Notes to Infinite Regress Arguments
1. Talk of ‘first’ and ‘last’ members here is just a matter of convention. We could just as well have said that an infinite regress is a series of appropriately related elements with a last member but no first member, where each element relies upon or is generated from the previous in some sense. What direction we see the regress going in does not signify anything important.
2. This entry will be focused on philosophical issues that arise when considering various regress arguments in different domains. It will not be especially concerned with an issue that some writers have focused on: whether there is a general form of argument under which all regress arguments can be subsumed: see inter alia Black 1996, Gratton 1997 and 2009, Löwenstein 2017, Passmore 1961 (Ch. 2), and Wieland 2013a, 2013b and 2014 for relevant discussion. We will also not take a stand here on the issue of whether every infinite regress that is vicious is vicious for the same reason. See Nolan (2001, 2019) and Cameron (2022, section 1.2).
3. Some philosophers are happy to simply accept contradictions in certain cases, but this is an unorthodox view. See the entry on dialetheism.
4. We will use ‘fundamental’ to simply mean something which is not ontologically dependent on anything, and when \(x\) is ontologically dependent on \(y\) we will say that \(y\) is more fundamental than \(x\). While not uncommon (See inter alia Bennett 2017, Cameron 2008, Schaffer 2009), this is not entirely uncontroversial. See Barnes 2012 and 2018 for an attempt to pull apart the notions of metaphysical priority/fundamentality and ontological dependence. See Wilson 2014 (560–1) for an argument that fundamentality should not be defined in terms of the absence of dependence (or, indeed, in any terms at all).
5. In his commentary on Aristotle’s Physics, Aquinas says “Those things are called causes upon which other things depend for their being.” See Cohoe 2013, from where this translation of Aquinas is taken, for discussion of this in the context of Aquinas’s regress argument.
6. The Rawlsian project of reflective equilibrium sometimes sounds like a kind of Coherentism, but Rawls is concerned with our epistemic justification of our normative beliefs, not about the source of the normativity in the first place. See the entry on reflective equilibrium for discussion.
7. Of course, particular versions of Foundationalism and Coherentism might be motivated by other considerations. Epistemic anti-Infinitism, e.g., has sometimes been motivated by the thought that even if in principle infinite regresses of justification are possible, finite minds like ours could not have justified beliefs by such a method. (See e.g. the discussion of ought-implies-can arguments in Aikin 2011 (Ch.2).) That kind of regress argument is like the cases discussed in section 1.2 where we have independent reason for thinking that a domain in question is finite.
8. We can guarantee that \(A\) is not amongst the Ys by the transitivity and irreflexivity of the proper parthood relation. Since the \(X\)s are proper parts of \(A\) and the \(Y\)s are proper parts of one of the \(X\)s, the assumption that \(A\) is amongst the \(Y\)s entails by transitivity that \(A\) is amongst the proper parts of \(A\), which is ruled out by irreflexivity.
9. Some people defend the possibility of infinite regresses in set-membership. This requires defending a non-well-founded set theory. See Cameron 2022 (Ch.2), Incurvati 2014, and Rieger 2000 for philosophical defences of various non-well-founded set theories. See also the entry on non-wellfounded set theory.
10. This is a departure from his earlier view (Schaffer 2003) where, apparently holding fixed the idea that the fundamental things would have to be mereological simples, he thought that there was no good reason to rule out the possibility of infinite mereological descent, and hence no good reason to believe in a fundamental level.
11. Actually Schaffer’s view is slightly more complicated: some complex objects may depend on their proper parts, but ultimately everything is dependent on the one fundamental thing that has every thing as a part.
12. Of course, as Bliss acknowledges (2013, 415), whether Metaphysical Foundationalism can provide an account of why things exist in the first place is itself debatable, since often at least the fundamental entities themselves are taken to exist without any explanation.
13. See Väyrynen 2013 for a related discussion in the normative case.
14. This assumption can of course be challenged. See Skow 2015 (104–105).
15. Not everyone agrees, of course. See inter alia Bliss 2014, Cameron 2022 (Chs. 4 & 5), and Jenkins 2011. Cf. Barnes 2018, and Thompson 2016 and 2018.