Ibn Sina’s Logic

First published Wed Aug 15, 2018

Ibn Sīnā [hereafter: Avicenna] (980–1037 CE) is—directly or indirectly—the most influential logician in the Arabic tradition. His work is central in the re-definition of a family of problems and doctrines inherited from ancient and late ancient logic, especially Aristotle and the Peripatetic tradition. While, in general terms, Avicenna squarely falls into a logical tradition that it is reasonable to characterize as Aristotelian, the trove of innovations he introduces establishes him as a genuinely new canonical figure. Every later logician in this tradition confronts him, either as a critic or as a follower, to the extent that, with few exceptions, Aristotle and the Peripatetic tradition almost entirely disappear from the scene. Arabic logic accordingly divides into two areas and periods: pre-Avicennan and post-Avicennan (Street 2004).[1]

The innovations introduced by Avicenna include systematic as well as technical points: from the division of logic into its main areas to the reading of propositions and the understanding of modality; from a new account of hypothetical propositions to his theory of demonstration.

This entry aims to offer an account of some of the most representative features of Avicenna’s logic without any pretense to exhaustiveness. A standard classification of the works and contents of the Aristotelian Organon in the Arabic tradition (which includes Porphyry’s Isagoge, alongside Aristotle’s Rhetoric and Poetics) divides the study of logic broadly into two main areas focusing either on (i) formal aspects (e.g., the analysis of the truth conditions of propositions, inference, and the structure of arguments) or (ii) on material aspects (e.g., the classification of arguments with respect to their terms and premises, which underwrites a standard division of logic into five areas: demonstration, dialectic, sophistic, rhetoric, and poetics). The entry focuses primarily on (i) and limits the treatment of (ii) to the case of demonstration and fallacies.

1. Avicenna’s Logical Works and His Sources

Avicenna’s logical works consist of a significant amount of material unevenly distributed across his various philosophical summae. The most comprehensive treatment of logic is, by far, the one to be found in the monumental treatment of the Šifāʾ (The Cure), from the 1020s, where Avicenna extensively engages in systematic analysis as well as interpretive debate with the Peripatetic tradition. At the opposite end of the spectrum is the Išārāt wa-tanbīhāt (Pointers and Reminders), the shortest and likely the latest (from the 1030s), where Avicenna organizes the material in an original way that came to shape the approach to logic in the Post-Avicennan tradition. In between (not chronologically, as the work largely reflects Avicenna’s early views from around 1014) lies the account of logic developed in the Nağāt (The Salvation). While offering a much abridged treatment (and leaving out dialectic, rhetoric, and poetics altogether), the latter is methodologically closer to the Cure than it is to Pointers and Reminders but far less ponderous, and offers a good point of access to Avicenna’s logic as a whole.

In light of their relative position in the corpus, the balance of detail and perspicuity, and—in the case of the Cure and Pointers—the relative influence they exerted on the later tradition, I have chosen in this entry to focus almost exclusively on these three sources, which also happen to be the ones that are in better shape in terms of available editions.

Other treatments of logic include the account found in the Dānešnāme-ye ʿAlāʾī (Philosophy for ʿAlāʾ ad-Dawla), in Persian, or the one preserved by the partially extant al-Mašriqiyyūn (The Easterners), which reflects an approach no longer committed to the terminology and exegetical problems of the Aristotelian tradition, written as it is in opposition to the methods and doctrines of (Western) Baġdadi Aristotelians (Street 2004).

Finally, interesting insights on certain areas of logic may also be gleaned from additional heterogeneous sources, such as Avicenna’s correspondence (Street 2010a) and texts not directly dealing with logic, most notably the Ilāhiyyāt (especially books I and V), which is his major work in metaphysics.

Avicenna’s logic is indebted first and foremost to Aristotle—the First Teacher (al-muʿallim al-awwal)—and the works of the Organon: the Categories (Maqūlāt), On Interpretation (ʿIbāra), the Prior Analytics (Anūlūṭīqā ūlā or Qiyās), the Posterior Analytics (Anūlūṭīqā ṯāniya or Burhān), the Topics (Ṭūbīqā or Ğadal), and the Sophistical Refutations (Sūfisṭīqā or Muġālaṭa). As noted above, the Arabic Organon included Porphyry’s Isagoge (Īsāġūğī or Madḫal) as well as Aristotle’s Rhetoric (Ḫiṭāba) and Poetics (Šiʿr).

Besides Aristotle, among the figures we encounter in Avicenna’s logical writings—whether identifiable by name, definite description, or doctrine—are Plato, Theophrastus, Alexander of Aphrodisias, Galen, Porphyry, Themistius, and Philoponus from the Greek tradition; al-Fārābī and other Baġdādī Aristotelians from the Arabic tradition (all variously involved in exegetical efforts focusing on the books of the Organon, traces of which survive in the glosses to the famous manuscript Paris BNF, Arabe 2346 that preserves its Arabic translation). Their presence varies from the explicit ascription of alternative interpretations (e.g., in the case of the interpretation of the absolute proposition) to the rejection of competing accounts (the contrast between “the widespread view” (al-mašhūr) and “the truth” (al-ḥaqq) is a standard device of Avicenna’s style of argument); from the tacit adoption of systematic distinctions and concepts (especially with regard to al-Fārābī, who is rarely acknowledged) to minute exegetical points.

In the following, I refer to Avicenna’s works by title, book, chapter, page, and line numbers from the Cairo edition for all works that are part of the Šifāʾ; from Forget’s edition of the Išārāt wa-tanbīhāt, and from Dānešpažūh’s edition of the Nağāt.

2. Definition and Subject Matter of Logic

A standard feature of late ancient Greek commentaries on Aristotle’s individual works is to begin with prolegomena dealing with the purpose and benefit of a certain discipline, determining its subject matter and rank within the system. Similar issues influence Avicenna’s approach to the question of the nature of logic and what it aims to accomplish as a discipline.

Logic is a theoretical discipline that provides the tools and methods required to avoid error in reasoning, where reasoning means acquiring new knowledge (conceptual or propositional) of what is unknown (mağhūl) starting from what is known (maʿlūm), and to attain the optimal epistemic states legitimately associated with various domains of human cognition, most notably certainty (yaqīn) in scientific discourse (ʿilm) and persuasion (iqnāʿ) in dialectic and rhetorical contexts.

Accordingly, logic has a twofold nature: it is at the same time (i) a normative (literally “canonical”) instrument, according to the definition in Pointers and Reminders, with respect to any other discipline, and (ii) a part of philosophy, i.e., an Aristotelian science with its own internal structure, which presupposes a well-defined subject.

If the purpose and benefit of logic is to lead from what is known to what is unknown, for example from premises to conclusion in a valid argument whose premises are asserted, Avicenna’s account of the subject (mawḍūʿ) of logic is inextricably tied with a fundamental distinction in Arabic logic, which can be traced back at least to al-Fārābī, between the two main ways in which knowledge is available to the human mind: conception (taṣawwur) and assertion (taṣdīq).

The distinction between conception and assertion marks the boundary between the acquisition or possession of individual concepts or notions, and the ascription of truth to statements or judgments. It provides the foundations of Avicenna’s logic (as well as those of his epistemology) and determines two distinct modes of knowledge linked on the one hand with (i) concept formation and the domain of definition (ḥadd) and description (rasm), and on the other with (ii) truth and reasoning (demonstrative and non-demonstrative syllogism (qiyās), depending on the epistemic strength of the assertions involved).

The ultimate building-blocks of definitions (directly) and of syllogisms (indirectly) are intelligible notions (maʿānin maʿqūla). Logic deals with a special kind of intelligible notions, which in the Ilāhiyyāt are characterized as second-order intelligible notions (maʿqulāt ṯāniya) (Ilāhiyyāt I.2, 10–11). Assuming that first-order notions are things like “human”, “rational”, “whiteness”, or “stone”, second-order (or more generally, higher-order) notions are either genuinely distinct concepts such as “subject”, “predicate”, “genus”, “proposition”, and “syllogism” or, on a weaker reading, ways to ascribe second-order properties (such as being a universal or being a genus and so on) to first-order notions. Logic investigates the salient properties that hold of second-order notions, such as the properties of being a genus, the characteristics of propositions and their terms, the types of predication (essential and accidental), the truth-conditions of propositions, the conditions under which arguments are valid and those under which arguments that seem to be valid are not. On the identification of secondary intelligibles and the subject matter of logic, see (Street 2013) and (Sabra 1980).

Furthermore, logic entertains two levels of analysis, addressing distinct sets of considerations that are commonly referred to as formal and material. Formal characteristics are the quantity and quality of a proposition or the arrangement of terms in an argument, and in general everything that is necessary and sufficient to proceed without error in reasoning.

Material aspects of logic involve considerations relative to the types of terms used in propositions and arguments and the relations holding among the terms. Thus, for instance, the question whether an argument is demonstrative or not is typically a question that concerns not only its form (a demonstrative argument must be valid and consist of well-formed propositions), but also its matter, namely whether its terms adequately express the right kinds of necessary and explanatory relations.

The question what the subject matter of logic is became pressing in later Arabic logic, as Avicenna’s explicit remarks in the Ilāhiyyāt were taken to identify too narrow a subject, and conceptions and assertions gained traction as a plausible, more general alternative to second-order notions (El-Rouayheb 2012).

On the relation between logic as an instrument and logic as a science, see Qiyās I.2, Madḫal I.3 and for a general discussion (Sabra 1980).

3. Propositions

Avicenna recognizes two basic types of proposition (qaḍiyya): (1) categoricals (ḥamliyyāt), atomic subject-predicate propositions, qualified in various ways; and (2) hypotheticals (šarṭiyyāt), molecular propositions governed by a main connective, which may express a conditional (muttaṣil) or a disjunctive (munfaṣil) statement taking as its parts categoricals, hypotheticals, or a combination thereof.

3.1 Categorical Propositions

Categorical propositions are subject (mawḍūʿ)-predicate (maḥmūl) propositions expressing a relation (nisba) or judgment (ḥukm) between terms. They are usually classified according to a number of distinctions and readings.

  1. The first layer of analysis involves their quality (kayfiyya) and quantity (kammiyya). An Avicennan categorical is either (a) determinate (muḥaṣṣala), which means that it is in turn either a quantified (maḥṣūra) or a singular (šaḫsiyya) proposition (that is to say an a-, e-, i-, or o-proposition or one which takes a singular term as its subject) or (b) indeterminate (muhmala), when it is neither quantified nor singular. If a proposition contains at least one negative term it is called metathetic (maʿdūla).
  2. The second layer of analysis involves a consideration of the logical form of a categorical proposition as opposed to its surface expression. Avicenna introduces a distinction between the bipartite (ṯunāʾiyya), the tripartite (ṯulāṯiyya), and the quadripartite (rubāʿiyya) proposition. In the first case the copula is not explicit, which is grammatical in Arabic as in certain cases the juxtaposition of two terms may be sufficient to yield a predicative statement (A B); in the second case the copula is explicit but the proposition is not explicitly modalized (A is B); in the third case the copula is explicit and the proposition is explicitly modalized (A is necessarily B or A is possibly B).[2]
  3. The third layer of analysis involves modality, whether implicitly or explicitly. A categorical proposition is either unqualified (muṭlaqa, commonly translated as “absolute”) or qualified by a specific modality (munawwaʿa). The latter is usually distinguished into three main types: the necessary, the possible, and the impossible proposition.

This yields an eight-fold categorization occasionally advocated by Avicenna himself when he says, for example in the treatment of hypothetical propositions, that the categoricals embedded in them may be one of the above eight (Qiyās VII.1, 361.1–362.4).

3.1.1 Modality and reading: referential/substantial and descriptional

Avicenna may be credited with one of the most significant reforms in the analysis of propositional forms in the Peripatetic tradition. His new catalog of subject-predicate propositions, their relations of contradiction, subalternation, and conversion, became the center of gravity of an established tradition of logic.

Avicenna introduces two radical innovations in the Aristotelian analysis of propositions.

  1. Temporal and alethic modalities: every categorical proposition is modalized, either implicitly or explicitly. The modality may be either temporal (e.g., sometime, always), alethic (e.g., necessarily, possibly), or a combination of both. This has significant repercussions on the traditional Aristotelian square of opposition, which Avicenna rejects as we shall see below, and on the account of conversion.
  2. Referential/substantial and descriptional reading: every categorical proposition is subject to an additional reading, depending on whether the proposition is taken to express a relation between the predicate and what is picked out by the subject, (a) as long as what is picked out by the subject exists (mā dāma mawğūd aḏ-ḏāt) or (b) as long as it is qualified—or “described” (mā dāma mawṣūf)—by the subject. This move amounts to adding a temporal parameter that identifies two distinct time frames: the continued existence of the item picked out by the subject term (where the subject term is used, as it were, just to fix the referent), and the time at which such an item is actually qualified by the subject term. The propositions corresponding to the two readings are canonically called in the post-Avicennan tradition “referential/substantial” (ḏātī) and “descriptional” (waṣfī).[3]

The two parameters jointly yield a variety of types of modalized propositions, a canonical list of which becomes standard in the thirteenth century. Below are some notable items that can be found in various forms in Avicenna’s works and which crystallized starting with Rāzī (Street 2013; cf. Strobino & Thom 2016).[4] The deeper syntax of these propositions is a subject of dispute (Hodges 2015).


  • A referential perpetuity (dāʾima)
  • X1 referential one-sided absoluteness (muṭlaqa ʿāmma)
  • X2 referential two-sided absoluteness (muṭlaqa ḫāṣṣa, wuğūdiyya lā dāʾima)
  • Ad1 descriptional unrestricted perpetuity (ʿurfiyya ʿāmma)
  • Xd1 descriptional one-sided absoluteness (ḥiniyya muṭlaqa)


  • Lreferential necessity (ḍarūriyya)
  • M1referential one-sided possibility (mumkina ʿāmma)
  • M2referential two-sided possibility (mumkina ḫāṣṣa)
  • Ld1descriptional unrestricted necessity (mašrūṭa ʿāmma)
  • Md1descriptional one-sided possibility (ḥiniyya mumkina)

Mixed Alethic and Temporal

  • Treferential temporal determinate (waqtiyya)
  • Ureferential temporal indeterminate (muntašira)
  • X3referential non-necessary absoluteness (wuğūdiyya lā ḍarūriyya)
  • Ld2descriptional restricted necessity (mašrūṭa ḫāṣṣa)
  • Ad2descriptional restricted perpetuity (ʿurfiyya ḫāṣṣa)

For a full list of instances of a-, e-, i-, and o-propositions see appendix A.

3.2 Hypothetical Propositions

Hypotheticals comprise two main sub-types, depending on whether the component sentences are in connection (ittiṣāl) or in conflict (ʿinād). In the first case, the connection is analyzed in terms of a relation of following (ittibāʿ) between an antecedent (muqaddam) and a consequent (tālin).[5] In the second case, conflict is expressed in terms of a disjunction of propositions (or parts, ağzāʾ).

The resulting propositional types are conditionals (muttaṣilāt) and disjunctions (munfaṣilāt). Avicenna investigates them both with respect to basic logical relations—such as contradiction, subalternation, mutual implication, or conversion—and within the context of syllogistic inferences.

A distinctive feature of Avicenna’s analysis of hypothetical propositions is quantification. The conditional relation between antecedent and consequent as well as the relation of conflict between the parts of a disjunction are embedded within the scope of a quantifier which may express a universal affirmative, a universal negative, a particular affirmative, or a particular negative hypothetical proposition.

The question with respect to what conditional and disjunctive statements are quantified may elicit different answers. In the case of conditional statements, Avicenna indicates that the quantification should be understood to apply to the times at which the antecedent is posited and the states or conditions (in short, additional assumptions) that can be associated with it. The problem is addressed for example by (Rescher 1963b), (Movahed 2009), and (Hodges 2013). A universal affirmative conditional statement is true when the consequent follows the antecedent at all times the antecedent is posited and with respect to all states that may legitimately be added to the antecedent:[6]

If the connection (ittiṣāl) is asserted under any condition and circumstance (ʿalā kull ištirāṭ wa-waḍʿ) [at which the antecedent] is posited, then the hypothetical conditional proposition is universal; (Qiyās V.4, 263.1–264.2)

In the statement “Always, if C is B, then H is Z” the words “always, if” are not only meant to cover what is [explicitly] intended (al-murād) [by this proposition], in such a way that it is as if one were to say “Every time at which C is B, H is Z”. Rather, [the words “always, if”] are also meant to cover every state (ḥāl) which may be added to the statement “Every C is B”, in such a way that there is no state (ḥāl) or condition (šarṭ) whatsoever that makes C to be B without making H to be Z, when it is added to [the antecedent “C is B”]. (Qiyās, V.4, 265.1–5)[7]

A classification of hypothetical propositions is given at the beginning of Qiyās V.3, where Avicenna explicitly lists a first set of permutations and illustrates them with examples. There seems to be no principled reason to think that Avicenna would not have entertained the possibility of more complex iterations (where, for instance, the antecedent of a conditional is itself a conditional whose antecedent is a disjunction of conditionals whose consequents are conditionals consisting of categoricals). A hint in this direction is that he is prepared to entertain the notion of potentially infinite disjunctions.

3.2.1 Types of hypotheticals

Avicenna considers the following types of hypothetical propositions in Qiyās V.3:

Conditional Disjunctive
(i) cat-cat [categorical] → [categorical] [categorical] ∨ [categorical]
(ii) c-c (…→ …) → (… → …) ( … → …) ∨ ( … → …)
(iii) d-d (… ∨ …) → (… ∨ …) ( … ∨ …) ∨ ( … ∨ …)
(iv) c-d (… → …) → (… ∨ …) (… → …) ∨ (… ∨ …)
(… ∨ …) → (… → …)
(v) cat-c [categorical] → (… → …) (… → …) ∨ [categorical]
(… → …) → [categorical]
(vi) cat-d [categorical] → (… ∨ …) (… ∨ …) ∨ [categorical]
(… ∨ …) → [categorical]

The first type comprises the most basic kind of hypothetical propositions, which take categorical propositions as their parts. The hypotheticals discussed in the development of the hypothetical syllogistic in Qiyās VI are of type (i) only. That is to say, the premise-pairs of hypothetical syllogisms are either type-(i) propositions (conditional-conditional; conditional-disjunctive; disjunctive-disjunctive); or combinations of type (i) propositions with categoricals (conditional-categorical; disjunctive-categorical). The former class comprises purely hypothetical syllogisms, the latter mixed hypothetical syllogisms.

Avicenna illustrates the above types by means of the following examples (Qiyās V.3, 253.1–255.2):

Conditional Disjunctive
(i) cat-cat If [the sun rises], then [it is day] Either [this number is even] or [<this number> is odd]
(ii) c-c If (always if [it is day], then [the sun has risen]), then (always if [it is night], then [the sun has set]) Either (always if [the sun rises], then [it is day]) or (sometimes if [the sun rises], then [it is not day])
(iii) d-d If (either [the body is at rest] or [<the body is> in motion]), then (either [some substances are at rest] or [<they are> in motion]) Either (either [this fever is yellowish] or [<this fever is> scarlet]) or (either [this fever is phlegmish] or [<this fever is> melancholic])
(iv) c-d If (always if [the sun rises], then [it is day]), then (either [it is day] or [the sun has not risen]) Either (if [the sun rises], then [it is day]) or (either [the sun rises] or [it is day])
If (either [this number is even] or [<this number> is odd]), then (if [<this number> is even] then [<this number> is not odd])
(v) cat-c If [the sun is the cause of day], then (always if [it is day], then [the sun has risen]) Either (always if [it is day], then [the sun has risen]) or [the sun is not the cause of day]
If (always if [it is day], then [the sun has risen]), then [the sun is the cause of day]
(vi) cat-d If [this is a number], then (either [this is even] or [<this is> odd]) Either (either [this is even] or [<this is> odd]) or [<this> is not a number]
If (either [this is even] or [<this is> odd]), then [this is a number]

3.2.2 Types of following

Conditionals express relations of following between an antecedent and a consequent. Complete conditionals are bi-conditionals.

Avicenna distinguishes between two types of conditionals: implicative (luzūmī) and coincidental (ittifāqī). While the former express necessary relations of following whereby the consequent follows because or in virtue of the antecedent, the latter have often been thought to express an accidental connection, though it seems plausible that Avicenna might simply mean agreement or coincidence in truth or in being the case together (maʿiyya).[8] When a conditional expresses an implication (luzūm), it is called real (ḥaqīqī or ʿalā t-taḥqīq); when it expresses coincidence (ittifāq, muwāfaqa or tawāfuq), it is called unqualified (muṭlaq or ʿalā l-iṭlāq). For a characterization of conditionals see (Karimullah 2014a).

3.2.3 Types of conflict

Avicenna distinguishes among three types of disjunctive statements: (i) exclusive and exhaustive; (ii) exclusive non-exhaustive; (iii) inclusive. Put simply, their characteristic properties may be expressed in terms of the following three relations:

  1. \(p \lor^{1} q\) with \(p \leftrightarrow \neg q\)
  2. \(p \lor^{2} q\) with \(p \rightarrow \neg q\)
  3. \(p \lor^{3} q\) with \(\neg p \rightarrow q\)

Avicenna refers to the first type as the real (or genuine) disjunction (munfaṣila ḥaqīqiyya) and to the other two types as unreal (ġayr ḥaqīqī) disjunctions. The second and third type were canonically referred to by Post-Avicennan logicians as the māniʿat al-ğamʿ disjunction (preventing the joint affirmation of the two disjuncts, i.e., compatible with their both being false together but incompatible with their both being true together) and the māniʿat al-ḫuluww disjunction (preventing the joint negation of the two disjuncts, i.e., compatible with their both being true together but incompatible with their both being false together) (El-Rouayheb 2010).

Negative disjunctions express absence of conflict or incompatibility.

3.2.4 Truth-conditions for conditionals

Implicative conditionals are true (1.1) when the antecedent and the consequent are both true or (1.2) when the antecedent is false and the consequent is true or (1.3) when the antecedent and the consequent are both false, and (2) there is a connection of meaning between the two such that the consequent is inseparable from the antecedent.

Coincidental conditionals are true when the antecedent and the consequent are both true or when the antecedent is false and the consequent is true (but false when both the antecedent and the consequent are false).

Both conditionals are false when the antecedent is true and the consequent is false. Implicative conditionals with true antecedents and consequents are also true as coincidental. The question how the two are related more generally and without such restrictions is in need of further investigation.

Negative universal (particular) conditionals express the fact the consequent does not necessarily follow from the antecedent (luzūmī) or is not true together with the antecedent (ittifāqī) at any (some) times and under any (some) circumstances. They are equivalent to affirmative conditionals of the same quantity with a contradictory consequent and express the dual relation of dependency (or togetherness) of the contradictory of the consequent with respect to the antecedent at all (some) times and under all (some) circumstances. For example, a universal negative conditional of the form “Never, if A is B, then C is D” is logically equivalent to “Always, if A is B, then C is not D”. Negative conditional statements may express absence of a luzūmī connection (as in “Never, if man exists, then void does not exist”) or absence of an ittifāqī connection (as in “Never, if man exists, then void exists”) (Qiyās V.5, 279.1–283.9).

3.2.5 Impossible antecedents

Avicenna is keenly interested in conditionals with impossible antecedents (sophisticated discussions are to be found in his account of a- and e-conditionals and in connection with reductio arguments) but only in the sense in which an impossibility may genuinely be derived from another impossibility, as it were, out of the meaning of the terms involved, not in the sense in which an arbitrary consequent may trivially be inferred from an impossible antecedent. The problem of explosion is recognized and rejected in post-Avicennan logic, starting with Ḫūnağī (d. 1248 CE). It seems reasonable to assume, even in the current state of our fragmentary knowledge of such a vast amount of material, that both Avicenna’s logic and post-Avicennan logic may generally be committed to an idea of logical consequence that could perhaps best be captured, in modern terms, by the intuition behind a relevantist approach to the notion of following. This is a feature that the Arabic tradition would share with certain strands of medieval Latin logic. In discussing the problem of conditionals with impossible antecedents in the post-Avicennan tradition (El-Rouayheb 2009 and 2010: xxxiii–xl) argues for an even stronger interpretation in terms of connexive logic.[9]

4. Contradiction and Conversion

Contradiction (tanāquḍ) and conversion (ʿaks) are fundamental relations in Avicenna’s logic. The principles that govern them are central in the development of the syllogistic, both categorical and hypothetical. It is not surprising, in light of the complexity of Avicenna’s analysis of categorical propositions and of his elaborate account of quantified hypotheticals, that his answers to questions such as what contradicts what, what follows from what, and what converts with what all came under close scrutiny in Post-Avicennan logic, before finding a stable equilibrium with Kātibī (d. 1276 CE), an equilibrium that turns in several key respects on the interpretation of these relations.

4.1 Contradiction of Categorical Propositions

The logical relations usually expressed in the Aristotelian square of opposition for assertoric propositions and its modal counterparts become the object of a significant revision in Avicenna’s system, as a result of the richer set of propositions it comprises. Perhaps the most striking feature is the replacement of the Aristotelian assertoric with the one-sided absolute (X1), a proposition containing an implicit temporal modality (“sometimes” or “at least once”) which, unlike the Aristotelian assertoric, is not contradicted by a proposition of the same kind, but by a stronger proposition, namely the “perpetual” (dāʾima) A-proposition.

Below is a summary of the relations of entailment (including subalternation) and contradiction for four basic types of propositions, all one-sided, in the referential/substantial reading; in the case of two-sided propositions, contradictories are disjunctive statements or involve a disjunctive predicate (the latter only applies to two-sided possibility propositions):

a diamond shape with 4 items on each side, for each side arrows point from the first item to the second, second to third, third to fourth. First side (upper middle to middle left): La, Aa, X1a, M1a. Second side (lower middle to middle left): Li, Ai, X1i, M1i. An arrow points from each item in the first side to the corresponding item on the second side (e.g., La to Li). Third side (upper middle to middle right): Le, Ae, X1e, M1e. Fourth side (lower middle to middle right): Lo, Ao, X1o, M1o. An arrow points from each item in the third side to the corresponding item on the fourth side (e.g., Le to Lo). Dotted lines connect the first item of the first side to the fouth item of the fourth side, second item of the first side to the third item of the fourth side (and so on). Similarly for the first item of the third side to the fourth item of the second side and so on. A legend explains that the arrows mean 'entails' and the dotted lines 'contradicts'

Figure 1: Referential/substantial necessity, perpetuity, general absoluteness, and general possibility: entailment and contradiction

The following are analogous relations among propositions in the descriptional reading:

very similar to figure 1, except that the side items are different. A diamond shape with 4 items on each side, for each side arrows point from the first item to the second, second to third, third to fourth. First side (upper middle to middle left): Ld1a, Ad1a, Xd1a, Md1a. Second side (lower middle to middle left): Ld1i, Ad1i, Xd1i, Md1i. An arrow points from each item in the first side to the corresponding item on the second side (e.g., Ld1a to Ld1i). Third side (upper middle to middle right): Ld1e, Ad1e, Xd1e, Md1e. Fourth side (lower middle to middle right): Ld1o, Ad1o, Xd1o, Md1o. An arrow points from each item in the third side to the corresponding item on the fourth side (e.g., Ld1e to Ld1o). Dotted lines connect the first item of the first side to the fourth item of the fourth side, second item of the first side to the third item of the fourth side (and so on). Similarly for the first item of the third side to the fourth item of the second side and so on.

Figure 2: Descriptional necessity, perpetuity, general absoluteness, and general possibility: entailment and contradiction

The above relations are central in syllogistic proofs by reductio.

4.2 Contradiction of Hypothetical Propositions

In the case of hypothetical propositions, contradiction is determined only with respect to the main quantifier of the conditional or the disjunction and does not affect the component statements. In other words, it should not be confused with another relation involving negation, namely mutual implication (talāzum). The contradictory of a conditional a-proposition is a conditional o-proposition with the same antecedent and consequent and the contradictory of a conditional e-proposition is a conditional i-proposition with the same antecedent and consequent. The same applies to the case of disjunctions.

Avicenna is keen to point out on various occasions throughout the treatment of conditionals in the Qiyās that what matters are the quantificational aspects of the relation between antecedent and consequent (the nisba or the ḥukm), not the quantity and quality of the antecedent and consequent themselves. In particular, he vigorously rejects the view that the contradictory of a conditional statement is a conditional statement of the same quality and quantity whose consequent is denied. In his view, the contradictory of (a-\(\mathbb{C}\))aa is (o-\(\mathbb{C}\))aa, not (a-\(\mathbb{C}\))ao. In other words, “Always, if every A is B, then every C is D” is contradicted by “Not always, if every A is B, then every C is D” and not by “Always, if every A is B, then not every C is D” which is in fact a stronger statement equivalent to its contrary, namely (e-\(\mathbb{C}\))aa (“Never, if every A is B, then every C is D”).[10] On the other hand, (o-\(\mathbb{C}\))aa is logically equivalent to (i-\(\mathbb{C}\))ao (“Sometimes, if every A is B, then not every C is D”), which is therefore another contradictory of (a-\(\mathbb{C}\))aa. A set of basic relations is represented in the following diagram

An 8 sided diagram. On the left side the vertices are (a-\(\mathbb{C}\))aa, (e0c)ao, (o-\(\mathbb{C}\))ao, (i-\(\mathbb{C}\))aa with double headed arrows connecting the first two items to each other and also the last two items to each other, a single arrow points from the second item to the third to make up three of the sides of the diagram. In addition the first item has an arrow pointing to the fourth item. Similary on the right side except the vertices are (e-\(\mathbb{C}\))aa, (a-\(\mathbb{C}\)ao), (i-\(\mathbb{C}\))ao and (o-\(\mathbb{C}\))aa. Between the first item of the left side and the first item of the right side is the word 'contraries' and between the last item of the left side and the last item of the right side is the word 'subcontraries'. Dotted lines connect the first item of one side to the third and fourth items of the second side and also from the second item of each side to the third and fourth of the other.

Figure 3: Relations among conditionals: mutual implication, subalternation, contrariety, and contradiction)

4.3 Conversion of Categorical Propositions

(Some of) the rules of conversion for categorical propositions constitute another major departure from Aristotle. On Avicenna’s model, the absolute universal negative proposition, X1-e, fails to convert due to its being a one-sided temporal proposition (in general it is not true that if no A is always B, then no B is always A, as in “No animal always sleeps” and “Nothing that sleeps is always an animal”). L-a and L-i propositions do not convert as L-i propositions but rather as M1-i propositions (for a general presentation and an account of the proofs see Street 2002, Thom 2003). L-e and Ld1-e propositions convert as such. In the first case, the proof is one of the most controversial points in Avicenna’s system, directly connected with the validity of first-figure syllogisms with a one-sided possibility, M1, minor premise. The conversion of Ld1-propositions as Ld1-propositions is in fact the minimal essential requirement for the productivity of second-figure moods involving absolutes in XX and XM mixes. For Avicenna’s account of why an Ld1-proposition may legitimately be regarded as an absolute proposition, see Qiyās I.4 and Burhān II.1, discussed in (Strobino forthcoming).

4.4 Conversion of Hypothetical Propositions

The conversion of hypothetical propositions is explicitly discussed only in a short chapter of the Qiyās (VII.3), where Avicenna briefly talks about the status of (e-\(\mathbb{C}\)) propositions (conversion does not apply in a genuine sense to disjunctions, whose parts are equivalent: “Always, either every A is B or C is D” is the same statement as “Always, either every C is D or every A is B”). This, however, should not suggest that conversion is less important in the case of hypotheticals than it is in the case of categoricals: it is in fact an essential method of proof for certain hypothetical syllogisms. Additional rules may be extrapolated from the extensive discussions of syllogisms involving conditionals in Qiyās VI.1, VI.2, and VI.4.

In the conversion of conditional propositions, the parameters that matter are the quantity of the proposition to be converted and that of its converse, and the type of conditional (luzūmī or ittifāqī), while the antecedent and the consequent are treated in a way analogous to the way in which terms are treated in the conversion of categoricals. The following are notable as well as frequently used conversion principles:

\[ \begin{align} (\eC^{i})pq & ⊢ (\eC^{i})qp & (\textit{Qiyās}, \textrm{ VII.3}) \\ (\aC)pq & ⊢ (\iC)qp\\ (\iC)pq & ⊢ (\iC)qp \end{align} \]

4.5 Inferential Relations among Hypotheticals

The analysis of inferential relations among hypotheticals includes the mutual implication (talāzum) of (i) conditional statements and (ii) disjunctive statements, as well as (iii) the interaction between the two classes of hypotheticals. Besides its intrinsic interest, such an analysis is often required for the proof validity of hypothetical syllogisms, in addition to standard techniques such as conversion, ecthesis (iftirāḍ), and reductio. The treatment of conditionals is found in Qiyās VII.1, while Qiyās VII.2 is devoted to the analysis of disjunctions and the connection between the two.

4.5.1 Conditionals

In Qiyās VII.1, Avicenna considers a basic set of quantified conditional statements with quantified antecedents and consequents. Assuming the four basic forms of quantified conditional statements (a-\(\mathbb{C}\)), (e-\(\mathbb{C}\)), (i-\(\mathbb{C}\)), and (o-\(\mathbb{C}\)) and all permutations of a-, e-, i-, o-propositions as antecedents and consequents, Avicenna generates four groups of sixteen conditional propositions (see Appendix B) and argues that any of those forms is logically equivalent to the contradictory conditional with a contradictory consequent, based on a reductio proof that may easily be generalized. As illustrated above (contradiction of conditional propositions), the (a-\(\mathbb{C}\))aa proposition is for instance equivalent to the (e-\(\mathbb{C}\))ao proposition (“Always, if every A is B, then every C is D” if and only if “Never, if every A is B, then not every C is D”). If that were not the case, then (i-\(\mathbb{C}\))ao would be true. But then (o-\(\mathbb{C}\))aa would be true, which contradicts the initial assumption. For an account of Avicenna’s reductio proof of the fact that “Always, if every A is B, then every C is D” implies “Never, if every A is B, then not every C is D”—at Qiyās 367.11–368.1—see (El-Rouayheb 2009: 209–210 and 2010: xxxiii–xxxiv).[11]

4.5.2 Disjunctions

The scheme of classification of disjunctive propositions is analogous to that of conditionals. Disjunctive statements consisting of two parts are quantified as a-, e-, i-, and o-propositions (where negative propositions express absence of conflict or incompatibility between the disjuncts at all (some) times and under all (some) circumstances) with sixteen permutations for each case depending on the quality and quantity of the parts (see Appendix B). In this case, however, the situation is complicated by the fact that different types of disjunctions have different logical properties, with specific considerations applying to each type. Besides, in the schematic representations offered below, I prefer to retain the quantificational features of the disjuncts, as Avicenna seems to differentiate explicitly between real and unreal disjunctions in virtue, among other things, of their having affirmative or negative parts, another point that deserves more attention (for a preliminary analysis see Street 1995). In general, for Avicenna disjunctions and conditionals are not inter-definable without qualification.

  1. Avicenna addresses the relation between disjunctions and conditionals first. The main distinction is between the case in which the disjunction is (i) real (exclusive and exhaustive) and the case in which it is (ii) unreal (to be taken here in the sense of inclusive).[12] In case (i), the negation of a disjunct implies the affirmation of the other disjunct and the affirmation of a disjunct implies the negation of the other disjunct. In case (ii), the negation of a disjunct implies the affirmation of the other disjunct, but the affirmation of a disjunct does not imply the negation of the other disjunct. Thus, for instance the following relations hold, as instances of the schemata \((\aD^1)pq \rightarrow (\aC)\neg pq\) and \((\aD^1)pq \rightarrow (\aC)p\neg q\):

    \[\begin{align} (\aD^{1})\ra^{1}\ra^{2} & \rightarrow (\aC)\ro^{1}\ra^{2 }\\ (\aD^{1})\ra^{1}\ra^{2} & \rightarrow^{ } (\aC)\ro^{2}\ra^{1}\\ (\aD^{1})\ra^{1}\ra^{2} & \rightarrow (\aC)\ra^{1}\ro^{2 }\\ (\aD^{1})\ra^{1}\ra^{2} & \rightarrow (\aC)\ra^{2}\ro^{1} \end{align} \]

    By contrast, if the disjunction is unreal (inclusive), only the following relations hold:

    \[\begin{align} (\aD^{3})\ra^{1}\ra^{2} & \rightarrow (\aC)\ro^{1}\ra^{2 }\\ (\aD^{3})\ra^{1}\ra^{2} & \rightarrow^{ } (\aC)\ro^{2}\ra^{1} \end{align} \]
  2. In analogy with the case of conditionals, Avicenna also discusses inferential relations among disjunctions (Qiyās VII.2, 379.17–381.10), where notable cases are, for real affirmative disjunctions with affirmative parts:

    \[\begin{align} (\aD^{1})\ra^{1}\ra^{2} & \rightarrow (\eD)\ro^{1}\ra^{2}\\ (\aD^{1})\ra^{1}\ra^{2} & \rightarrow (\eD)\ro^{2}\ra^{1} \end{align} \]

    Thus, an exclusive and exhaustive universal affirmative disjunction entails a proposition that expresses universal absence of conflict between one of the disjuncts and the contradictory of the other (“from ‘Always either every A is B or every C is D’ one can infer ‘Never either not every A is B or every C is D’ and ‘Never either not every C is D or every A is B’”, Qiyās VII.2, 380.1–4). The converse is not generally true, as the negative disjunction may be true in virtue of an impossible disjunct that is not in conflict with the other (according to the semantics of negative disjunctions discussed in Qiyās V.5). The same holds for (i-\(\mathbb{D}\)1) and (o-\(\mathbb{D}\)1) propositions.

  3. The relations among disjunctions and conditionals, a theme of obvious interest from the standpoint of modern logic, reflect the complexity of the above distinctions. Avicenna investigates relations such as, for instance, the triangulation between (a-\(\mathbb{D}\)), (a-\(\mathbb{C}\)), and (e-\(\mathbb{D}\)) propositions (Qiyās VII.2, 381.11–17):

    (a-\(\mathbb{D}\)^1)pq with arrows pointing to (e-\(\mathbb{D}\)^1)¬pq and to (a-\(\mathbb{C}\)^l)¬pq and also an arrow pointing from the last to the second to the last item

This is only an example of a more complex network of inferential relations that should be complemented with an exhaustive list and an accurate analysis of the inferences used in the treatment of syllogisms, especially in Qiyās VI.

5. Syllogistic

The culmination of Avicenna’s formal logic is the development of an elaborate theory of the syllogism that brings together various strands from ancient and late ancient logic, filtered through Peripatetic lenses, and produces a new and original system.

The theory of the syllogism (qiyās), in its main divisions, occupies a prominent part in all of Avicenna’s logical works. The doctrinal skeleton remains the same in spite of a significant re-arrangement of the material, especially in the Išārāt. In the works of the middle period, especially the Nağāt and the extensive treatment of the Qiyās, Avicenna follows the path charted by the Prior Analytics.[13]

Types of syllogisms: connective and repetitive

Among the several innovations Avicenna may be credited with is the codification of a canonical division, echoing distinctions already brewing in ancient and late ancient logic, of syllogisms in a number of categories that became standard conceptual vocabulary in later Arabic logic.

Syllogisms divide into two main types: (1) connective syllogisms (iqtirānī) and (2) repetitive syllogisms (istiṯnāʾī).

Connective syllogisms are defined as those in which neither the conclusion nor its contradictory is explicitly part of the premises, and hence as those syllogisms in which the conclusion is only potentially contained in the premises. Connective syllogisms are characterized by a partial overlap or sharing between the premises (of a middle term or of a proposition discharged in the conclusion).

Repetitive syllogisms are defined as those in which either the conclusion or its contradictory is explicitly part of the premises.

Further discussion of syllogistic arguments include the (i) compound syllogism (qiyās murakkab), which involves multiple syllogisms such that the conclusion of a syllogism serves as a premise for the next syllogism, whether by an explicit concatenation (mawṣūl) or an implicit one (mufaṣṣal), as well as other forms that came to be discussed, in later Arabic logic, under the rubric of concomitants of the syllogism (lawāḥiq al-qiyās). These variously connect to chapters of the Prior Analytics and include: (ii) the proof through the impossible or reductio ad absurdum (qiyās al-ḫalf or kalām ilā l-muḥāl), which in Avicenna is interestingly analyzed in terms of a combination of a connective and a repetitive syllogism, (iii) the conversion of the syllogism (ʿaks al-qiyās), (iv) the syllogism from opposites (qiyāsāt muʾallafa min muqaddamāt mutāqabila), and (v) circular proof (bayān ad-dawr).

5.1 Connective Syllogistic

Connective syllogisms are divided into two main types: (1) categorical (ḥamlī) and (2) hypothetical (šarṭī) syllogisms.

(1) Categorical syllogisms are those whose premises and conclusions are all and only categorical propositions. Their treatment constitutes one of Avicenna’s most original contributions. It follows paths and adopts techniques that are familiar in the Aristotelian tradition but the resulting system is original and based on distinctive intuitions, largely due to the sophisticated understanding of modality that emerges in the analysis of propositions.

(2) The hypothetical syllogistic is a new development, at least with respect to Aristotle. Although the model is likely indebted to late ancient Greek sources, the genuinely innovative character of its constituent elements (quantified hypothetical propositions) turns this area into something rather different from its most natural Greek (Galen) or Latin (most notably Boethius) terms of comparison, even leaving aside other differences.

The hypothetical syllogistic investigates arguments in which at least one of the premises is a hypothetical proposition (of type (i), namely one whose parts are themselves categoricals, though Avicenna does not seem to put any restriction on more complex argument forms). Purely hypothetical syllogisms are those in which the combination of the premises involve only hypotheticals (conditional-conditional; conditional-disjunction; disjunction-disjunction). Mixed hypothetical syllogisms are those in which the combination of the premises involves a hypothetical (conditional or disjunction) and a categorical.

The extent to which hypothetical syllogisms are treated in Avicenna’s various logical works varies significantly. A great deal of material is left out of the abridged treatments (for instance in the Nağāt and in the Išārāt) compared to the extensive analysis provided in the Qiyās (and to that promised but never delivered—as far as we know—in the frequently announced Kitāb al-Lawāḥiq, the Book of the Appendices). The criteria of selection are not just pragmatic (hypothetical syllogisms are significantly more complex, if only in virtue of the compounding effect generated by an additional layer of quantification) but also based on the idea that some combinations are more natural (perhaps more intuitive) than others.

The entire edifice of Avicenna’s connective syllogistic rests on the assumption that certain argument forms are self-evidently productive (bayyina, bayyina bi-anfusihā, bayyinat al-intāğ) or perfect (kāmila) and that all other forms can be reduced (ruğūʿ) to them by standard methods of proof. The latter include (i) proofs based on conversion (ʿaks) (alongside other kinds of transformation of premises or conclusions into logically equivalent premises or conclusions, in the case of hypothetical syllogisms), (ii) proofs based on setting out a term (iftirāḍ)—the counterpart of the Aristotelian notion of ecthesis, and (iii) proofs through the impossible (or reductio ad absurdum, qiyās al-ḫalf). Depending on the circumstances, one, two or all three methods may be used to prove productivity.

5.1.1 Categorical syllogistic

Categorical syllogisms are argument forms consisting of triplets of terms (ḥudūd) arranged in two premises (muqaddamāt) and a conclusion (natīğa or, insofar as it is implicitly contained in or aimed at by the premises, maṭlūb). The two premises share a term with one another and one each with the conclusion, for example, “Every B is C; every A is B; therefore every A is C” (BaC, AaB ⊢ AaC). The term shared by the premises is called middle term (ḥadd awsaṭ). The subject of the conclusion is called minor term (ḥadd aṣġar), the predicate of the conclusion is called major term (ḥadd akbar). The premise that shares with the conclusion the minor term is called minor premise (muqaddama ṣuġrā). The premise that shares with the conclusion the major term is called major premise (muqaddama kubrā).

Figures and moods

The middle term may be (i) subject of the major premise and predicate of the minor premise; (ii) predicate of both; or (iii) subject of both. The resulting configurations are called (i) first figure (šakl awwal), (ii) second figure (šakl ṯānin), and (iii) third figure (šakl ṯāliṯ). Like Aristotle, Avicenna does not contemplate a fourth figure.[14] Each figure contains a number of valid moods (ḍurūb), identified by the quantity, quality, and modality of the premises and conclusion. For the sake of simplicity, I use standard vocabulary for the treatment of the Aristotelian syllogistic (in particular the list of mnemonic tags developed in the Latin middle ages for the identification of moods).[15] The moods of the first figure are Barbara, Celarent, Darii, Ferio. The moods of the second figure are Cesare, Camestres, Festino, Baroco. The moods of the third figure are Darapti, Felapton, Datisi, Disamis, Bocardo, and Ferison. Each of the above will be productive with certain combinations of modalized premises and not with others.

The discussion of productive moods in the Qiyās and in the Nağāt follows the order and method of presentation of the Prior Analytics and focuses on different modal mixes (iḫtilāṭāt) that are then distinguished by figure (for example, the LX or the LM combinations in the first, second, and third figure). In the Išārāt Avicenna chooses a different approach and discusses productivity by figure, not by mix. This enables him to present more effectively a number of general principles governing inferences in each figure, and most importantly modifications to the so-called rule of the major for the first figure (Street forthcoming). The rule of the major tells us that the modality of the conclusion in first-figure syllogisms follows the modality of the major premise, except in two cases that will be discussed below (Ld1LL and XMM). Given the logical priority ascribed by Avicenna to the first figure, this move represents a significant gain in terms of simplicity.

Below is a schematic summary of the productive combinations of modalized premises in each figure (the combinations in square brackets are productive but not always explicitly identified by Avicenna).

only with
X converting as itself
no moods only with
X converting as itself

In the first figure, according to the terse account offered in the Išārāt, if the minor premise is an actuality proposition (X or L), the conclusion follows the modality of the major (X, L or M). There are, however, two exceptions in which the conclusion follows the modality of the minor premise. The first exception is Ld1LL, where the major is a descriptional necessity proposition and the conclusion, like the minor, is an L-proposition (stronger than the major). The second exception is XMM, where the major is an absolute proposition and the conclusion, like the minor, is an M-proposition proposition (weaker than the major). In the remaining two cases in which the minor is an M-proposition, namely MMM and LML, the rule of the major applies.

MMM and MLM moods in the first figure are perfect (Qiyās IV.1, 181.2–4, 184.3–6, and IV.3, 199.5–6, where the latter are explicitly characterized as instances of the maqūl ʿalā l-kull or dictum de omni). LML moods, by contrast, require proof.

Some of the most interesting (and problematic) aspects of Avicenna’s modal logic emerge in connection with the proofs used to establish the productivity of certain notable moods. For instance, the controversial idea that the possible may be assumed to be actual in the context of a reductio proof (as well as in the proof of e-conversion of necessity propositions) is justified by intuitions that have sparked heated controversies in the post-Avicennan tradition (similar issues arise in the Greek tradition; for a philosophical interpretation of this technique, see Malink & Rosen 2013). Another problem is the potential circularity of the proof of Barbara LML, which, even if we leave aside the issue of assuming the possible to be actual, seems to rest on Baroco LXL, which in turn depends on Barbara LML (Street 2002).

A crucial intuition that lies at the core of Avicenna’s understanding of modality is connected with the different readings introduced above (referential/substantial and descriptional). If a property holds necessarily of something (picked out by the middle term) under the referential/substantial reading, then it also necessarily holds of whatever the middle term may be true of:

In sum, be aware of the fact that that for which it is possible to be necessary is always necessary (mā yumkinu an yaṣīra ḍarūriyyan fa-huwa ḍarūriyyun dāʾiman) and that it may [also] be possible in the more general sense (wa-amkanahū l-imkān al-aʿāmm). (Qiyās IV.3, 203.4–5)

A similar line of reasoning applies to the case of LXL moods (Qiyās IV.3, 202, Nağāt 71) and, mutatis mutandis, to Ld1LL moods with regard to the minor premise.

Avicenna explicitly formulates a generalized modal version of the dictum de omni at Qiyās IV.1, 184.3–5:

What possibly holds of what possibly holds [of something] possibly holds of [that something] in an evident way (mumkin al-mumkin mumkin ẓāhir al-imkān), just as what necessarily holds of what necessarily holds [of something] necessarily holds [of that something] (ḍarūrī aḍ-ḍarūrī ḍarūrī) and what holds of what holds [of something] holds of [that something] (mawğūd [for wuğūd] al-mawğūd mawğūd).

Perhaps the most striking feature of Avicenna’s system is the productivity (and foundational role) of first-figure syllogisms with a possibility minor premise, which has traditionally been regarded as problematic by many of Avicenna’s commentators. The case in support of this view hinges primarily on a certain reading of the terms and the idea that possibility propositions express relations of compatibility (or separability) among conceptions or essences, which Avicenna often spells out in terms of natures (of the subject and predicate) (Thom 2008, 2012).

A noteworthy property of the second figure is that as a result of Avicenna’s replacement of the Aristotelian assertoric with his own general absolute, there are, strictly speaking, no productive moods out of two absolute premises, due to their failure to convert as themselves (Street 2002). Avicenna, however, is committed to the productivity of the familiar four moods in the second figure when the absolute is taken in a qualified sense, according to which it converts as itself, namely when it is at least as strong as an Ld1-proposition (the same applies to second-figure XM moods). Avicenna consistently discusses this essential requirement in his logical works, often in conjunction with the claim that this qualified reading is the default sense of the e-proposition as well as being the one adopted in the sciences (Strobino forthcoming).

An account of Avicenna’s modal syllogistic influenced by considerations of this sort and aiming to look at its logical properties in tandem with Avicenna’s metaphysics has been recently offered by (Thom 2012). The project is inspired by principles that are similar to those underpinning the most significant recent developments in the interpretation of Aristotle’s modal syllogistic (Malink 2013). A model that stresses the two-dimensional character of Avicenna’s logic and reads Avicenna as reducing alethic modalities to temporal modalities only has been proposed by (Hodges and Johnston 2017).

5.1.2 Hypothetical syllogistic

The hypothetical propositions discussed above may be used as premises and conclusions of syllogistic arguments.

Types of hypothetical syllogism

Avicenna investigates five main types of hypothetical syllogisms (with further internal divisions). The first three are combinations of two conditional premises (type 1), a conditional premise and a disjunctive premise (type 2), or two disjunctive premises (type 3), and are called pure (ṣirfa) hypothetical syllogisms. The last two are combinations of a conditional and a categorical premise (type 4, subdivided into two classes), or of a disjunctive and a categorical premise (type 5), and are called mixed (muḫtalaṭa) hypothetical syllogisms.[16]

In general, there are some structural features that need to be kept in mind, while looking at this part of Avicenna’s logic. Hypothetical syllogisms are connective (iqtirānī) syllogisms and, as we have seen above, this means by definition that the premises are connected by a shared element. The latter may be either (i) a term (types 4 and 5, where the sharing occurs between a term in the categorical premise and a term in one of the constituent propositions of the hypothetical (conditional or disjunctive) premise) or (ii) a proposition (types 1, 2, and 3). In certain cases, the arrangement is such that it is possible to identify three figures in a way analogous to categorical syllogisms, whether the shared part is a term (types 4 and 5 again) or a proposition (type 1). In other cases, no such partition emerges, especially in the absence of an intrinsic order of the parts (type 3).

Another standard feature of Avicenna’s discussion, especially where premises are of different kinds (type 2, 4, and 5), is that arguments are classified in function of (i) which premise is major and which is minor; (ii) what part is shared (for conditionals, whether it is part of the antecedent or of the consequent; for disjunctions, whether the disjunction is real or unreal, and whether the shared part is affirmative or negative).

On several occasions—most notably but not exclusively in the context of the abridged treatments—Avicenna simplifies the analysis and avoids a detailed discussion of individual productive moods by providing general criteria for productivity, determined according to these different parameters. Again, this approach is structurally similar to the one adopted in the treatment of the categorical syllogistic but the complexity is higher due to additional variables at play with hypotheticals. It is worth noting that in Post-Avicennan logic, starting in particular with Ḫūnağī, considerable attention is paid to this part of Avicenna’s system, and the discovery of additional moods as well as the rejection of moods accepted by Avicenna were often associated with a critique and revision of these criteria (El-Rouayheb 2010).

Type 1: hypothetical syllogisms with two conditional premises (Qiyās VI.1)

In hypothetical syllogisms with two conditional premises, the shared part is a proposition which plays the same role as the middle term in categorical syllogisms. Depending on whether it is (i) the consequent of the major premise and the antecedent of the minor, (ii) the consequent of both or (iii) the antecedent of both, arguments of this kind will fall into one of the three familiar figures. The moods in each figure are determined here in function of the quality and quantity of the conditional premises and conclusion, unlike in the case of combinations involving a categorical and a conditional, where figures and moods, as we shall see below, are determined by the categorical premise and another categorical proposition, which is either the consequent or the antecedent of the other (conditional) premise.

The moods presented below are not unrestrictedly productive. In several cases their productivity depends on whether the conditional is implicative (luzūmī) or coincidental (ittifāqī). I list moods that Avicenna regards to be valid once the required qualifications are added, but for the sake of simplicity the latter are not expressed in the notation.

The first figure comprises the four characteristic moods, which are described as perfect (kāmil). Avicenna discusses at some length the status of this figure with respect to whether the conditionals it expresses are luzūmī or ittifāqī.

First figure

Hyp. Barbara \(\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\) \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})rq\); \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})pr ⊢ (\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})pq\)[17]
Hyp. Celarent \(\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\) \((\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})rq\); \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})pr ⊢ (\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})pq\)
Hyp. Darii \(\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\) \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})rq\); \((\textrm{i-}\mathbb{C})pr ⊢ (\textrm{i-}\mathbb{C})pq\)
Hyp. Ferio \(\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\) \((\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})rq\); \((\textrm{i-}\mathbb{C})pr ⊢ (\textrm{o-}\mathbb{C})pq\)

Second figure

Hyp. Cesare \(\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\) \((\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})qr\); \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})pr ⊢ (\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})pq\)
Hyp. Camestres \(\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\) \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})qr\); \((\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})pr ⊢ (\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})pq\)
Hyp. Baroco \(\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\) \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})qr\); \((\textrm{o-}\mathbb{C})pr ⊢ (\textrm{o-}\mathbb{C})pq\)
Hyp. Festino \(\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\) \((\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})qr\); \((\textrm{i-}\mathbb{C})pr ⊢ (\textrm{o-}\mathbb{C})pq\)

Again, the conditions of productivity depend on the kind of conditional expressed in each of the premises. For example,

If the negative [premise] is [the negation] of an implication, which is compatible with [mere] coincidence, and the affirmative [premise] affirms coincidence, then the syllogism will not be productive at all. (Qiyās VI.1, 300.2–3)

On the other hand “If the affirmative premise is an implication, the combination will be productive” (Qiyās VI.1, 300.9–10) regardless of the status of the negative premise.

All of the above moods may be proved, according to Avicenna, either by converting one of the premises or by reductio (and in the case of Baroco, by the analogue of an ecthetic proof, where the instantiated element is a specified “case and time”).

Third figure

Hyp. Darapti \(\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\) \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})rq\); \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})rp ⊢ (\textrm{i-}\mathbb{C})pq\)
Hyp. Felapton \(\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\) \((\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})rq\); \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})rp ⊢ (\textrm{o-}\mathbb{C})pq\)
Hyp. Datisi \(\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\) \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})rq\); \((\textrm{i-}\mathbb{C})rp ⊢ (\textrm{i-}\mathbb{C})pq\)
Hyp. Disamis \(\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\) \((\textrm{i-}\mathbb{C})rq\); \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})rp ⊢ (\textrm{i-}\mathbb{C})pq\)
Hyp. Bocardo \(\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\) \((\textrm{o-}\mathbb{C})rq\); \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})rp ⊢ (\textrm{o-}\mathbb{C})pq\)
Hyp. Ferison \(\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\textrm{-}\mathbb{C}\) \((\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})rq\); \((\textrm{i-}\mathbb{C})rp ⊢ (\textrm{o-}\mathbb{C})pq\)

Just as in the first and second figure, these moods are typically proved by conversion or by reductio.

Type 2: hypothetical syllogisms with a conditional and a disjunctive premise (Qiyās VI.2)

Hypothetical syllogisms consisting of a conditional and a disjunctive premise are second, in terms of complexity, only to the combination of conditionals and categoricals (type 4 below). The proof of the productive moods, in addition to the standard methods seen above, often involves turning a conditional premise into a disjunctive premise or vice versa (the analysis of these inferential relations occupies Avicenna in Qiyās VII.1–2, but he uses them freely throughout Qiyās VI, before explicitly discussing them in the subsequent treatise). Similarly, after showing that a given premise pair yields a hypothetical conclusion of a certain kind, Avicenna often shows that it also yields a hypothetical conclusion of the other kind, whether logically equivalent or simply implied by the former.

In general, for this type of premises, the classification of arguments rests on the following criteria: which premise—major or minor—is conditional and which is disjunctive; whether the shared part (here always a proposition) is the antecedent or the consequent of the conditional;[18] whether the disjunction is real or not; whether the parts of the disjunction are affirmative or negative; and whether the conditional is an implication or not.[19]

Avicenna discusses various combinations (taʾlīfāt) of syllogisms, identified first on the basis of their major and minor premises, and then differentiated according to the other parameters. Individual moods, in analogy with categoricals, are identified in function of the quality and quantity of their (hypothetical) premises. The combinations are accordingly distributed into two main groups. In the first group, syllogisms have a disjunctive major and a conditional minor. In the second group, syllogisms have a conditional major and a disjunctive minor.

Group 1 (disjunctive major, conditional minor)

Case 1: the disjunction is real and the shared part is the consequent of the conditional

Case 2: the disjunction is unreal and the shared part is the consequent of the conditional

Case 3: the disjunction is real and the shared part is the antecedent of the conditional

Case 4.1: the disjunction is unreal, the shared part is the antecedent of the conditional and is affirmative

Case 4.2: the disjunction is unreal, the shared part is the antecedent of the conditional and is negative

Group 2 (conditional major, disjunctive minor)

Case 5: the disjunction is real and the shared part is the antecedent of the conditional

Case 6.1: the disjunction is unreal, the shared part is the antecedent of the conditional and is affirmative

Case 6.2: the disjunction is unreal, the shared part is the antecedent of the conditional and is negative

Case 7: the disjunction is real, the shared part is the consequent of the conditional

Case 8: the disjunction is unreal, the shared part is the consequent of the conditional

An example of case 1, from the first group, is the following (Qiyās VI.2, 305.8–10):

\[ (\aD^{1})rq; (\aC)pr \vdash (\aC)p\neg q \]

Always, either C is D or A is B; Always, if H is Z, then C is D ⊢ Always, if H is Z, then A is not B

but also (Nağāt 82, xix)

\[ (\aD^{1})rq; (\aC)pr \vdash \aD^{1})pq \]

Always, either C is D or A is B; Always, if H is Z, then C is D ⊢ Always, either H is Z or A is B

Avicenna’s discussion, besides its intrinsic logical merits, is enriched by several examples (especially counterexamples put forward to show that certain moods are not productive) taken from the domains of physics and metaphysics.

Type 3: hypothetical syllogisms with two disjunctive premises (Qiyās VI.3)

The third type of hypothetical syllogisms is, by contrast, the simplest. It involves premise pairs with two disjunctions. Avicenna notes that as a result of the status of real disjunctions, which are both exclusive and exhaustive, there can be no combination involving two such premises. The proof of this claim involves an interesting point about the meaning of quantification in the case of disjunctions already raised at Qiyās V.5 (particular disjunctions express non-exhaustive alternatives).

Furthermore, this type is not arranged in figures because disjuncts are symmetrical (mutakāfiʾ), unlike the antecedent and the consequent of a conditional, which also implies that there is no distinction between major and minor premise (all permutations are equivalent, as they are not sensitive to order).

The combinations considered in this case all involve at least an unreal disjunction, which may be paired with a real disjunction, the negation of a real disjunction or with another unreal disjunction, where the shared part may be affirmative or negative.

The first mood, where the two premises are both affirmative and one has a negative part, is as follows (Qiyās VI.3, 321.4–5)

\[ (\aD^{3})r\neg q; (\aD^{1})pr \vdash (\aD^{1/3})\neg p\neg q \]

The proof is based on turning the two disjunctive premises into the conditional statements that logically follow from them, namely \((\aD^{3})r\neg q \vdash (\aC)\neg r\neg q\), and \((\aD^{1})pr \vdash (\aC)p\neg r\). From such conditional premises, one may easily derive the conditional conclusion \((\aC)p\neg q\), which in turn entails the disjunctive proposition \((\aD^{1/3})\neg p\neg q\).

An example with affirmative universal unreal disjunctive premises sharing a negative part is as follows (Qiyās VI.3, 323.14–324.5)

\[ (\aD^{3})\neg rq; (\aD^{3})p\neg r \vdash (\oD^{3})pq \]

which is equivalent to the following syllogism

\[ (\aC)rq; (\aC)rp \vdash (\iC)pq \]

in virtue of inferential relations holding among disjunctions and conditionals.[20]

Type 4: hypothetical syllogisms with a conditional and a categorical premise (Qiyās VI.4–5)

The first three types are pure hypothetical syllogisms. The fourth and fifth are mixed hypothetical syllogisms consisting of a hypothetical premise combined with a categorical.

The hypothetical syllogism consisting of a conditional and a categorical premise is the most prominent case in the extensive treatment of the Qiyās. The analysis occupies two chapters whose sequential order seems to be all but accidental. The classification of arguments follows familiar criteria but in this case the order of priority is different. The first parameter depends on what the shared part is. There are two main types according to whether the connection between major and minor premise obtains in the consequent (Qiyās VI.4) or in the antecedent of the conditional premise (Qiyās VI.5). The second parameter depends on whether the major is categorical or conditional.

What is shared in this case is a term that connects the categorical premise with another categorical, namely the antecedent or the consequent of the conditional premise. This entails that syllogisms of this type are in fact arguments “containing” a categorical syllogism whose conclusion is either implied by or implies another proposition. This is perhaps the reason why the main division is given in terms of whether the sharing occurs (i) in the consequent or (ii) in the antecedent, and also the reason why the former case is taken to be more relevant (or at least more common) in the sciences. For in case (i), all syllogisms will yield the conclusion of the corresponding categorical syllogism subject to a condition, namely as the consequent of a conditional statement; whereas in case (ii) the interaction between the quantification of the conditional and the quantification of the antecedent yields moods that only partially overlap with the standard set of categorical moods and that are subject to various qualifications.

Both kinds of considerations—on the more natural character of certain inference patterns and on their applicability to the sciences (Qiyās V.1, Nağāt 82)—indirectly confirm that the hypothetical syllogistic is an integral part of Avicenna's theory and practice of philosophical and scientific discourse.

Last, the two types of mixed hypothetical syllogisms are the only cases in which Avicenna systematically investigates quantified atomic propositions (an obvious consequence of the fact that he is looking at inferences which, in conditional form, very much resemble those analyzed in the categorical syllogistic).

In Qiyās VI.4, which generally deals with the group of syllogisms where the sharing occurs in the consequent of the conditional premise, Avicenna investigates two cases: the first with a categorical major and a conditional minor, the second with a conditional major and a categorical minor. It is not hard to see how this approach naturally yields conditional versions of the familiar figures and moods, in function of the position of the shared term.

In each case and figure, Avicenna distinguishes the moods also according to the kind of quantified conditionals involved in the conditional premise and in the conditional conclusion.

Case 1: categorical major, conditional minor, sharing in the consequent of the conditional; in three figures (Qiyās VI.4, 325.2–331.9)

First figure: predicate of the consequent of the conditional = subject of the categorical major

  1. universal affirmative conditional premise

    Hyp. Barbara \(\textrm{Cat-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\textrm{-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\) BaC; \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AaB} ⊢ (\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AaC}\)

    Every B is C; Always, if H is Z, then every A is B ⊢ Always, if H is Z, then every A is C (where p stands for “H is Z”)

    Hyp. Celarent \(\textrm{Cat-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\textrm{-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\) BeC; \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AaB} ⊢ (\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AeC}\)
    Hyp. Darii \(\textrm{Cat-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\textrm{-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\) BaC; \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AiB} ⊢ (\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AiC}\)
    Hyp. Ferio \(\textrm{Cat-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\textrm{-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\) BeC; \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AiB} ⊢ (\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AoC}\)
  2. particular affirmative conditional premise: Avicenna simply states that there are four productive moods, presumably the analogues of the above where the minor premise and the conclusion are i-conditionals.

  3. universal negative conditional premise: in this case, the fact that the conditional premise is negative affects the categorical consequent, which is denied at all times and under all circumstances. Avicenna presents three moods that are in fact equivalent, in virtue of the relations of mutual implication discussed in Qiyās VII.1, to three moods of case (a) (he does not explicitly discuss the hypothetical equivalent of Celarent, which is also productive via the corresponding Ferio):

    Hyp. Barbara* \(\textrm{Cat-}(\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})\textrm{-}(\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})\) BaC; \((\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AoB} ⊢ (\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AoC}\)[21]
    [Hyp. Celarent* \(\textrm{Cat-}(\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})\textrm{-}(\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})\) BeC; \((\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AoB} ⊢ (\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AiC}\)]
    Hyp. Darii* \(\textrm{Cat-}(\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})\textrm{-}(\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})\) BaC; \((\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AeB} ⊢ (\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AeC}\)
    Hyp. Ferio* \(\textrm{Cat-}(\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})\textrm{-}(\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})\) BeC; \((\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AeB} ⊢ (\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AaC}\)
  4. particular negative conditional premise: Avicenna states that there are four productive moods, which must presumably be particular versions of the previous case, if we supplement the latter with a counterpart of BeC; \((\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AoB} ⊢ (\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AiC}\) (Avicenna does not discuss this mood explicitly, but it is compatible with the general criteria of productivity he adopts, namely that the categorical major should be universal and the consequent of the conditional negative).

Second figure: predicate of the consequent of the conditional = predicate of the categorical major

  1. universal affirmative conditional premise

    Hyp. Cesare \(\textrm{Cat-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\textrm{-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\) CeB; \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AaB} ⊢ (\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AeC}\)
    Hyp. Camestres \(\textrm{Cat-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\textrm{-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\) CaB; \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AeB} ⊢ (\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AeC}\)
    Hyp. Festino \(\textrm{Cat-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\textrm{-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\) CeB; \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AiB} ⊢ (\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AoC}\)
    Hyp. Baroco \(\textrm{Cat-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\textrm{-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\) CaB; \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AoB} ⊢ (\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AoC}\)

    When the conditional is particular, Avicenna contends that there are four additional moods. Negative (universals) are treated in general terms: their criteria of productivity require the categorical major and the consequent of the conditional minor to be both affirmative or both negative, and the categorical to be universal. For example,

    Hyp. Cesare* \(\textrm{Cat-}(\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})\textrm{-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\) CeB; \((\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AoB} ⊢ (\textrm{e-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AiC}\)

    is valid in virtue of the familiar rules of transformation.[22]

Third figure: subject of the consequent of the conditional = subject of the categorical major

  1. universal affirmative conditional premise

    Hyp. Darapti \(\textrm{Cat-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\textrm{-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\) BaC; \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-BaA} ⊢ (\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AiC}\)
    Hyp. Felapton \(\textrm{Cat-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\textrm{-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\) BeC; \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-BaA} ⊢ (\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AoC}\)
    Hyp. Datisi \(\textrm{Cat-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\textrm{-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\) BaC; \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-BiA} ⊢ (\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AiC}\)
    Hyp. Disamis \(\textrm{Cat-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\textrm{-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\) BiC; \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-BaA} ⊢ (\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AiC}\)
    Hyp. Bocardo \(\textrm{Cat-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\textrm{-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\) BoC; \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-BaA} ⊢ (\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AoC}\)
    Hyp. Ferison \(\textrm{Cat-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\textrm{-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\) BeC; \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-BiA} ⊢ (\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AoC}\)

    When the conditional premises is quantified differently, the moods will be revised forms of the above, just as in the case of the first and second figure.

Case 2: conditional major, categorical minor, sharing in the consequent of the conditional; in three figures (Qiyās VI.4, 331.10–336.8).

First figure: subject of the consequent of the conditional = predicate of the categorical minor

  1. universal affirmative conditional premise

    Hyp. Barbara \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\textrm{-Cat-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\) \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-BaC; AaB} ⊢ (\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AaC}\)[23]

    Always, if H is Z, then every B is C; Every A is B ⊢ Always, if H is Z, then every A is C

    Hyp. Celarent \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\textrm{-Cat-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\) \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-BeC; AaB} ⊢ (\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AeC}\)
    Hyp. Darii \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\textrm{-Cat-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\) \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-BaC; AiB} ⊢ (\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AiC}\)
    Hyp. Ferio \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\textrm{-Cat-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\) \((\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-BeC; AiB} ⊢ (\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})p\textrm{-AoC}\)

When the conditional premise is (e-\(\mathbb{C}\)), (i-\(\mathbb{C}\)) or (o-\(\mathbb{C}\)), the moods are four in each case, in virtue of the canonical equivalences.

Second and third figure:

The four conditional moods of the second figure (where the predicate of the consequent of the conditional is the predicate of the categorical minor) and the six conditional moods of the third figure (where the subject of the consequent of the conditional is the subject of the categorical minor) are treated in a similar way. In both cases the moods correspond to those of the relevant categorical figures, in each case with four variations depending on the quality and quantity of the conditional major. The transformations are the same as above. Avicenna occasionally gives a summary of the conditions of productivity (for example, in second-figure moods where the conditional premise is a universal negative, the consequent must be particular and have the same quality as the categorical premise) without ever analyzing the case of particular conditional premises explicitly.

Last, it is worth noting that Avicenna explicitly characterizes the hypothetical syllogisms with an affirmative conditional major, a categorical minor and a shared term in the consequent of the categorical, as those in which the condition of productivity is that the categorical and the consequent of the conditional should be related in the same way as in the connections (iqtirānāt) of first-figure categorical syllogisms. In this case,

the conclusion is a conditional proposition whose consequent would be the conclusion [produced] by the two categorical [propositions], were they to be taken in isolation [i.e., not as part of a hypothetical syllogism]. (Qiyās VI.4, 331.13)

For similar reasons, the same applies to the previous case (the combination of a categorical major and a conditional minor). In this connection, Avicenna notes that the only difference between categorical syllogisms and hypothetical syllogisms with such characteristics is that in the former the conclusion “follows without qualification, while here [it follows] if something is posited” (Qiyās VI.4, 325.14–5).

The second major division of hypothetical syllogisms consisting of a conditional and a categorical premise obtains when the sharing occurs in the antecedent. The analysis of these syllogisms is the subject of Qiyās VI.5, which is the only place in the corpus where they are treated explicitly. Elsewhere (e.g., Nağāt 82), hypothetical syllogisms of this kind are said to be less used in the sciences. In spite of the structural analogy to the cases discussed above (the conclusion is still a conditional proposition, even though here the categorical “fragment” occupies the place of the antecedent), the way the quantification of the conditional and the quantification of the antecedent interact generate results that do not generally mirror categorical syllogisms. The classification is parallel to the previous case and consists of two main groups: the first with a conditional major and a categorical minor, the second with a categorical major and a conditional minor. Each group is divided into three figures, as above, and the moods of each figure are analyzed with respect the four combinations of quality and quantity of the conditional premise.

Type 5: hypothetical syllogisms with a disjunctive and a categorical premise (Qiyās VI.6)

The second kind of mixed hypothetical syllogisms consists of a disjunctive and a categorical premise (or several categorical premises). It is at least briefly mentioned in all of Avicenna’s logical works and receives a more extensive treatment in Qiyās VI.6, 349.1–354.12. Like some of the types discussed above, this kind of hypothetical syllogism is indirectly acknowledged to have an application outside the domain of formal logic, as Avicenna contends that, with certain qualifications, it expresses a mode of reasoning similar to that involved in the method of induction (Qiyās VI.6, Burhān I.7). This obtains when a hypothetical syllogism of this type expresses a complete division, the predication is real (ḥaqīqī), and the subject is the subject of the disjunctive proposition, in which case it is called “divided syllogism” (qiyās muqassam).

Avicenna explores different possibilities in turn. With the help of the shorter treatment in the Nağāt, an underlying structure may be identified, where the order is inverted with respect to the way in which materials are arranged in the Qiyās. He distinguishes between two main groups of syllogisms, one (i) in which the categorical premise is only one; the other (ii) in which multiple categoricals are involved.

In the first case, the most natural arrangement is when the minor is an affirmative categorical and its predicate is the subject of the disjunctive major. The example at Nağāt 82, xvi “Everything countable is either even or odd; every large quantity is countable; therefore, every large quantity is either even or odd” is in line with the general scheme “Always, every B is either H or Z; every C is B; therefore, always, every C is either H or Z” given at Qiyās VI.6, 353.8–9. In the Nağāt Avicenna asserts that this arrangement comes in four combinations, and both in the Qiyās and in the Nağāt he refers to the above as (a mood of) the first figure. Admissible variants seem to be those involving a particular major and minor, or a universal negative major (or affirmative with negative parts). The second figure is said to be non-productive (and is consistently not mentioned in the Nağāt), while the third figure is said to conclude by conversion but is not discussed any further.

In the second case, where the major is categorical and the minor disjunctive, the major consists in fact of multiple categoricals, which must be as many in number as the parts of the disjunction (to ensure a proper connection). Every categorical and every disjunct are connected by a term; and all the parts of the disjunction share a term.[24] This yields two basic sub-cases, each arranged in figures. A schema from the first figure associated with the notion of a complete induction is “Every C and H and Z is A; every B is either C or H or Z; therefore every B is A”. It is illustrated by the example

Every animal is a body and every plant is a body and every mineral is a body; everything that moves is either an animal or a plant or a mineral; therefore everything that moves is a body. (Nağāt 82, xvii)

Syllogisms of hypotheticals sharing an incomplete part (two disjunctions) (Qiyās VI.6, 354.13–356.6)

Hypothetical syllogisms whose premises share an incomplete part are perhaps best understood in opposition to two types of purely hypothetical syllogisms discussed above, namely those consisting of a pair of disjunctive premises and those consisting of a disjunctive and a conditional premise. In both cases, the shared part was a whole proposition. Syllogisms involving hypotheticals that share an incomplete part are a variation on the latter, determined by the fact that the shared element is a term instead of a whole proposition. They may involve either (i) two disjunctive premises or (ii) a conditional and a disjunctive premise with one term in common (in the latter case, with a conditional minor). An example is given at Nağāt 82, xx.

Avicenna’s cursory treatment of this case may be at the origin of a much more elaborate development in the analysis of this class of hypothetical syllogisms in Post-Avicennan logic, starting with Kaššī (El-Rouayheb 2010).

5.2 Repetitive Syllogistic

The repetitive (istiṯnāʾī) syllogistic covers inference patterns such as modus ponens and modus tollens (in their conditional and disjunctive variants). It constitutes the other major division of the syllogistic along with the connective (iqtirānī) syllogistic and seems to be regarded by Avicenna as somehow dependent on it (a systematic discussion of the reducibility of the former to the latter occupies part of Qiyās IX.1, where Avicenna discusses among other things the idea that the major premise of modus ponens may be in a sense redundant).

Repetitive syllogisms consist of (i) a hypothetical premise (conditional or disjunctive) containing the conclusion or its negation as one of its parts, and (ii) another premise which asserts or denies (and thereby “repeats”) part of the hypothetical premise. Example of notable argument forms of this kind are the following

\[\begin{align} p \rightarrow q, p & ⊢ q && (\textit{modus ponens})\\ p \rightarrow q, ¬q & ⊢ ¬p && (\textit{modus tollens}) \end{align}\]

where the hypothetical premise is a conditional (Avicenna also considers the case of bi-conditionals), and

\[\begin{align} p \lor^{1} q, \neg p & ⊢ q\\ p \lor^{1} q, p & ⊢ \neg q\\ p \lor^{3} q, \neg p & ⊢ q && (\textrm{disjunctive syllogism})\\ \end{align}\]

where the hypothetical premise is a disjunction (either real or unreal).

5.3 Reductio ad absurdum (qiyās al-ḫalf )

Avicenna’s account of reductio is an interesting case in which several of his technical distinctions come into play. A reductio is a compound syllogism (qiyās murakkab)—i.e., a concatenation of syllogisms—consisting of a connective hypothetical syllogism and of a repetitive syllogism. Both categorical and hypothetical propositions may be proved by reductio.

At Nağāt 91, i, Avicenna offers a straightforward example of a reductio proof of AaB in the categorical syllogism CaB; AaC ⊢ AaB, where (1) is the connective hypothetical syllogism (with a conditional minor) and (2) the repetitive syllogism (an instance of modus tollens):

  1. CaB; If ¬AaB, then AoB ⊢ if ¬ AaB, then AoC
  2. If ¬AaB, then AoC; AaC ⊢ AaB

First syllogism (connective hypothetical of type 4, with a conditional minor)

i. CaB (major premise of the initial syllogism = major premise of 1)
ii. If ¬ AaB, then AoB (minor premise of 1, based on a/o contradiction)
iii. If ¬ AaB, then AoC (i, ii, Hyp. Baroco \(\textrm{Cat-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\textrm{-}(\textrm{a-}\mathbb{C})\), Qiyās VI.4, 328).

Second syllogism (repetitive)

iv. If ¬ AaB, then AoC (conclusion of 1 = major premise of 2)
v. AaC (minor premise of the initial syllogism = minor premise of 2)
vi. AaB (iv, v, modus tollens) QED

In Qiyās VIII.3 Avicenna discusses a version of reductio in which the conclusion aimed at (maṭlūb) is a hypothetical (conditional) proposition:

Hypothetical case: (a-\(\mathbb{C}\))qr; (o-\(\mathbb{C}\))pr ⊢ (o-\(\mathbb{C}\))pq

  1. (a-\(\mathbb{C}\))qr; If ¬(o-\(\mathbb{C}\))pq, then (a-\(\mathbb{C}\))pq ⊢ if ¬(o-\(\mathbb{C}\))pq, then (a-\(\mathbb{C}\))pr
  2. If ¬(o-\(\mathbb{C}\))pq, then (a-\(\mathbb{C}\))pr; (o-\(\mathbb{C}\))pr ⊢ (o-\(\mathbb{C}\))pq

For a recent analysis of the logical properties of reductio in Avicenna and its general significance see (Hodges 2017).

6. Demonstration

The theory of demonstration represents for Avicenna not only an essential part of logic but its true culmination. Its central problems are the identification of (i) the conditions under which certainty (yaqīn) may be attained in making assertions within the context of a scientific discipline and the identification of (ii) the conditions under which completeness, relevance, and accuracy may be achieved in the process of concept formation that leads to definitions. This determines in turn the nature of the principles assumed in each science for the derivation of its own theorems, the way in which boundaries between disciplines are drawn, and more generally the overall architecture of scientific knowledge.

Avicenna’s original contributions in this area include: (1) re-casting the model of the Posterior Analytics in terms of the two fundamental notions of conception and assertion (Strobino 2010 and 2015b), associating them with (2) a more systematic, and ultimately simplified, treatment of the four Aristotelian questions (if, that, what, why) (Strobino 2015b); (3) a peculiar understanding of the notion of necessity in light of Avicenna's own distinction between the referential/substantial and the descriptional reading (Strobino 2015a); (4) a sophisticated account of per se, linked with the theory of the predicables (Strobino 2016b); (5) an elaborate model for the classification of the sciences (Strobino 2017); (6) an innovative classification of that- and why-demonstrations (Strobino forthcoming); and (7) a commitment to the applicability of formal logic as a whole to scientific discourse, for instance through the explicit acknowledgment of the fact that the principles and conclusions of demonstrative arguments may be both categorical and hypothetical propositions, and that categorical as well as hypothetical (and repetitive) syllogisms play a role in the sciences.

In this area, Avicenna’s work reflects in complex ways the influence not only of al-Fārābī but also of the Greek commentary tradition, especially Themistius and Philoponus, whose exegetical work on the Posterior Analytics, now lost in Arabic, was available to Avicenna. This becomes especially evident through implicit or explicit references to the commentators (mufassirūn) and their commentaries (tafāsīr, šurūḥ) disseminated in his own Kitāb al-Burhān (Eichner 2010, Strobino 2012, forthcoming).

6.1. Conception and Assertion

The distinction between conception (taṣawwur) and assertion (taṣdīq) comes into play in several crucial ways in Avicenna’s logic of scientific discourse.

The distinctive mark of demonstrative arguments—certainty—is characterized in terms of assertion. An assertion p is certain if and only if one holds (i) the justified belief that p and (ii) the justified belief that p cannot be otherwise; a demonstrative argument is one in which certainty is transferred from premises to conclusion. Demonstrative assertions are explicitly identified by Avicenna in the framework of a broader classification of various types of assertions of decreasing epistemic strength (certain, endoxic, suppositional, fallacious), which are in turn associated with a canonical taxonomy of logical disciplines (demonstration, dialectic, rhetoric, sophistic) (Gutas 2012; Hasnawi 2013; Black 1990).

Furthermore, Avicenna’s flavor of Aristotelian foundationalism, i.e., the view that in every science there are first principles on which everything else depends and which do not depend in turn on anything else, is expressed in terms of the need for (i) immediate assertions (taṣdīqāt) that are not grounded on further assertions and (ii) for the conceptions (taṣawwurāt) of primitive notions.

The notion of conception is also crucial for Avicenna’s theory of per se (ḏātī), where a basic distinction between types of scientific predicates depends on whether they are conceptually inseparable from their subjects or not (Strobino 2016b).

6.2 Questions

The four Aristotelian questions—if, that, what, and why—discussed in Posterior Analytics B1–2 are subject to a more systematic analysis in Avicenna’s Burhān I.5 and IV.1. In Burhān I.5, in particular, they are rearranged in three pairs with several internal subdivisions: (i) what (), with respect to the meaning of the name or with respect to the essence; (ii) why (limā), with respect to unqualified existence or with respect to existence in a given state; and (iii) if (hal)/that (anna), again with respect to unqualified existence or with respect to existence in a given state. The notion of existence in a state in (ii) and (iii) encapsulates the case of attribute ascription in its causal and factual version, respectively. The three pairs of questions may apply to both subject and predicate of a scientific statement.

Avicenna explores various relations and concludes that what- and if-questions, in some of their declensions, are more fundamental in character, as why-questions ultimately reduce to questions about the essence of something, and if-questions express crucial necessary conditions for any science, namely the existence of basic entities in its domain and the assumption of certain fundamental predicative claims about them.

The classification of questions is inspired by the idea of reducing them to the two basic paths of scientific knowledge: conception and assertion and their discursive counterparts, definition and syllogism (Strobino 2015b).

6.3 Necessity

One of the single most important theoretical revisions of the Aristotelian model concerns the notion of necessity (ḍarūra), which in fact takes on a new role in Avicenna’s system in a number of different ways. At a general level, there is an epistemic notion associated with the idea of certainty mentioned above; then there is a technical sense involved in Avicenna’s reading of necessity statements (which are unsurprisingly a major ingredient of scientific theories); and finally there is a notion of necessity associated with scientific predication, which in a way is the most fundamental of all.

Take “triangle” as a subject of predication and consider the following two sets of attributes: (i) “being a plane figure enclosed by three straight lines” or simply “being a plane figure”, and (ii) “having three angles” or “having the sum of the internal angles equal to two right angles”. All of these attributes are necessarily true of “triangle” but, according to Avicenna, they are necessarily true of their subject in two quite different ways. The first two attributes, “being a plane figure” and “being a plane figure enclosed by three straight lines” are essential attributes of “triangle” (the former is its genus, the latter is its definition); they are constitutive of it in a way that the other attributes are not. Furthermore, “being a figure” is conceptually inseparable from “triangle” and contained in its definition, in the sense that we cannot properly define “triangle”, in its true nature, without appealing to that notion. By contrast “having the sum of the internal angles equal to two right angles” is not at all required to define “triangle”, even if it is necessarily implied by it, and is in fact an attribute that we typically prove to hold of its subject. Essential attributes of the first kind are captured by definitions, and in general have an explanatory role with respect to attributes of the other kind. They explain the fact that attributes of the other kind hold of their subjects. In Aristotle’s theory of science, these two types of attributes are usually designated by the technical term “per se”.

Avicenna also originally puts his own distinction between the referential/substantial and descriptional reading to use in his theory of science. Each of the above two types of necessity (essential and non-essential) can hold on either reading. In particular, the descriptional reading, which Avicenna takes to be the default sense of necessity in scientific discourse, allows us to study the properties of a given object qua object of a certain kind (a bronze triangle qua triangle) and to make true, necessary predications about it as long as it is a triangle (but not as long as it exists, as a bronze triangle could be re-cast into a different shape and lose some of the properties that necessarily hold of it qua triangle) (Strobino 2015a).

6.4 Per se, Inseparability, Containment, and Implication

Avicenna’s elaborate account of per se predication elevates the role of a technical distinction internal to the Aristotelian model and assigns it a larger and more systematic theoretical relevance, where three levels of discourse are linked in an original way: (i) the theory of per se itself, (ii) a distinction between types of metaphysical necessity of different strength, captured by the notion of containment (taḍammun) and necessary implication (iltizām), and (iii) a distinction between types of inseparability, which grounds the other two. All three levels express in different ways the dichotomy between essential and non-essential necessity (Strobino 2016b, forthcoming).

(i) The notion of a per se attribute is ultimately linked with the idea that in a scientific theory the admissible terms must be salient properties of the objects under investigation. Avicenna argues that it is only through this regimented conceptual vocabulary that the two defining conditions of scientific knowledge (necessity and explanatory character) can be met by a theory. In doing so, he provides a systematic account of per se which elaborates on Aristotle’s cursory remarks in Posterior Analytics A4 and A22. The Aristotelian analysis of per se is based on the relation of “being part of the definition, i.e. of the essence, of something”: a term A is per se 1 with respect to another term B if and only if A is part of the definition of B while a term A is per se 2 with respect to another term B if and only if B is part of the definition of A.

Avicenna connects the definition and classification of the two primary types of per se relation to the concepts of constituent (muqawwim)—the counterpart of per se 1—and implicate (lāzim)—the counterpart of per se 2—two characteristic notions of his system associated with different kinds of metaphysical necessity.

(ii) These different kinds of metaphysical necessity are the counterparts of two types of entailment which Avicenna calls containment and necessary implication and which express necessary connections of different strength between terms. Containment is the relation between a notion and its intensional parts (i.e., the constituents of its definition, which are ontologically part of its essence). Necessary implication is a weaker form of necessity holding between two notions that are merely inseparable.

(iii) The above pairs (per se 1 and 2, and containment and necessary implication) are associated with a further distinction between two types of inseparability. The theme is developed by Avicenna especially in connection with the Isagoge, most notably in Madḫal I.5, I.6, and I.8. The first type is conceptual inseparability (the counterpart of per se 1 and containment); the second type is inseparability in imagination (the counterpart of per se 2 and necessary implication) (Strobino 2016b).

Another interesting feature of Avicenna’s account of per se is the attempt to develop systematically the Aristotelian criteria and to identify the sets of per se predicates relevant for a given kind or domain of scientific discourse. This has a significant impact on his taxonomy of the interrelations among the sciences.

6.5 Division of the Sciences

Avicenna’s classification (or division) of the sciences is a natural complement to his treatment of per se as well as being one of the most innovative attempts to develop systematically the material on the subordination of scientific disciplines in Posterior Analytics A7, A9, and A13. It is also important for an historical reason. Avicenna’s account of the division of the sciences is in fact the only part of his Burhān that actually had a direct impact on the Western Latin tradition.

The source of Avicenna’s classification is a chapter from his Burhān famously translated and encapsulated by the twelfth-century Toledan philosopher and translator Dominicus Gundissalinus (ca. 1110–1190) in his De divisione philosophiae. In the first part, Avicenna presents a basic classification of the types of hierarchical relations holding between various pairs of sciences, based on the corresponding relations holding between their underlying subjects. At the root of the division is a distinction between sciences that differ because (a) they have two distinct subjects or (b) because they treat one and the same subject in different ways. He articulates in full the primary divisions of scientific domains, offering an analysis and categorization of basic types of relations and dependencies (most notably, parthood and subordination). In the second part, Avicenna develops a complementary classification of the criteria of identity and distinctness for the sciences focusing on the ways in which sciences may have elements in common. In this context, he addresses the question from a different perspective—that of the canonical three elements of an Aristotelian science—including not only the subjects, but also scientific principles and questions (masāʾil), i.e., the conclusions of scientific syllogisms (the theorems of a science).

The use of three fundamental criteria—subject/genus (mawḍūʿ/ğins), principles (mabādiʾ), and per se attributes (ʿawāriḍ ḏātiyya)—to determine identity, overlap, or distinctness between domains of scientific inquiry is in line with Aristotelian orthodoxy. But Avicenna takes the criteria to a whole different level and articulates a complex network of relations of superordination and subordination whereby scientific knowledge is rigidly organized in hierarchical structures that reflect underlying ontological relations between their objects and attributes. For a detailed account see (Hugonnard-Roche 1988) and (Strobino 2017).

6.6 Why- and That-Demonstration

Avicenna’s re-interpretation of the distinction between a demonstration that something is the case and a demonstration why something is the case is related (i) to the classification of per se, i.e., to the types of predicates used in demonstrative arguments, and (ii) to the division of the sciences (Strobino forthcoming).

Avicenna distinguishes between two main types of demonstration in function of the types of predicates involved (in first-figure categorical syllogisms): (a) those in which the middle term expresses a per se 2 attribute of the minor, in which case the major may be either (aa) a per se 2 attribute of the middle or (ab) a per se 1 attribute of the middle; and (b) those in which the middle term expresses a per se 1 attribute of the minor, in which case the major is in most cases (ba) a per se 2 attribute of the middle, and only in two exceptional cases (bb) a per se 1 attribute of the middle (the reason is that usually demonstrations do not aim to prove that per se 1 attributes hold of their subjects, these relations being self-evident and captured by definitions).

While proving an assertion, a demonstration may merely provide an inferential justification of it or, in addition to that, also the terms that causally explain why things are the way they are. All demonstrations of the first kind are that-demonstrations; all demonstrations of the second kind are why-demonstrations.

Why-demonstrations may express why (i) a certain attribute holds of a subject or (ii) both why it holds of that subject and why it exists. In this connection, Avicenna aims to draw a distinction between two different kinds of explanation. The fact that the attribute of having the sum of the internal angles equal to two right angles holds of isosceles triangles because they are triangles is an example of the first kind: the attribute is true of something in virtue of its being true of a per se 1 attribute (in this case its genus) of that thing. The fact that vines are deciduous because they are wide-leaved is an example of the second kind. The distinction is parallel to a distinction proposed for Aristotle between application arguments and subject-attribute demonstrations (McKirahan 1992). Avicenna’s account of per se fits neatly into this scheme, where case (aa) corresponds to why-demonstration of type (ii), and case (ba) corresponds to why-demonstrations of type (i) (Strobino forthcoming).

That-demonstrations are also divided into two types, depending on whether the context is one in which there is (iii) a causal relation between subject and predicate or (iv) not. Case (iii) is the most common type of that-demonstration, which typically obtains when the middle term (in the first figure) is the effect of the existence of the major instead of being its cause (the opposite of type-(ii) why-demonstration). Case (iv) is a peculiar kind of that-demonstration which Avicenna includes to account for immediate predications where an attribute directly follows, without mediation, from something’s essence, which is the only case in which a that-demonstration may be associated with certainty; or for cases where two attributes that are both effects of a cause are used to prove one another of a subject (Strobino 2016a, forthcoming).

6.7 Logical Forms of Premises and Conclusions

A point that Avicenna borrows from al-Fārābī (Strobino 2017) is the acknowledgment of the fact that the logical forms of scientific statements (whether premises or conclusions) include both categorical and hypothetical propositions and that demonstrative arguments may be both categorical and hypothetical (or even repetitive) syllogisms. What may look like a minor technical point has in fact significant implications for a better understanding of some of Avicenna’s motives in developing his formal logic.

6.8 Formal Logic and the Logic of Scientific Discourse

Avicenna is open about the fact that the project undertaken in the investigation of formal aspects of logic goes beyond its application in the sciences (Qiyās IV.1).[25]

At the same time he is also open about the fact that the formal apparatus developed in the syllogistic is not exclusively analyzed for the sake of studying its properties as a logical system. In fact, on multiple occasions Avicenna tells us that the various tools developed for instance in the Qiyās are used in the sciences, or offers remarks on theoretical questions by specifying the default interpretation in the context of scientific reasoning. This is the case (just to mention a few significant examples) in the discussion of reductio ad absurdum and conditionals with impossible antecedents and consequents (Qiyās V.4–5); in his account of descriptional necessity as the canonical reading of necessity propositions (Burhān II.1, Qiyās II.2, Nağāt 123); in the acknowledgment that premises and conclusions of scientific syllogisms may be categorical as well as hypothetical propositions (Qiyās V.1, Burhān II.6); when he contends that certain hypothetical syllogisms are less used in the sciences (Nağāt 82); when he draws connections between the two areas (Qiyās VI.5, Burhān I.7: induction and qiyās muqassam; Burhān IV.1: if-question and conditional reasoning); or in maintaining the conditional character of certain principles in the particular sciences (Burhān II.7) (Strobino 2017).

While the formal development of logic undeniably acquires for Avicenna an autonomous status that invites its own independent theoretical questions, to see it as an entirely separate enterprise, detached from application in the context of scientific discourse, would betray a misconception of his intentions as well as of his practice.

7. Fallacies

The treatment of fallacies addresses one of the complementary conditions expressed by the definition of logic, which is supposed to deal not only with what is required in order to infer correctly what is unknown from what is known, but also with what is required to avoid error in the case of inferences that appear legitimate without being so. There is a parallel in the case of conception and definition: logic provides rules to identify and construct definitions and at the same time instructions on how to avoid common errors in the process. Avicenna’s analysis of fallacious reasoning attempts to combine (or perhaps force) Aristotle’s treatment from the Sophistical Refutations into a broader scheme driven by more systematic concerns, which even in the extensive treatment of the Cure is rather compact. The analysis of error in defining is usually covered in connection with the Posterior Analytics and the Topics (for instance at Burhān IV, Ğadal, IV, Nağāt 149). I will focus here only on the former.

The Nağāt treatment perfectly captures this complex strategy. It starts with a canonical distinction between fallacies as (i) dependent on expression (lafẓ) or (ii) dependent on meaning (maʿnā)—the familiar distinction between de dictione and extra dictionem (language-dependent and language-independent) fallacies—and pairs it with the claim that fallacies are also either dependent on (iii) the form or on (iv) the matter of an argument, an aspect that is present also in the cursory classification given in the Išārāt (Street forthcoming).

The analysis continues with an attempt to “deduct” the fallacies based on the idea that when a false conclusion is reached, then at least one of the characteristic conditions of syllogistic reasoning must not have been met. It then proceeds to articulate a detailed account of the different ways in which failure to meet those conditions corresponds to different items in Aristotle’s famous list of thirteen fallacies, which Avicenna occasionally groups or divides in slightly different ways, especially in the case of those that are dependent on expression.

The discussion ends with a recapitulation that yields something very close to Aristotle’s list, even though in a few cases it is hard to pinpoint where exactly certain items belong in the systematic analysis.

The primary reasons of error may be abstracted from a strong characterization of a syllogism. If a syllogistic argument is (a) arranged according to one of the figures and its mood is productive, (b) it has primary distinct parts (terms) and secondary distinct parts (premises), (c) its premises are true, (d) distinct from and (e) better known than the conclusion, then a true conclusion must follow. Otherwise, at least one of conditions (a)–(e) has not been met.

Avicenna unequivocally identifies two of the fallacies that are not dependent on expression with (d) and (e), namely petitio principii (muṣādara ʿalā l-maṭlūb al-awwal) and positing what is not a cause as a cause (aḫḏ or waḍʿ mā laysa bi-ʿilla ʿillatan). The latter is identified with circular proof (bayān ad-dawr), which is consistent with the doctrine of Qiyās IX.4 and Burhān II.1.

The fallacy of consequent (īhām ʿaks al-lawāzim or īhām al-ʿaks) can be traced back to a subdivision of (c).

The fallacy of combining many questions (ğamʿ al-masāʾil) is listed in the Nağāt without being discussed and it is altogether absent from the Išārāt. In Safsaṭa I.3, however, Avicenna seems to treat this case, too, as a subdivision of (c).

Two other canonical fallacies of type (ii), namely the fallacy of accident (mā bi-l-ʿaraḍ) and secundum quid (sūʾ iʿtibār al-ḥaml or iġfāl tawābiʿ al-ḥaml) are listed at the end of the Nağāt section without being discussed, although they, too, may presumably be classified as subdivisions of (c), namely errors based on taking a premise to be true which merely appears to be true.

The case of ignoratio elenchi is more problematic. The last available slot in the Nağāt list is called “sterility of the connection” (ʿaqm al-qarīna) and is seemingly not discussed in the preceding analysis. A possibility is to associate it with case (a), namely with the error resulting from failing to recognize an argument as invalid, which would however distort the original Aristotelian meaning. It may be that Avicenna fails (or refuses) to recognize ignoratio elenchi in Aristotle’s sense and perhaps turns into something like the error resulting from a lack of awareness of the form of the syllogism, which leads to accept an invalid argument as valid. This would be consistent with the Išārāt vocabulary, which introduces the “ignorance of the composition” (ǧahl at-taʿlīf) as a fallacy while at the same time failing to mention ignoratio elenchi.

In the Nağāt, fallacies dependent on expressions seem to be variously associated with cases (a)–(c). Avicenna divides this category into two main sub-cases involving (i) a simple expression (lafẓ mufrad) or (ii) a compound expression (lafẓ murakkab).

In case (i), error may result from the association of multiple meanings with an expression either in its core form (ğawhar) or in a derivative form (hayʾa). The first case is proper equivocation (ištirāk al-ism) (even though Avicenna uses the term also to refer generically to other types of language-dependent fallacies) and is in fact divided into a number of different sub-types (lafẓ muštarak, mušakkak, mutašābih, lafẓ manqūl, mustaʿār, mağāz). The second case is where Avicenna puts the counterpart of the fallacies of accent and form of expression (or inflection).

Case (ii) includes the canonical fallacies of composition (tarkīb al-lafẓ) and division (tafṣīl al-lafẓ).

The case of amphiboly (judging from the examples) seems to be treated as an independent type, associated with (b), but its omission in the final Nağāt list may suggest that Avicenna, in line with what he does in the Išārāt, possibly regards it as a sub-type of equivocation.

The treatment of fallacies is complemented by a parallel classification of fallacious assertions (propositions that are deemed to be true because of a systematic error in their evaluation) consistently discussed throughout Avicenna’s logical works (e.g., Burhān I.4, Išārāt I.6).


I use standard abbreviations for quantified categorical propositions: a-, e-, i-, and o-propositions (universal affirmative, universal negative, particular affirmative, and particular negative).

AaB “Every A is B” (kull A B)
AeB “No A is B” (lā šayʾ min A B)
AiB “Some A is B” (baʿḍ A B)
AoB “Not every A is B” (laysa kull A B)

In the case of modalized categoricals, the modality is prefixed (for the one-sided absolute proposition, I omit the identifier X1 unless required to avoid ambiguity). A full list of abbreviations is given below. For example, Ld1-AaB stands for “Every A is necessarily B as long as it is A”, M1-AiB for “Some A is possibly B”, and A-AeB for “No A is ever B”.

In the case of hypotheticals, I indicate first between parentheses quantification and type (conditional or disjunctive), followed by an indication of the quality and quantity of the parts (or, when the latter is not required, by simple propositional variables); in some cases the syntactic structure of an embedded categorical is made explicit in the above canonical form. Below are a few examples of expressions frequently used in this entry:

(a-\(\mathbb{C}\))aa “Always, if every A is B, then every C is D”
(e-\(\mathbb{C}\))ia “Never, if some A is B, then every C is D”
(i-\(\mathbb{C}\))oe “Sometimes, if not every A is B, then no C is D”
(o-\(\mathbb{C}\))ee “Not always, if no A is B, then no C is D”
(a-\(\mathbb{D}\))aa “Always, either every A is B or every C is D”
(e-\(\mathbb{D}\))ia “Never, either some A is B or every C is D”
(i-\(\mathbb{D}\))oe “Sometimes, either not every A is B or no C is D”
(o-\(\mathbb{D}\))ee “Not always, either no A is B or no C is D”
(a-\(\mathbb{C}\))pq “Always, if p, then q
(a-\(\mathbb{C}\))p-AaB “Always, if p, then every A is B”

Occasionally, a more fine-grained distinction between types of conditionals (luzūmī or ittifāqī) or types of disjunctions (exclusive and exhaustive; exclusive but non-exhaustive; inclusive) is required. Similarly, it is sometimes necessary to identify antecedents and consequents of conditionals (for conversion and inferential relations with disjunctions). In such cases the above abbreviations are expanded to include the required additional information. For instance to express the claim that a universal affirmative exclusive and exhaustive disjunction implies a universal affirmative luzūmī conditional in which antecedent and consequent are contradictories and may be any of the parts of the disjunctive, I will write that (a-\(\mathbb{D}\)1)a1a2 implies (a-\(\mathbb{C}\)l)a1o2, (a-\(\mathbb{C}\)l)a2o1, (a-\(\mathbb{C}\)l)o1a2, and (a-\(\mathbb{C}\)l)o2a1, where superscript “l” stands for luzūmī, and the superscript numbers are used to track the disjuncts where they appear as antecedent or consequent of the conditional statements.


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