Interpretivism about law offers a philosophical explanation of how institutional practice—the legally significant actions and practices of political institutions—modifies legal rights and obligations. Its core claim is that the way in which institutional practice affects the law is determined by certain principles that explain why the practice should have that role. Interpretation of the practice purports to identify the principles in question and thereby the normative impact of the practice on citizens’ rights and responsibilities.
Interpretivism is famously associated with Ronald Dworkin, who developed the position in a number of publications spanning 45 years (see the works of Dworkin cited in the Bibliography). Dworkin’s writings have stimulated a great deal of debate (the following are some examples from the vast secondary literature: Mitchell 1983; Cohen 1984; Hart 1994 (Postscript); Raz 1972, 1986, 1994: Chapters 10 and 13, 2001; Finnis 1992; Coleman 2001b; Brink 2001; Burley 2004; Hershovitz 2006a; Ripstein 2007; Shapiro 2007; Smith 2010; Gardner 2012; Greenberg 2014; Hershovitz 2015). In this entry, we shall focus on the explanation of the position that was developed and defended by Dworkin (though not necessarily on his way of presenting or defending it).
- 1. The grounds of law
- 2. The orthodox view
- 3. Hybrid Interpretivism
- 4. Pure, nonhybrid interpretivism
- 5. Why does institutional practice matter?
- 6. Disagreement
- 7. Related Theories
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. The grounds of law
Interpretivism is a thesis about the fundamental or constitutive explanation of legal rights and obligations (powers, privileges, and related notions) or, for short, about the grounds of law. In the relevant sense, some fact grounds another when the latter obtains in virtue of the former; and the relation between the two facts is explanatory in a non-causal, metaphysical sense of constitutive determination. (See Fine 2012 and other essays in Correia and Schnieder 2012). Consider the fact that, if you buy a mobile phone at a store in London and it turns out to be defective, you have a right, which is enforceable through the courts, to have it replaced or repaired by the seller, provided the defect existed when the phone was delivered and became apparent not later than two years from delivery. In virtue of what does the right obtain? What makes it the case, more abstractly, that any legal right or obligation obtains? What makes the proposition that some right or obligation exists true, if it is true? (Dworkin 1986; Stavropoulos 2017.) What sorts of nonlegal facts do legal rights and obligations depend upon in this fundamental way, and what is the character of the relation of dependence that holds between legal rights and obligations and the nonlegal facts in virtue of which they obtain? What is the order in which the relevant factors appear within the fundamental explanation?
Legal rights and obligations vary when certain institutional and other nonmoral social facts vary; and cannot vary as long as such facts remain the same. The class of relevant facts most prominently includes institutional practice, the actions or practices of political institutions and ultimately the actions and psychology of the agents that operate within such institutions. You came to have the right to have the defective phone replaced or repaired by the seller and under the conditions mentioned when certain facts of this kind obtained: most directly, when the European Parliament and the Council of the EU adopted a certain Directive and the UK Parliament adapted its own legislation to give effect to it. You did’t have that specific right under the specific conditions before these actions were taken, and there is no guarantee you will retain the right now that the UK has completed its withdrawal from the EU and may take unilateral action to modify or abolish it. You couldn’t have come to have the right or, once you did, to lose it, unless some facts of that character obtained. Your right is therefore contingent upon and varies with the actions and practices of political institutions. The task for theories of law is to offer an account of legal rights and obligations that explains these relations. Legal positivism is an account of legal rights and obligations that appeals, at the fundamental level, exclusively to institutional and other nonmoral social considerations. Interpretivism is a kind of natural law or “nonpositivist” theory since it claims that, in addition to institutional practice (and perhaps other nonmoral social factors), certain moral facts necessarily play some role in the explanation. It makes a number of related distinctive claims within that approach.
First, interpretivism says that the explanation of rights and obligations in which both moral principles and institutional practice play some role is a kind of interpretation. Interpretation in the relevant sense is the study of normatively significant objects or of the actions of producing such objects and the practices within such production takes place. It is a familiar point from literary and other kinds of interpretation in the arts that an interpretation may impute to its object a certain content that consists in or reflects its normative significance or impact, without thereby imputing the content to the psychology of the agent who produced the object; it is also a familiar point that an interpretation’s success does not depend on such endorsement. In the case of law, an interpretation so understood may correctly identify, say, the change in rights and obligations that obtained in virtue of some enactment, even though the enactment’s having that impact was not considered and endorsed, in some specified sense, by the enacting institution.
Second, interpretivism says that interpretation identifies some moral principles which justify, in some specified sense, the enactment’s having the impact in question. The point generalizes. For institutional practice as a whole, or for any individual action or attitude or other aspect of the practice, certain moral principles justify its having the impact on the law that it does have. The principles thereby make it the case that it has it.
Third, for interpretivism, the justifying role of principles is fundamental: for any legal right or obligation, some moral principles ultimately explain how it is that institutional and other nonmoral considerations have roles as determinants of the right or obligation. In the order of explanation, morality comes first.
The relevant notion of justification has two aspects. First, the principles and therefore the moral facts that they reflect give reasons why any aspect of institutional practice or other nonmoral consideration bears on legal rights and obligations. The principles therefore explain why any such consideration is legally relevant. Second, the principles thereby determine how any such consideration bears on rights and obligations. An interpretivist might say that certain principles of fairness or procedural justice give enactments some role in determining rights and obligations. The precise role depends on the precise reasons why enactments should have it. An appeal to principles of fair notice might give, other things equal, a central role specifically to the plain meaning of the text of enactments. But on the hypothesis that democratically constituted assemblies have justified power to shape rights and obligations as they choose, some conception of such assemblies’ linguistic intentions, or of their intention to affect the law in some particular way by the relevant enactment, might be given priority. There may be special cases. An interpretivist might say that, because fair notice is essential to the permissibility of criminal punishment, criminal statutes affect the law only as narrowly construed. An interpretivist might further say that, in all cases, certain more specific moral principles control “the operation and effect” of all laws (as the Riggs v. Palmer court famously said, 115 NY 506 (1889)).
Similar hypotheses would be germane to cases or institutional practice in general. For example that, because government ought to treat morally like alike when it exercises its coercive power, judicial decisions should stand; such that past decisions partly determine what rights and duties now obtain in circumstances similar to those of precedent cases in their morally relevant respects. Or, more abstractly, that, because government has a duty to bring its action under a coherent scheme of principle when it recognizes and enforces claims against some person, its institutional practice affects rights and obligations as certain principles dictate: namely the principles which together justify the practice’s having that role. In these examples, the moral facts that the principles express explain why and how the institutional action in question affects legal rights and duties and therefore the principles’ role is to assign to institutional practice, or any of its aspects, their own role in the explanation.
Fourth, since in these explanations the mechanism, through which institutional practice determines rights and obligations, follows from some moral principles that give the practice that very role, the rights and obligations so determined have genuine moral force. For other conceptions of law, the question of the moral force of rights and obligations in law is separate from and must come after the question of how institutional practice constitutes them (Stavropoulos 2012). We first ask how the practice determines rights and obligations, which is a conceptual or otherwise nonmoral question that aims to identify the legally relevant aspects of institutional practice. Since our investigation is nonmoral, these must be understood as the factors that determine the content of legal rights and obligations, though not their force. We then ask the moral question, left open by the initial investigation, whether rights and obligations so determined truly bind. (Typically, the question takes the form of whether we have an obligation to obey the law.) The appropriate moral question is therefore severely constrained by the answer to the first, nonmoral one. We should ask what would have to be true if the institutional factors already identified as legally relevant were to constitute genuine moral rights and obligations. And of course there is no guarantee that what would have to be true would be true as often as one might suppose, or that it could be true at all. Perhaps legal rights and obligations are rarely or never morally ratified.
This approach separates the metaphysical investigation of grounds from the moral investigation of force. Considered from this perspective, a moral explanation of how institutional practice determines rights and obligations of the sort offered by interpretivism may seem to belong in the second part of a complete account of the phenomenon of law, the part that concerns whether legal rights and obligations, nonmorally identified, have genuine moral force.
However, interpretivism is a thesis about the grounds of legal obligation which purports to compete with the two-stage and other such theses, not a thesis merely about the force of the obligations that institutional practice constitutes in some nonmoral way. Rather, interpretivism builds moral investigation into the metaphysical one. The moral explanation that it offers assumes no nonmoral prior account of grounds and leaves no residual question whether legal obligations have moral force.
That said, there is an important distinction between two ways of understanding the interpretivist claim that institutional practice and moral facts both play roles in the explanation of legal rights and obligations.
On the first way of understanding the claim, institutional practice constitutes by itself part of the law; moral facts constitute by themselves another part; and the final content of the law is some function of the two parts. On the second, institutional practice is one factor in the explanation but does not constitute any part of the law. Rather, morality and institutional practice both figure in the constitutive explanation of the law in the sense that the practice determines the content of the law as certain moral facts dictate and in virtue of those facts.
As we will see, a different version of interpretivism corresponds to each way of reading the claim that institutional practice and morality together ground legal rights and obligations. The first version, hybrid interpretivism, which understands institutional practice as an independent ground, may give rise to a concern of moral bias in the approach to the metaphysical problem. For it is reasonable to suspect that this kind of interpretivist sets out with the goal of finding moral force in the law, and the purpose of combining the institutional base with a moral overlay is to secure such force. On the second version, pure or nonhybrid interpretivism, which reflects the second reading of the distinction, there is no scope for such bias. For according to that version morality mandates the constitutive role that the theory assigns to institutional practice; while there is no nonmorally predefined route through which the practice is supposed to determine any obligations.
It will help to develop these claims in comparison to the orthodox view about how institutional practice affects legal rights and obligations.
2. The orthodox view
On the orthodox view (reflected in Hart 1994, and developed in its strongest form in Raz 1994), questions about the existence and content of legal rights and obligations are questions purely of institutional history. Legal rights and obligations are creatures of institutional action. Institutions that count as authoritative in a legal system create, modify, or extinguish a legal right or obligation primarily through communication (see e.g. Hart 1994 at 124). Institutional communication has its own logic. When an institution passes a statute or adopts a regulation, it must be understood to be conveying a norm (a standard that mandates or permits some action) or, more precisely, to be conveying the institution’s intention to create, by the act of conveying the intention, a norm with the stipulated content. From the perspective of the institution, such an act of communication always has the force of a binding order that subjects are meant to obey and brings into existence a binding norm, namely that subjects ought to take the stipulated action. The norms produced by institutional communication so understood (and possibly also the norms that institutions consider and tacitly endorse in their customary practices) are valid norms of the system and make up the entire content of the law. A legal right or obligation exists when and in virtue of the fact that a norm that is part of the law so understood confers or imposes it, therefore ultimately in virtue of the fact that some institution said so. On the orthodox view, it is a basic, conceptual truth about law that institutional action determines legal rights and obligations in this way.
These considerations describe the mechanism through which authoritative institutional action constitutes rights and obligations. Further questions arise. What makes for authoritativeness in the relevant sense (which institutions count as authoritative in the system)? How is legal validity related to moral force?
The question which institutions count as authoritative in the system is to be settled in the first instance by other norms constituted by authoritative directive that count as more fundamental. But this kind of explanation can only go so far. To avoid regress, the question must be settled ultimately by some factor other than an authoritatively created norm. A prominent suggestion is that the factor that ultimately explains legal authority is the settled official practice of recognition of the action of certain agents or institutions as a source of norms (a practice that may be considered itself as constituting a customary norm that is tacitly endorsed in and regulates official practice and from which legal institutions ultimately derive their authority to create valid norms; Hart 1994).
On the other hand, the considerations in discussion settle the legal relevance of institutional decisions: the decisions matter to the law as institutionally valid norms that impose obligations, which are genuine moral obligations from the point of view of the system (Raz 1990; contra Hart 1982). They settle, at the same time, the terms in which the further question of the decisions’ genuine normative relevance must be posed. This becomes the question whether institutional communications work as advertised, such that they truly create norms (norms that are valid outright, not merely in the eyes of the institution that produced them) and therefore whether subjects do acquire an obligation to take some action because the relevant institution said so. In sum, the question of the genuine normative relevance of institutional action becomes the question of whether the institutions have legitimate authority so understood (Raz 1990). Finally, these considerations leave open the question of what moral conditions must be met for the institutions to have legitimate authority. This is the business of theories of justification of authority, which include theories that appeal to consent, political association, democracy, or the ability of legal authority to secure cooperation or help subjects better conform to right reason. (For an overview, see the entry on authority; see further Finnis 1980, 1989; Raz 1986; Dworkin 1986. Notice that on Dworkin’s view political obligation is grounded in political association. Association generates obligations that associates owe one another, rather than an obligation to obey authoritative directives.)
Some writers defend a less austere version of this model, by weakening the notion of legal validity. They say that the validity of a norm needn’t depend solely on whether an institution has conveyed the norm but may further depend on certain moral conditions, provided such conditions are laid down by more fundamental institutionally created norms. For example, if the Constitution entrenches some values, the conditions of validity of norms created by ordinary legislation would include those values. In such a case, the values would play the crucial role only because some institution—a constitutional assembly—said so. In another variant, values may be made relevant to legal validity by the customary norm that governs judicial practice, which is the most fundamental norm, constitutive of a legal system. In that case, the nonnormative social fact of custom that constitutes the fundamental norm would make the values relevant to the validity of ordinary norms (Coleman 2001a). In all these cases, rights and obligations in law are explained ultimately by nonnormative social facts, but moral facts occupy some place further up in the order of explanation.
3. Hybrid Interpretivism
Hybrid interpretivism represents another possibility along that spectrum. It begins at the austere norm-based explanation of law but defends an even more inclusive conception.
For hybrid interpretivism, the set of institutionally valid norms—the norms determined by what the institutions said—forms the interpretive baseline. Interpretation is a kind of moral processing of these norms. To interpret is to assess the norms constituted by institutional communication and adjust the set in order to make it more attractive in some way—to make it better conform to the abstract point of legal practice against which it is interpreted. Hybrid interpretivism is therefore the thesis that the institutional input to the interpretive process—what the institutions said—does not alone yield the final, complete set of legally valid norms. Rather, the final set of valid norms is the output of the process. The final set takes as an additional input certain moral facts. Yet the contribution of each kind of input remains distinct. Each episode of institutional communication, by itself, creates an institutionally valid norm which it makes available for interpretive scrutiny. The hybrid interpretivist considers as settled, without reference to any moral or other substantive normative facts, how the contingencies of institutional practice contribute to the law: he relies on the orthodox explanation of that mechanism (cf. Raz 1986, attributing the hybrid view to Dworkin). But he thinks that there are additional conditions of validity. Substantive normative facts may filter, supplement, or otherwise modify the original norms, as dictated by the interpretive goals in play. Legal validity of a norm now entails that the norm was either created by official communication and survived interpretive scrutiny or that it bears a certain relation, defined by the general point of legal practice, to such survivor norms.
One variant of hybrid interpretivism is the conception of law as consisting of both rules and principles. This is typically attributed to Dworkin’s early work (Dworkin 1978; notice that Dworkin actually disowns this view: 1978, at 76). Institutions convey rules, as Hart claimed. These are screened and rejected or modified to the extent that they conflict with certain basic moral principles of fairness or justice, as they did in Riggs. Rules are also supplemented with non-conflicting principles in hard cases, where the rules alone yield no determinate results. In such cases, the principles fill the gaps. The law is the hybrid of the two sets of standards generated by the filtering and gap-filling operation.
A sophisticated variant of this view can be built around the notion of principled consistency (“integrity”) which, according to Dworkin’s later work, is a distinct political virtue that forms the foundation of law (Dworkin 1986). Taking principled consistency in the law as an interpretive target, the interpreter identifies a set of principles that together justify the given set of norms. The interpreter works therefore with two sets of norms, one composed of norms conveyed by institutions, the other composed of uncreated, genuine moral norms—general moral principles. He is to compare the two sets, and adjust the first in light of the second. He may then say that the law now includes both the original norms and the principles (or perhaps some further norms determined by the principles). Like its older, rules-and-principles cousin, the law is a hybrid, a creature of the two separate sets of standards, one grounded in social facts, the other in moral facts, that interpretation blends together (cf. Raz 1986). (A closely related variant says that the law is simply the set of principles that best justifies the institutionally given norms or, more loosely, the legal and political practices that generate them; Greenberg 2014).
In this operation, the principles (and the further norms that they determine) are valid in virtue of the relation of justification they bear to the original norms. In the presently relevant sense of justification, an eligible principle is one that reflects an ideal arrangement, prescinding from institutional practice, against which norms that the practice produced are measured, provided the principle is at least logically consistent with the norms. Consider principles that set out the morally right way to identify and deal with private wrongs, setting aside the actual practice of institutions in that area. Such principles would be germane to the project of designing institutions of tort from scratch or of reforming existing ones. But for some principles to be said to justify some actual, institutionally created, norms of tort, as the hybrid interpretivist says his favoured principles do, it wouldn’t be enough that the principles captured the relevant ideals. They would further need to be at least consistent, in some specified sense, with the norms. A principle wouldn’t count as justifying an institutionally created norm in any sense, when it prohibited what the norm required or permitted. For any putative set of justifying principles, it’s a condition of eligibility additional to and independent of merit that the principles be consistent, in some specified sense, with the set of the original norms.
The understanding of principled consistency used in this conception of interpretivism corresponds to one understanding of Dworkin’s famous distinction between fit and justification as dimensions of interpretation (Dworkin 1986). Dworkin said that correct interpretation must both fit and justify its object. On the understanding in discussion, fit operates as a threshold constraint on eligibility of interpretations. Independent moral appeal governs the choice among alternatives that pass the threshold (cf. Raz 1994: 223). Fit, on this conception, is meant to ensure that a candidate interpretation is indeed an interpretation of some object rather than an invention. It is a nonmoral constraint, in two ways. First, it is meant to secure consistency with a set of norms that are grounded in nonmoral considerations—in the action and psychology of agents and institutions. Second, the relevant notion of consistency itself is meant to be nonmoral, a constraint of formal consistency between norms and principles. (See Greenberg 2004 on fit as a matter of formal consistency with practice. Greenberg argues that a constraint of formal consistency is empty.) The thought is that the original set of norms could not really constrain interpretation if substantive, moral considerations played some role in determining what it is to fit the norms. If the notion of fit were tainted by the very kind of consideration that defines the ideals against which the actual norms are to be measured, the distinction between interpreting the actual practice of institutions and inventing a new, better practice would be erased.
In order to pursue principled consistency in the law while taking the set of institutionally created norms as the baseline, the interpreter will have to aim at a composite objective, which can be analysed into its components. He will have to strive for principle and for consistency.
Some of the time, the interpreter may be able to pursue both objectives simultaneously without difficulty. Given some principles that justify norms in this sense, the interpreter might add to the set certain further norms such as those implied by the explicit communication that constitutes the original norms, if adding those norms would give better effect to the principles and thereby improve principled consistency (on the current understanding of that notion) in the way government treats its citizens. Or he may add certain norms that correspond to the relevant principles so do not conflict with the prior, institutionally communicated norms with which by hypothesis the principles are consistent, whether or not the new norms are implied by the prior norms. Or (if this is different) he may add the norms that judges are morally required to rely on in order to resolve residual matters in domains that are only partially regulated by the original set. In his view, the expanded rather than the original set of standards would be valid law.
But the interpreter can’t reasonably hope that his work will always be so easy. Even assuming a fairly decent institutional history, the set of norms that would form the baseline would be the product of political action taken by different agents at different times, with a variety of motives and facing different political and other constraints in their choices (Raz 1994). The norms produced might conflict in their justification, some consistent with one scheme but indefensible under another. There might be no scheme of independently appealing principles—certainly not a perfectly just and otherwise compelling scheme—consistent with all the norms without exception. If the baseline included a norm that couldn’t be justified by his favored scheme of principle, the interpreter might have to try a different, less than perfect scheme, under which the problematic norm might be subsumed, and trade merit for consistency. But even if he were willing to accept a measure of imperfection in a scheme’s appeal, he might fail to find any eligible scheme, in which case he would have to reject the norm. Of course, if the communicated norms were to function as a fundamental, pre-interpretive constraint, rejection would have to be rare and subject to special justification. Only something about the remaining institutional norms—that they all cohered with a given set of principles—could allow the interpreter to reject the outlier.
On the other hand, there might be several mutually inconsistent schemes of principle, each consistent with the original set of norms. The interpreter would therefore have to choose from among these schemes on grounds other than consistency with institutional practice. Normally it would not be permissible, on this model, to add a principle to the original set of norms (or to rely upon it to generate more norms) just because it was attractive. Rather, the principle would have to bear a relation at least of consistency with some norm in the original set. But, in case that relation did not uniquely determine the principles in a scheme, the interpreter would have to choose without being able to ground the choice by appeal to the original set. He would have to choose on merit alone. (This is a consequence of the model that has attracted a lot of criticism. See Raz 1994: 223–6; Finnis 1987, 1992. For Dworkin’s protests that the distinction is merely heuristic, and should not be understood to mark two different dimensions of interpretation, see Dworkin 1982, 1986, 2006.)
A harder problem would arise where there are multiple candidate schemes of principle that are unequal in both independent appeal and consistency, and imperfect in each dimension. Should the interpreter reject more of the original norms in return for an improvement in appeal, or accept a larger compromise in appeal for a gain in consistency? At least in some cases, where the relative gains and losses would not be disproportionate on some conception of their magnitude, the interpreter could not appeal to either merit or consistency to justify a choice and it is unclear to what else he might appeal.
There are further difficulties. Hybrid interpretivism gives us no reason to abandon a sharp distinction between the pre-interpretively given corpus of institutionally valid norms constituted by communication alone, on which interpretation operates, and the final set of norms that interpretation yields. It therefore makes it seem that the question whether the law is limited to the unprocessed input or extends to the processed output is merely verbal (Hart 1994, Postscript; Schauer 1996; Greenberg 2011a).
Given these problems, hybrid interpretivism makes interpretation too close to cooking the books to make them reflect some ideal which, if left alone, they fail. It is reasonable to take it, not as a doctrine about what determines the content of the law, but instead as an argument about how best to decide hard cases given the law (now understood to be restricted to the institutionally communicated norms). It becomes a theory of adjudication, which builds upon the orthodox explanation of how institutional action creates rights and obligations, namely by conveying norms, and recommends some way of resolving disputes given those norms. Even so reinterpreted, problems remain. For hybrid interpretivism now seems to recommend that judges extend the effect of any norms they find (or at least the ones not bad enough to fail the test of consistency with even the least acceptable scheme of principle) into situations the norms don’t explicitly or clearly regulate, and it’s doubtful that some political ideal should support this conservative policy (Raz 1986: 1111, 1994: 224).
The immediate source of the difficulties lies in the composite character of the ideal of principled consistency deployed by hybrid interpretivism, which entails that the interpreter must simultaneously aim at consistency and merit, understood as separate targets which needn’t coincide. Given the difficulties, it is unclear that interpretation could secure completeness, understood as the potential to resolve all possible disputes (which is often understood to be interpretation’s further, perhaps basic objective; see Raz 1994; Finnis 1987; see also Leiter 2007, who claims that the thesis that there is a right answer to all legal questions is at the core of Dworkin’s project). The composite conception of principled consistency is forced upon hybrid interpretivism by its fundamental commitment, to which the difficulties are ultimately traced: that the starting point of interpretation must be some norms constituted by the contingencies of institutional communication, and that interpretation’s purpose is to compare and somehow to reconcile those norms with ideals.
The hybrid interpretivist may claim that it is a deep constitutive fact about law that the institutional input to the law must be interpreted in the relevant sense. Still, his view is hybrid in that it takes as the fundamental, pre-interpretive constituent of the law some norm-creating acts of communication. So the basic explanation of the legal relevance of political decisions—that the decisions matter to legal rights and obligations and indeed that they matter as such communications—is not itself interpretive in character. The fact that, other things equal, an institution’s say-so makes law, is a primitive legal fact, or at least a legal fact that is not to be explained by either the nature of interpretation or some substantive interpretive conclusion in the legal domain. Hybrid interpretivism is not therefore faithful to the basic interpretivist idea that the legal relevance of institutional practice is fundamentally explained by some political ideals. For example, that the fact that it’s the duty of government to treat its citizens in a manner consistent in principle makes institutional decisions relevant to their legal obligations, rather than supplement the decisions or filter their results.
Before we turn to that alternative, it is worth noting that hybrid interpretivism differs from the view, not similarly unfaithful to the basic interpretivist idea, that some political ideal (perhaps involving fair notice) makes it the case that institutional decisions contribute to the law the norms that the decisions are widely understood to express or endorse. (An example is the doctrine Dworkin calls “conventionalism”, an interpretive conception of law that he rejects as inferior to the conception he calls “integrity”.) For such a view, political ideals and institutional history would together constitute the content of the law in the right way. As a result, interpretation would be over at the stage of identification of the norms. Hybrid interpretivism, by contrast, takes the norms as the object of interpretation and so its starting point, not its end.
4. Pure, nonhybrid interpretivism
Pure interpretivism is nonhybrid. It understands principles, institutional practice, and their relation differently.
Interpretivism begins at the question how institutional practice bears on rights and obligations. For hybrid interpretivism, this question is, at least in part, pre-empted by the orthodox view on which it builds. Recall that according to the orthodox view, the practice itself (and ultimately the very idea of law as that is commonly understood; cf. Raz 1986: 1114, 1994: 235 ff.) determines how the practice bears on rights and obligations. This is so because the practice consists in communication or tacit endorsement of norms which is meant to place subjects under obligations just by virtue of communicating or endorsing the norms. By taking all this as given, hybrid interpretivism begs in some considerable part the fundamental question at which interpretivism says one must begin.
In doing so, hybrid interpretivism commits itself to the existence of some normative content—the norms and the obligations that follow from them—that is constituted by institutional practice alone. Moral principles contribute some more normative content, and the final content imputed to the law is some combination of the two.
By shedding the orthodox base layer of its hybrid counterpart, pure, nonhybrid interpretivism takes no part of the basic question as settled in that way. It therefore does not take the practice already to contribute norms, obligations, or any other kind of normative content, whether outright or from a point of view, or to consist in communication that conveys or is intended to constitute normative content. It understands the idea that the practice, nonnormatively specified, plays a role in the fundamental explanation of the content of the law differently: the practice is a factor in the explanation, but does not alone constitute any content. Nonhybrid interpretivism says that moral principles determine how the practice may determine such content.
There are several important implications. Institutional practice is conceived in terms of actions and attitudes, not norms or communication of norms. We start at what people do and say and think. Assemblies draft, debate, amend, and enact statutes. Agencies develop and adopt regulations. Courts consider disputes, resolve them and issue opinions, including dissents, which offer reasons that support resolving the disputes in one or another way. In short, institutions and agents operating within them take actions, including the action of producing certain texts or utterances, and hold a variety of attitudes, whose role as determinants of legal rights and obligations is itself determined by the moral principles in play. The principles may assign a certain legal significance to the fact that some assembly produced a text with some linguistic content. It does not follow from the fact that the action of producing the text is legally relevant that the action constituted a norm with the same content. Nonhybrid interpretivism does not assume that institutional practice consists in communication of norms with its own logic that is logic of the law. It does not assume that the practice contains in itself the particular way in which enactments or decisions “are meant” to constitute obligations. How institutional actions constitute obligations (the metaphysical mechanism) a matter for theory. There is no special, privileged institutional perspective so no internal, perspectival notion of obligation.
A further implication is that legal obligations are not constituted by the say-so of institutions, nor are their contents determined by what institutions said. A legal obligation need not match the content of official language (though a variety of moral factors will often see to it that it does) and needn’t be an obligation to take action for the reason that some institution said so. If that’s obedience, legal obligation needn’t be obligation to obey.
It follows that the purpose of moral explanation is not to assess the moral force of obligations whose content (and perspectival existence) is given in advance of the explanation. It is to explain how obligations come to obtain, and therefore what their content is. No prior question of content is taken as settled, and no further question of force is left open.
Since it competes, rather than build upon, the orthodox view that institutions communicate or tacitly endorse norms (which thereby become legally valid), pure interpretivism has no use for the orthodox notion of norms understood to play substantial explanatory roles (or for a metaphysically important notion of a law, as distinct from the informal notion that picks out statutes or other legislation). It is not a doctrine about the conditions of validity of norms. Legal norms (or other standards) may figure in conclusions of reasoning that summarize the legal effect of institutional practice and are useful for exposition. Since standards so understood are derived from the explanation of the legal effect of practice, their existence is not constitutively responsible for the effect. Standards may also play an epistemic role: we may draw inferences about what rights and obligations exist from tried and tested formulations of standards, but the inferences are always subject to independent confirmation and the formulations are subject to revision (Dworkin 1978: 76; Greenberg 2007; Stavropoulos 2013).
A related point concerns the structure of the explanation. On the orthodox explanation of law, institutions issue directives each of which conveys and thereby creates a valid norm. The impact of each individual institutional action is therefore distinct: it is the addition of a valid norm to the law. Norms so constituted are then weaved together to form the complete content of the law. (This is not to deny that, on this view, some of the norms may concern precisely how to weave norms together, for example by stipulating that lex posterior derogat legi priori.) The explanation is in that sense atomistic (Greenberg 2007). Nonhybrid interpretivism is not so committed. Since it holds that morality determines how institutional practice affects rights and obligations, it inherits the holistic structure of morality: the whole of morality confronts the whole of institutional practice and determines its effect, which interpretation purports to identify. Particular episodes of institutional practice, say the enactment of a new statute, change rights and obligations by changing the content of the practice and therefore its moral effect (Greenberg 2007, 2011a).
The notion of justification is very different on this view. Moral facts fix the relevance of other factors. The moral principles that reflect those facts do not add content to the law, which needs to be combined with content otherwise contributed by institutions. They determine which precise aspect of institutional practice is relevant to the practice’s contribution to the law. The moral facts are therefore fundamental to the constitutive explanation of law, but do not directly determine its content. They determine how institutional practice determines the law.
A familiar hypothesis of that kind involves the principle that disputes that are similar in morally relevant respects should be treated alike. This hypothesis dictates identifying morally relevant respects in cases, which introduces a role for further hypotheses involving more specific principles that pick out those respects. Consider an imaginary case, Roe v Doe, where Doe is ordered to compensate Roe for the damage that she incurred, which was caused by Doe’s action. In the currently relevant sense, a principle, e.g., that one is responsible for damage caused by one’s carelessness on some conception of due care, would be germane in case it identified the factor that was relevant to Doe’s liability. If it did, it would normatively explain why Doe was ordered to pay—it would show how it’s right that he was. At the same time, the principle would determine how this decision would bear on other cases, given the duty to treat like alike. It would reflect the facts that ground the duty of due care and the liability that due care entails that is articulated by the principle. A principle that figures in such a hypothesis must, first, justify resolving an actual or hypothetical contested case in a particular way; and, second, justify resolving past actual or hypothetical settled cases, i.e., cases the outcome of which is not in dispute in the instant case, in the way they were or would have been resolved. Hypotheses of this character have similar functions, whether they concern the action of institutions or of litigants. By picking out the morally relevant features of some aspect of institutional practice, hypotheses of principle function as explanations of the legal relevance of that aspect of the practice today.
Candidate factors are not restricted to what institutions said; nor are they restricted to what settled legal opinion considers relevant. Perhaps the court said that the fact that the damage was caused by Doe’s carelessness was what made him liable to pay compensation. But the court might not have said so—it might have mentioned something else, or said some conflicting things. Or it might have mentioned carelessness and damage, but might have failed to say whether the magnitude and likelihood of the damage compared to the burden of precaution were germane to the standard of care that Doe failed. Would the fact that the court failed to mention these considerations rule out their relevance to future cases? The answer would depend on some further principles that explained why and how past decisions as a kind are relevant, if they are, to instant cases. If courts should respect their past decisions because doing so reduces uncertainty or mitigates other costs of economic transactions, a principle that the court failed to articulate might be irrelevant to the bearing of a case on future cases. But if courts’ responsibility is to engage with their past decisions because they must act with integrity, such principles may be decisive (Hershovitz 2006b).
These complications are not special to case law. A number of candidate factors might plausibly determine a statute’s effect on legal rights and obligations. The plain meaning of the text of the statute; the actual (linguistic) intentions of certain members or the assembly as a whole (on some conception of corporate linguistic intention) to say or state something by producing the text; their intentions to change legal rights and obligations in a certain way, i.e., to secure some legal effect by using the specific language of the statute; the effect they would have intended to achieve if they had considered some circumstances they did not; the effect they wanted the statute to be regarded by the courts to have; the effect they expected it to be regarded to have; their second-order intention that a certain first-order intention, e.g., their linguistic intention, control the effect of the statute; the political practices that existed before the relevant statute was enacted and were not thought at the time and ever since to have been affected by its enactment (Scalia 1998); the purposes the statute was formally announced to serve in its preamble or in its sponsors’ reports; the reasons given in its defense during debates; and so on. Often all of these considerations will pull in the same direction, so the choice among them would make no perceptible difference. But they needn’t, and we can always construct hypotheticals to test their relative contribution to the impact that some decision has on the law.
For pure interpretivism, interpretive hypotheses are such tests and are designed to support the relevant theoretical choices. The hypotheses appeal to principles of political morality that justify some particular aspect of the institutions’ action having a role as a determinant of rights and obligations. By doing so, they aim to establish, for each candidate determinant of law, its precise impact on the law, including its impact when some other candidate pulls in a different direction (cf. Dworkin 1985, 1986, 1998; Greenberg 2004; Stavropoulos 2013).
Candidate relevant factors include considerations—texts, practices, or attitudes—that concern the very question how candidate determinants bear on the law. Intentions about which intentions count, mentioned above (discussed in Dworkin 1985 and 1986) are such factors and canons or conventions of interpretation and procedural provisions are familiar further examples. These are not exempt from the question why and so how they should bear on the law. Something other than the factors must determine their relevance to the law, even when it is pre-theoretically plausible that they are indeed relevant. For example, an interpretive convention tends to have a significant effect on expectations about how the relevance of the other institutional factors that the convention concerns would be assessed in court, such that considerations of fairness favour conforming to the convention. If so, the convention is vindicated by considerations other than itself, and this holds for any similar factor (see Dworkin 1985, 1986 regarding legislative intentions; Greenberg 2004 regarding any aspect of the practice that concerns the relevance of other aspects).
In this conception, the difficulties of hybrid interpretivism do not arise. Principles have the role of identifying the legally relevant aspects of institutional practice. Principled consistency in this conception therefore consists in consistency in the morally relevant respects of the practice. Principled consistency so understood has no room for prior or residual concern about fidelity to the practice. The pure interpretivist would say that, since it is not the case that we compare moral ideals with some nonmoral code of norms constituted by the content of institutional communication, the question does not arise whether we ought to trade merit for consistency, to weaken our morality to make it compatible with our history. Or whether we should treat some ideal as a ground of obligation just because our institutions have not clearly said anything inconsistent with it. Since we ask in what ways institutional history is morally relevant, the correct answer is determined by moral fact, not a moral approximation or an ideal diluted by history. Yet the answer does not describe ideal arrangements—those we should want to have, prescinding from institutional history—but the normative significance of the arrangements we do have. So we shouldn’t worry about our morality being too perfect for our history, or not as perfect as our history might let us get away with, or about how to choose between the two. We deploy morality, as is, not to compare it with history but to find what difference history made.
5. Why does institutional practice matter?
We have been discussing the question which aspect of institutional practice is relevant to legal rights and obligations. But how is it that some or other aspect of institutional practice is so relevant? The pure interpretivist case would be severely undercut if at that abstract level morality played no role in the explanation of relevance.
Pure interpretivism offers a thoroughly moral explanation of the normative relevance of institutional practice, by identifying a moral concern that gives the practice in the abstract such relevance. It characteristically begins at some familiar, structural features of legal practice, whose existence is usually tacitly assumed. The first concerns the institutional character of law. It’s an unspoken fundamental assumption in law that claims of legal right or obligation are claims grounded, in some appropriate way, in past institutional decisions and standing practices of government—in actual not ideal institutional arrangements—and that only claims so grounded shall be recognized and enforced. Call that kind of grounding the legality of a claim. The second concerns the role that the legality of a claim is supposed to play in relation to some moral concern. It is not merely uncharacteristic but also impermissible for legal institutions to enforce some claim against a person, unless the claim meets the conditions of legality by being appropriately grounded in institutional practice.
This is not the discredited claim that what it is for a legal obligation to take some action to exist is for some sanction to be attached to not taking the action, or that a coercive clause must of necessity be attached to every law. Rather, it is the claim that putative rights and obligations may be enforced through the institutions of government only when and because they bear a certain relation to the institutions’ practice. This is a normative constraint that is not dependent on whether occasion for enforcement ever arises. It is closer to Kelsen’s view that legality is at bottom a boundary separating permissible coercion exercised in the name of the community and impermissible coercion not so exercised (though of course for Kelsen this would be a moral boundary that only need exist in the eyes of the law, whether or not it exists outright; see Kelsen 1952).
A familiar hypothesis is that the moral concern in play is raised by institutions’ effective power to use force or otherwise coercively to direct citizens’ action. Legality is supposed to constrain or regulate that power, by constituting a necessary condition that demands against persons must meet if they are to be permissibly enforced. Notice that in this role, legality is not a moral filter, a moral constraint on the validity of norms. In the hypothesis in discussion, there is no pool of candidate norms, identified by nonmoral tests, to be put through a further, moral test, before they are pronounced finally valid. Rather, legality is a condition of permissible enforcement of demands against a person, a special moral test that applies to any such demand, including those that are entirely unfounded as well as those that may pass other moral tests. (This is the moral concern, and corresponding role of legality, developed in Dworkin 1986, see also Dworkin 2011. Alternative interpretivist hypotheses might assign to legality a similarly distinctive role in relation to some other moral concern.)
On this view, it is essential to law that the legality of a demand—its being grounded in institutional history in the right way—is a condition of its permissible enforcement. This is a claim that is at once metaphysical—a claim about the nature of law—and normative—a claim about the morality of coercion. It says that the correct explanation of why institutional history should have the role of constraint on coercive enforcement (a substantive normative explanation of a political ideal that makes history morally relevant to the permissible enforcement of claims) determines the correct explanation of how institutional history determines legal rights and obligations (the constitutive explanation of what it is, more precisely, for a claim of right and obligation to be grounded in institutional history in the legally appropriate way).
This general explanatory template can be filled out in a number of ways. The best known (Dworkin 1986, also 2006, 2011) begins at the claim that what explains the role of institutional history in the identification and enforcement of rights and obligations is that government’s action should be consistent in principle—some version of the virtue of treating what’s morally like alike, perhaps ultimately to be explained by some combination of reasons of fairness and government’s special duty to treat citizens as equals.
This approach is based on the view that, emergencies aside, it is wrong for government to exercise its power to coerce if such an exercise is not allowed by law. Here, the law is meant to work as a constraint on government’s action, and its role as a constraint is claimed to be grounded in reasons of political morality. (Recall that the constraint follows from moral fact, not the logic of institutional action.) If government is to stand behind my request coercively to enforce my demand against you, it must justify its action by appeal to its institutional practice. The explanation of the role of legality in the exercise of coercive power is that government is under a standing obligation always to act in line with an honest conception of justice. It cannot begin to meet this obligation unless it takes what it has said and done on pertinent issues as relevant to what it may do now. Justice is egalitarian in character. The familiar requirement of treating morally like alike would bind government to use force on a given occasion in the way it has used or would use it in any other actual or hypothetical circumstances relevantly similar to the instant one.
Principled consistency in the use of force does not mean, in this, nonhybrid conception, that government is bound punctiliously to apply all norms promulgated by authorities or to repeat past mistakes. The claim is rather that the morality of coercive interaction makes institutional practice relevant to what may or must be done now. Government must take its other action (legislation, cases, etc.) seriously and act now in a way that’s consistent in principle with that action, taken together. Any past action that cannot be justified under the scheme that justifies the rest is action that is not after all relevant to what is to be done now, and is to be set aside as mistake. We must revise our understanding of principles on which we acted in the past, which may have led us to such mistakes.
Since government must make its action consistent in principle (rather than formally), the conclusion we should derive from this normative explanation, suitably elaborated, is that certain moral principles that together justify institutional decisions and settled practice determine legal rights and obligations. These are moral rights and obligations that bear the right relation to institutional practice, which therefore government may enforce, and must do so on demand, through its institutions (Dworkin 1986, 2011).
On this view, the morality of coercion fundamentally explains the normative relevance of actual institutions (Stavropoulos 2009). A related familiar hypothesis in political philosophy assigns to the morality of coercion a fundamental role in the explanation of duties of socioeconomic justice. On this hypothesis, duties of justice (whether egalitarian, as many philosophers suppose, or not) obtain in virtue of the political relation that holds among those who are placed under the coercive control of some government, and are discharged by designing institutions in a way that meets certain constraints (Nagel 2005). Whether or not coercion matters in that way is a topic much discussed in political philosophy, where writers are concerned with ideal arrangements. The question is underexplored in relation to law, where we are concerned with the normative effect of actual arrangements.
As indicated above, nonhybrid interpretivism is not committed as such to appeal to egalitarian concerns related to coercive enforcement. Alternative explanations that vindicate the assumed role of institutional practice in grounding obligations might be built on the basis of considerations of fair notice (cf. the doctrine Dworkin calls “conventionalism”, Dworkin 1986) or other principles of political morality, perhaps including considerations related to authority.
A further question concerns boundaries. This is a matter of the first importance for the orthodox view, which purports to organize obligations by institutional source, but seems less urgent for pure interpretivism, on which no obligations are explained by institutional contingencies alone.
Recall that, on the current approach, some moral concern makes institutional practice relevant to rights and obligations, and the rights and obligations in question have genuine moral force. But it doesn’t follow that just any action of government that has moral consequences, or even action that changes rights and obligations, and any change in rights or obligations that obtains in consequence of such action, is to be regarded as falling within the legal domain. The interpretivist says that the justifying connection between institutional practice and legal rights and obligations must be such as to serve as an adequate response to the moral concern that is characteristic of legal practice. On the hypothesis we have been discussing, the concern is raised by coercive enforcement. A conception of law must therefore articulate the relation that must hold between some right or obligation and institutional practice if the right or obligation is to be permissibly enforced. (Recall that that moral relation is, on this hypothesis, the relation of legality, and rights and duties are legal when and because they bear that relation to institutional practice). The requirement of legality so understood plausibly imposes procedural and other constraints on the kind of institutional action or other aspect of institutional practice that may ground legal rights and obligations. Officials often make public announcements about their future behavior designed to shape the expectations and thereby the action of their intended audience (as did the President of the European Central Bank when he announced, at a major investment conference organized by the British government, that the ECB will “do whatever it takes to preserve” the currency, Draghi 2012). Normally when we give assurances designed to raise expectations, we thereby change what we owe to those that we assure, often coming to have a duty to perform. But there is no reason to expect that action of this kind, taken by officials outside normal procedures, should in itself affect any legal right or duty. Equally, there is no reason to rule out its playing some role in the determination of the impact of other, procedurally proper institutional action or other aspect of the practice.
For similar substantive reasons, it does not follow from its conception of legal rights and duties as moral consequences of institutional action, that interpretivism cannot distinguish between enforceable rights and duties that obtain in consequence of the kind of institutional action whose role as shaper of such rights and duties serves the value of legality, on the appropriate conception, on the one hand; and further moral consequences, downstream of these rights and duties, on the other. On the hypothesis in discussion, the determination relation between rights or duties and institutional practice allays the relevant moral concern if it makes for principled consistency in the practice (in the way discussed in more detail in this Section and Section 4). On this basis, we can distinguish between the legal duty of Albert, who owns a small business, to purchase a new, more costly health insurance program for his employees following the enactment of some new health care legislation that specifies a certain minimum coverage, and his further, derivative duty, owed to his family, to reduce his personal spending to make ends meet given the increase in his business expenditure. By hypothesis, Albert comes to have the legal duty to purchase the new, more costly program because, once the new legislation is factored into institutional practice, that is what principled consistency in the practice now dictates. On this basis, we can say that the duty obtains because of the difference that the legislation properly made to the law. On the other hand, Albert comes to have some duty of financial prudence because of the effect of these developments on Albert’s finances, together with certain personal circumstances and standing obligations that seem unrelated to the subject matter of legislation and to the principles that govern it. On these facts, there is no reason to suppose that this duty bears the right relation to institutional practice, as that was changed by the legislation, which would qualify it is as genuine legal duty whose recognition and enforcement would serve principled consistency. We have no basis, in this case, to say that the duty was due to the difference that the legislation properly made to the law—though it remains possible that the effect of the difference the legislation did make on Albert’s finances might bear on some aspect of antecedent legal rights or duties that he might have, e.g. a duty of child maintenance.
The fundamental assumption that ties enforcing rights and obligations to institutional practice serves to fix the subject matter of inquiry by setting the interpretive problem. Notice however that it does not rise to a conceptual constraint as these are normally understood. For the theory treats it as a commonly held moral hypothesis about the normative relevance of institutional practice. As a substantive hypothesis it is not immune to doubt but is subject to critical scrutiny. It would remain possible coherently to reject the assumption as mistaken, as long as an alternative hypothesis could make intelligible other common pre-theoretical commitments. The doctrine that Dworkin (1986) calls “pragmatism” illustrates this possibility, since it rejects the dependence of permissible enforcement on legality as defined above, and recommends instead that claims of obligation be enforced when doing so is justified by forward looking considerations. For the pragmatist, the claims’ relation to institutional practice is to be invoked merely for strategic purposes. We might say that the assumption that connects enforcement to institutional practice fixes but does not determine the subject matter of legal theory. Moreover, the basic assumption does not by itself entail an answer to the interpretive problem that it sets. That is the problem of constitutive explanation with which we began: how institutional practice figures in the constitutive determination of legal rights and obligations.
This picture requires that it be possible to share a subject matter without sharing truths that define it. Interpretivism about law implies the possibility of disagreement about the grounds of law, because it makes law’s constitutive explanation a matter of substance—specifically, a matter of the moral justification of the role of institutional history in the determination of rights and obligations. Notice that the possibility of disagreement about grounds is implied not only by the controversial nature of morality, but already by the substantive (therefore potentially controversial) character of the grounds. If the question of grounds is substantive, we can disagree about what they are without changing the subject. Unsurprisingly, this is the issue with which Dworkin begins Law’s Empire (1986).
One way to make out the possibility of disagreement about grounds that interpretivism implies is to show that disagreement of that character obtains. Dworkin said that disagreement about the grounds of law is pervasive. Many of his critics objected that the kinds of disagreement that Dworkin seemed to have in mind can be explained in a way other than as disagreements about grounds: for example, disagreements about the social facts that constitute legal norms, or about how to apply the norms, or about how to decide cases where the norms run out (therefore how to extend the law), against a background of agreement on the grounds of law (Leiter 2003; Shapiro 2007, though not a defender of interpretivism, finds such responses unsatisfactory).
Another strategy is to show the possibility of such disagreement directly, by offering arguments against the view that it must be impossible.
The first strategy is unlikely to be productive. (Notice that some theorists nonetheless think the strategy important to the defense of interpretivism; see Smith 2010.) The interpretivist might begin by considering judgments about the existence of some legal obligation. His critics will say that disagreement in such judgments conceals agreement on grounds. The interpretivist will say that agreement in such judgments conceals disagreement on grounds. Absent some demonstration that actual agreements and disagreements are of one or the other kind, it will be hard to resolve the issue. It is possible instead to construct an inference to the best explanation of the phenomena, and the interpretivist may press that line. However, as I will suggest, the success of his thesis does not depend on the outcome.
The second strategy addresses what really matters for interpretivism. It may be that all lawyers agree on some question about the grounds of law. That would be consistent with it being a matter of substance what the grounds are: perhaps lawyers just happen to concur in their judgments. What the interpretivist needs to show is that to challenge the consensus would not be to change the subject. He needs to show that disagreement about grounds is on the cards.
To defend the claim that disagreement about grounds is indeed possible, one would have to resist the assumption that, as a general matter, we can only share a subject matter by sharing truths that define it. Indeed Dworkin, anticipating that his examples of disagreement that appears to be about grounds would be reinterpreted by his critics as disagreement about social facts or about how to change the law, invited his critics not to rule out the possibility that disagreement might be more fundamental. He said that to think that disagreement about grounds is never possible, for the reason that to share a subject matter we must share criteria that define it, is a philosophical prejudice: he called the prejudice “the semantic sting” (see Dworkin 1986).
It is now a familiar claim in general philosophy that, in the case of certain objects and phenomena, an account of their nature is not built into the understanding that is sufficient for competent use of the words that refer to them (or into the understanding of the relevant concepts that is sufficient for competent thinking). Such understanding, captured in criteria of application and truths shared among competent users, does not provide sufficient metaphysical guidance. In many cases, such understanding includes an open-ended clause that allows for the existence of a certain kind of explanation of the nature of the objects, or, at least, that understanding does not rule out some such explanation, yet certainly falls short of picking out any particular explanation from among the eligible ones. In such cases, substantive investigation is indispensable to a complete explanation of the nature of the relevant object, and often must come first, before we realize that it is indeed germane to the nature of the object (Kripke 1980; Burge 1986; Rey 1998; Williamson 2007; Stavropoulos 1996, 2012).
Now if it is granted that, at least in some cases, the explanation of the nature of some objects may turn on matters of substance, the interpretivist may defend the view that judgments about the grounds of law are open to challenge. For he can simply construct such a challenge explicitly as one that disputes that the considerations that are generally regarded to be the grounds of law are indeed such grounds (cf. Burge’s strategy in Burge 1986).
It is easy for the interpretivist to pursue that strategy. He can show that there exist different eligible and mutually inconsistent candidates for legal relevance. Do achievement intentions of legislatures (intentions to change the law in a certain way) play any role in the explanation of the impact of a statute? If so, do they play a constitutive or merely an evidentiary role? Do expectations that some arrangement introduced by statute will persist ever play some role in the explanation of the statute’s impact? If so, do such expectations, even if formed in the face of explicit notice to the contrary, prevent later legislation from radically changing the original arrangement (cf. National Federation of Independent Business v. Sebelius 567 US 519 (2012) (11-393), opinion of the court), or is their legal relevance extinguished by the explicit notice (cf. National Federation of Independent Business v. Sebelius, Ginsburg, dissenting)? As we already saw in section 4, institutional practice includes countless examples of such inconsistent eligible candidates, each eminently defensible as legally relevant. But suppose that almost all lawyers agree on the relevance of one of a pair of inconsistent candidates. The fact that they do is yet another aspect of the practice, which is not privileged. For the interpretivist, substantive—moral—considerations serve the purpose of determining the relevance of any factor. On the basis of such considerations, he can argue that the unpopular candidate is in fact relevant so the lawyers’ consensus is mistaken.
This view traces the intelligibility of fundamental challenges about the grounds of law to unusual moral views about the legal relevance of some factor. If this is correct, we should expect that such challenges may occur with some regularity, and that arguments once widely considered not colorable may come to be taken seriously and finally to become dominant. The quick transition, from nonstarter to endorsement by the US Supreme Court, of the view that the Constitution limits legislative authority to regulate private civilian uses of firearms (District of Columbia v. Heller, 554 US 570 (2008) (07–290)), or of the view that the regulatory powers of the federal government do not extend to mandating the purchase of health insurance (National Federation of Independent Business v. Sebelius, cited above), are recent illustrations.
7. Related theories
Interpretivism offers a moral explanation of how institutional practice shapes legal rights and obligations. It is possible to offer an alternative explanation that is moral in character, without embracing certain other claims characteristic of interpretivism. Focusing on the mechanism through which institutions can change people’s normative situation, Greenberg (2014) and Hershovitz (2015) claim that legal rights and obligations are a subset of the moral rights and obligations that obtain in virtue of the actions of legal institutions. Greenberg claims that the subset is composed of those moral rights and obligations that obtain in the ‘legally proper way’. Which way is legally proper is to be understood in light of a normative constraint constitutive of law: that law is supposed to improve the moral situation. When legal institutions improve the moral situation, e.g. by taking action that secures coordination, the resulting moral obligations are legal obligations. But when the actions of legal institutions give rise to obligations to resist or undo or otherwise mitigate what the institutions did (an obligation to repeal legislation, shelter the persecuted, and so on), the resulting obligations do not trace to the action of institutions in the proper way (Greenberg 2014, Schaus 2015). By contrast, Hershovitz argues that we should not be overly concerned with the boundaries of the legal. As we saw, the question about the boundaries is a matter of the first importance for theories on which legal rights and obligations are created through some special nonmnoral mechanism but need not be consequential for theories that appeal to no such mechanism (see section 5). Developing a point from Dworkin, Hershovitz argues that the idea that there is an existing body of law, which comprises all and only those rights and obligations in force in a given system, plays no role in legal practice (Hershovitz 2015, crediting Dworkin 1978). He argues that the better view is that the practice of legal institutions has a variety of normative consequences, moral and prudential. We might use ‘legal’ as a label for some of those, depending on our purposes: for example, to mark the source of an obligation or the institution that gets to enforce the obligation (Hershovitz 2015).
It is common ground between these views and interpretivism that, like other contingencies, the practice of legal institutions may change rights and obligations because and to the extent that it is morally relevant. This implies that the rights and obligations so produced are ordinary, genuine moral rights and obligations. Moreover, it implies that legal institutions can exploit the fact that their action is generally morally relevant in order reliably and systematically to change what we owe to each other. While the views in discussion focus on these implications, interpretivism concentrates on the problem of identifying the content and operation of the principles that in fact make legal practice morally relevant and govern its effects on rights and obligations.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- Riggs v. Palmer, 115 NY 506 (1889).
- District of Columbia v. Heller, 554 US 570 (2008) (07–290).
- National Federation of Independent Business v. Sebelius, 567 US 519 (2012) (11-393).
I presented drafts of this entry at Pompeu Fabra University, Department of Law, and at the University of Michigan, Department of Philosophy. I am grateful to participants at these events for valuable discussion. I was greatly helped by comments on earlier drafts by Scott Hershovitz, Leslie Green, Liam Murphy, Dale Smith, and, especially, Scott Shapiro, and by many discussions with Mark Greenberg over the years on some of the topics discussed in this entry.