, “Remarks on a text of Avempace”, in Studi in onore di Francesco Gabrieli, vol. 1, Roma: La sapienza, pp. 291–300.
  • Fakhry, Majid, 1970, “Ta‛aliq ‛alà kitab Isaguji li-l- Farabi”, Abhath, 23: 52.
  • –––, 1971, “Ta‛aliq ‛alà kitab al-Maqulat li-l- Farabi”, Abhath, 24: 37–53.
  • –––, 1978–79, “Ta‛aliq ‛alà kitab al-Burhan li-l- Farabi”, Abhath, 27: 23–42.
  • –––, 1986, “Ta‛aliq ‛alà kitab al-Qiyas wa-l-Tahlil li-l- Farabi”, Abhath, 34: 3–49.
  • Lomba Fuentes, Joaquín, 1994, “Ibn Baŷŷa (Avempace) sobre el fin del hombre”, Sharq al-Andalus, 10–11: 467–482.
  • –––, 1995, “Sobre la felicidad política y la felicidad de la otra (vida) o defensa de Abu Naṣr (Al-Farabi)”, Revista del Instituto Egipcio de Estudios Islámicos en Madrid, 27: 23–39.
  • –––, 1996, “Tratado sobre el Entendimiento Agente de Avempace”, Anales del Seminario de Historia de la Filosofía, 13: 265–274.
  • –––, 2000, “Avempace. Tratado de la unión del intelecto con el hombre”, Anaquel de Estudios Árabes, 11: 369–391.
  • Rachak , Jamal, 2021, “Statut et rôle de la logique chez Ibn Bājja (d. 1139). (Publication d’un texte ignoré),” Rivages, 6: 157–88 [edition of Fī funūn shatá].
  • Tornero, Emilio, 1983, “Dos epístolas de Avempace: Sobre el móvil y sobre la facultad impulsiva”, Al-Qanṭara: Revista de Estudios Árabes, 4: 5–21.

4. Primary Literature By Others

  • Damascenus, Nicolaus (fl. late 1st century BCE), 1989, De plantis: Five translations, (Aristoteles Semitico-latinus), H.J. Drossaart Lulofs and E.L.J. Poortman (eds.), Amsterdam: North-Holland.
  • Dhahabi, Muhammad ibn Ahmad (1274–1348), 1995, Tarikh al-Islam wa-wafayat al-mashahir wa-l-a‛lam, vol. 36, years 521–540 AH, Beirut: Dar al-Kitab al-‛Arabi.
  • Farabi, Abu Nasr al-, [ca. 950] 1938, Risalat fi’l-‛Aql, Maurice Bouyges (ed.), Beirut: Impr. Catholique.
  • –––, 1952, Ihsa’ al-‛ulum, bilingual edition by A. González Palencia, Clasificación de las ciencias, Madrid-Granada.
  • –––, 1985–1987, Al-mantiq ‘ind al-Farabi, Majid Fakhry; Rafiq al-‛Ajam (eds.), 4 vols. Beirut: Dar al-Machreq.
  • –––, 2003, Sharh sadr al-maqala al-ulà wa-sadr al-maqala al-khamisa min Kitab al-Usul li-Uqlidis, Muhammad Qushayqish (ed.), Fez. Dafatir majmu῾at al-bahth fi l-falsafa al-islamiyya, 4.
  • –––, 1985, On the perfect state (Mabadi’ ara’ ahl al-madinat al-fadila); revised text with introduction, translation, and commentary by Richard Walzer, Oxford: Oxford Univesity Press; Reprint Chicago: Kazi Books, 1998.
  • Ibn Abi ‛Usaybi‛a (d. 1269/70), 1886, Kitab ‛uyun al-anba’ fi tabaqat al-atibba’, Augustus Müller (ed.), 2 vols. Cairo-Königsberg.
  • –––, 2001, Kitab ‛uyun al-anba’ fi tabaqat al-atibba’, ‛Amir an-Najjar (ed.), 5 vols. Cairo: al-Hay’ah al-Misriyyah al-‛Ammah li-l-Kitab.
  • Ibn al-Jawzi, Sibt (d. 1257), 1952, Mir’at az-zaman fi ta’rikh al-a‛yan , vol. 8.2, (Haydarabad: M. ‛Uthmaniyya), pp. 172–173
  • Ibn al-Khatib, Lisan ad-Din (d. 1374), 1958, Al-ihata fi akhbar Gharnata, ‛Abd Allah ‛Inan (ed.), Cairo: Dar al-Ma‛arif.
  • Ibn an-Nadim (d. 995/998), 987 [1871], Kitab al-fihrist , G. Flügel (ed.), Leipzig: Vogel, 1871–1872, 2 vols. Reprint Beirut: Khayyat, 1964.
  • Ibn al-Qifti (d. 1248), 1903, Ta’rikh al-hukama’, Julius Lippert (ed.), Leipzig: Dieterische VB.
  • –––, 2005. Kitab Ikhbar al-‛Ulama’ bi Akhbar al-Ḥukama, ed. Ibrahim Shams ad-Din, Beirut: Dar al-Kutub alIlmiyya (same text, no apparatus).
  • Ibn Khallikan, Ahmad (1211–1282), 1998, Wafayat al-a‛yan wa-anba’ abna’ az-zaman, Yusuf ‛Ali Tawil - Maryam Qasim Tawil (ed.), vol. 4, Beirut.
  • Ibn Khaqan, Abu Nasr al-Fath (d. 1134?), 1966, Qala’id al-‛iqyan, Sulayman Hara’iri (ed.), Paris, 1277/1860; R Tunis: Al-maktaba al-‛atiqa.
  • Isfahani, ‛Imad ad-Din Katib al- (1125–1201), 1971, Kharidat al-qasr wa-jaridat al-‛asr; qism shu‛ara’ al-Maghreb, Tunis: Dar at-tunisiyya li-n-nashr. 1971), entry nº 94, pp. 332–334.
  • Maqqari, Ahmad al- (d. 1631), [Maqqari-N], Nafh at-tib min ghusn al-Andalus ar-ratib, Ihsan ‛Abbas (ed.), 8 vols, Beirut: Dar Sadir, 1968.
  • Maqrizi, Taqi ad-Din Ahmad al- (d. 1442), 1913, Kitab al-mawa‛iẓ wa-l-i‛tibar fi dhikr al-khitat wa-l- athar, tome 2, 1. pt., Gaston Viet (ed.), Mémoires des membres de l’I.F.A.O. vol. 33, Cairo: I.F.A.O.
  • Sa‛id Ibn Sa‛id (d. 1070), [1991], Tabaqat al-umam, English translation by Sema`an I. Salem and Alok Kumar, Science in the Medieval World: “Book of the Categories of Nations”, Austin, TX: University of Texas Press, Austin.
  • –––, 1998, Tabaqat al-umam, Husayn Mu’nis (ed.), Cairo: Dar al-Ma‛arif.

B. Secondary Literature

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  • ‛Alawi, Jamal ad-Din al-, 1983, Mu’allafat Ibn Bâjja, Beirut-Casablanca: Dar ath-Thaqafa & Dar an-Nashr al-Maghribiyya.
  • Allard, Michel, 1974, “Ibn Bağğa et la politique”, Orientalia Hispanica, vol. 1, J.M. Barral (ed.), Leiden: Brill, pp. 11–19.
  • Alwuzad, Muhammad, 1994, Al-qawl al-insani li-Bni-Bâjja, Casablanca. Al-falsafa fi-l-Maghrib 1.
  • Asín Palacios, Miguel, 1900, “El filósofo zaragozano Avempace”, Revista de Aragón, 1 (1900) 193–197; 234–238; 278–281; 338–340; 2 (1901) 301–303, 348–350.
  • Altmann, Alexander, 1965, “Ibn Bâjja on Man’s Ultimate Felicity”, in Harry Austryn Wolfson Jubilee Volume on the Occasion of his Seventy-fifth Birthday. English Section, Jerusalem: American Academy for Jewish Research, vol. 1: 65–70.
  • Badawi, ‛Abd al-Rahman (ed.), 1947, Aristu ‛ind al-‛Arab: dirasah wa-nususs ghayr manshurah, Cairo: Maktabat an-Nahda al-Misriyya.
  • ––– (ed.), 1954, Aristutalis fi-n-nafs, Cairo: Maktabat an-Nahda al-Misriyya.
  • Bellver, José, 2020, “The Beginnings of Rational Theology in al-Andalus: Ibn Masarra and his Refutation of al-Kindī’s On First Philosophy”, Al-Qantara, 41: 323–371.
  • Blaustein, Michael, 1986, “Aspects of Ibn Bâjja’s theory of apprehension”, in Maimonides and philosophy: papers presented at the Sixth Jerusalem Philosophical Encounter, May 1985. S. Pines & Y. Yovel (eds.), (Archives Internationales d’Histoire des Idées / International Archives for the History of Ideas, 114), Dordrecht: Nijhoff, pp. 202–212. doi:10.1007/978-94-009-4486-2_14
  • Bos, Gerrit, 1994, Aristotle’s “De anima” translated into Hebrew by Zerahyah ben Isaac ben Shealtiel Hen; a critical edition with an introduction and index by G. Bos, (Aristoteles Semitico-Latinus, 6), Leiden; New York: E.J. Brill.
  • Bousklaoui, Said El, 2020, “Free Will in Ibn Bājjah’s Physics”, in: Homo – Natura – Mundus: Human Beings and Their Relationships. Proceedings of the XIV International Congress of the Société Internationale pour l’Étude de la Philosophie Médiévale, July 24–28, 2017, Porto Alegre, Brazil, eds. Roberto Hofmeister Pich; Alfredo Carlos Storck; Alfredo Santiago Culleton (SIEPM, Rencontres de Philosophie Médiévale 22). Turnhout: Brepols, pp. 283–294.
  • Codera, Francisco, 1899, Decadencia y desaparición de los Almorávides en España, (Colección de Estudios Árabes), Zaragoza: Tip. de Comas Hermanos. Reprint Pamplona: Urgoiti editores, 2004. [Codera 1899 available online]
  • –––, 1903, “Familia real de los Benitexufín”, Revista de Aragón, 3: 418–419.
  • Cortés García, Manuela, 1996, “Sobre la música y sus efectos terapéuticos en la Epístola sobre las melodías de Ibn Baŷŷa”, Revista de Musicología, 19(1–2): 11–23. doi:10.2307/20797089
  • Crawford, F. Stuart (ed.), 1953, Averrois Cordubensis: Commentarum Magnum in Aristoelis de Anima Libros, (Corpus Commentariorum Averrois in Aristotelem), The Mediaeval Academy of America, no. 59. Reprint Tunis, 1998. [Crawford 1953 available online]
  • Danishpazhuh, Muhammad T., 1989, Al-Mantiqiyyat li-l-Farabi(check transliteration), volume on Ibn Bâjja, Qum: Maktabat al-Mar’ashî al-Najafî, 3 volumes.
  • Davidson, Herbert A, 1992, Alfarabi, Avicenna, and Averroes on Intellect: Their Cosmologies, Theories of the Active Intellect, and Theories of Human Intellect, New York; Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Djebbar, Ahmed, 1992, “Las matemáticas en al-Andalus a través de las actividades de tres sabios del siglo XI”, in J. Vernet (ed.), El legado científico andalusí: Museo Arqueológico Nacional, Madrid, abril-junio 1992, Madrid, pp. 23–35.
  • Dunlop, D.M., 1952, “The Diwan attributed to Ibn Bājjah (Avempace)”, Bulletin of the School of Oriental and African Studies, 14(3): 463–477. doi:10.1017/S0041977X00088443
  • –––, 1955a, “Al-Farabi’s Introductory Sections on Logic”, The Islamic Quarterly, 2(4): 264–282.
  • –––, 1955b, “Philosophical predecessors and contemporaries of Ibn Bajja”, The Islamic Quarterly, 2: 100–116.
  • –––, 1956, “Al-Farabi’s Eisagoge”, The Islamic Quarterly, 3: 117–138.
  • –––, 1957a, “Al-Farabi’s Introductory Risalah on Logic”, The Islamic Quarterly, 3: 224–235.
  • –––, 1957b, “Remarks on the Life and Works of Ibn Bajjah (Avempace)” in Proceedings of the 22nd Congress of Orientalists, Istanbul 1951, Leiden, pp. 188–196.
  • Elamrani-Jamal, Abdelali, 2003, « De Anima. Tradition arabe », in R. Goulet (ed.), Dictionnaire des philosophes antiques, Supplément, Paris: CNRS, 346–358.
  • Esots, Janis,2021, “The Typology of Excellent and Non-Excellent Cities according to al-Fārābī and Ibn Bājja,” Rivages, 6: 9–37.
  • Forcada, Miquel, 1999. “De Avempace a Averroes. La transmisión de las ciencias de los antiguos de la época taifa a la época Almohade”, in M.I. Fierro & M.L. Avila (eds.) Biografías Almohades 1 (Madrid. CSIC), pp. 407–423.
  • –––, 2011, “Ibn Bājja on Medicine and Medical Experience”, Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 21(1): 111–148. doi:10.1017/S0957423910000147
  • Franco, Abel B. 2003. “Avempace, Projectile Motion and Impetus Theory”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 64(4): 521–546. doi:10.2307/3654219
  • Frank, Richard. 1958–59, “Some Fragments of Ishaq’s Translation of De anima”, Cahiers de Byrsa, 8: 231–251.
  • Gätje, Helmut, 1971, Studien zur Überlieferung der aristotelischen Psychologie im Islam, (Annales Universitatis Saraviensis. Phil. Fak. nº 11), Heidelberg: C Winter.
  • Genequand, Charles, 2008, “Loi morale, loi politique: al-Farabi et Ibn Bağğa”, Mélanges de l’Université Saint-Joseph, 61: 491–514.
  • Elias Giannakis, 1992, Philoponus in the Arabic tradition of Aristotle’s Physics, PhD thesis, University of Oxford.
  • Harvey, Stephen, 1992, “The Place of the Philosopher in the City according to Ibn Bâjja”, in C.E. Butterworth (ed.), The Political Aspects of Islamic Philosophy. Essays in Honor of M. S. Mahdi, (Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University), pp. 199–233.
  • Ivry, Alfred L, 2001, “The Arabic Text of Aristotle’s De anima and its Translator”, Oriens 36: 59–77. doi:10.1163/1877837201X00051
  • Kochin, Michael S., 1999, “Weeds: cultivating the imagination in medieval Arabic political philosophy”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 60(3): 399–416. doi:10.2307/3654010
  • Kruk, Remke, 1997, “Ibn Bâjja’s commentary on Aristotle’s De animalibus”, in The Ancient Tradition in Christian and Islamic Hellenism, G. Endress & R. Kruk (eds.), Leiden: Research School CNWS, pp. 165–179.
  • Lagardère, Vincent, 1989. Les almoravides, Paris: L’Haramattan.
  • –––, 1998, Les Almoravides. Le djihâd andalou (1106–1143), Paris; Montréal: L’Harmattan.
  • Lettinck, Paul, 1999, Aristotle’s “Meteorology” and its reception in the Arab world, with an edition and translation of Ibn Suwar’s “Treatise on meteorological phenomena” and of Ibn Bâjja’s “Commentary on the Meteorology”, (Aristoteles Semitico-Latinus, 10), Leiden: Brill.
  • Lomba Fuentes, Joaquín & J.M. Puerta Vílchez, 2009, “Ibn Baŷŷa, Abū Bakr”, in Jorge Lirola & J.M. Puerta Vílchez (eds.) Biblioteca de al-Andalus (Almería), vol. 2, pp. 624–661.
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  • –––, 1994, “Le kitab al-Taḥlil d’Alfarabi”, Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 4: 317–335.
  • Ma‛sumi, M. Ṣaghir Ḥasan al-, 1960, “Ibn al-Imam, the disciple of Ibn Bajjah”, Islamic Quarterly, 5: 102–108.
  • Maier, Anneliese, 1958, Studien zur Naturphilosophie der Spätscholastik, 5 vols. Rome, 1943–1958, specially, vol. 5.
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  • –––, 1964, “La Dynamique d’Ibn Bâjja”, in Mélanges Alexandre Koyré, Vol. II, Paris, pp. 442–468. Reprinted in Pines 1986: 450–474.
  • –––, 1986, The Collected Works of Shlomo Pines, vol. 2, Studies in Arabic Versions of Greek Texts and in Mediaeval Science, Leiden-Jerusalem: Magnes Press, Hebrew University.
  • –––, 1981: “Les limites de la métaphysique selon al-Farabi, Ibn Bâjjah et Maimonide. Sources et antithèses de ces doctrines chez Alexandre d’Aphrodise et chez Thémistius”, in J.P. Beckmann et.al. (eds.), Sprache und Erkenntnis im Mittelalter, vol. 1, (Berlin: de Gruyter), pp. 211–225. Reprinted in The Collected Works of Shlomo Pines, vol. 5, W.Z. Harvey & M. Idel (eds.), Studies in the History of Jewish Thought, (Jerusalem: Magnes Press, 1997), pp. 432–446.
  • Puig Montada, Josep, 2003, “Avempace’s Isāghūğī” in Miklós Maróth (ed.), Problems in Arabic Philosophy, (Acta et studia 2), Pilisczaba: The Avicenna Institute of Middle Eastern Studies, pp. 51–67.
  • –––, 2021, “De l’usage du terme ‘puissance’ chez Ibn Bâjja (Avempace)”, Rivages (Marrakech) 6: 39–51.
  • Rashaq, Jamal, 2016, Ibn Bâjja faylasuf Saraqusta wa-Fas (533/1139): Sira wa-a‛mal, Marrakech: al-Matba‛a wa-l-Warraqa al-Wataniyya.
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  • Samsó, Julio, 1993–1994, “Sobre Ibn Bāŷŷa y la astronomía”, Sharq al-Andalus, 10–11: 669–681. doi:10.14198/ShAnd.1993-1994.10-11.39
  • Steinschneider, Moritz, 1893, Die hebräischen Übersetzungen des Mittelalters und die Juden als Dometscher, Berlin 1893; Reprint Graz: Akademische Druck- und Verlagsanstalt, 1956.
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