Notes to Ibn Sina’s Logic

1. The two should not be understood exclusively in chronological terms: a scant number of logicians writing after Avicenna, like Averroes (1126-1198 CE) or Avempace (d. 1139 CE), are committed to a pre-Avicennan and programmatically Aristotelian orthodoxy.

2. The tripartite proposition enables Avicenna, among other things, to express clearly the distinction between nominal negation and negation of the copula.

3. The term ḏātī may refer to the essence of the subject (as long as it exists), to the substance of the subject (as long as it exists) or, on a more deflationary reading, simply to the subject itself (as long as it exists). In the literature, various translations can be found corresponding to these readings. The interpretation turns on what constraints should be put on the kinds of terms that may count as subjects of a ḏātī proposition. In particular, the question is whether a ḏātī proposition may take an arbitrary term as its subject (in which case it would be just a “referential” proposition, i.e. one that merely fixes the referent, whatever the latter may be) or whether it requires a substance term or an essence term.

4. Relevant sources for this discussion are the chapter on the division of propositions (aqsām al-qaḍāyā) in Rāzī’s Mulaḫḫaṣ, 160–170, and Ṭūsī’s Asās al-iqtibās fī l-manṭiq, III.2, chapters 1–7, 148–270.

5. It has recently been suggested that the part of Avicenna’s logic which deals with muttaṣil propositions is not primarily about conditionals in the usual sense but rather about quantified conjunctions (Hasnawi & Hodges 2016: 63 and 65). In favor of this interpretation are various passages (especially in reductio arguments showing the validity of certain inferential relations of the sort discussed in Qiyās VII.1) where Avicenna does seem to speak of i- and o-conditionals in terms of the conjunction (iğtimāʿ) of antecedent and consequent. By contrast, in favor of a reading of muttaṣil propositions as conditionals are the following facts: (i) Avicenna seems unfailingly committed to the view that antecedent and consequent of muttaṣil propositions are not on a par, as muttaṣil statements express relations of dependency, not just co-instantiation at all or at some times (Qiyās V.1); (ii) when Avicenna discusses i- and o-muttaṣil propositions outside the context of reductio proofs, he seems to treat them as genuine conditionals, for example by specifying that “Sometimes if p then q” means not just that sometimes p and q are the case together, but rather that in some cases, under the assumption that p is the case, q is the case too (Qiyās V.4, 275–278); last, (iii) if i-conditionals were conjunctive statements that require the joint truth of antecedent and consequent at some time, this would be incompatible with two other views Avicenna is committed to. The first view is that there are true muttaṣil a-propositions in the luzūmī sense involving impossible antecedents and impossible consequents (e.g., Qiyās V.4, 273: “Always, if this is a pair which is not divided into two equals, then this is odd”); the second view is that from a muttaṣil a-conditional, the corresponding muttaṣil i-conditional always follows (Qiyās V.4, 276).

6. This consideration raises an intriguing question about the relationship between Avicenna’s logic and problems usually associated with the presence or absence of monotonicity. This lies far beyond the scope of this entry, but it seems to be a question that would deserve further attention.

7. Another useful reference is Qiyās V.4 272.15–273.4

We say that the hypothetical [conditional] universal proposition is universal only when the consequent follows the antecedent under any circumstances (kull waḍʿ li-l-muqaddam) not only with regard to what is [explicitly] intended (fī l-murād fa-qaṭ), but [also] with regard to the [other] states. And which states are these? The states that are necessarily implied by the assumption of the antecedent or [the states] that may be assumed [as antecedents] for it, [as well as those that may] follow it or be together with it, whether (i) because they are predicates of the subject of the antecedent, if [the antecedent] is categorical or (ii) because they are connected to the antecedent as other premises, if [the antecedent] is not categorical—I mean the premises that may be true when [the antecedent] is true, and which do not give rise to an impossibility together with [the antecedent], even if [the antecedent] is impossible in itself—, or (iii) because they are conceded as [additional premises] that make [the antecedent] necessary or possible, even if it is impossible in itself. In all these cases, the antecedent may not only be true (ḥaqq) but it may also be a false (bāṭil) [proposition] assumed by way of positing. For even in this case it will have things that follow necessarily (lawāzim) [from it] and things that occur to it accidentally.

Cf. also Qiyās VII.2, 379.6–7 with a reference to a “time and state” (al-waqt wa-l-ḥāl) and Qiyās VII.2, 383.9 for a reference to a “time and condition” (waqt wa-šarṭ).

8. At least in the case of true conditionals with a true antecedent and a true consequent (the case may be less straightforward for true conditionals with false, and especially impossible, antecedents and consequents), Avicenna says on several occasions that if a conditional is true in the luzūmī sense, it is also true in the ittifāqī sense (e.g., Qiyās V.1, 237). This seems compatible with the view that if the consequent is necessarily implied by the antecedent, then it is also true together with the antecedent when the latter is true, but would be problematic if the two conditionals were to express two radically different ways of following, one necessary, the other accidental in the sense of a chance-connection (which is the translation preferred by Shehaby for ittifāqī and its cognates). Furthermore, Avicenna also points out that what we call ittifāqī connections may conceal a stronger, hidden connection that we may simply be unaware of (Qiyās V.1). On the compatibility of a luzūmī with the corresponding ittifāqī, see at least Qiyās V.1, 237.13–16, V.2, 251.7–9, and V.5, 291.1–292.16.

9. The analysis of disjunctive syllogism in post-Avicennan logic in (El-Rouayheb 2010) further indicates that the rejection of the principle that anything follows from an impossible antecedent may be inspired by an relevantist intuition, at least in spirit.

10. For (a-\(\mathbb{C}\))aa is equivalent to (e-\(\mathbb{C}\))ao, and (e-\(\mathbb{C}\))ao entails (o-\(\mathbb{C}\))ao, which is in turn the contradictory of (a-\(\mathbb{C}\))ao.

11. Earlier in the same chapter, Avicenna proves that “Never, if every A is B, then every C is D” implies “Always, if every A is B, then not every C is D” both as an ittifāqī and as a luzūmī. The first proof—at Qiyās, VII.1, 366.14–367.6—shows this for ittifāqī conditionals; the second proof—at Qiyās, VII.1, 367.6–10—gives the version for the luzūmī.

12. The only way I find to make sense of what Avicenna says about (ii) is not to take him literally elsewhere (Qiyās V.2): the inferences he presents all seem to involve inclusive disjunctions.

13. Even Avicenna’s innovative treatment of hypothetical syllogisms may be seen as a way to fill in a gap in the Prior Analytics, located as it is right between Qiyās IV (where the treatment of categorical syllogisms ends, in line with Prior Analytics A22) and Qiyās IX.1–2, which resumes the thread of Prior Analytics A24. In other words, the whole treatment of the hypothetical and of the repetitive syllogistic is inserted at a juncture where Aristotle, in Prior Analytics A23, introduces the notion of syllogisms from an assumption (ex hypothesi, which the Arabic translation of the Prior Analytics renders as šarṭiyyāt). This division of the text may usefully be seen in connection with Avicenna’s reference to a missing treatise (Street 2004).

14. A novelty that becomes mainstream, in the Arabic tradition, with Ḫūnağī (El-Rouayheb 2010).

15. I depart from Avicenna’s usage in (i) adopting these labels and (ii) always stating the major premise first (Avicenna designates moods in each figure by ordinals and almost without exception states the minor premise first).

16. For a canonical list in later Arabic logic, the most accessible and straightforward outline is perhaps Kātibī’s. The two lists line up as follows: two conditional premises (A1 = K1); two disjunctive premises (A2 = K5); a conditional and a disjunctive premise (A3 = K2); a conditional and a categorical (A4 = K3); a disjunctive and a categorical premise (A5 = K4) (Kātibī, Šamsiyya 3.3).

17. “Always, if A is B, then C is D; Always, if C is D, then H is Z ⊢ Always, if A is B, then H is Z”. I abbreviate indefinite (non-quantified) sentences like “A is B”, “C is D” with the letters p, q, r. In this section, Avicenna’s examples never involve quantified antecedents and consequents, but this is of no theoretical significance with regard to the productivity of the moods. Avicenna contends explicitly that each component proposition may be one of the canonical eight types mentioned above.

18. In this case, Avicenna is exclusively interested in what he calls the sharing of a “complete part,” i.e., of a whole proposition, not just of a term. We shall see below that he also entertains the possibility of two hypothetical propositions sharing an incomplete part, i.e., a term. Note that this case is different from the two cases in which a hypothetical is paired with a categorical, because then the shared element will necessarily be a term. The notion of a shared incomplete part applies therefore only to the case in which two premises may share a whole proposition, but in fact only happen to share a term.

19. For instance, when the minor premise is a conditional, moods in which the disjunction is not real and the conditional not an implication are not productive.

20. The only case in which a conditional is equivalent to the disjunction of the negation of its antecedent and its consequent is when the disjunction is inclusive, that is to say when it expresses the third kind of incompatibility or conflict (ʿinād) (between the negations of the two disjuncts).

21. Because (e-\(\mathbb{C}\))p-CoD is equivalent to (a-\(\mathbb{C}\))p-CaD, and (e-\(\mathbb{C}\))p-AoC is equivalent to (a-\(\mathbb{C}\))p-AaC.

22. Avicenna’s omission of particular negatives may simply be a slip. There is no reason—logical or stylistic—to justify their absence, in light of the symmetry of all the other cases in the three figures.

23. In his commentary on the corresponding passage in the Išārāt, Ṭūsī notes that “other connections are remote from nature,” (Ḥall muškilāt al-Išārāt, on Path 8.1, in Avicenna Išārāt-Ṭūsī: 493) in line with a number of remarks we find in Avicenna, who frequently omits large portions of this analysis in the shorter treatises.

24. A further distinction is based on whether the parts of the disjunctive are affirmative or negative.

25. “Nor is the Book of the Syllogism written in accordance with [its] usefulness for the sciences [only], but with respect to what is common to demonstration and dialectic and so on” (Qiyās IV.1, 188.1–2).

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Riccardo Strobino <>

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