Willard Van Orman Quine
Willard Van Orman Quine (1908–2000) worked in theoretical philosophy and in logic. (In practical philosophy—ethics and political philosophy—his contributions are negligible.) He is perhaps best known for his arguments against Logical Empiricism (in particular, against its use of the analytic-synthetic distinction). This argument, however, should be seen as part of a comprehensive world-view which makes no sharp distinction between philosophy and empirical science, and thus requires a wholesale reorientation of the subject.
In what follows, a very brief section on Quine’s life and philosophical work will be followed by an overview, which will serve to orient the reader. We shall not comment in any detail on Quine’s work in pure logic or set theory (for Quine’s work on set theory, see the entry on Quine’s New Foundations), and also Morris 2018. The third section is devoted to Quine’s arguments against the use that the Logical Empiricists made of the analytic-synthetic distinction, and the view that he worked out to take its place. The subsequent three sections go systematically through Quine’s own views; the final section is on Quine’s place in the history of philosophy.
- 1. Quine’s life and work
- 2. Quine’s Naturalism and its Implications
- 3. The Analytic-Synthetic Distinction and the Argument Against Logical Empiricism
- 4. Quinean Epistemology
- 5. Metaphysics Naturalized
- 6. Underdetermination of Theory by Evidence; Indeterminacy of Translation
- 7. Quine’s place in the history of philosophy
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1. Quine’s life and work
|1908||Born, Akron, Ohio, on June 25th.|
|1926–30||Attended Oberlin College, Ohio; B.A, major in Mathematics with honors reading in mathematical philosophy.|
|1930–32||Attended Harvard University; Ph.D. in Philosophy, dissertation on Whitehead and Russell’s Principia Mathematica.|
|1932–33||Held a Sheldon Traveling Fellowship and visited (most notably) Vienna, Warsaw, and Prague (where Carnap was then teaching).|
|1933–36||A Junior Fellow in Harvard’s newly-formed Society of Fellows; worked chiefly on logic and set theory.|
|1934||Published A System of Logistic, a revised version of his dissertation.|
|1936–78||Held teaching positions at Harvard, first as Faculty Instructor, then as Associate Professor (1941) and then as Professor (1948).|
|1940||Published Mathematical Logic.|
|1942–45||U.S. Navy, working chiefly in Naval intelligence.|
|1953||Published From a Logical Point of View.|
|1960||Published Word and Object.|
|1963||Published Set Theory and its Logic.|
|1966||Published Ways of Paradox.|
|1969||Published Ontological Relativity and Other Essays.|
|1974||Published The Roots of Reference.|
|1981||Published Theories and Things.|
|1990||Published Pursuit of Truth.|
|1995||Published From Stimulus to Science.|
|2000||Died, Boston, Massachusetts, December 25th.|
(Note: for the sake of brevity, we have listed only Quine’s most notable books, including collections of essays.)
2. Quine’s Naturalism and its Implications
Quine’s philosophical thought is remarkably consistent over the course of his long working life. There are developments, of course, but outright changes of mind are relatively rare and mostly on relatively minor points. We can, for the most part, treat him as having a single philosophical orientation, to which what he calls “naturalism” is fundamental. This is not to say that his naturalism is self-conscious and explicit from the start; it is, rather, something that he became clearer about over the years. (For the development of Quine’s naturalism, see Verhaegh, 2018; for the very early Quine, see Sinclair 2022.)
The term “naturalism” has been understood in various ways; we need to see what Quine’s naturalism comes to. At one point, he describes naturalism as “the recognition that it is within science itself, and not in some prior philosophy, that reality is to be identified and described” (1981, 21). Two points are important to note about the idea of “science” here. First, it is less restrictive than it may seem. Quine certainly takes the natural sciences, especially physics, as paradigmatic. As he says himself, however, he uses the word “science” broadly; he explicitly includes psychology, economics, sociology, and history (see 1995, 49). Second, Quine does not see scientific knowledge as different in kind from our ordinary knowledge; he sees it, rather, as the result of attempts to improve our ordinary knowledge of the world: “Science is not a substitute for common sense but an extension of it.” (1957, 229). The scientist, he says, “is indistinguishable from the common man in his sense of evidence, except that the scientist is more careful.” (1957, 233). We might add that the scientist is more narrowly focused on issues of truth and objectivity and, in the hope of contributing to these goals, clearer and more systematic.
Many philosophers would no doubt accept that the methods and techniques of science are the best way to find out about the world. (With or without the points just noted about the word “science”.) The distinctiveness of Quine’s naturalism begins to emerge if we ask what justifies this naturalistic claim: what reason do we have to believe that the methods and techniques of science are the best way to find out about the world? Quine would insist that this claim too must be based on natural science. (If this is circular, he simply accepts the circularity.) This is the revolutionary step: naturalism self-applied. There is no foundation for Quine’s naturalism: it is not based on anything else.
The point here is that Quine denies that there is a distinctively philosophical standpoint, which might, for example, allow philosophical reflection to prescribe standards to science as a whole. He holds that all of our attempts at knowledge are subject to those standards of evidence and justification which are most explicitly displayed, and most successfully implemented, in the natural sciences. This applies to philosophy as well as to other branches of knowledge. The epistemologist, therefore, reflects on science from within science; there is no theory of knowledge distinct from science. “Epistemology”, Quine says, “…is contained in natural science, as a chapter of psychology” (1969, 83). (For an alternative view of the relation of philosophy to science, based on discussion of the history of science, see Friedman, 1997.)
In Quine’s view, philosophers can, therefore, do no better than to adopt the standpoint of the best available knowledge, i.e. science, in some suitably broad sense. We adopt what he calls “the fundamental conceptual scheme of science and common sense” (1960, 276). Philosophers are thus to be constrained by scientific standards. In (1974) he puts it this way: “In our account of how science might be acquired we do not try to justify science by some prior and firmer philosophy, but neither are we to maintain less than scientific standards. Evidence must regularly be sought in external objects, out where observers can jointly observe it….” (1974, 34f.)
2.2 Negative Aspects
The view sketched above has both positive and negative aspects. The latter are better-known, and Quine is often thought of as a negative philosopher, primarily concerned to criticize others. He casts doubt on terms which many philosophers take for granted. He does not dismiss such terms as meaningless, but simply as not meriting a place in serious science, or in the objective account of the world at which science aims. A well-known and important example is his criticism of the idea of meaning, in the sense of the meaning of a particular sentence or statement. Quine says: “Meaning… is a worthy object of philosophical and scientific clarification and analysis, and… it is ill-suited for use as an instrument of philosophical and scientific clarification and analysis.” (1981, 185). The term is insufficiently clear, and putative explanations which employ it are in fact unexplanatory; by engendering the illusion of explanation they tend to impede the progress of science. So philosophers should not rely on the term. He makes similar remarks about “thought”, “belief”, “experience”, “necessity”, and other terms which many philosophers assume are legitimate and available for philosophical use without themselves requiring explanation and justification in other terms. (For an illustration of Quine’s attitude towards the term “meaning” as used by one such philosopher, see his reply to Pagin in Orenstein and Kokato, 420f.)
This criticism of the scientific and philosophical use of certain ordinary terms goes along with rejection of philosophical questions which make essential use of those terms. For example, many philosophers hold that there are important philosophical problems concerning knowledge: Do we really know anything at all? What exactly are the conditions on knowledge? (This latter question has seemed especially pressing since Gettier, 1963.) Quine, by contrast, finds the word “knowledge” vague, and consequently rejects it for serious use, saying that the word is ‘‘useful and unobjectionable in the vernacular where we acquiesce in vagueness, but unsuited to technical use because of lacking a precise boundary’’ (1984, 295). Accordingly, many such questions formulated using the term may simply be dismissed, even if it remains eminently useful for making rough sorts of claim, when we say as above that scientific knowledge is not different in kind from our ordinary knowledge.
2.3 Positive Aspects (1): Knowledge
As we have just seen, Quine’s views issue in very general criticism of much philosophy and indeed of the assumption that the term “knowledge” marks a clear subject of inquiry. It is, nevertheless, a mistake to think of him as primarily a critical or negative thinker: his criticisms rely on his positive doctrine, which in turn generates further questions. As for whether those are genuinely philosophical questions, it is implicit in what has already been said that he would not acknowledge such a category as the ‘genuinely philosophical’ if that is meant to imply questions which are different in kind from those of science. But certainly he accepts that some questions are sufficiently general, abstract, and remote from observation, that they may be classified as philosophical. At times he assimilates the questions with which he is concerned to those which have traditionally occupied philosophers. Epistemology—the theory of knowledge—is a clear example, although Quine’s approach to that subject is quite different from that of many philosophers.
In some places, Quine approaches epistemology through the problem of scepticism about the external world. But he has no room for the kind of scepticism which asks the following kind of question: even if our alleged knowledge, our science, is completely successful in its predictions, how do we know that it tells us the way the world really is? (See Alston, 1993.) Thus Quine says:
Our scientific theory can go wrong, and precisely in the familiar way: through failure of predicted observation. But what if… we have achieved a theory that is conformable to every possible observation, past and future? In what sense could the world then be said to deviate from what the theory claims? Clearly in none…. (1981, 22; emphasis added)
This dismissal of one kind of scepticism is an example of Quine’s naturalism, and indicates how he understands that idea.
There is, however, a way of understanding the sceptical question which Quine takes seriously. Philosophers have been concerned with the gap between what is given in experience and the knowledge that we take ourselves to have. Quine invokes gestalt psychology and argues that the simple sensory ideas which Berkeley and Hume had claimed were given by the senses are not in fact given, that we see things in three-dimensions, for example, instead of having to infer the third. He does not, however, conclude that there is no problem at all here. Rather, he says, “the problem was real but wrongly viewed” (1974, 2). Epistemology, as he sees it, is here “confronting a challenge to natural science that arises from within natural science.” (loc. cit.). What is the challenge? It starts with what Quine takes to be “a finding of natural science itself… that our information about the world comes only through impacts on our sensory receptors” (1990a, 19). The sceptical challenge is then: “How… could one hope to find out about that external world from such meager traces? In short, if our science were true, how could we know it?” (1974, 2).
Scepticism, understood in this fashion, is a challenge to Quine’s form of naturalism. It questions whether our knowledge can be accounted for in terms which are, by Quine’s standards, purely naturalistic. Quine’s response is thus to sketch an austerely naturalistic account of how our knowledge, and the cognitive language in which that knowledge is embodied, arises, or might arise. This project, as he sees it, is essential to the defence of his naturalistic world-view. (Section 4. will go into more detail about the project.)
When Quine asks: “How… could one hope to find out about that external world from such meager traces?” this is not a rhetorical question. It is, rather, a serious question, to be answered by deploying the full resources of our knowledge; it is a scientific question. Quine recognizes that the question, thus construed, is not exactly what earlier epistemologists had in mind, but argues that the change is justified: “A far cry, this, from the old epistemology. Yet it is no gratuitous change of subject matter, but an enlightened persistence rather in the original epistemological problem.” (1974, 3).
2.4 Positive Aspects (2): the Nature of the World
The defence and articulation of Quine’s naturalism requires Quinean epistemology, an analogue of traditional epistemology but carried out as a scientific enterprise. It also requires that he set out, in outline, what is to be included in a naturalistic account of the world; in other words, it requires an account of the world, a least in broad outline. Among other things, this account constrains his epistemology, since that is to be a naturalistic account of knowledge.
In what follows, we shall sometimes speak of Quine’s account of the world as his “metaphysics”, but it is metaphysics naturalized: it is not carried out a priori, or by reflection on the nature of Being quâ Being, or anything of that sort. (Quine himself does not much use the word “metaphysics”. He puts forward views on metaphysical topics—such as ontology, time, and abstract objects—but within the confines of his naturalism.)
Quine approaches his naturalistic analogue of metaphysics through the idea of regimented theory. Regimented theory is our overall science, the sum total of our best and most objective knowledge about the world, reformulated in the clearest and simplest form. Quine sees this kind of reformulating as of a piece with ordinary scientific endeavours, but carried further than working scientists are likely to have reason to do. He discusses the distorting effect which language is likely to have on our view of the world and comments:
To some degree…the scientist can enhance objectivity and diminish the interference of language, by his very choice of language. And we [meaning we philosophers, we scientists at the abstract and philosophical end of the spectrum], concerned to distill the essence of scientific discourse, can profitably purify the language of science beyond what might reasonably be urged upon the practicing scientist. (1957, 235)
Regimented theory is, of course, an idealization. It is not a complete and finished object, available for us to examine. Quine’s reflections on it might be considered as something like a thought-experiment: if we were to set about assembling our total theory of the world and recasting it in the best form, what would it look like? Since the enterprise is not in fact going to be carried out all the way we are not going to get a detailed answer. But on some important general issues, Quine holds, we can get answers. In particular, he argues that the framework of regimented theory is first-order logic with identity (and so that theory is extensional); that the variables of this theory range only over physical objects and sets; and that the predicates of the theory, the only non-logical vocabulary, are physicalistic, in his somewhat complicated sense. (See section 5, below.) Although this is not traditional a priori metaphysics, we should not underestimate the ambition of the project. He says of his regimented theory that “all traits of reality worthy of the name can be set down in an idiom of this austere form if in any idiom” (1960, 228) and speaks of “limning the true and ultimate structure of reality” (1960, 221). The claim that the variables of regimented theory range only over physical objects and sets is, as far as he is concerned, the claim that only physical objects and sets really exist.
3. The Analytic-Synthetic Distinction and the Argument Against Logical Empiricism
The philosophers who most influenced Quine were the Logical Empiricists (also known as Logical Positivists), especially Rudolf Carnap. The distinction between analytic truths and synthetic truths plays a crucial role in their philosophy. Analytic truths might be characterized as those true solely in virtue of the meanings of the words they contain, or of the rules of the language, or something of the sort. Synthetic truths, by contrast, state matters of extra-linguistic fact, and are known by experience. The Logical Empiricists accounted for truths which do not seem to be answerable to experience, most obviously the truths of logic and mathematics, by saying that they are analytic. This position was very widely held by the 1940s. Quine, however, famously casts doubt on analytic-synthetic distinction, and rejects the use made of it by the Logical Empiricists and other philosophers from the 1930s on. (Notable among the others is C. I. Lewis, first a teacher and then a colleague of Quine; his influence on Quine has perhaps been underestimated. See Baldwin 2013, Ben-Menahem 2016, and Sinclair 2016.)
The issues here are complex, and the argument takes many twists and turns. The aim of this section is to give an account of Quine’s mature view, and of the strongest arguments that he has for it.
3.1 Carnap’s Principle of Tolerance and Quine’s Objections
Carnap holds that the role of philosophy is to analyze and clarify the language of science, and to formulate and recommend alternative languages. After 1932, he holds that there are languages which differ in expressive power, not merely as notational variants. The difference between intuitionistic logic and classical logic is an important example here, as is the difference between the language of Newtonian mechanics and the language of relativistic mechanics. (Earlier, he says, he had ‘overlooked the fact that there is a multiplicity of possible languages’, Carnap 1934, 245; cf. also 322 of the same work.) Within a given language, there may be only one correct theory on a given subject. But the choice of a language is in that respect unlike the choice of a theory. In deciding which theory is correct, we will appeal to observations but also to the rules of the language; no such appeal is possible when we are choosing a language, for in this case it is the rules themselves that we are choosing. So Carnap holds that there is no one correct language. This idea has become known as the Principle of Tolerance; from the 1930s on, it is fundamental to Carnap’s view of what philosophy is and how it differs from science. (That there is such a difference is a point which Carnap never questions.) Because there is no one correct language, it is no part of the philosopher’s job to prescribe this or that language, merely to analyze, to clarify, and to suggest alternatives.
The Principle of Tolerance requires the analytic-synthetic distinction. It requires that we can, in all cases, distinguish between theoretical changes which involve a change of meaning, and hence, strictly speaking, a change of language, and those which do not. The former kind of change involves analytic sentences, and is a matter for Tolerance; the latter involves only synthetic sentences, and Tolerance does not apply. The use of the Principle of Tolerance thus presupposes a clear distinction between the analytic sentences of the language and its synthetic sentences.
At least as Quine sees the matter, the use of the Principle of Tolerance puts analytic sentences on an entirely different epistemological footing from synthetic sentences. Synthetic sentences are answerable to evidence; analytic sentences are a matter of the choice of language, which does not require theoretical justification. Quine, however, rejects the idea that there is such an epistemological difference. Even if we can distinguish the analytic sentences from the synthetic sentences, we may still have reasons to reject an analytic sentence. And those reasons may be of the same kind that lead us to reject synthetic sentences. This point is hard to see if one focuses on examples such as “All bachelors are unmarried”. The matter is otherwise if one considers examples such as “Force equals mass times acceleration”. (See Putnam, 1962.) A change of mind about an analytic sentence would be a change in the language. Still, we might have reasons to make such a change, reasons that are of the same sort that lead us to make revisions to synthetic sentences. In that case, we have no more reason to apply Tolerance in the one kind of case than in the other.
This is the view that Quine argues for. On the one hand, he emphasizes the point (which Carnap largely accepts) that choice of language is not theoretically neutral: some choices will make for a better theory than others. On the other hand, he argues that ‘pragmatic’ factors, such as simplicity, which Carnap had accepted as playing a role in choice of language, also play a role in the choice of a theory within a language. Hence, he claims, the two sorts of choice are on the same epistemological footing, and the Principle of Tolerance is unjustified.
Quine’s argument for this position relies on holism. This is the claim that most of our sentences do not have implications for experience when they are taken one-by-one, each in isolation from the others. What has experiential implication is, in most cases, not an individual sentence but a larger chunk of theory. Holism is not a very controversial doctrine. (Carnap accepts it; see Carnap, 1934, 318.) Quine claims that holism shows that most of our sentences are not justified by the relation of the individual sentence, considered in isolation, to experience. Almost always, what matters is the relation to experience of some larger chunk of theory (in principle, although perhaps never in practice, of the theory as a whole). This means that in principle the correctness of a given claim is almost never settled simply by looking at the empirical evidence for that claim alone. Other factors will play a role, in particular the way in which accepting the given claim would contribute to the efficacy and simplicity of the theory as a whole. But these are precisely the ‘pragmatic factors’ which Carnap thought played a role in the choice of language. In arguing that such factors play a role throughout our knowledge, Quine accepts ‘a more thorough pragmatism’ (1951, 46) which puts Carnap’s external changes on the same epistemological footing as his internal changes. (Quine’s early account of these matters is extremely sketchy. For elaboration, see Quine 1991 and 1996; for criticism of the sketchy account, see Sober 2000.)
3.2 Quine’s Alternative
If logic, mathematics, and other putatively a priori parts of our knowledge, are not to be explained by analyticity, how are they to be accounted for? Holism, which is central to Quine’s argument against Carnap, also provides him with an alternative position. It seems as if logic and mathematics have a special status because they are independent of experience. They appear to be necessary and not susceptible of refutation by what future experience brings; they appear to be a priori because we know them independent of experience. Carnap sought to explain these appearances by appealing to the idea that accepting an analytic sentence of a given language goes with speaking that language, and to the Principle of Tolerance. Since choice of language is not justified by experience, the truth of the analytic sentences of a given language is not answerable to experience.
How is Quine to explain the apparent necessity and a priori status of some truths without appeal to the Principle of Tolerance? Quine’s holism is the view that almost none of our knowledge is directly answerable to experience. (The exceptions are what he calls ‘observation sentences’; see 4.2, below.) In almost all cases the relation is indirect: a given sentence is only answerable to experience if a body of theory is presupposed. (When we say that a given observation confirms or refutes a given theoretical claim, we are tacitly presupposing other theoretical knowledge.) This is most easily seen if we consider a highly theoretical sentence, but in Quine’s view it holds, of almost all our sentences. The reason to accept a sentence is its contribution to the success of theory as a whole as an efficient and simple method of dealing with and predicting experience; in principle, this means the success of our theory as a whole, the whole body of sentences that we accept, in dealing with experience as a whole.
For many of our sentences, this strong statement of holism holds only in principle. In practice, we may have a good idea what experiences would lead us to change our minds about a given sentence, and what further changes in theory would follow. Elementary arithmetic (to take that as an example) is different because it is involved in almost every part of systematic knowledge. (In Quine’s well-known metaphor, it stands near the centre of the ‘web of belief’.) Abandoning it would mean abandoning our whole system of knowledge, and replacing it with an alternative which we have not even begun to envisage. Nothing in principle rules out the possibility that the course of experience will be such that our present system of knowledge becomes wholly useless, and that in constructing a new one we find that arithmetic is of no use. But this is a purely abstract possibility, certainly not something we can imagine in any detail. So the idea that we might reject arithmetic is likewise unimaginable; hence the truths of arithmetic appear to be necessary.
For similar reasons, arithmetic appears to be a priori. No particular experience confirms ‘2 + 2 = 4’. (Quine is not advancing what Frege derided as a ‘gingerbread and pebble’ account of arithmetic (Frege 1884, vii), in which the sentence is justified by our observations of cookies or stones.) Arithmetic is independent of any particular experience, or any easily specifiable portion of experience; hence it appears as a priori. On Quine’s account, it rests on our experience as a whole, and the fact that the theory which best accounts for that experience makes essential use of arithmetic.
3.3 Meaning and Quinean Analyticity
As we have just seen, even sentences which we cannot imagine rejecting might, in principle, be rejected. As Quine says: ‘no statement is immune to revision’ (1951, 43; see Ebbs 2017, Ch. 8). This claim of Quine’s has attracted a good deal of attention, and is sometimes thought to be shocking or even paradoxical. In the context of his debate with Carnap, however, it is not, by itself, at all surprising. For Carnap too, any sentence can be revised; he would insist, however, that in the case of some sentences, the analytic ones, a revision involves a change of language, and thus of the meaning of the words used in the sentence. So the idea of meaning, and sameness of meaning, occupies a crucial role in the debate over analyticity.
Quine’s initial arguments against the analytic-synthetic distinction seek to cast doubt on the idea that there is a notion of meaning which is clear enough to use in defining a notion of analyticity. He explores various proposals and finds them wanting. (See especially Quine 1951.) Here too a crucial role is played by holism. One apparently clear conception of meaning is that the meaning of a sentence is given by the experiences which would confirm it; holism, however, implies that the idea of confirmation does not apply to individual sentences, considered in isolation from the theories of which they are parts. (For criticism see Fodor and Lepore 1992; for a counter to Fodor and Lepore see Heal 1994; for later Quine on holism see his 1991.)
Quine’s scepticism about the idea of meaning is much criticized. We will mention two criticisms. First, what standards of clarity is he employing, when he says that the notion of analyticity is insufficiently clear? The answer, not explicit in Quine (1951), is that the standards are those indicated by our discussion in the previous section; Quine is asking for an explanation which is acceptable by his naturalistic standards (see Lugg 2012). Such an explanation would not presuppose an idea of meaning, and would use such ideas as definition or convention only in ways which are justified by the literal sense of those terms. Second, some responses to Quine’s position here argue that it has obviously absurd consequences, such as that meaningful discourse would be impossible or that we could not understand our language. (See, for example, Grice and Strawson, 1956.) But Quine’s scepticism about meanings does not lead to any scepticism about meaningfulness. If we think of meaningfulness as a matter of having a meaning then we may think that our words cannot be meaningful unless there are meanings. But such a way of thinking is, Quine claims, quite misleading. In Quine 1953, he offers a rough and ready behavioural account of meaningfulness; it is clear from the way the account proceeds that the success of something along those lines would be of no help at all in defining synonymy or analyticity.
We said above that Quine seeks ‘to cast doubt’ on the idea of meaning, and on the use of that idea to explain the distinction between those changes of doctrine which involve a change of meaning and those which do not, and thus also to explain analyticity. One might read Quine 1951 and get the impression that he is not merely casting doubt but wholly rejecting these ideas. In later works, however, he himself suggests a definition of analyticity. A sentence is analytic for a given native speaker ‘if he learned the truth of the sentence by learning to use one or more of its words’ (Quine 1991, 270; see also Quine 1974, 78–80). It is analytic without qualification if it is analytic for all native speakers. By this criterion, some obvious truths, such as ‘Bachelors are unmarried’, will presumably count as analytic. If we think of the set of analytic sentences as closed under logical consequence, as Quine suggests, then, he says, all first-order logical truths ‘would then perhaps qualify as analytic’ (Quine 1991, 270). Along with this, he comes to accept that certain revisions of belief do involve a change of meaning, presumably in a sufficiently clear sense of meaning (Quine 1991, 270).
Now it might seem as if Quine completely withdraws his earlier criticism of the analytic-synthetic distinction and thus, presumably, of Logical Empiricism as a whole. But in fact this is not so. One consideration here is the scope of Quinean analyticity. The idea will perhaps (as Quine says) include first-order logic, but it will not include mathematics; on this count alone, it is clear that it will not do what Carnap requires of the idea of analyticity. An even more important consideration is that Quine’s version of the analytic-synthetic distinction is not an epistemological distinction. Some changes of doctrine involve changes of meaning, others do not. In Quine’s view, however, this does not mean that the two sorts of change must have different epistemological bases. To the contrary: as we saw in 3.1, Quine rejects the Principle of Tolerance and, with it, the idea that a change of language takes place on a different kind of epistemological basis from a change of theory within a language. His acceptance of a limited conception of analyticity does not change this picture. As he says: “I recognize the notion of analyticity in its obvious and useful but epistemologically insignificant applications” (1991, 271; emphasis added).
On the interpretation advanced here, Quine’s rejection of the Principle of Tolerance is the deepest aspect of his disagreement with Carnap. Quine sees all our cognitive endeavours, whether they involve formulating a new language or making a small-scale theoretical change, as having the same very general aim of enabling us to deal with the world better; all such endeavours have the same very general kind of justification, namely, as contributing to that end. In this picture, there is no basis for Carnap’s insistence that philosophy is in principle different from science. Philosophy, as Quine sees it, has no special vantage point, no special method, no special access to truth. Here we have the crucial idea of Quine’s naturalism, discussed in the previous section.
4. Quinean Epistemology
4.1 The Epistemological Project
As we saw in section 2, Quine takes the fundamental epistemological problem to be that of showing how we come to have knowledge of the world. He seeks an account which is naturalistic in his austere sense, and thus starts with the idea that we know about the world only from impacts of various forms of energy on our sensory nerves (see 2.3, above). How do we get from such impacts to something recognizable as knowledge of the world? In the words of the title of Quine’s last monograph: how do we get from stimulus to science?
This question is central for Quine’s scientific naturalism in general. An answer would show that that world-view can accommodate an account of human knowledge. If no answer is available, that world-view is cast in doubt. For these purposes it is perhaps enough if Quine can sketch an account, compatible with his naturalistic view, of how we might acquire the knowledge which we take ourselves to have, whether or not it is correct in detail. (See Quine 1990c, 291.)
Quine treats knowledge as embodied in language. Apart from other considerations, language-use is observable and thus subject to scientific inquiry. Quine’s concern with how we might acquire knowledge thus takes the form of a concern with how we might acquire cognitive language. But his interest here is in epistemology, rather than in language for its own sake: “I am interested in the flow of evidence from the triggering of the senses to the pronouncements of science…. It is these epistemological concerns, and not my incidental interest in linguistics, that motivate my speculations.” (1990b, 3).
Much of Quine’s work in epistemology is thus a discussion of how a child might acquire cognitive language. This genetic project may seem to be a long way from the traditional concerns of epistemology. Quine claims, however, that the project in fact affords us the best obtainable insight into the nature of the evidence for our theories, and into the relation between theory and evidence: “the evidential relation is virtually enacted, it would seem, in the learning.” (1975b, 74–75).
4.2 Observation Sentences
Central to Quine’s naturalistic account of knowledge is the idea that all our knowledge is in some way based upon stimulations of our sensory nerves. For much of our knowledge, the relation is quite indirect. (This is one way of expressing holism; see 3.1, above.) Most sentences are not accepted because of a direct relation between the given sentence and stimulations of nerve endings; the connection goes via other sentences, and may be quite indirect and remote. But then there must presumably be some sentences which are directly related to stimulations. This is the role that observation sentences play in Quine’s thought. Acts of uttering such sentences, or of assenting to them when they are uttered by others, are shared responses to stimulation. (We shall enter some qualifications at the end of this sub-section.)
Observation sentences are the starting point for our acquisition of knowledge, the child’s entry into cognitive language. They are also the sentences which are evidentially basic. What fits them to play both roles is that they are (largely) independent of other parts of our language. Hence they can (largely) be mastered by a child otherwise without linguistic competence, and known without presupposing other parts of our theory. (The reason for the qualification will become apparent at the end of this sub-section.)
Many philosophers are content to take for granted the idea of an evidentially basic sentence. Quine, however, cannot take that attitude; he needs to show how we get “from stimulus to science”. The first step is to show that we can give a purely naturalistic account of how some linguistic utterances can be directly tied to the occurrence of stimulations of the sensory nerves---an account of observation sentences, more or less. Quine expends enormous labour on this point.
Quine considers acts of assenting to sentences (or dissenting; but we shall mostly leave that as understood). He focuses, in particular, on our dispositions to assent to sentences. (We will briefly consider the idea of a disposition in the next section.) To be an observation sentence, a sentence must fulfill two criteria, one individualistic and one social. The individualistic criterion is that a sentence is an observation sentence for a given person if he or she is disposed to assent to it when, and only when, he or she is undergoing appropriate sensory stimulations, regardless of her internal state (e.g. the ancillary information which he or she possesses). “It’s warm in here” presumably satisfies this criterion; my willingness to assent to it perhaps depends only on which of my sensory nerves are stimulated at the given moment. “There’s milk in the refrigerator” presumably does not; unless I am actually looking into the refrigerator at the time, my willingness to assent to it depends not on what I am experiencing at the time but on my internal state, what I remember. The social criterion is that the individualistic criterion should hold across the linguistic community as a whole. To specify this more precisely is tricky, and we shall postpone the matter for a few paragraphs.
Even the individualistic criterion raises considerable complications and difficulties. We speak of a disposition to assent (or dissent) in response to a pattern of stimulation but this is not quite accurate. Such a pattern, a complete list of which sensory nerves are firing, and in which order, will hardly ever repeat itself. So what we need is, rather, the idea of a correlation of a response with a type of stimulation pattern. But the relevant idea of a type here is complicated. The physical resemblance of two stimulation patterns, what Quine calls receptual similarity, is not enough to make them constitute events of the same type, in the relevant sense; two such patterns may resemble each other very closely yet lead to quite different responses. (Two occasions on which I am driving a car may be almost identical in terms of my stimulation patterns, except that on one occasion I see a red light and on the other I see a green light. As far as my response goes, that small difference outweighs all the similarities.) What is wanted is a more complex notion which Quine calls perceptual similarity. Very roughly, two stimulation patterns count as similar (for an animal, at a time) if they tend to lead to the same response.
With the account of perceptual similarity in place, we can say what it is for a sentence to be observational for me: if I am disposed to assent to it on one occasion on which I have a certain neural intake, then I will also be disposed to assent to it on any other occasion on which I have neural intake which is (sufficiently) perceptually similar for me at that time.
It is worth emphasizing the fact that the definition of the key notion of perceptual similarity is behavioural. It avoids any idea of experience, of awareness, of what strikes the person (or other animal) as more similar to what. It is simply a matter of responses, and thus of behaviour. (Assent is also treated as behavior, as sound-making propensities; see 1975c pp. 87–88). This is in accord with Quine’s insistence on what he takes to be scientific standards of clarity and rigour. One consequence of it is that the notion cannot be invoked to explain behaviour. Quine is under no illusions on this score. (See 1975c, 87, where the point is explicit.) The behavioural account does not explain our understanding of observation sentences; explanation, if possible at all, comes at the neuro-physiological level. What the behavioural account does is to make clear exactly what behaviour constitutes that understanding and, hence, what the neuro-physiological account would have to explain. (It also shows that there is indeed something to be explained.)
So far we have only an account of what it is for a sentence to be an observation sentence for a particular person. But our language is shared, as it must be if it is to enable us to communicate with one another. So we need to generalize the criterion across the linguistic community. One might at first think that the social criterion would be: if one person is disposed to assent to the sentence on any occasion on which he or she has a certain neural intake, then any other person having the same neural intake will also be disposed to assent to it. Quine gives essentially this account in (1960). As he quickly comes to see, however, it is not tenable, for it assumes that we can make sense of the idea of “same neural intake” between different people. But different people have different sensory nerves (and there is no reason to suppose that one person’s sensory nerves are homologous to those of others; see Quine 1969, chapter 6).
Quine returned to this problem on and off over the next thirty-five years. His eventual solution is that a sentence only counts as an observation sentence if an occasion which leads to my having neural intake which disposes me to assent to it also leads to your having neural intake which disposes you to assent to it. Here there is no cross-person identification of neural intake or cross-person standards of perceptual similarity. On this account, however, there can only be observation sentences if our standards of perceptual similarity line up in the right way. Two occasions which produce in me neural intakes which are perceptually similar by my standards must also (often enough) produce in you neural intakes which are perceptually similar by your standards. Quine is happy enough with this assumption of mutual attunement and suggests that it can be explained along evolutionary lines (see 1996, 160f., and for the whole story, Kemp 2022, 805–810).
We have been explaining the idea of our having shared responses to stimulation. For the most part, Quine assumes that assent to an observation sentence simply is such a response. This assumption, however, cannot be quite correct. It may look for all the world as if there were a rabbit in front of me, even though there is not. If I have no reason to be suspicious I will be disposed to assent to “Rabbit?”; if I know about the deception, however, I will not be. So my disposition to assent does not, after all, depend solely on my sensory stimulations at the time. It depends also on my internal state, whether I know that in this case the rabbit-like appearance is misleading. The difficulty arises because “There’s a rabbit” is corrigible, a feature which, on most accounts, it shares with just about every sentence other than those about the speaker’s current experience. If a sentence is corrigible then there will be circumstances in which it is false, even though those circumstances produce stimulation patterns which would generally lead observers to assent to it. But then some observers may know that the circumstances are of this deceptive kind and not be disposed to assent, while others have no such knowledge and are disposed to assent. The moral of this is that assent, even to observation sentences, is not a mere response to stimulation; the responder’s internal state (having ancillary knowledge, or not) may also play a role.
Quine does not seem to have fully appreciated this point, though some of his later discussions come close to doing so (see, in particular, Quine 1996). It is not fatal to his general account; it complicates the story rather than requiring a radical change. There may be no sentences—at least none that satisfy the social criterion for observationality—which can be wholly mastered simply by acquiring appropriate dispositions to assent and dissent in response to current stimulations. For some sentences, however, acquiring such dispositions comes close to mastering their use, because those sentences are almost always true in those cases where observers receive sensory stimulations which dispose them to assent. (Clearly this will be a matter of degree.) So the acquisition of the relevant dispositions, and partial mastery of the sentence, can be used as a basis on which the child can learn more of the language, and more about the world. This further learning in turn allows the child to modify her or his original disposition to assent and dissent merely in response to current stimulation.
4.3 More Complex Forms of Cognitive Language
Quine’s treatment of more sophisticated parts of language is notably sketchier and more speculative than his detailed discussion of observation sentences. In part this may be because he holds that it is most important to understand the very first step into cognitive language, how such language is possible at all. It may also be that the difficulty of getting a satisfactory account of observation sentences impeded him.
Beyond these points, however, there is, from a Quinean perspective, a limit to how detailed an account we should expect to have of the acquisition of sophisticated cognitive language. Mastery of an observation sentence corresponds (more or less) to a relatively straightforward disposition: to assent when receiving a stimulation pattern within a certain range. For most sentences, however, this is not the case. What disposition must one have acquired in order to count as understanding a sentence such as “The economy is in recession”? No doubt the disposition to assent in response to evidence is required, but what counts as evidence is almost unmanageably diffuse. In such a case, the links between sensory stimulation (such as that induced by the sight of words in a newspaper) and assent are “multifarious [and] not easily reconstructed even in conjecture” (1960, 11). A relatively clear-cut account, of the sort that Quine gives of observation sentences, is simply not available.
So Quine does not offer any sort of detailed account of the acquisition cognitive language beyond the observation sentences. (For comparison of Quine’s approach here with the very different approach of Chomsky, see Smith 2014.) Instead, he considers stages on the way, forms of language which one might suppose could be easily acquired by a child who has mastered observation sentences and which might provide steps leading to yet more advanced language.
One such step, which is emphasized in Quine’s later work, is the mastery of what he calls observation categoricals (1981 p. 28) These are sentences of the form “Whenever X [happens], Y [happens]”, where the schematic letters are to be replaced by observation sentences. (E.g. “Whenever there’s smoke, there’s fire.”) It is plausible to suppose that a child who has learnt the observation sentences can come by a mastery of the relevant observation categorical. Observation sentences are what Quine calls occasion sentences, true on some occasions and false on others, whereas observation categoricals are eternal sentences, true or false once for all. Quine suggests that we can think of observation categoricals as a plausible first step towards a general mastery of eternal sentences, which make up our serious theoretical knowledge.
Another step of the same kind is what Quine calls eternal predications, subject-predicate sentences true or false once for all, such as “Fido is a dog”. Assuming the child has learnt each term as an observation sentence, the sight of the dog will dispose him to assent to each. Quine speculates that the sound of the word “Fido” may have something of the same effect as the sight of the beast, inclining our learner to assent to “Dog” and thus to “Fido is a dog”. It is notable that there is a sort of use-mention confusion operating here, if Quine’s suggestion is correct. Language is learnt by confusion and “short leaps of analogy” rather than by “continuous derivation” (1975b, 77f.); indeed a holistic language cannot be learnt without such leaps.
A further advance, in Quine’s view, takes place when the child comes to use similar sentences but with two general terms, such as “Dogs are animals”. Such a sentence, Quine remarks is ‘‘really a universal categorical, ‘Every α is a β’.’’ (1974, 66). This kind of sentence, can be represented using pronouns (“If something is a dog then it is an animal”) or, more or less equivalently, using the logical device of quantifiers and variables. Such sentences have a particular importance for Quine in connection with the idea of reference. Merely to be able to use a name, to be able to name Fido upon seeing him, for example, is not yet to refer; one might simply be using the term as a response to the sight of the dog, hence as an observation sentence. Reference, as Quine sees the matter, requires the capacity to reidentify the object over time and changing circumstances: if a dog is barking then it—that very same dog—is hungry; hence the importance of pronouns.
4.4 Other aspects of epistemology
Quine also has things to say on more familiar epistemological themes. In some cases he indicates how they can be integrated into his approach; thus he suggests that we can (albeit unrealistically) schematize the testing of a scientific theory by thinking of ourselves as deriving observation categoricals which can then be directly tested against observation sentences. In other cases he is content to adopt more or less unchanged the account given by earlier authors, as in his list of the virtues of a theory (see 1990a, 20). Our account above has stressed the most novel parts of his epistemology.
One issue left unaddressed above is the question whether Quine’s naturalized version of epistemology is normative. Some commentators have claimed that it is not, and that this is a serious defect (see Kim, 1988). Others claim that naturalized epistemology is normative (see Gregory, 2008). Quine himself has weighed in, saying that critics ‘are wrong in protesting that the normative element…goes by the board’ (Quine 1990a, 19). He cites the ‘finding of natural science…that our information about the world comes only through impacts on our sensory receptors’ (Quine 1990a, 19) as being normative, ‘warning us against telepaths and soothsayers’ (Quine 1990a, 19). More generally, naturalized epistemology is concerned with ‘the whole strategy of rational conjecture in the framing of scientific hypotheses’ (Quine 1990a, 20).
Naturalized epistemology is thus certainly normative in this sense: it tells us that in drawing up scientific theories we should rely on the evidence of the senses rather than on soothsayers; that we should aim at simple theories, and so on. In telling us these things, however, it relies on what we already know: it deploys some parts of our science to guide attempts in other areas. It does not take a normative attitude towards science as a whole, criticizing or justifying it by wholly external, non-scientific standards. That would require a wholly extra-scientific position, an idea which Quine derogates as ‘First Philosophy’ (e.g. Quine 1981, 67). The rejection of any such idea is one way of phrasing the naturalism he advocates.
5. Metaphysics Naturalized
Quine takes seriously the idea that “it is within science itself, and not in some prior philosophy, that reality is to be identified and described” (1981, 21). It follows from this idea, as he construes it, that our best scientific theory of the world tells us as much as we know about reality. (Our best theory at given time tells us as much as we know at that time; no doubt our views will progress.) So setting out the broad outlines of that theory is the Quinean version or analogue of metaphysics, though he does not much use the word. This subject interacts with that of the last section: Quine’s account of the world both lays down the constraints within which an account of knowledge must proceed, and is, in outline, the knowledge that must be accounted for.
5.1 Method: Regimented Theory
How does Quine think we should establish the sort of claims that we are calling “metaphysical”? Some points are familiar from our discussion in section 2. First, we do not resort to any special kind of philosophical insight. Second, what matters is ordinary knowledge as refined and improved upon: science. Third, we rely upon the idea of regimented theory, science formulated in a language that is clarified and simplified “beyond what might reasonably be urged upon the practicing scientist” (1957, 235; see 2.4, above). We rely upon ordinary usage where no better is to hand, but accept changes that are improvements (see 1960, 3). A further point is that in striving for the clarity and simplicity of our theory we must consider the whole theory; local gains may be offset by global losses. It is thus to overall regimented theory that we look when we are “limning the true and ultimate structure of reality” (1960, 221).
What is Quine’s justification for relying on the idea of regimented theory, rather than on our ordinary conceptual scheme? (Cf. Strawson, 1959, Introduction.) One part of the answer is that just as science is in the same line of business as ordinary knowledge, but does it better, so regimented language is in the same business as ordinary language, but does it better. Regimentation, that is to say, is not the imposition of a wholly foreign language; it is the adoption of a language that maximizes scientific virtues already partially present in ordinary speech—logical structure, reference, the ready amenability to algorithmic methods. But another part of the answer is the idea that “our ordinary conceptual scheme” does not pick out anything definite enough to answer metaphysical questions. Thus Quine says: “…a fenced ontology is just not implicit in ordinary language…. Ontological concern is not a correction of a lay thought and practice; it is foreign to the lay culture, though an outgrowth of it.” (1981, 9).
Regimentation, in Quine’s view, involves paraphrase into logical notation. Such paraphrase greatly clarifies and simplifies our theory. Inferences which are a matter of logic will be revealed as such; where additional assumptions are required it will be explicit just what is needed. The logic which Quine takes as the structure of regimented theory is classical (bivalent) first-order logic with identity. Bivalence is justified on the grounds of simplicity. It is not that we have some independent insight into the nature of the world which shows us that every sentence of regimented theory is either true or false. It is, rather, that the simplicity that we gain from making this assumption, justifies our using a bivalent language; the metaphysical claim follows along. (This reversal of direction should remind us of Carnap. The difference is that Quine does not accept the Principle of Tolerance; see section 3, above.)
Quine’s choice of first-order logic, rather than second-order logic, has been more controversial than his adoption of bivalence. One reason he gives for the decision is that every formalization of second-order logic (unlike first-order logic) is incomplete, relative to the standard semantics. A further reason is that one purpose of the canonical framework is to enable us to assess the ontology of a theory. From this point of view it is an advantage that first-order logic has no ontological presuppositions of its own. (By adopting that logic we do commit ourselves to there being some object or other, but not to the existence of any particular entity.) Here again there is a clear contrast with second-order logic, which does have ontological presuppositions. Exactly what those presuppositions are is unclear, and has been debated; for Quine, this unclarity is a further reason to avoid the subject entirely.
Paraphrasing a theory into classical logic imposes extensionality on it: a predicate may be replaced by a co-extensive predicate without change of truth-value of the containing sentence; likewise an embedded sentence by a sentence of the same truth-value. Extensionality imposes quite severe restrictions. It requires, for example, that attributions of belief, and other propositional attitudes, be regimented into a form quite different from that which they may appear to have. (For this reason, the commitment to extensionality is quite controversial; see Føllesdal 1986 and Kaplan 1968, 1986.) So one might suppose that Quine accepts extensionality reluctantly, as the price to be paid for the advantages of the use of logic in regimenting theory. Such is not his attitude, however. To the contrary, he thinks of the clarity that extensionality brings as a great advantage, and of theories that lack it as not fully comprehensible: “I find extensionality necessary, indeed, though not sufficient, for my full understanding of a theory.” (1995, 90f.)
5.2 Metaphysical Claims
Quine’s regimented theory, then, is the sum total of our knowledge, the best that we have, reformulated so as to fit into the framework of first-order logic. The extra-logical vocabulary consists only of predicates. All metaphysical questions can thus be boiled down to two: What objects do the variables range over? and: What sorts of primitive predicates are to be admitted?
To the first of these questions Quine offers a straightforward answer: his ontology consists of physical objects and sets. We will say a little more about each. He counts as a physical object the matter occupying any portion of space-time, however scattered the portion and however miscellaneous the occupants; such an object need not be what he calls a “body”, such as a person or a tree or a building (see 1981, 13). He briefly entertains the idea that we could manage without postulating matter at all, simply using sets of space-time points, where these are understood as sets of quadruples of real numbers, relative to some co-ordinate system—that is, an ontology of abstract objects only. He seems to see no knock-down argument against this but abandons it, perhaps because the gain is too small to justify the magnitude of the departure from our ordinary views. That he is willing to consider such a view, and take it seriously, shows something about his general attitude.
Besides physical objects, Quine’s ontology includes sets. Our ordinary (unregimented) scientific theories require mathematical entities (numbers, functions, and so on). Set-theory enables us to define all those mathematical entities, and many non-mathematical entities, in clear and economical fashion; hence regimented theory admits sets. Quine is often said to put forward an “indispensability argument” (sometimes known as “the Quine-Putnam indispensability argument”) for the existence of mathematical entities. (And thus, it might be said, for Platonism, though that is not a term that Quine favors.) The argument has been well summed-up like this: “the indispensability of mathematics to empirical science gives us good reason to believe in the existence of mathematical entities” (Quine 1976, 1991; see also the introduction to the entry on indispensability arguments in the philosophy of mathematics). Taken very narrowly, it is correct to say that Quine endorses this argument. Our ordinary theories employ mathematical entities, and so regimented theory must give us some way of achieving the same effect; admitting sets into our ontology is Quine’s preferred method. But ascribing that argument to Quine may be misleading if doing so is taken to imply that he holds that there is some special problem about the ontological status of sets, or mathematical entities, or abstract objects in general, and that he employs the indispensability argument to solve that problem. For the mature Quine, there is no more of a problem with realism about abstract entities than there is with realism about concrete objects; indeed the distinction between the abstract and the concrete plays no significant role in his mature thought (see 1960, 233). All questions of existence and reality are to be settled in the same way: entities exist if and only if the quantifiers of regimented theory range over them.
Quine does not accept the existence of any abstract objects apart from sets. His ontology thus excludes other alleged abstracta, such as properties, propositions (as distinct from sentences), and merely possible entities. The chief reason for his denial of the existence of such alleged entities is that he finds their identity-criteria unclear; he holds, quite generally, that we should not postulate entities without having clear identity-criteria for them. (This is the view that he sums up in the slogan “no entity without identity”; see (1969, 23) and elsewhere.) Doing so would threaten the clarity and definiteness which the notion of identity brings to theory; local gains from postulating, say, propositions are not worth this global loss. (For a contrary view about properties, see Armstrong 1980.)
Regimented theory also has no place for mental entities, most obviously minds, if those are taken to be distinct from physical entities. The qualification is important. Many mental entities can be admitted as special cases of physical objects. Thus my act of thinking about Fermat’s Last Theorem at a particular time can simply be identified with my body during that period of time (see 1995, 87f.). The things that we might want to say about my act of thinking (that it was inspired, or stupid, or what have you) can simply be reconstrued as predicates true or false of physical objects. This is the view sometimes known as anomalous monism or as token-token identity theory, as distinct from type-type identity theory (see 1960, §54, and Davidson 1980). I may think of Fermat’s Last Theorem at many times, over the years, and on each occasion that act is identified with the physical state that I am in at the time. Token-token identity theory does not claim that these physical states have anything in particular in common, still less that all acts of thinking about the theorem, including those of other people, have something in common. There is no claim that each act of thinking about the theorem can be identified with, e.g. a repeatable pattern of the firing of brain cells (hence the monism is ‘anomalous’). It is enough for Quine’s purposes that each particular act of thinking can be identified with a physical object. This ontological physicalism might seem almost trivial; Quine speaks of it as “[e]ffortless monism … form without substance” (1995, 85). The view does, however, exclude disembodied minds and mental entities; Quine thinks that is no loss. Note that the view can be construed either as eliminating mental entities or simply as identifying them with physical objects. Quine prefers the latter phrasing but thinks there is no real difference here; cf. 1960, 265.
On the issue of the admissibility of predicates, Quine’s physicalism is more complicated. (This is in keeping with his general idea that we can think of the predicates, rather than the ontology, as “where the metaphysical action is”; 1976, 504). The requirement here is that the difference between a predicate’s being true of a given object and its being false of it should, in all cases, be a physical difference: “nothing happens in the world, not the flutter of an eyelid, not the flicker of a thought, without some redistribution of microphysical states…. physics can settle for nothing less” (1981, 98). If a predicate such as “…is thinking about Fermat’s Last Theorem” picks out genuine events in the world then there is a physical difference between its being true of a person and its not being true of them: a fact of the matter.
A difficulty in making sense of this is that the idea of a physical fact is not definitively specifiable. To tie the idea too closely to current physics would rule out fundamental changes in that subject; to leave it floating free might seem to allow anything at all to qualify. But clearly Quine does not mean just any subject that someone might call by the name “Physics”. He has in mind a subject continuous with our physics, alike or superior in its coherence and in its explanatory power. (In particular, it would not have “an irreducibly psychological annex”: 1986a, 403f.). If phenomena occurred which could not be explained by any theory of that kind, then Quine’s physicalism would go by the board.
The most controversial application of this view is to mental phenomena. Within that realm, Quine focuses on attributions of propositional attitudes, statements that so-and-so believes that such-and-such, or hopes that, or fears that, etc. (One reason for this focus may be that his interest is primarily in human knowledge; another that some other mental states, such as pain, can perhaps be accounted for by identifying them with certain types of neurophysiological events.)
Propositional attitudes also raise a different kind of issue. Attributions of such attitudes violate extensionality. If Mary is the Dean, still Tom’s believing that the Dean sings well is not the same as his believing that Mary sings well, since her accession to the Deanship may be unknown to him. Quine escapes this sort of problem by taking an attribution of belief to express a relation between the believer and a sentence, understood to be, in the usual case, in the language of the ascriber (not the language of the believer, where the languages differ).
It is worth noting the idea of another sense of belief-ascription which would not be vulnerable even prima facie problems of extensionality: so-called de re belief, as distinct from de dicto belief. In the 1950s Quine argued that there must be such a sense. In the late 1960s, however, he abandoned the idea, for lack of clear standards of when it is correct to ascribe a de re belief to someone. (See Quine 1956 for a statement of the distinction, and Quine 1973 for retraction.) Other philosophers, however, continue to hold the idea. (See, for example, Kaplan 1968, Kripke 1979.)
Construing attributions of belief as statements of attitudes towards sentences gives them a syntax and an ontology that Quine can accept. That does not, however, show that the idiom “A believes that p” satisfies his physicalistic criterion, i.e. that all statements of this form correspond to (physical) facts. The matter is complicated. Quine certainly accepts that most uses of this idiom are factual. The relevant facts are neurophysiological states of the person concerned, and those states are causally connected with actions which the person performs, or would perform under certain circumstances, and which we would count as manifestations of the belief, or lack of belief. (Assenting or dissenting when asked is one such action, but only one among a myriad.) In cases where we have evidence for or against the ascription of a belief to someone, the evidence consists in behaviour and there are presumably neurophysiological states which explain the behaviour. Those states are not in practice specifiable in neurophysiological terms. Nevertheless, the person’s being in those states is the physical fact in which the truth of the ascription consists. Even where there is no behaviour of the relevant kind, there may still be dispositions to behave in those ways under certain unrealized circumstances. The dispositions are the physical states in which the truth of the ascription consists. So in most cases where we ascribe belief, there is a fact of the matter which makes the ascription true or false. (More on dispositions a few paragraphs hence.)
The belief idiom, however, also lends itself to use in other cases, where there is no fact of the matter. These are not merely cases in which we have no evidence. They are cases in which no behavioural tests which we might have carried out would have supplied evidence, cases in which there simply is nothing in the subject’s neurophysiology, and hence nothing in their actual or potential behaviour, which would decide the matter. Quine puts the point like this: “Some beliefs, perhaps belief in the essential nobility of man qua man, are… not readily distinguishable from mere lip service, and in such cases there is no fact of the matter…. But most attributions or confessions of belief do make sense…. The states of belief, where real, are… states of nerves.” (1986a, 429)
Quine explicitly acknowledges that we could not in practice manage without idioms of propositional attitude, and that most uses of such idioms are entirely unobjectionable. But such idioms allow the formation of sentences which do not correspond to facts of the matter. For that reason, Quine excludes them from regimented theory; they are not be used when we are concerned with “limning the true and ultimate structure of reality” (1960, 221). (Some philosophers might insist: ‘Either you accept the concept of belief or you don’t’. Quine would not agree; see 1986e for closely related remarks about the idea of knowing who someone is.)
A somewhat similar point can be made about subjunctive or counterfactual conditionals. Some are factual, but the general counterfactual idiom allows for the formation of sentences which are not factual. Like propositional attitudes, counterfactual conditionals have an important role in our practical lives. They are also closely connected with dispositions which, as we have seen, play a central role in Quine’s account of language and how it is learnt. The connection is easily seen: to call an object fragile is to say that it would break if it were dropped onto a hard surface from a significant height.
Quine does not accept the general counterfactual idiom, “if X were to happen then Y would happen”, as part of regimented theory. As in the case of belief, the unrestricted use of this idiom allows us to form sentences whose truth-conditions are, at best, unclear. A famous example is the pair, presumably alluding to the Korean war of the early 1950s: “If Caesar were in charge he would use the atom bomb”; “If Caesar were in charge he would use catapults” (see Quine 1960, 222); they seem equally plausible but they cannot both be true (for a response, see Lewis 1973). In such cases, we have no reason to think that some (physical) fact is being claimed. Many dispositions, however, are perfectly acceptable by Quinean standards. To call the glass fragile is to attribute to it a structure which would lead its breaking under certain circumstances; the structure is a physical state, even if we cannot in practice specify it in physical terms.
Quine claims that the dispositions he relies on in his account of language are like the case of fragility rather than the case of Caesar. The disposition to assent to an observation sentence when receiving certain stimulations is a physical state of the person concerned; in particular, presumably, of his or her brain. The claim that a given person has such a disposition is thus a claim about the state of a physical object. It is, moreover, a claim that we can test, at least under favourable conditions. There is no reason to exclude it from regimented theory.
Another idiom which Quine famously excludes from regimented theory is that of modality, statements that such-and-such must be the case, or cannot be the case, and so on. Such idioms have been the subject of much discussion on the part of Quine and (especially) his critics; the discussion here will be very brief. Technically, there are similarities with the case of belief. There is prima facie violation of extensionality which can, however, be avoided by taking necessity to apply to sentences; some philosophers have claimed that there is a de re sense of necessity which does not lead to even prima facie violations of extensionality. Quine allows that modal terms have a legitimate ordinary language use (‘possible’ is sometimes used to mean something like: we can’t rule it out; see 1966, ch. 10). But his attitude towards the philosophical use of the idea of modality, dividing truths into the necessary and the possible, is far less sympathetic than his attitude towards belief; he is particularly unsympathetic towards the idea of de re necessity, which he sees as requiring “Aristotelian essentialism” (Quine 1953, 155).
What frames these critical points about necessity is that Quine holds that regimented theory, the best and most objective statement of our knowledge, simply has no need for that notion. The benefit of including such idioms in regimented theory is not worth the cost in unclarity that it would bring.
Truth, in Quine’s view, is immanent, as opposed to transcendent. In accord with his fundamental naturalism, he sees judgments of truth as made from within our theory of the world. For this reason, he sympathizes with what is sometimes called disquotational theory of truth: to say that a sentence is true is, in effect, to assert the sentence. Two qualifications must be made. First, the disquotational view is not a definition of “is true”. It enables us to eliminate the predicate from contexts in which it is applied to a finite number of specific sentences, but not from contexts where it is applied to infinitely many. Contexts of the latter kind are of particular importance to logical theory. We say, for example, that a conjunction is true just in case both conjuncts are true; here “is true” cannot be eliminated. (Unless, indeed, we ascend to a metalanguage and give a definition of truth for the object language that we are concerned with, following Tarski 1933.) Second, calling an eternal sentence true is in one way unlike asserting it. If we subsequently change our verdict on it we say that we used to believe it but now we don’t. We do not, however, say that it used to be true but now it isn’t; rather we say that it was never true. Quine, however, sees this as simply a point of usage, with no particular philosophical implications.
6. Underdetermination of Theory by Evidence; Indeterminacy of Translation
In this section we take up two ideas much discussed by commentators. Neither is essential to Quine’s overall philosophy, although in each case, but especially in the case of indeterminacy, the opposite claim has been made. (See Ebbs, 1997; for a defense of the position taken here, see Hylton, 2007.)
The basic idea of underdetermination is that two or more rival theories might have all the same observational consequences, and thus be empirically equivalent. Theory would thus be underdetermined by observation. This might be held to call realism into question (as in van Frassen 1980). Quine finds underdetermination harder to make sense of than might appear and, in any case, does not see a threat to realism.
In Quine’s idealized schematization of the relation between theory and evidence, evidence for theory consists of observation categoricals. (These latter can, in turn, be tested by observing or contriving situations in which relevant observation sentences are true.) The case which most obviously poses a potential threat to realism is that of a final global theory, a perfected and completed version of our own. What if there are two or more such theories, equally simple, each of which implies all true observation categoricals? (Note that the theory will not be implied by all the true observation categoricals; apart from other considerations, some sentences of the theory will essentially contain terms which do not occur in observation categoricals.)
Quine is often thought to accept underdetermination. But in fact he holds that there is considerable difficulty in making non-trivial sense of the doctrine. He identifies theories with sets of sentences, not with sets of sentence-meanings (propositions). So we can quite trivially obtain an empirically equivalent alternative to any theory: simply spell one of the theoretical terms differently at every occurrence. Strictly speaking, the result is a different set of sentences which implies all the same observation categoricals (1975a, 319). The difference from the original theory, however, is merely orthographic; this possibility is clearly not of any philosophical significance.
A closely related point can be made in terms of translation. Translation of observation categoricals is quite unproblematic in principle. So we can count two theories as empirically equivalent not merely if they imply the same observation categoricals but also if they imply intertranslatable observation categoricals. So classical physics as formulated in English (say) would, by this criterion, count as empirically equivalent to classical physics as formulated in German, yet the two formulations are, strictly speaking, different theories. Quite generally, any theory is empirically equivalent to its translation into any other language. But this fact is also not of any great philosophical significance, and certainly poses no threat to realism.
In order to threaten realism, a version of underdetermination would thus have to assert that our postulated complete global theory of the world has empirically equivalent alternatives and that no translation from one theory to the other is possible. Since the predicates of the theory are its only non-logical vocabulary, this is equivalent to saying that we cannot obtain one from the other by reconstruing the predicates of the theory. Quine comments: “This, for me, is an open question.” (1975a, 327). Much of his subsequent discussion of underdetermination takes place in terms of the weaker idea that our theory might have empirically equivalent alternatives and that “we would see no way of reconciling [them] by reconstrual of predicates” (loc. cit, emphasis added; cf. also 1990a, 97).
If some version of underdetermination were true, how should we respond? This is an issue on which Quine has not merely changed his mind but vacillated, going back and forth between what he calls the “sectarian” and the “ecumenical” responses. The sectarian response is to say that we should not let the existence of the alternative in any way affect our attitude towards our own theory: we should continue to take it seriously, as uniquely telling us the truth about the world. (We are assuming that the two theories possess all theoretical virtues to equal degree; clearly Quine would say that if one theory were superior in some way then we would have reason to adopt it.) The ecumenical response, by contrast, counts both theories as true. In almost his last word on the subject he suggests that there may be little at stake since the “fantasy of irresolubly rival systems of the world” takes us “out beyond where linguistic usage has been crystallized by use” (1990a, 100f).
Quine can afford to vacillate because, in his view, nothing very much turns on the issue. In particular, he never holds that underdetermination, in any version, would threaten realism; at no time does he suggest that it casts doubt on the truth of our theory. That is not what is in question between the sectarian and the ecumenical positions; all that is in question is whether the alternative theory should also be counted as true. Nor is this surprising. The terms in which underdetermination is stated, such as observation categoricals, are part of our theory, as would be the demonstration that another theory was empirically equivalent. The point here is the naturalism which we have emphasized throughout. Nothing in our epistemology pronounces on the status of theory from an independent standpoint; to the contrary: it presupposes the truth of our theory. This central idea is not cast in doubt by underdetermination. (See Severo 2008; for criticism, see Moore 2015 and for a rejoinder to Moore see Kemp 2016.)
6.2 Indeterminacy of Translation
The general claim of the indeterminacy of translation is that there might be different ways of translating a language which are equally correct but which are not mere stylistic variants. The claim includes what one might think of as the limiting case of translation, that in which a given language is ‘translated’ into itself.
Some philosophers hold that the idea of indeterminacy is absurd, or that it amounts to an extreme form of scepticism about whether we ever understand one another, or whether correct translation is possible at all. (See for example Searle, 1987; for a reply, see Føllesdal, 1990.) It is not hard to see how such opinions arise. One picture of communication is like this: you have an idea, a determinate meaning, in your mind and convey it to me by your utterance. To those who have that picture, indeterminacy threatens the whole idea of communication, for it suggests that the conveying is always vulnerable to drastic failure. In the case of translation, the analogous view is that synonymy, or sameness of meaning, is the criterion of correct translation; in that case, indeterminacy may appear as a denial that translation is possible at all.
Such views, however, take for granted a view of communication, or of translation, which is very far from Quine’s. For Quine, the criterion of successful communication, whether or not it involves translation, is fluent interaction, verbal and nonverbal: “Success in communication is judged by smoothness of conversation, by frequent predictability of verbal and nonverbal reactions, and by coherence and plausibility of native testimony.” (1990a, 43) This is a third person or external view of language and communication, as required by Quine’s naturalism. From this point of view, talk of synonymy and of ideas in the mind is simply a theoretical gloss which is (at best) in need of justification. Quine doubts that the gloss is justifiable; scepticism about the theorizing, however, is not scepticism about the data. Smooth communication certainly occurs, sometimes in cases where different languages are involved. Quine says nothing that casts doubt on the idea that successful translation (by his criterion) is possible; his claim, indeed, is that it may be possible in more than one way.
At this point we need to distinguish two kinds of indeterminacy. Quine introduces the general idea of indeterminacy, in Chapter Two of (1960), without explicitly distinguishing the two, but subsequently comes to treat them quite differently. The first is indeterminacy of reference: some sentences can be translated in more than one way, and the various versions differ in the reference that they attribute to parts of the sentence, but not in the overall net import that they attribute to the sentence as a whole. (Quine uses the terms “ontological relativity” and “inscrutability of reference”, as well as “indeterminacy of reference”. Some philosophers have sought to distinguish these doctrines, but in later work Quine makes it clear that he uses the terms simply as different names for the same thing. See Ricketts 2011, Roth, 1986, and Quine 1986d.) To use an example which has become famous, a given sentence might be translated as “There’s a rabbit” or as “Rabbithood is manifesting itself there” or as “There are undetached rabbit parts”, or in other ways limited only by one’s ingenuity. All that is needed is what Quine calls a proxy function, which maps each object onto another object and each predicate onto one which is true of a given proxy-object if and only if the original predicate is true of the original object. For terms referring to physical objects, he suggests, we can take the proxy-function to map each object onto its space-time complement. The change to the translation of singular terms and the change to the translation of predicates cancel out, leaving the overall significance of the sentence unchanged. The claim of indeterminacy of reference is not in any way a claim about what goes on in the language-user’s mind (pace Wright 1997). (Note that it will not help to ask the person we are translating whether she means to refer to the family dog or to its space-time complement: her answer is subject to the same indeterminacy.)
Indeterminacy of reference is akin to a view of theoretical entities put forward by Ramsey: that there is no more to such an entity than the role that it plays in the structure of the relevant theory (see Ramsey, 1931). For Quine, however, the point holds for all objects, since he “see[s] all objects as theoretical…. Even our most primordial objects, bodies, are already theoretical” (1981, 20). Quine holds, moreover, that considerations akin to those of the previous paragraph amount to a “trivial proof” of indeterminacy of reference (1986c, 728).
The second kind of indeterminacy, which Quine sometimes refers to as holophrastic indeterminacy, is another matter. Here the claim is that there is more than one correct method of translating sentences where the two translations of a given sentence differ not merely in the meanings attributed to the sub-sentential parts of speech but also in the net import of the whole sentence. (Hence the two translations would express different propositions, in the abstract sense, or different Fregean Gedanke; Quine claims that undermining these ideas was part of his motivation in developing the doctrine; see 1990d.) This claim involves the whole language, so there are no examples, except perhaps of an exceedingly artificial kind. There is also nothing resembling a proof; in some late works, indeed, Quine refers to it as a “conjecture” (1986c, 728). At some earlier points, he seems to think that sufficiently clear-headed reflection on what goes into translation will suffice to make the idea at least plausible. All that can be required of a method of translation is that it enables us to get along with the speakers of the other language: why should there not be more than one way to do it?
Arguments have been offered for holophrastic indeterminacy based on the idea of underdetermination of theory by evidence (by Quine himself in his 1970) . Perhaps there is determinate translation of observation sentences, and thus of observation categoricals. Still, if each two distinct theories is compatible with all observational truths, surely we could plausibly attribute either theory to the speaker of the other language. The weakness of this kind of argument is that translation must presumably preserve more than links between sentences and stimulations, as captured by observation sentences; it must also preserve links among sentences, links which make it more or less likely that a person who accepts a given sentence will also accept another. Could there be methods of translation which preserved both kinds of links but nevertheless yielded different results? Quine’s term “conjecture” seems apt.
Given the interpretation advanced in section 3, above, indeterminacy is not crucial for Quine’s rejection of the sort of use that Carnap makes of the idea of analyticity. He has other arguments on that score, as we saw. More generally, on the interpretation advanced here, indeterminacy is not a crucial part of Quine’s overall view. His coming to speak of it as conjectural, while not questioning other parts of his philosophy, suggests that he would accept this. If we were sure that translation is determinate, we could perhaps use the idea to define a notion of synonymy. (Agnosticism here favours the contrary position.) And, as Quine has indicated, we could then define the meaning of an expression as the set of synonymous expressions. Such a notion of meaning might make some difference. It might, for example, provide a criterion of identity which enabled us to accept beliefs as entities. It would not, however, play the most important roles in which philosophers have cast the idea of meaning. In particular, it would not play a role in the explanation of how we understand our language, or of how communication between persons takes place.
7. Quine’s place in the history of philosophy
In the 1930s and 1940s, many scientifically-oriented philosophers tended to assume some form of Logical Empiricism. One important aspect of Quine’s influence on the course of philosophy is that he called that view or nexus of views into question (see section 3, above). Some of his criticisms are detailed and technical. His target, however, was not a technical detail but the fundamental idea of Logical Empiricism, that there is a distinction between analytic truths and synthetic truths which can account for a priori truth. After Quine’s work of the early 1950s, philosophers, even those who did not accept his detailed arguments could no longer take it for granted that some form of Logical Empiricism is correct. This was a very major change among scientifically-oriented philosophers.
Quine’s rejection of Logical Empiricism leads him to two (connected) views which have been extremely influential. First, he rejects the idea of a distinction between philosophy on the one hand and empirical science on the other hand. To the contrary: he sees philosophy as essentially in the same line of work as science, but mostly concerned with more theoretical and abstract questions. This is an integral part of his naturalism. Second, his criticism of Carnap, and of the Principle of Tolerance in particular, opens the way for something that might be called metaphysics: for very general reflections on the nature of the world, based on the best scientific knowledge that we have and on claims about how that knowledge might be organized so as to maximize its objectivity and clarity.
Both of these Quinean views, his naturalism and his acceptance of something like metaphysics, correspond to very important developments within analytic philosophy over the past half-century. His influence has surely played a significant role here. (In the case of metaphysics, in particular, it is notable that two leading figures, Saul Kripke and David Lewis, were students of Quine’s.) For the most part, however, those Quinean doctrines have led to work to which Quine himself would be strongly opposed.
In the case of naturalism, many philosophers have welcomed the idea that they are free to use concepts and results drawn from empirical science. Fewer have accepted that philosophy should also be constrained by scientific standards of clarity, of evidence, and of explanatoriness. The result is that while views which claim to accept naturalism are common, those which accept Quine’s standards of what counts as reputable naturalistic philosophy are not.
The case of metaphysics is similar but perhaps more extreme. Quine accepts that the philosopher is in a position to make very general claims about the world (that there are sets but not properties, for example). In his hands, such claims are answerable to the idea of a total system of our scientific knowledge, regimented so as to maximize clarity and systematicity. Many philosophers have welcomed the freedom to speculate about the nature of the world but have not accepted Quine’s constraints on the process. The result is a flourishing of metaphysics, often based on ordinary (unregimented) language or on the alleged deliverances of ‘intuition’; much of this work would be anathema to Quine. (See Rosen 2014.)
On the one hand, then, Quine’s work has been extremely influential and has done much to shape the course of philosophy in the second-half of the twentieth century and into the twenty-first. On the other hand, much of the work directly or indirectly influenced by Quine is of a sort that he would have thought quite misguided.
Quine’s complete corpus
- Willard Van Orman Quine’s Professional Essays, Articles, Reviews, Abstracts, Unpublished Manuscripts, Lectures, and Remarks, maintained by Douglas Boynton Quine.
- See also the bibliography in Edwin Hahn and Paul Arthur Schilpp (eds.), 1986, The Philosophy of W. V. Quine, Peru, IL: Open Court; second, expanded edition, 1998, which is complete up to 1997.
Works by Quine referred to in the text
- 1951, “Two Dogmas of Empiricism”, Philosophical Review, 60: 20–43; reprinted in From a Logical Point of View, pp. 20–46.
- 1953, From a Logical Point of View, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1953, revised edition 1980.
- 1957, “The Scope and Language of Science”, British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 8: 1–17; reprinted in Quine 1966. (Note: there is an earlier publication with what Quine describes as “a corrupt text” in Leary (ed.), The Unity of Knowledge, New York: Doubleday, 1955.)
- 1956, “Quantifiers and Propositional Attitudes”, Journal of Philosophy, 53: 177–87.
- 1960, Word and Object, Cambridge, Mass.: M.I.T. Press, 1960.
- 1966, Ways of Paradox, New York: Random House, 1966; second edition, enlarged, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1976.
- 1969, Ontological Relativity and Other Essays, New York: Columbia University Press, 1969.
- 1970, “Reasons for the Indeterminacy of Translation”, The Journal of Philosophy 67: 178–83.
- 1974, Roots of Reference, La Salle, Ill.: Open Court, 1974.
- 1975a, “Empirically Equivalent Systems of the World”, Erkenntnis, 9: 313–28.
- 1975b, “The Nature of Natural Knowledge”, in S. Guttenplan (ed.), Mind and Language, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1975, pp. 67–81.
- 1975c, “Mind and Verbal Dispositions”, in S. Guttenplan (ed.) Mind and Language, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1975, pp. 83–95.
- 1976, “Whither Physical Objects?”, Boston Studies in Philosophy of Science, 39: 497–504.
- 1977, “Intensions Revisited”, Midwest Studies in Philosophy, 2: 5–11.
- 1981, Theories and Things, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1981.
- 1984, “Relativism and Absolutism” The Monist, 67: 293–96.
- 1986a, “Reply to Hilary Putnam” in Hahn and Schilpp (eds.), The Philosophy of W. V. Quine, pp. 427–31.
- 1986b, “Reply to Roger F. Gibson Jr.” in Hahn and Schilpp (eds.), The Philosophy of W. V. Quine, pp. 684–85.
- 1986c, “Reply to John Woods” in Hahn and Schilpp (eds.), The Philosophy of W. V. Quine, pp. 726–28.
- 1986d, “Reply to Paul A. Roth” in Hahn and Schilpp (eds.), The Philosophy of W. V. Quine, pp. 459–61.
- 1986e, “Reply to Jaakko Hintikka” in Hahn and Schilpp (eds.), The Philosophy of W. V. Quine, pp. 227f.
- 1990a, Pursuit of Truth, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1990; revised edition, 1992.
- 1990b, “Three Indeterminacies” in Barrett, Robert and Gibson, Perspectives on Quine, pp. 1–16.
- 1990c, “Comment on Parsons” in Barrett, Robert and Gibson, Perspectives on Quine, pp. 291–3.
- 1990d, “Comment on Hintikka” in Barrett, Robert and Gibson, Perspectives on Quine, p. 176.
- 1991, “Two Dogmas in Retrospect”, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 21: 265–74.
- 1995, From Stimulus to Science, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1995.
- 1996, “Progress on Two Fronts”, Journal of Philosophy, 93: 159–63,
- 2000, “I, You, and It”, in eds. Orenstein, Alex and Petr Kotatko, Knowledge, Language and Logic, Dordrecht, Holland: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 2000.
- 2018, The Significance of the New Logic, ed. and trans. by Walter Carnelli, Frederique Janssen-Lauret and William Pickering, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Alston, William P., 1993, The Reliability of Sense Perception, Ithaca NY: Cornell University Press.
- Armstrong, D. M., 1980, “Against ‘Ostrich’ Nominalism: a Reply to Michael Devitt”, Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 61: 440–449.
- Baldwin, Thomas, 2013, “C. I. Lewis and the Analyticity Debate”, Erich H. Reck, The Historical Turn in Analytic Philosophy, New York: Palgrave Macmillan, pp. 201–230.
- Barrett, Robert and Roger Gibson (eds.), 1990, Perspectives on Quine, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
- Ben-Menahem, Yemima, 2016, “The Web and the Tree: Quine and James on the Growth of Knowledge”, in Janssen-Lauret and Kemp (eds.) 2016, 59–75.
- Carnap Rudolf, 1928, Der Logische Aufbau der Welt (Berlin: Weltkreis-Verlag); translated by Rolf A. George as The Logical Structure of the World, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1967.
- –––, 1934, Logische Syntax der Sprache, Vienna: Julius Springer Verlag; translated by Amethe Smeaton as Logical Syntax of Language, London: Kegan Paul Trench, Trubner & Co., 1937.
- Davidson, Donald, 1980, “Mental Events”, in Essays on Actions and Events, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Ebbs, Gary, Rule-Following and Realism, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1997.
- –––, 2017, Carnap, Quine, and Putnam on Methods of Inquiry, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Fodor, Jerry and Lepore, Ernie, 1992, Holism: A Shopper’s Guide, Oxford: Blackwell.
- Føllesdal, Dagfinn, 1986, “Essentialism and Reference”, in Hahn and Schilpp (eds.) 1986, 97–113.
- –––, 1990, “Indeterminacy and Mental States”, in Barrett and Gibson (eds.) 1990, 98–109.
- Forster, Thomas, 2018, “Quine New Foundations”, in The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2018 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/sum2018/entries/quine-nf/>.
- Frege, Gottlob, 1884 Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik, Breslau: Willhelm Koebner Verlag; trans. by J. L. Austin as The Foundations of Arithmetic, Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press, 1978.
- Gettier, Edmund L., 1963, “Is Justified True Belief Knowledge?” Analysis, 23(6): 121–123.
- Gibson, Roger F., Jr., 1982, The Philosophy of W. V. Quine, Tampa, FL: University of South Florida Press.
- –––, 1988, Enlightened Empiricism, Tampa, FL: University of South Florida Press.
- ––– (ed.), 2004, The Cambridge Companion to Quine, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Gregory, Paul, 2008, Quine’s Naturalism: Language, Knowledge and the Subject, New York: Continuum Press.
- Grice, H. Paul, and P. F. Strawson, 1956, “In Defense of a Dogma”, 1956, The Philosophical Review, 65(2): 141–58.
- Hahn, Edwin, and Paul Arthur Schilpp (eds.), 1986, The Philosophy of W. V. Quine, Peru, IL: Open Court; second, expanded edition, 1998.
- Heal, Jane, 1994, “Semantic Holism: Still a Good Buy”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 94(1): 325–339.
- Hookway, Christopher, 1998, Quine, Cambridge: Polity Press.
- Hylton, Peter, 2007, Quine, London and New York: Routledge.
- Janssen-Lauret, Frederique, and Kemp, Gary, 2016, Quine and His Place in History, London: Palgrave Macmillan.
- Kaplan, David, 1968, “Quantifying In”, Synthese, 19(1/2): 178–214.
- –––, 1986, “Opacity”, in Hahn and Schilpp (eds.) 1986, 229–289.
- Kemp, Gary, 2006, Quine: A Guide for the Perplexed, New York: Continuum.
- –––, 2016, “Underdetermination, Realism, and Transcendental Metaphysics in Quine”, in Janssen-Lauret and Kemp (eds.) 2016, 168–188.
- –––, “Observation Sentences Revisited”, Mind, 131/523: 805–825.
- Kripke, Saul, 1979, “A Puzzle About Belief”, Meaning and Use, A. Margalit (ed.), Dordrecht, Netherlands: D. Reidel.
- Leonardi, Paolo and Marco Santambrogio (eds.), 1995, On Quine: New Essays, Cambridge, Cambridge University Press.
- Lewis, David, 1973, Counterfactuals, Oxford: Blackwell; revised 1986, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
- Lugg, Andrew, 2012, “W. V. Quine on Analyticity: ‘Two Dogmas of Empiricism’ in Context”, Dialogue, 51: 2321–46.
- Moore, Adrian, 2012, The Evolution of Modern Metaphysics: Making Sense of Things, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Orenstein, Alex. 2002, W. V. Quine, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
- Morris, Sean, 2018, Quine, New Foundations, and the Philosophy of Set Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Orenstein, Alex and Petr Kotatko (eds.), 2000, Knowledge, Language and Logic, Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
- Putnam, Hilary, 1962, “The Analytic and the Synthetic”, Herbert Feigl and Grover Maxwell (eds.), Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science (Volume III), Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, pp. 358–97; reprinted in H. Putnam, Mind, Language and Reality, Cambridge: University of Cambridge Press, pp. 33–69.
- Ramsey, Frank P., 1931, “Theories”, in R. B. Braithwaite (ed.), The Foundations of Mathematics and other Logical Essays, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1931, pp. 212–236.
- Ricketts, Thomas. 2011. “Roots of Ontological Relativity”. American Philosophical Quarterly, 48(3): 287–300.
- Rosen, Gideon, 2014, “Quine and the Revival of Metaphysics” in A Companion to W. V. O. Quine Harman/Lepore Wiley-Blackwell.
- Roth, Paul A., 1986, “Semantics Without Foundations”, The Philosophy of W. V. Quine, Hahn and Schilpp (eds.) 1986, Chicago and LaSalle Ill: Open Court, 433–462.
- Searle, John, 1987, “Indeterminacy, Empiricism and the First Person”, in The Journal of Philosophy, 84(3): 123–146.
- Severo, Rogério, 2008, “‘Plausible insofar as it is intelligible’: Quine on underdetermination”. Synthese, 161(1): 141–165.
- Sinclair, Robert, 2016, “On Quine’s Debt to Pragmatism: C. I. Lewis and the Pragmatic A Priori”, in Janssen-Lauret and Kemp (eds.) 2016, 76–99.
- –––,Quine, Conceptual Pragmatism, and the Analytic-Synthetic Distinction, London: Rowan & Littlefield.
- Smith, Barry, 2014, “Quine and Chomsky on the Ins and Outs of Language”, in G. Harman and E. Lepore (eds.), A Companion to W. V. O. Quine, Oxford: Blackwell, pp. 483–507.
- Sober, Elliot, 2000, “Quine’s Two Dogmas”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society (Supplementary Volume) 74: 237–280.
- Strawson, P. F., 1959, Individuals, London: Methuen.
- van Fraassen, Bas C., 1980. The Scientific Image, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Verhaegh, Sander, 2018, The Nature and Development of Quine’s Naturalism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Wright, Crispin, 1997, “The Indeterminacy of Translation”, in A Companion to the Philosophy of Language, Bob Hale and Crispin Wright (eds.), Oxford: Blackwell Publishers.
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- Quine’s Philosophy of Science, entry in The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy, by Robert Sinclair (Brooklyn College/CUNY).
- Willard Van Orman Quine, 1908–2000, Philosopher and Mathematician, a site maintained by Douglas Quine, son of W. V. O. Quine, dedicated to the work of the latter. It includes bibliographical information, lists of books on Quine, and much else.
We are grateful to Dagfinn Føllesdal, Andrew Lugg, and Ed Zalta for their comments on earlier drafts of this entry.