Logical Pluralism

First published Wed Apr 17, 2013; substantive revision Thu Jan 10, 2019

Logical pluralism is the view that there is more than one correct logic. Logics are theories of validity: they tell us, for different arguments, whether or not that argument is of a valid form. Different logics disagree about which argument forms are valid.[1] For example, logics like Classical and Strong Kleene logic tell us that that ex falso quodlibet, the argument form below, is valid:

¬ A

However Relevant logics and other Paraconsistent logics say that this argument form is not valid. It’s natural to think that they can’t all be right. If ex falso quodlibet is valid, then the Relevant and Paraconsistent logics are not correct theories of validity, or as we might say, they are not correct logics. Alternatively, if ex falso quodlibet is not valid, then Classical logic and Strong Kleene logic are not correct. Logical pluralism takes many forms, but the most philosophically interesting and controversial forms of the view hold that more than one logic can be correct, that is: logics L1 and L2 can disagree about which arguments are valid, and both can be getting things right.

Much current work on the subject was sparked by a series of papers by JC Beall and Greg Restall (Beall & Restall 2000, 2001; Restall 2002), which culminated in the book (Beall & Restall 2006). This work has generated a substantial literature, including papers arguing against pluralism and for logical monism, the view that there can only be One True Logic.[2.] Interest in the contemporary debate has also led to a re-examination of some older views, especially the pluralism resulting from Carnap’s famous tolerance for different linguistic frameworks and the work of Scottish/French logician Hugh McColl (1837–1909), who some have claimed was an early logical pluralist (Rahman & Redmond 2008). The recent upsurge of interest has also resulted in the proposal of several additional varieties of logical pluralism, some of which are surveyed in the final section below.

1. Case-Based Logical Pluralism

How could two logics both be correct, when they disagree about which arguments are valid? One way is if there is more than one relation of logical consequence (and so more than one interpretation of ‘valid’) so that one of the logics captures validity in one sense, while its rival captures validity in another. Pluralists commonly elaborate on this by maintaining that natural language expressions like ‘follows from’ are unsettled, vague, or ambiguous, and may be settled, made more precise, or disambiguated, in more than one way (Shapiro 2014, 1–2). The best-known version of this view, for example, is presented as the conjunction of two main theses (Beall & Restall 2006). First, the Generalised Tarski Thesis:

Generalised Tarski Thesis (GTT):
An argument is validx if and only if in every casex in which the premises are true, so is the conclusion.

Second, the thesis that the expression ‘casex’ in the (GTT) can be made more precise in at least two, equally acceptable, ways, resulting in different extensions for ‘valid’. For example, by ‘case’ we might mean a first-order interpretation of the kind Tarski uses to define classical first-order consequence (Tarski 1983) or alternatively we might mean a possible situation. Other alternatives include inconsistent or incomplete interpretations, of the sort used in the model theories for intuitionistic and paraconsistent logics. Different choices for the interpretation of ‘case’ will result in a different precisifications of the (GTT) analysis of logical consequence, which may in turn result in different relations of logical consequence (Beall & Restall 2006, 29–31). Call this view ‘Case-based Logical Pluralism.’

Case-based pluralists do not need to hold that every conceivable precisification of the GTT defines a relation of logical consequence. Typically, they think that only relations with certain properties—e.g., necessity, normativity and formality—are admissible (Beall & Restall 2006, 26–35). Hence having its extension given by a precisification of the GTT is only a necessary condition on being a genuine relation of logical consequence.

1.1 The Argument from Appearances

One argument for case-based pluralism is the argument from appearances (Beall & Restall 2006, 30–31). According to it, pluralism is just straightforwardly plausible—it appears to be true—and hence ought to be believed in the absence of reasons not to believe it.

This might seem like a surprising approach, given the presumption of logical monism in the writings of most logicians of the past—presumably pluralism did not appear to be correct to them. But perhaps once one considers the GTT explicitly, accepts the underdetermination of ‘case’ and considers a few of the ways it can be made more precise to get different logics, it just seems clear that there will be several alternative ways to make it more specific, with none singled out as more correct than the others by current usage. The hardest thing about logical pluralism, one might think, was seeing how it could be a coherent view at all, but once the work of developing and laying out the case-based view has been done, the resulting position can strike one as quite reasonable. Perhaps an unbiased reader should feel tempted to endorse it?

One problem with this argument is that the plausibility of a view tends to vary with the onlooker’s ability to think up reasonable alternatives; if view A seems like the only reasonable way a certain thing can have happened, then we might shrug and accept it as our best working hypothesis. But if we can conceive of several different ways things could plausibly be, we might rationally withhold judgement pending more evidence.

More specifically, while the case-based pluralism is not patently implausible, it does rest on a linguistic picture with two distinctive features: first, that the meaning of ‘case’ is unsettled, and second, that given that it is unsettled, the discovery of more than one reasonable precisification should make us pluralists. But neither of these features is inevitable. Contemporary philosophy of language describes models in which the correctness of the application of some ordinary language expression—such as ‘water’, ‘elm’ or ‘star’—can turn on the presence or absence of a feature that ordinary speakers need not be able to distinguish, such as having a certain constitution or make-up. Why should ‘follows from’ not be similar? That is, though no a priori analysis of ‘follows from’ (or ‘valid’) uncovers the single correct precisification of the (GTT), there might nevertheless exist an account—perhaps making use of sophisticated mathematical techniques—that exactly captures the extension of ‘follows from’. Rival accounts would then have the same status as rival accounts of stars or water. Though analysis of the word ‘star’ will not tell us that stars are not holes in the fabric of the night, or the gods riding their chariots across the heavens, those accounts are still wrong. Similarly, though analysis of the expression ‘follows from’ might not tell us that intuitionist accounts are wrong, they might be wrong nonetheless. In such circumstances we might hold that the meaning of ‘follows from’ is not really underspecified.

Secondly, even if the meaning of the expression is underspecified, it needn’t be the case that any precisifications are correct, and hence pluralism is not an inevitable consequence of the underspecificity. Consider a paradigm underspecified word like ‘heap’ and a thinker who presents themselves as a pluralist about the heap property. They hold that one may specify the meaning of ‘heap’ different ways within certain parameters, and arrive at conflicting but equally correct definitions of ‘heap.’ For example, the classical heapists might claim that a heap is any pile of items with more than 10 members, deviant heapists protest that a heap is any pile of items with more than 13 members and the heap pluralist holds that both are correct. But there are lots of alternatives to pluralism here. For example, one might think that anyone who interprets the English word ‘heap’ as requiring a pile of n items for any specific n is wrong, since they are trying to import more specificity into the meaning of the word than can really be found there. Or one might be a skeptic about heaps, on the grounds that the word is too vague—it fails to specify a genuine meaning—or one might hold that the expression is context-sensitive: in some contexts it picks out the classical property, in some the deviant, but argue that that doesn’t make one a pluralist about heaps, anymore than acknowledging that ‘I’ picks out different people in different contexts makes one a pluralist about oneself.

The mere possibility of these alternatives does not, by itself, argue against that view, but it does undermine the argument from appearances, since the availability of these alternatives makes it clear that the intriguing reasonableness of pluralism is not unique.

1.2 The Argument from Virtue

A different argument for logical pluralism invokes the view’s combined practical and theoretical virtues:

One virtue is that the plurality of the consequence relation comes at little or no cost. Another is that pluralism offers a more charitable interpretation of many important (but difficult) debates in philosophical logic than is otherwise available; we will argue that pluralism does more justice to the mix of insight and perplexity found in many of the debates in logic in the last century. (Beall & Restall 2006, 31)

Pluralists have also stressed that their view encourages innovation in logic (Carnap 1937, foreward), and allows one to study more mathematical theories, such as those that would be rendered trivial by classical logic (Shapiro 2014, Ch. 3).

Such claims can be quite difficult to assess. Some important distinctions need to be drawn between theoretical and practical reasons to endorse pluralism, and even once this has been done it can be difficult to decide whether the view, over all, really possesses a virtue—it may depend on substantial empirical claims for which the evidence has yet to be gathered—whether or not it possesses a greater weight of virtues than rival theories (is not logical monism a simpler theory, and simplicity a theoretical virtue too?) and finally whether or not that is a good reason to believe the view.

For example, one virtue claimed for logical pluralism is charity, but not all instances of charity are theoretically virtuous; no-one should think that deterministic physics is more likely to be correct because it allows a more charitable view of wrong-doers, or of Einstein. Charity can be misplaced. But one place where charity is taken seriously as a theoretical virtue is in the assessment of theories of meaning and translation—though even here it can be misplaced, since it is not a virtue if a theory interprets infants as uttering true claims about quantum mechanics (Davidson 1984). Logical pluralism is not itself a thesis about translation or interpretation, but one about logics and how many there are. Nonetheless, the version outlined above rests on some substantial claims about the meaning of ‘valid’ and ‘follows from’ and it might be argued that it is proper to invoke charity in adjudicating between this theory and rival ones for that reason: we are deciding between theories which interpret ‘valid’ and ‘follows from’ differently. Perhaps one of these interpretations seems to make our informants (both ordinary language users and the experts who have written about logic) responsible for fewer false claims.

But an opponent might respond that interpreting ordinary speakers as uttering truths concerning logic can look rather similar to attributing true beliefs about quantum mechanics to infants. As the Wason selection task experiments have shown in psychology, even educated speakers will fail to act as if the argument form modus tollens is correct in certain circumstances (Wason 1966, 1968; Cosmides 1989). Though the most charitable interpretation of their behaviour might be that they do not mean by ‘follows from’ what the experimenters meant by it, by far the most natural understanding of what is going on here is that the subjects make mistakes. To interpret them as meaning something different by misses what these experiments reveal about human reasoning, and fails to explain why the subjects later judge that their earlier answers were wrong.

The logical pluralist can agree with this, but distinguish between being charitable to ordinary speakers, and being charitable to expert logicians. It is, they might maintain, expert logicians that we should interpret charitably, including those experts who have proposed apparently incompatible systems. Relevant logicians have written ‘disjunctive syllogism is not valid’. Classical logicians have written ‘disjunctive syllogism is valid’. Intuitionist logicians say ‘double negation elimination is not valid’. Classical logicians have retorted ‘double negation elimination is so valid.’ If logical monism is correct, at least two or more of these parties have written falsehoods. Logical pluralism would allow us to say that more than one, perhaps many more than one, have been writing truths.

But logical pluralism is also uncharitable in ways that logical monism is not, since it holds that the monist participants in debates over which logic is correct have been arguing based on a confusion. The upshot with respect to the argument from charity, and from virtue more generally, is that quite a lot remains to be done before it will be clear which virtues are desirable and the extent to which logical pluralism possesses them to a greater degree than its rivals.

1.3 The Generality Objection

1.3.1 The Interpretation of ‘every’ in the GTT

One objection to case-based logical pluralism is to allow that ‘case’ is underspecified and admits of various interpretations, but reject the further step that those interpretations correspond to different relations of logical consequence. We can do this is by insisting on the largest possible domain for the quantifier ‘every’ in the context of the GTT. There is a tradition in logic that holds that in order for an argument to be logically valid, the conclusion must be true in (unrestrictedly) all cases in which the premises are true. So when ‘every’ is used in defining logical consequence, we might argue, it must be understood in the broadest possible way: if there are any cases at all—anywhere, of any kind—in which the premises are true and the conclusion is false, the argument will be invalid, and if not, then the argument will be valid. The One True Logic, then, will be the one that describes the relation of truth-preservation over all cases—where ‘all’ is construed as broadly as possible (Beall & Restall 2006, 92; Priest 2006, 202).

Suppose we do take the broadest interpretation of ‘every’. One question is whether we will be left with any useful relation of logical consequence at all. Logics which are arrived at by quantifying over extra cases have a tendency to be weaker—that is, to classify fewer arguments as valid—since the more cases we include, the better our chances of including one in which the premises of a particular argument are true and the conclusion false. Dialetheists would include cases in which both a sentence and its negation are true, and this means we can have cases where P and ¬P are true, but Q is false, making both PQ and ¬P true, even though Q is not, and thus providing a counterexample to the argument form disjunctive syllogism. If this is acceptable, one might think, why not allow cases where AB is true, but B is not? Or worse. Perhaps if we construe ‘every case’ broadly enough, we will find that there are no valid arguments left, and hence the result will not be logical monism, but a form of logical nihilism, or something close to it:

…we see no place to stop the process of generalisation and broadening of accounts of cases. For all we know, the only inference left in the intersection of (unrestricted) all logics might be the identity inference: From A to infer A. That identity is the only really valid argument is implausible and, we think, an unmotivated conclusion. (Beall & Restall 2006, 92)[3]

Priest disagrees, and suggests that what will stop the slide down this slippery slope is the fact that certain key consequence relations hold in virtue of the meanings of the connectives:

I think it just false that all principles of inference fail in some situation. For example, any situation in which a conjunction holds, the conjuncts hold, simply in virtue of the meaning of ∧. (Priest 2006, 202–203)

But it is relatively common for logicians to claim that the logical principles that they endorse are valid in virtue of the meanings of the connectives involved. The intuitionist logician denies that A ∨¬A is true in virtue of the meanings of ∨ and ¬ though other logicians will say that it is, and it is difficult to adjudicate such disputes independently of a more substantial theory of the meanings of the connectives. This is yet another area where the dispute over logical pluralism runs into an older dispute in the philosophy of logic, and one that is ostensibly a question about meaning. The two key questions that remain for the success of this monist objection are i) which, if any, argument forms are guaranteed to preserve truth (perhaps in virtue of meaning) in any case whatsoever, and ii) if there are any such argument forms, are there enough of them to constitute a non-trival logic?

1.3.2 A Response from Polysemy

There is more than one plausible model for the underspecificity of ‘case’ in the GTT. The version of pluralism we have been considering allows different kinds of things to count as ‘cases.’ Sometimes a case may be a mathematical structure, sometimes a possible world (perhaps incomplete or inconsistent) or the actual world or parts of it.[4] Given this, the underspecification of ‘case’ in the GTT could be less like the indeterminacy that results from variation in the domain of quantification, and more like the variation that results from polysemy. Consider:

Every bank needs numerate staff.

This sentence has two readings because the word ‘bank’—even once we’re talking about money—has more than one meaning. It can mean a financial institution (such as HSBC), or the building where a such an institution offers its services (such as the bank five minutes from campus.) Sometimes additional context can rule out one of the readings, for example:

Every bank needs numerate staff in all of its branches.

in which it is clear that bank-as-financial-institution is meant, and

Every bank needs numerate staff and plenty of customer parking.

in which it is clear that bank-as-building is meant.

When we were assuming that the underspecificity in the GTT resulted from underspecificity about the domain of quantification for ‘every’ there was a natural temptation to think that we would get the strictest, most careful and correct answer by dealing with a completely unrestricted domain. In the polysemy kind of case however, what can vary is not (just) the size of the domain of quantification but also which kind of object it is that we are making claims about. The result is that we can allow the domain of quantification to be as large as we like, and no object of the wrong kind can count as a counterexample to the general claim, precisely because it is of the wrong kind. To illustrate with ‘bank’: if we mean bank-as-financial-institution, then no bank-as-building can serve as a counterexample to (1), no matter how unrestricted the domain of quantification—since the sentence is not making a claim about such things. And conversely, if we mean bank-as-building, then no internet bank-as-financial institution can be a counterexample to sentence (3).

So suppose that ‘case’ in the GTT is polysemous. Perhaps ‘case’ sometimes means possible world, but it can also be used to mean first-order model. If the classical logician means first-order model by ‘case’, then it is not legitimate to complain that he has failed to take into account incomplete possible worlds, and hence has not considered every case. On the case-as-FO-model disambiguation of ‘case’, the classical logician has considered every case, since incomplete possible worlds are not cases in that sense.

1.3.3 Choosing a best case?

Let’s continue to assume that ‘case’ is polysemous. Just as there was room for someone to argue that only a single interpretation of ‘every’ was appropriate in the GTT, so a monist might argue here that there is only one appropriate disambiguation of ‘case’ in the GTT, and hence that there is only one relation of logical consequence.

We can develop that thought as follows. The logician’s task is to capture the consequence relation on natural language sentences, but it usually simplifies things to pay attention only to particular expressions in those sentences, such as conjunction, negation, and disjunction, say, or those expressions plus the universal quantifier and identity. Whichever set of symbols we select as our so-called logical constants, the meanings of all the other expressions in the sentences—the non-logical expressions—are determined by the interpretations (or, as we call them in the GTT, ‘cases’), and since we are quantifying over all such interpretations, in effect we are simply ignoring the meanings of all non-logical expressions.

So now consider what we might say about this argument:

a is red
a is colored.

Normally we’d translate this into the language of first-order predicate logic as something like this:


That formal argument is not valid, but one might still want to say that the original, natural language argument is. First-order logic which fails to treat words like ‘red’ and ‘colored’ as logical constants, one might think, falls short of capturing logical consequence.

Priest considers this view, and though he acknowledges that it is not the only view one might have, he holds that it’s the right one.

The standard move [to resist this line of thought] is to claim that the inference is, in fact, invalid, but that it appears to be valid because we confuse it with a valid enthymeme with suppressed premise ‘All red things are colored’ taken for granted. (Priest 2006, 201)

But suppose we do hold, as Priest does, that the argument is valid. Generalising, we might think that if you are interested only in the truth about logical consequence, then it is never legitimate to ignore the meaning of some expression in an argument. If simplicity and conservativeness are of no concern, then you should not be appealing to Tarski-style interpretations in defining validity—since the whole point of such interpretations is to allow the meanings of certain expressions to vary. Better than any ‘interpretation’ would be a complete possible world (perhaps we can argue about which things are included in ‘all possible worlds’, but there might also be a correct answer to that question.) Hence many of the possible disambiguations of ‘case’ give us different false theories of validity. Those might be useful because they are simple and they approximate the true account, but since the logics they capture are not correct, this is a view on which no pluralism threatens.

1.4 The Normativity Objection

A different objection to logical pluralism starts from the premise that logic is normative, where this means that logics have consequences for how we ought to reason, i.e. for what we ought to believe, and for how we ought to update our beliefs when we learn new things. Many writers have thought that logic is normative, sometimes because they have thought that logic just is the science of good reasoning:

In Logic we do not want to know how the understanding is and thinks, and how it has hitherto proceeded in thinking, but how it ought to proceed in thinking. (Kant 1800, p. 4)

logic is a normative subject: it is supposed to provide an account of correct reasoning. (Priest 1979, p. 297)

Sometimes, though, philosophers have taken the position that whether or not logic is about reasoning, its claims about logical consequence have normative consequences for reasoning:

Rules for asserting, thinking, judging, inferring, follow from the laws of truth. And thus one can very well speak of laws of thought too. (Frege 1918, pp. 289–90)[5]

…logical consequence is normative. In an important sense, if anargument is valid, then you somehow go wrong if you accept thepremises but reject the conclusion. (Beall & Restall 2006, p. 16)

There is an apparent tension between this alleged normativity of logic and the thesis of logical pluralism. Suppose, for example that if an argument form is valid, then some normative conclusion follows concerning what we ought to believe. (Perhaps it is that we ought to believe the conclusion of an instance of the argument form if we believe the premises, though much work on the normativity of logic suggests that it would need to be something substantially more complicated.) Now suppose that logical pluralism is correct. In particular logic 1, which says that disjunctive syllogism is valid, and logic 2, which says that disjunctive syllogism is not valid, are both correct. Ought we to believe what logic 1 tells us to believe? It is hard to see how we could escape this obligation, given that logic 1 tells us that the premises entail the conclusion, and logic 1 is correct. Yet if the normative consequence for belief does follow, then perhaps logic 2 is falling down in some respect—it fails to capture all of the obligations that follow from our logic. As S. Read puts it:

[S]uppose there really are two equally good accounts of deductive validity, K1 and K2, that β follows from α according to K1 but not K2, and we know that α is true…. It follows K1-ly that β is true, but not K2-ly. Should we, or should we not conclude that β is true? The answer seems clear: K1 trumps K2. … K1 answers a crucial question which K2 does not. [This] question is the central question of logic. (Read 2006, 194–195)

Versions of this objection can be found in Priest 2006, Read 2006, Keefe 2014 (p. 1385), and Steinberger 2018, and there are responses in Caret 2016, Russell 2017 and Blake-Turner & Russell forthcoming.

1.5 The Change-of-Meaning Objection

A final question for pluralists is whether they are correct to take rival logicians to be arguing about the same logical principles. The classical logician accepts a logical truth which they write “A ∨¬A” and the Strong Kleene rejects as a logical truth a principle which they write the same way. But it only follows that they accept different logics if the symbols express the same principle in both cases, and in particular, if “∨” and “¬” mean the same in both.

In debate, monists have often been willing to grant this assumption to the pluralists, because they have assumed that their preferred logic is right and the rival logic wrong, not that they and their rivals were talking past each other. Still, the suggestion was famously made by Quine (1986, 81) that in a dispute between rival logicians “neither party knows what he is talking about” since they cease to be talking about negation as soon as its core logical properties are seriously questioned (in Quine’s example the logicians argue about whether sentences of the form A∧¬A can be true.)

The pluralist thus needs a way to exclude the possibility that each of their preferred logics is correct, but that pluralism itself is still false, because those logics don’t disagree. Perhaps each logic could even be a part of a single, greater logic containing e.g. intuitionist negation and paraconsistent negation as well as classical negation and Strong Kleene negation etc. Places were pluralists have taken on this question include Beall and Restall 2001 (§3) and Hjortland 2013.

2. Logical Pluralism via Linguistic Pluralism

The contemporary debate over case-based logical pluralism has lead to a revival of interest in an older form of pluralism advocated by the famous logical positivist, Rudolf Carnap (1937, §17 and 1958; see also Restall 2002; Cook 2010; Field 2009; Kouri Kissel forthcoming; Varzi 2002; Eklund 2012).

2.1 The Principle of Tolerance

In section 17 of The Logical Syntax of Language, Carnap writes:

In logic there are no morals. Everyone is at liberty to build his own logic, i.e. his own language, as he wishes. All that is required of him is that, if he wishes to discuss it, he must state his methods clearly, and give syntactical rules instead of philosophical arguments. (Carnap 1937, §17)

Two kinds of tolerance are expressed in this passage. The more famous is Carnap’s tolerance for different languages, and it is motivated both by the thought that verbal disputes are not really theoretical disputes about the domain we are describing, but at best practical ones about the most useful and efficient ways to use words, given our goals, and by the thought that such practical matters are best left to those working in the relevant field. As Carnap wrote later,

Let us grant to those who work in any special fields of investigation the freedom to use any form of expression which seems useful to them. The work in the field will sooner or later lead to the elimination of those forms which have no useful function. Let us be cautious in making assertions and critical in examining them, but tolerant in permitting linguistic forms. (Carnap 1958, 221)

The second kind of tolerance is a tolerance for different logics, something that is naturally construed as a kind of logical pluralism. The phrase “everyone is at liberty to build his own logic” suggests that no-one would be making a mistake in so doing, and it seems clear from the phrase “i.e. his own language” that follows immediately after that Carnap takes the two kinds of toleration to be extremely close, perhaps even that he thinks linguistic tolerance and logical tolerance amount to the same thing.

It might not be obvious to a modern reader why that is the case. Why could we not be tolerant of alternative languages, which seems only sensible, without thereby committing ourselves to being tolerant of alternative logics? Moreover, logicians who disagree about which sentential logic is correct (e.g., classical or intuitionist) seem to be able to use the same language (containing ∧, →, ¬, etc.) even while they suppose that one logic is right for that language, and one logic wrong. If that position is coherent, then one side must have made a mistake after all, implying they were not really ‘at liberty to build their own logic.’

That view seems at least an open possibility, though whether two rival logicians are really advocating different logics for the same language can be difficult to determine. It will not be sufficient that they are using the same symbols, since they might each be using the symbols with different meanings in which case they will be using different languages. But what more, beyond using the same expressions, is required?

This is a question to which there are many rival answers, even for the most basic logical constants. Perhaps the expressions must denote the same truth-function, or have the same intension, or share a mode of presentation, or a character, or a conceptual role. But The Logical Syntax of Language was published (in German) in 1934, before the innovations of Grice, Gentzen, Montague, Kaplan, Lewis, Putnam or Kripke, (and, moreover before Tarski’s “On the Concept of Logical Consequence” (Schurz, 1998; Tarski 1983)) and in an environment in which Wittgenstein’s Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus was a powerful influence. Carnap has quite definite and explicit ideas about both meaning and logic, and these help to explain why he thinks linguistic tolerance leads straight to logical tolerance. In the foreword he writes:

Up to now, in constructing a language, the procedure has usually been, first to assign a meaning to the fundamental mathematico-logical symbols, and then to consider what sentences and inferences are seen to be logically correct in accordance with this meaning. Since the assignment of the meaning is expressed in words, and is, in consequence, inexact, no conclusion arrived at in this way can very well be otherwise than inexact and ambiguous. The connection will only become clear when approached from the opposite direction: let any postulates and any rules of inference be chosen arbitrarily; then this choice, whatever it may be, will determine what meaning is to be assigned to the fundamental logical symbols. (Carnap 1937, xv).

According to Carnap then, the right way to specify a language is to pick some expressions, and then give the rules of inference for them. It is this specification which gives the expressions their meanings, and so, first, there is no question of their being the wrong rules for the expressions—everybody is at liberty to build his own logic, to choose whatever rules he likes—and second, to be tolerant about language choice is already to be tolerant about choice of logic—for languages so-conceived come with different logics already ‘built in.’

One of Carnap’s reasons for accepting logical pluralism is that he saw it as making space for innovation in logic. In the foreword to The Logical Syntax of Language he writes:

Up to the present, there has been only a very slight deviation, in a few points here and there, from the form of language developed by Russell which has already become classical. For instance, certain sentential forms (such as unlimited existential sentences) and rules of inference (such as the Law of Excluded Middle), have been eliminated by certain authors. On the other hand, a number of extensions have been attempted, and several interesting, many-valued calculi analogous to the two-valued calculus of sentences have been evolved, and have resulted finally in a logic of probability. Likewise, so-called intensional sentences have been introduced and, with their aid a logic of modality developed. The fact that no attempts have been made to venture still further from the classical forms is perhaps due to the widely held opinion that any such deviations must be justified—that is, the new language-form must be proved to be ‘correct’ and to constitute a faithful rendering of ‘the true logic’.

To eliminate this standpoint, together with the pseudo-problems and wearisome controversies with arise as a result of it, is one of the chief tasks of this book. (Carnap 1937)

This passage highlights several features of Carnap’s logical pluralism and philosophy of logic more generally. It seems clear that he intended his logical pluralism to be both ‘horizontal’—that is, to allow for different logics at the same level, such as classical and intuitionist sentential logics—as well as ‘vertical’—allowing for logics for new kinds of expression, such as intensional logics and second-order logic (the terminology is from Eklund 2012). Furthermore the passage expresses a “logic-first” approach, and rejects a “philosophy-first” approach, suggesting that rather than trying to figure out which is the best logic a priori from first principles (the ‘philosophy-first’ approach), we should let logicians develop languages as they like, and then make our judgements based on how things turn out.

The most obvious contrast here is with W.V.O. Quine, who criticised second-order logic as “set-theory in sheep’s clothing” and rejected tense and modal logics on philosophical grounds (Quine 1986 (Chapter 5), 1953, 1966; Burgess 1997, 2012). Such a stand-off is quite intriguing, given Quine’s rejection of such “Philosophy-First” approaches in epistemology more generally.

2.2 Issues for Carnap’s Pluralism

A number of contemporary writers have been happy to endorse Carnap’s approach to pluralism and Restall argues that it is less radical than his and JC Beall’s case-based version (Varzi 2002, 199; Restall 2002). Nonetheless there are several issues that someone who wanted to defend Carnap’s position today would need to address. A first concern about the view is that while we are working within the various languages we invent, we could be missing the ‘correct’ rules—the ones that were out there, in effect, before we invented anything. In the words of Paul Boghossian,

Are we really to suppose that, prior to our stipulating a meaning for the sentence ‘Either snow is white or it isn’t.’ it wasn’t the case that either snow was white or it wasn’t? Isn’t it overwhelmingly obvious that this claim was true before such an act of meaning, and that it would have been true even if no one had thought about it, or chosen it to be expressed by one of our sentences? (Boghossian 1996)

Carnap would perhaps not have taken this objection seriously, since, like the Wittgenstein of the Tractatus (e.g., §4.26, 4.641–4.465), he does not believe that logical truths and rules are ‘out there’, waiting to be discovered:

The so-called ‘real’ sentences, constitute the core of the science; the mathematico-logical sentences are analytic, with no real content, and are merely formal auxiliaries. (Carnap 1937, xiv)

Nonetheless, such a ‘conventionalist’ view of logical truth (and along with it, analytic truth) has been argued against by, for example, Quine, Sober, Yablo and Boghossian, and it no longer enjoys the popularity that it had in Carnap’s time (Quine 1936; Yablo 1992; Boghossian 1996; Sober 2000). It also highlights the extent to which it is odd to call Carnap a logical pluralist, since in a way his view is not that there is more than one correct logic, but that there is nothing for logic to be correct about (Cook 2010, 498). Perhaps it would be more illuminating to call Carnap a logical constructivist.

Another issue is whether Carnap’s conception of meaning is correct. These days there are many alternative approaches to meaning and lively debate about them. Field writes:

On some readings of “differ in meaning”, any big difference in theory generates a difference in meaning. On such readings, the connectives do indeed differ in meaning between advocates of the different all-purpose logics, just as ‘electron’ differs in meaning between Thomson’s theory and Rutherford’s; but Rutherford’s theory disagrees with Thomson’s despite this difference in meaning, and it is unclear why we shouldn’t say the same thing about alternative all-purpose logics. (Field 2009)

Field concludes that “the notion of difference of meaning is unhelpful in the context” and that Carnap’s view of the meanings of the logical contexts is therefore hard to defend.

But proponents of particular alternative views about the meanings of the logical constants might instead hold that they can make good sense of difference in meaning in these contexts, and that Carnap has simply endorsed the wrong theory of meaning and as a result drawn the wrong conclusions for logic. One specific issue that they might point to is associated with Prior’s 1960 paper “The Runabout Inference Ticket”, in which he provides rules for a new connective, tonk, which quickly lead to triviality, suggesting that he was not quite “at liberty to build his own logic” by introducing rules for his expressions. Another issue is the fact that one can generate different logics, not by varying the rules governing any particular expression, but rather by varying the more general structural rules of the logic, which govern things like whether or not one is allowed multiple conclusions, and whether or not a premise can be used more than once in a proof (Restall 2000; Paoli 2003). This suggests that even if the meanings of the logical expressions are governed by the rules that tell you how they can be used in proofs (as Carnap suggests) two logics can agree on those rules, whilst disagreeing on the relation of logical consequence. Hence even if you have successfully chosen a language, it seems that you might not yet have determined a logic.

3. Further kinds of Logical Pluralism

Several other varieties of logical pluralism have been proposed since Beall and Restall’s early work, and five are outlined in this section. A useful way to classify these different views—including Beall and Restall’s case-based pluralism—is as each taking logical consequence to be relative to a different feature—e.g. precisifications of ‘case’ (for Beall and Restall), sets of logical constants (for Varzi), kinds of truth-bearer (for Russell), goals (for Cook’s less radical approach), and epistemic norms (for Field’s).[6]

Occasionally it is objected that one or more of these views does not constitute a ‘real’ logical pluralism, on the grounds that it merely relativises consequence to some new parameter, and (the objection continues) this would make the view a form of relativism, rather than a form of pluralism.[7] But it is worth remembering that not just some but most of the views standardly discussed under the heading of logical pluralism—including the most central case-based versions—can be understood as relativising logical consequence to something distinctive. They they are standardly described as logical pluralisms anyway, presumably because they are views on which it can reasonably be claimed that more than one logic is correct. The literature is thus easier to follow if one doesn’t assume that the words “pluralism” and “relativism” to mark an important or widely agreed-upon distinction (Shapiro 2014, p. 1).

3.1 Pluralism regarding the set of Logical Constants

Achille Varzi points out that one way to generate competing relations of logical consequence is to vary the set of expressions that we treat as logical constants. If we take = to be a logical constant, then the following argument will be valid

a = b

But if the set of logical constants does not include = then it will not, since our models will now include those that assign non-reflexive relations to =, and these can generate counter-examples.

Should = be treated as a logical constant? Tarski himself endorsed the view that any expression in the language might be taken to be logical:

The division of all terms of the language discussed into logical and extra-logical … is certainly not quite arbitrary. If, for example, we were to include among the extra-logical signs the implication sign, or the universal quantifier, then our definition of the concept of consequence would lead to results which obviously contradict ordinary usage. On the other hand no objective grounds are known to me which permit us to draw a sharp boundary between the two groups of terms. It seems to me possible to include among the logical terms some which are usually regarded by logicians as extra-logical without running into consequences which stand in sharp contrast to ordinary usage. … In the extreme case we could regard all terms of the language as logical. (Tarski 1983, 418–419)

Varzi is inclined to endorse Tarski’s liberalism with respect to the choice of logical constants:

The relevant claim is that all (or any) terms of the language could in principle be regarded “as logical”—and I agree with that. (Varzi 2002, 200)

The result is that on his view there is more than one correct relation of logical consequence, since that relation is relative to the choice of logical constants, and there is more than one equally correct set of these, resulting in different, equally correct logics.

The Tarksi/Varzi view is controversial. Varzi defends it in his paper of 2002 and there is useful discussion in MacFarlane 2009.

3.2 Pluralism about the objects of Logical Consequence

Another variety of logical pluralism results if we consider that there might be different correct logics for different kinds of truth-bearer, as is argued in (Russell 2008). Suppose that logical consequence is indeed a matter of truth-preservation over cases. Then we could coherently talk of truth-preservation relations on (sets of) sentences, on (sets of) propositions, or on (sets of) characters (as in Kaplan 1989) and ultimately on any truth-bearer whatsoever. This would not be very exciting if those logics all turned out to determine a single ‘parallel’ consequence relation, so that, for example, a sentence S1 had a sentence S2 as a logical consequence if and only if the proposition it expressed, P1, had the proposition expressed by S2 (P2) as a logical consequence. Russell uses various examples involving names, rigidity, direct reference, and indexicals to argue that this is not always the case. To take just one, on the assumption that the sentence a=b contains two different, directly referential names, a = b and a = a express the same proposition. Given the minimal assumption that the relation of logical consequence is reflexive, that means that proposition expressed by a = b is a logical consequence of the proposition expressed by a = a, even though the sentence a = b is not a logical consequence of the sentence a = a. Hence the relation of logical consequence on sentences is interestingly different from that of the relation of logical consequence on propositions, and there are at least two different, correct relations of logical consequence.

3.3 Pluralism about Modelling

Shapiro and Cook have suggested that the job of a formal logic is to model a natural language (Shapiro 2006; Cook 2010; Shapiro 2014). Since models are simplified structures intended to exhibit some but not all of the features of the phenomenon being modelled, there may be several rival models of the same language, each capturing different aspects of that language, and as Shapiro writes:

…with mathematical models generally, there is typically no question of ‘getting it exactly right’. For a given purpose, there may be bad models—models that are clearly incorrect—and there may be good models, but it is unlikely that one can speak of one and only one correct model. (Shapiro 2006)

This sounds like it might support a species of logical nihilism—a view on which there is no correct logic (and in fact Cotnoir (2019 explores that view)—but Cook prefers to think of it as offering two different kinds of pluralism. The first, less controversial, kind holds that which logic is the correct one is relative to one’s goal. If one wants to study vagueness, the correct logic might be one that allows for intermediate truth-values, whereas if one wants to study identity, perhaps first-order classical logic with identity is to be preferred. Since the correct model is relative to your goal, so is the correct logic.

But Cook wonders whether his and Shapiro’s logic-as-modelling view could also support a more radical pluralism, since it seems possible that even relative to a specific purpose, there could be two rival logics, each clearly better than all the rest relative to that purpose, yet neither of which is better than the other. Under such circumstances Cook thinks we might want to say that both are correct, and hence that there is more than one correct logic. However one could also hold that in such circumstances there are two equally good logics, neither of which counts as correct.

3.4 Pluralism about Epistemic Normativity

Hartry Field proposes another kind of logical pluralism (Field 2009). The view rests on the thesis that logic is normative (see §1.4) along with a pluralism about epistemic normativity. Field holds that there are many possible epistemic norms, and that we might think of agents as endorsing one, or—more likely—different norms at different times, and as having views about how good different possible epistemic norms are. We use these epistemic norms to evaluate themselves, and other norms (think of using numerical induction to evaluate both induction and counter-induction.) Some norms do well by their own lights, in which case we feel no tension. Some do badly even by their own lights, in which case we feel pressure to change them. There’s no sense, on Field’s view, in regarding any of these norms as correct or incorrect, but he does think that it makes sense to call them better or worse, so long as we recognize that these evaluations are relative to our epistemic goals. Still, though this makes norms criticizable and evaluable, it doesn’t mean that there will be a uniquely best norm. “For instance, there might be a sequence of better and better norms for achieving the goals; in addition, there might be ties and/or incomparabilities ‘arbitrarily far up’” (355). Hence we have an epistemic normative pluralism.

Similarly, we can use our epistemic norms—including deductive logics—to evaluate how well various deductive logics perform in achieving epistemic goals we have, e.g. resolving the semantic paradoxes. And again “it isn’t obvious that there need be a uniquely best logic for a given goal, much less that we should think of one logic as ”uniquely correct“ in some goal independent sense” (356). The result then, is a kind of logical pluralism: logics are better or worse relative to different goals, but even relative to a particular goal, it might be that no single logic is the unique best one.

3.5 Pluralism by Restriction

Finally, Hjortland explores another kind of logical pluralism in defending sub-classical logics from Williamson’s abductive argument that classical logic is the One True Logic (Hjortland 2017, 652–657; Williamson 2017). Consider the claim that the ubiquitous use of classical logic (rather than other weaker logics) in mathematics is a strong point in its favour; if we had to give up classical logic, we might be worried about losing a lot of elegant, simple and otherwise virtuous mathematical theories, and preserving virtuous theories (and letting go of ad hoc and otherwise vicious theories) is what the abductive approach in logic is all about.

However, the move from the importance of classical logic in mathematics to the truth of classical logic is much too fast. It is one thing to say that classical logic, including say, instances of the principles of Double Negation Elimination (DNE) and ex falso quodlibet (EFQ), are widely used in mathematics. But mathematics does not require any principles with the full strength and generality of classical logic’s (DNE) and (EFQ)—it only uses some of the instances of those principles, the instances that employ mathematical language. When we say that (DNE) and (LEM) are logically valid we are saying that they are valid no matter what expressions we substitute for the non-logical expressions in them—including extra-mathematical vague predicates like ‘heap’ or ‘red’ and notoriously troublesome metalinguistic predicates like ‘true’ and ‘heterological’.

Mathematical proofs do contain an abundance of instances of classical principles: applications of classical reductio ad absurdum, conditional proof, disjunctive syllogism, the law of absorption, etc. The emphasis, however, should be on the fact that these are instances of classical principles. The mathematical proofs do not rely on any of these principles being unrestricted generalisations of the form that Williamson defends. They do at most rely on the principles holding restrictedly for mathematical discourse, which does not entail that the principles of reasoning hold universally. Put differently, mathematical practice is consistent with these reasoning steps being instances of mathematical principles of reasoning, not generalisable to all other discourses. A fortiori, they may very well be principles of reasoning that are permissible for mathematics, but not for theorizing about truth. (Hjortland 2017, pp. 652–3)

That leaves space for a kind of pluralism that holds that some of the stronger logical principles are correct only when they are restricted to particular kinds of linguistic expression (such as those that feature in the language of Peano Arithmetic); if we don’t restrict them in this way, there will be counterexamples. Other logical principles (perhaps conjunction elimination is on this list) do not need to be restricted to the language of Peano Arithmetic. This leaves us with a clear sense in which we have different correct logics, depending on which language we are assuming.


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