Naturalism in Epistemology
Naturalism in epistemology, as elsewhere, has a long history. But it is only relatively recently that it has gone by just that name and received so much focused attention. As in other areas of philosophy, questions concerning naturalism’s merits are central to recent epistemological debate. While many epistemological theories and positions are agreed by all to exemplify, or to run counter to, naturalistic epistemology (NE), it is difficult to characterize precisely, since “naturalism” is used to refer to a range of positions, commitments, and so on. NE, then, is more a movement or general approach to epistemological theorizing than it is some substantive thesis (/theses). Broadly speaking, however, proponents of NE take the attitude that there should be a close connection between philosophical investigation—here, of such things as knowledge, justification, rationality, etc.—and empirical (“natural”) science. Beyond that, and as detailed below, proponents of NE diverge in how they conceive of that close connection, exactly—whether and to what extent they advocate use of empirical methods, or insist upon the relevance of the results of certain areas of empirical study, or invoke certain recognized “natural” properties, relations, and so on, in their accounts of certain central epistemic phenomena. So too, proponents of NE differ in which science(s) they take to be relevant to epistemological theory—whether it is psychology and/or cognitive science, ethology, cultural studies, evolutionary theory, social theory, or some other area of empirical investigation.
NE can also be understood as an attempt to redress the perceived shortcomings of what’s typically termed “traditional epistemology” (TE). Here too, different naturalists are motivated by different concerns. TE is variously seen as unduly and unprofitably concerned with skeptical worries; as too much the product of “armchair” (perhaps a priori, and maybe ultimately idiosyncratic) theorizing; as too geared towards the study of “our concepts” of various states and properties and not concerned enough with the epistemological phenomena themselves; as operating without attention to the conditions in which knowledge (for example) is actually produced and/or shared, the limits, contours and history of actual human cognition, and so on.
Given that the differences amongst naturalistic theories make it difficult to give a precise characterization of NE, it is not surprising that the division between NE and TE is itself something of an idealization. Of course, just as there are clear instances where a theory belongs on one or the other side of this divide, there are some real differences between NE and TE broadly understood. Nonetheless, many specific epistemological theories incorporate elements of each, and so any neat bifurcation of extant epistemologies into NE and TE is bound to sacrifice accuracy for precision.
The discussion to follow describes some of the dominant claims, commitments, and forms that naturalistic epistemology, so understood, has taken, and specific examples of such naturalistic views. As well, both the principal motivations for and the major objections to NE will be discussed. Finally (and, in some cases, along the way), we will briefly consider the relation between NE and some other recent and important subjects, positions, and developments—some of them just as controversial as NE itself. These include externalism, experimental philosophy, social epistemology, feminist epistemology, evolutionary epistemology, and debates about the nature of (epistemic) rationality.
- 1. General Orientation
- 2. “Epistemology Naturalized”
- 3. Critical Reactions to Quine
- 4. Epistemology as “Thoroughly Empirical”
- 5. A Moderate Naturalism
- 6. Other Topics and Approaches
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. General Orientation
Contemporary discussions of NE tend to take as their starting point Quine’s seminal 1969 paper, “Epistemology Naturalized”. Before considering that work, some background will help to give a sense of the general character of the traditional approach to epistemological theorizing, the various themes running through NE, and the pre-Quinean history of NE. Here, the natural starting point is Descartes, who is widely regarded as “the founder of modern epistemology” (Sosa 2003: 554; cf. BonJour 2002: 6).
1.1 Some key features of TE
Descartes’ avowed goal was to “start again right from the foundations” (First Meditation, 1988 : 17) of science—i.e., to legitimate the foundations of inquiry per se, and to show how we ought to conduct ourselves intellectually in order to achieve knowledge and avoid error. The realization of the possibility of massive error—made vivid through the device of certain skeptical possibilities—of course had a significant influence over Descartes’ theorizing. His specific recommendation, arrived at through careful reflection on his own ideas, was a particularly strong foundationalism designed to rule out the possibility of error: one should “hold back [one’s] assent from opinions which are not completely certain and indubitable” (ibid.), and in fact treat as false anything that could possibly be false. On the other hand, Descartes says, “I…seem to be able to lay it down as a general rule that whatever I perceive very clearly and distinctly is true” (ibid.: 87). So long as one carefully apportions one’s judgment to the degree of “clarity and distinctness” of one’s ideas, given God’s providence, one can proceed in confidence that one is not theorizing in error.
Very few current practitioners of TE endorse Descartes’ arguments and positive views. Very few, for example, accept his infallibilism about what knowledge requires, and many regard Descartes’ arguments as manifesting an unfortunate circularity. Nonetheless, Descartes’ work exemplifies certain assumptions about the epistemological enterprise that many epistemologists have retained, even if only implicitly, and that have come to be closely associated with TE. Taking our cue from Crumley (2009: 185; Goldman 1986: 1–2, and Pacherie 2002: 300–301, make similar suggestions), we can identify the most salient such assumptions as follows:
- Much of traditional theorizing about central epistemic notions, such as knowledge, justification, evidence, and so on, has been carried out a priori: careful reflection, rather than empirical investigation, is taken to be the proper method to arrive at an accurate understanding of the true epistemological principles and facts.
- Second, and relatedly, is a view of epistemology as autonomous: in terms of both its methods and its subject matter, epistemology is independent of the sciences. Hence, for example, there’s nothing the sciences can tell us that will, or could, inform our answers to the distinctively philosophical questions epistemologists ask (“what is knowledge?”, “is knowledge even possible?”, etc.). On the contrary, if anything, it is epistemology that’s prior to the sciences—advances in the former can aid and constrain the latter, but not vice versa.
- Third—and again, relatedly—a distinctive feature of traditional epistemology is said to be its concern with normative matters. By this, it is usually meant at least that epistemological facts—whether a belief is justified or rational, e.g.—are evaluative, and not purely descriptive: to say that a belief is justified, for example, is to say that from an epistemic point of view it is good, correct, or permissible, to hold it. (Compare Chisholm’s (1977) calling “justified” a “term of epistemic appraisal”.) Many proponents of TE regard epistemology as being normative in respect of being prescriptive as well—i.e., of telling us how we should form our beliefs, and so on. This connects with the idea, popular within TE, that epistemology is in the business of offering useful advice, and so as having “an important meliorative dimension” (Kitcher 1992: 64; cf. Wrenn 2006: 60).
To Crumley’s list, we might, given its historical importance, add the following:
- While there is hardly agreement about how best to do so, among the central tasks of epistemology as traditionally practiced has been to articulate a plausible response to skepticism—i.e., to defend the ordinary commitment that we have, or are reasonable in taking ourselves to have, a wide range of justified beliefs and/or a decent stock of knowledge.
(a)–(d), again, are some of the central features of TE, as it is usually understood. Obviously, there are natural connections among them. For instance, to the extent that the autonomy of epistemology (b) is thought to amount to its priority—insofar as it approaches the status of “first philosophy”, in the manner Descartes supposed—a concern with (d) will be natural, even obligatory. So too, one might think that the autonomy of epistemology (b) is owing to its (partly) normative subject matter (c), and/or its distinctive methodology (a), as compared with the (purportedly) purely descriptive concerns and a posteriori methods of science. And so on. However, the theories falling within TE are, once again, a varied lot; and those sympathetic to TE at times pull these features apart, emphasizing commitment to them to varying degrees and in different ways.
1.2 NE: Some key forms and themes
And so too for those who favor NE: Naturalists join in rejecting one or more of the above features of traditional (non-naturalistic) epistemology. But different theories and theorists within NE reject—to varying extents, in different ways, and for different reasons—different combinations of these features, and so differ in how much distance is put between their specific view and traditional epistemologies. The resulting variety among naturalistic theories is reflected in the various taxonomies that other commentators have offered. Thus, for example, Alvin Goldman (1994: 301–304) has distinguished between meta-epistemic, substantive and methodological versions of NE:
Meta-epistemic NE: The meta-epistemological position that epistemic properties—in particular, those usually counted as “normative” or evaluative (see above)—are, or must be, appropriately related to “natural” properties. The major forms of such appropriate relations are commonly thought to be reduction and supervenience. (As Goldman notes (1994: 301–302), and we’ll see below, meta-epistemic NE may not as it stands be sufficient to distinguish between certain naturalistic and non-naturalistic views; and arguably, the motivation for it is as much methodological as it is metaphysical—see Section 3.2.)
In terms of (a)–(d) above, meta-epistemic NE would constitute a denial of the autonomy of epistemology (b), at least as regards its fundamental ontology. If the relevant evaluative property cannot be appropriately related to natural ones, on this view, it is rejected as unreal—yielding eliminativism or error theory—which would constitute a rejection of (c).
Substantive NE: Some object-level thesis in the vein recommended by meta-epistemic NE—that is, an account of some epistemic phenomenon in terms of certain natural (non-normative) properties or relations. Examples here would include accounts of knowledge or justification in terms of causation (Goldman 1967), reliability (Armstrong 1968, Goldman 1979, Papineau 1993, Kornblith 2002), natural functions (Graham 2012, Millikan 1984), information theoretic notions (Dretske 1981), or some kind of nomic or counterfactual dependence (Nozick 1983). Such accounts tend to be “externalist” in character—i.e., they do not require, for a subject to know or be justified in believing, that s/he be aware of that in virtue of which s/he knows or is justified.
Substantive NE too is a rejection of any very strong version of the autonomy of epistemology (b), understood as a claim about its subject matter. Further, some critics have contended that externalism is, as such, ill-equipped to provide useful guidance to epistemic agents, at least of the first-personal reason-guiding variety. In this way, it has been thought, substantive naturalistic views might run afoul of (c), understood as a claim about a specific type of normative guidance or improvement (see, e.g., Kaplan 1994, BonJour 1994). An important sub-theme within substantive NE, as Goldman notes, is “descriptive realism as opposed [to] idealization” (1994, p. 305), not merely for accuracy’s sake, but so as to ensure responsiveness to the principle that “ought implies can” (ibid.). For some, this is the primary motive for adopting a naturalistic approach:
The main reason that I believe that epistemology would have much to learn from psychology if psychologists knew more about belief formation is that I believe that in epistemology as in ethics ought implies can. Epistemic agents cannot and ought not be faulted on the grounds that they did not follow epistemic strategies which are not cognitively possible for them. (Grandy 1994: 343; cf., e.g., Cherniak 1986; Harman 1986, 1999; Bach 1984, 1985; Kornblith 2001)
Another manifestation of the aversion to overly-demanding or otherwise “unrealistic” epistemic theory is a tendency to treat
the question “How is knowledge possible?”…as an abbreviation for the question “How is knowledge possible for beings like us in the world as it is?” (Pacherie 2002: 306; cf. Papineau 1993, “Introduction”, and Kornblith 1994b)
The same “realistic” outlook is evident as well as in naturalists’ well-known and often-criticized disinclination to seriously engage with the traditional problem of philosophical skepticism (on which, more below).
Last within Goldman’s typology is methodological NE, according to which epistemology
should either consist in empirical science, or should at least be informed and beholden to the results of scientific disciplines. (1994: 305)
If the former, we have what Feldman (2012) and others, following Kornblith (1994a: 3–4), refer to as replacement naturalism. On the latter, weaker reading, on which epistemology retains some of its essential (traditional) features and merely “needs help” from other disciplines (Goldman 1986: 9), we have what Feldman (2012) calls cooperative naturalism and what Goldman elsewhere (1999a) dubs moderate naturalism (see Section 5.1 below).
In his own work, Goldman (1999a; 1986; 2005: 403) has emphasized the methodological form or dimension of NE; and it is foremost in the work of others as well, including Quine (1969b) and Kornblith (e.g., 2002, 2007). In terms of the features of TE described above, a commitment to methodological NE would see us rejecting or qualifying both the a priori character of epistemology (a), understood as a prescriptive claim, and its methodological autonomy (b): on this view, empirical methods and the results obtained thereby have a crucial role to play in epistemological theorizing.
Having reviewed some general features of TE, and some of the major forms and themes of NE, we will next consider some important and influential recent versions of NE, using the above features and categories to clarify and facilitate discussion. This survey will center on recent epistemological developments. However, it bears emphasizing once again that NE per se is not itself a recent phenomenon: as briefly explained in the next (sub)section, various themes within NE are as much a part of our epistemological inheritance as are the usual features of TE.
1.3 NE: A brief note on the pre-Quinean history
While Cartesian epistemology offers an especially vivid instance of all of the features of TE discussed above, some of those same tendencies and concerns are, of course, present in varying degrees in the work of other figures in the epistemological canon. The assumption that epistemology trades in normative matters, and not just description (c), and an abiding concern with skepticism (d), for example, can be seen in much epistemology from Descartes through to the present.
At the same time, however, many of the same figures’ works comfortably assume features of the naturalistic outlook. So naturalism is far from a recent invention; as Kornblith puts it, it has “a long and distinguished heritage” (1999: 158). As the subtitle of Hume’s most famous work, for example, makes clear—“An attempt to introduce the experimental method of reasoning into moral [i.e., human] subjects”—his intention was to apply the Newtonian “experimental method” to the human mind, avoiding “hypotheses” and trying to uncover the most general underlying principles. Only then, he thought, would we be in a position to get our epistemic position into proper perspective. Further, the inspiration Hume draws from sciences beyond “the science of man” (1739, “Introduction”) to which he intends his own work to be a contribution, is not merely methodological. He compares his principles of association to gravity, for example, “ideas and impressions” being the relevant domain of “objects” on which those “forces” operate (ibid., 1.1.4 para 6). Lastly, according to Barry Stroud, Hume’s “revolution in philosophy” was his use of this empirical orientation to rein in and replace an overly rationalistic conception of cognitive agents:
There had traditionally been a largely inherited or a priori framework of thinking about human nature—in particular about man’s rationality—that Hume seeks both to discredit and to supplant. (Stroud 1977: 9)
On the face of it, the “skeptical” upshot of Hume’s study stands in stark contrast to the strong sense of enlightenment optimism with which the Treatise begins (compare the “Introduction” of the Treatise to Book I’s “Conclusion”). But Locke, for example, is more consistently optimistic. His discussion of the nature and extent of human knowledge is, like Hume’s, preceded and informed by psychological theorizing based—to the best of his ability—on good observational reasoning. Further, Locke insists that it is “[f]olly to expect demonstration in everything” (Locke 1690: IV.XI.10), and he defends the information of the senses as giving us “an assurance that deserves the name knowledge” (ibid., IV.XI.3), notwithstanding the theoretical possibility of our being deceived. This runs counter to Descartes’ infallibilism, of course. But it also illustrates the above-mentioned shift, characteristic of NE, away from perfectly general questions about the nature and possibility of knowledge to understanding human knowledge, given the facts of our powers and situation:
…our faculties being suited not to the full extent of Being, nor to a perfect, clear, comprehensive Knowledge of things free from all doubt and scruple; but to the preservation of us, in whom they are; and accommodated to the use of Life: they serve to our purpose well enough, if they will but give us certain notice of those Things, which are convenient or inconvenient to us…. (1690: IV.XI.8)
Similar themes, both methodological and epistemic, are at the forefront in Thomas Reid, who begins his first major work as follows:
Wise men now agree, or ought to agree, in this, that there is but one way to the knowledge of nature’s works—the way of observation and experiment….All that we know of the body, is owing to anatomical dissection and observation, and it must be by an anatomy of the mind that we can discover its powers and principles…. (1764: Chapter 1, Section 1)
As to his epistemology, Norman Daniels claims that Reid’s views can be seen as “a precursor to recent work in cognitive psychology and ‘naturalized epistemology’” (1989: 133). And Rysiew (2002) argues that Reid does not entirely separate psychological facts from epistemic norms.
In general, then, if by “psychologism” we mean simply the view that psychology is of direct relevance to certain areas of philosophy—as opposed to its (usually pejorative) usage in denoting the identification of psychological and normative or logical matters—there is ample backing for Goldman’s claim that “[p]sychologistic epistemology…is in the mainstream of historical epistemology” (1986: 6). It was Frege (in The Foundations of Arithmetic, 1884), and Husserl (in his “Prolegomena to Pure Logic”, in the Logical Investigations, 1900), with their trenchant critiques of psychologism in logic and mathematics, who were largely responsible for initiating the sharp turn away from this broadly naturalistic status quo (see Kusch 2014; see too Kitcher 1992, Goldman 1986, Kelly 2014, Anderson 2005, and Engel 1998). A key part of Frege’s and Husserl’s thinking here was that tying logic to psychology was incompatible with preserving its necessary character, and with its being knowable a priori. Following their lead, the logical positivists approached epistemology, as other areas, as a matter of a priori “rational reconstruction”, in Carnap’s (1928 ) famous phrase. Such reconstruction “replace[d] rationally opaque processes with transparently rational definitions and inferences” (Richardson 2006: 682). Claims about ordinary objects were given “logical definitions” in a language that made reference only to experience (sense data); more complex such statements were defined in terms of simpler ones, and logical relations between them were made explicit. In none of this was the goal to be faithful to actual psychology.
The clean separation of psychology from epistemology was enshrined as well in Reichenbach’s famous distinction between the context of discovery and the context of justification, which he described as “a more convenient determination” of rational reconstruction (Reichenbach 1938: 6; cf. Richardson 2006: 683). Reichenbach writes:
Epistemology does not regard the processes of thinking in their actual occurrence; this task is entirely left to psychology. What epistemology intends is to construct thinking processes in a way in which they ought to occur if they are to be ranged in a consistent system; or to construct justifiable sets of operations which can be intercalated between the starting-point and the issue of thought-processes, replacing the real intermediate links. Epistemology thus considers a logical substitute rather than real processes. (Reichenbach 1938: 5)
While enthusiasm for the project of rational reconstruction faded, elements of the program—a disinterest in psychology, a preference for a formal-logical approach, and a concern with precise definition of key terms—were retained. It was in this period that “conceptual analysis”, for example, came to prominence.
The paradigms of epistemology became the logic of confirmation, the analysis of “S knows that p”, and the theory of justification or warrant, (Goldman 1986: 7)
to none of which was psychology, much less any other empirical science, thought to be relevant.
2. “Epistemology Naturalized”
Just as very few proponents of TE endorse Descartes’ own epistemological views, very few advocates of NE endorse the position presented—or seemingly presented—in the paper that is the starting point of contemporary discussions of NE, Quine’s “Epistemology Naturalized” (1969b). However, because of its undeniable historical importance, and because it will serve to introduce some of the principal objections to NE, it can hardly be ignored.
Like Descartes, Quine takes epistemology to be “concerned with the foundations of science” (1969b: 69). Addressing the logical empiricist project of rational reconstruction, he says that
[t]he Cartesian quest for certainty [is] the remote motivation of epistemology, both on its conceptual side and its doctrinal side. (1969b: 74)
About the epistemological project, so understood, Quine’s chief observation is hardly news: the Cartesian quest is “a lost cause” (ibid.). Whether in the form Descartes himself practiced, or in any subsequent form up to and including the logical empiricists’, work on both the conceptual and the doctrinal side is bound to fail: no strict translation of the notion of “body” in sensory terms is possible, and “the inferential steps between sensory evidence and scientific doctrine must fall short of certainty” (1969b: 74–75).
What is new in “Epistemology Naturalized” is what Quine recommends in the face of this result:
Why all this creative reconstruction, all this make-believe? The stimulation of his sensory receptors is all the evidence anybody has had to go on, ultimately, in arriving at his picture of the world. Why not just see how this construction really proceeds? Why not settle for psychology? (1969b: 75)
If all we hope for is a reconstruction that links science to experience in explicit ways short of translation, then it would seem more sensible to settle for psychology. Better to discover how science is in fact developed and learned than to fabricate a fictitious structure to a similar effect. (1969b: 78)
Epistemology, or something like it, simply falls into place as a chapter of psychology and hence of natural science. It studies a natural phenomenon, viz., a physical human subject. This human subject is accorded a certain experimentally controlled input—certain patterns of irradiation in assorted frequencies, for instance—and in the fullness of time the subject delivers as output a description of the three-dimensional external world and its history. The relation between the meager input and the torrential output is a relation that we are prompted to study for somewhat the same reasons that always prompted epistemology: namely, in order to see how evidence relates to theory, and in what ways one’s theory of nature transcends any available evidence….But a conspicuous difference between old epistemology and the epistemological enterprise in this new psychological setting is that we can now make free use of empirical psychology. (1969b: 82–83)
Even if it would offend strong anti-psychologists, it is not the suggestion that epistemologists make “free use” of empirical psychology that is so radical; it is the suggestion that psychology can and should replace epistemology. (As we’ll see in Section 3.2 below, in later writings Quine cites other sciences as being relevant to epistemology naturalized as well. But that does not affect the present discussion.) In terms of the features of TE laid out above (Section 1.1), Quine appears here to be rejecting (a)–(c) altogether: epistemology—“or something like it”—is recast as wholly a posteriori, descriptive, and anything but autonomous. As to (d), the traditional concern with finding an adequate response to the skeptic, Quine, in later writings, responds with the claim that “skeptical doubts are scientific doubts” (1975: 68):
Scepticism is an offshoot of science. The basis for scepticism is the awareness of illusion, the discovery that we must not always believe our eyes.…But in what sense are they illusions? In the sense that they seem to be material objects which they in fact are not. Illusions are illusions only relative to prior acceptance of genuine bodies with which to contrast them….The positing of bodies is already rudimentary physical science; and it is only after that stage that the sceptic’s invidious distinctions make sense.…Rudimentary physical science, that is, common sense about bodies, is thus needed as a springboard for scepticism…. (1975: 67)
But if skepticism itself is born of science, we can appeal to science in answering its doubts. For instance, we can look to natural selection, and find “some encouragement in Darwin” in quelling doubts about the reliability of induction:
creatures inveterately wrong in their inductions have a pathetic but praiseworthy tendency to die out before reproducing more of their kind. (1969c: 126)
(For similar ideas, see Kornblith 1994a and Dretske 1989. For a discussion of “evolutionary epistemology”, a specific avenue of study that treats both aspects of human cognition and theory change in science in terms of selectional processes, see Bradie and Harms 2015.)
In thus deflating the skeptical problem, Quine turns his back on (d), the final characteristic feature of TE. In terms of the forms of NE discussed above (Section 1.2), Quine appears to be recommending replacement naturalism and, consequently, the elimination of terms of epistemic appraisal in favor of descriptions of psychological goings-on (eliminative NE).
3. Critical Reactions to Quine
Unsurprisingly, given the radical character of the view defended, Quine’s “Epistemology Naturalized” has been subjected to heavy criticism. In this Section, we briefly consider a number of specific objections to it that have been presented. As we will see, some of these are more easily met, at least prima facie, than others. Others, geared as they are towards Quine’s arguments and position in particular, are of less general interest. Others still raise issues facing all versions of NE—they remain front and center in current discussions of NE and its prospects.
3.1 Five objections
(1) One natural response to Quine’s “Epistemology Naturalized” is to see it as involving, in one or another way, a gross non sequitur. On one version, this is because Quine equates TE with Cartesian epistemology; whereas, by the time of his writing, infallibilism had largely fallen out of fashion (e.g., Kim 1988: 386–388; Van Fraassen 1995: 82). So too for the project of “rational reconstruction”, “an epistemological program”, as Kelly puts it, “that had already been abandoned by the time [Quine] wrote” (2014: 24). Instead, by 1969 TE had largely turned to the now-familiar analytic program of suggesting definitions, or criteria for the application, of epistemic terms and concepts, revising these in light of often-imaginary counter-examples, and so on (Almeder 1990: 267). (A fair snapshot of the then-state of the art would be Knowing: Essays on the Analysis of Knowledge, edited by Roth & Galis 1970.) So, whatever the merits of Quine’s attack on the sort of strong foundationalist program practiced by Descartes and the logical empiricists, they fail to motivate any rejection of TE as such.
(2) A second objection is that Quinean naturalism is viciously circular. Among the central tasks of epistemology, it’s said, is to establish that empirical knowledge is possible—that we may, for example, legitimately rely upon empirical science as a source of knowledge. However, Quine would have epistemologists make “free use” of the results of science from the start.
(3) A third, related objection is that Quine’s response to skepticism is unsatisfactory. Insofar as the challenge posed by skepticism is to establish the possibility of knowledge, making use of certain methods of belief-formation, common-sensical or otherwise, is hardly going to strike the skeptic as legitimate: “Such attempts to respond to the skeptic’s concerns involve blatant, indeed pathetic, circularity” (Fumerton 1994: 338). Granted, Quine claims that skeptical arguments inevitably trade on the fact of illusions, which would seem to make (other) appeals to common sense fair game. According to BonJour, however,
[t]he fundamental skeptical move is to challenge the adequacy of our reasons for accepting our beliefs, and such a challenge can be mounted without any appeal to illusion. (1994: 288)
And even in the case of illusions, skepticism requires only their possibility, not their reality (Stroud 1981, 1984: Ch. VI; compare Feldman 2012: Section 3).
(4) Fourth, and perhaps best known, is the objection that, in recasting epistemology as “a chapter of psychology”, Quine is stripping away any concern with epistemic normativity. (Hence, that his endorsement of replacement naturalism has eliminativism as a consequence.) The complaint here is not merely that normativity is a feature of TE (Section 1.1); it is that a concern with normative epistemic matters is essential to epistemology per se. Jaegwon Kim, the foremost author of this complaint, takes the abandonment of normativity to be what’s really distinctive about Quine’s proposal:
He is asking us to set aside the entire framework of justification-centered epistemology. That is what is new in Quine’s proposals. Quine is asking us to put in its place a purely descriptive, causal-nomological science of human cognition. (Kim 1988: 388)
Quine does, of course, speak of NE as investigating “how evidence relates to theory”, but this claim is misleading. Since “evidence” here is proxy for certain causal-nomological relations, the claim “suggests a conflation of causal and evidential relations” (Grandy 1994: 345; cf. Sellars 1956: Sec 32; Siegel 1980: 318–319; Lehrer 1990: 168–172). Evidence as it relates to justification is what concerns the epistemologist. Justification is the central epistemic notion—it makes up the difference between mere true belief and knowledge (modulo Gettier), and is the locus of specifically epistemic normativity. Thus, to jettison justification is to abandon any concern with normativity; and without such a concern, whatever we’re doing, it’s not deserving of the title “epistemology”:
…it is difficult to see how an “epistemology” that has been purged of normativity, one that lacks an appropriate normative concept of justification or evidence, can have anything to do with the concerns of traditional epistemology. And unless naturalized epistemology and classical epistemology share some of their central concerns, it’s difficult to see how one could replace the other, or be a way (a better way) of doing the other…. For epistemology to go out of the business of justification is for it to go out of business. (Kim 1988: 391)
(5) A final objection that has been presented in various forms (e.g., Bealer 1992, Kaplan 1994, BonJour 1994, Siegel 1984, Brandom 1998) is that Quine’s position is self-defeating. For example, part of Quine’s argument for the idea that “the old epistemology” is doomed is his rejection of the a priori—feature (a) of TE (Section 1.1). However, as Mark Kaplan puts it, to convince of us this, and of the disreputability of “[t]he a priorism involved in the traditional sort of armchair methodological research”, “what the proponents of naturalism have offered us is a series of arguments” (1994: 359). But it seems that nothing in epistemology as Quine conceives of it affords us the resources for evaluating such arguments:
…are [naturalists’] arguments cogent? So long as the naturalists mean to be showing their audience in spoken word and in print that their doctrines are correct, this question will be an urgent one. But how are we supposed to go about trying to answer it? What are we to do—what can we do—to decide whether the naturalists’ arguments are cogent?
It is hard to see what we can do except evaluate these arguments by the light of the very sorts of epistemic intuitions which the naturalists are so eager to disparage. (Kaplan 1994: 360; cf. Almeder 1990: 266–267)
In this way, NE itself requires or presumes the legitimacy of appeals to a priori or “armchair” intuition, such appeals being a key element within what George Bealer has called “the standard justificatory procedure” in philosophy (Bealer 1992). So the position of the proponent of NE is self-defeating—“it seeks to justify naturalized epistemology in precisely the way in which, according to it, justification cannot be had” (Siegel 1984: 675).
3.2 Some responses, and further clarification of the issues
Various responses to the preceding objections have been suggested. Addressing the first will give us occasion to clarify typical current naturalists’ motivations, as well as—and relatedly—to get a better sense of what is, and is not, central to NE. Addressing the fourth and fifth will carry us beyond Quine and into the heart of current disagreements with, and within, NE.
(1) Recall, first, the non sequitur objection, according to which Quine falsely equates TE with Cartesian epistemology. One response is that Quine’s arguments survive—at least in spirit—the recognition that many epistemologists had/have already moved away from infallibilistic requirements on foundational beliefs, and that even in its more lenient forms, “[f]oundationalism has simply failed to deliver the goods” (Kornblith 1995: 238). For the looser we make the requirements on justified beliefs in answer to our pretheoretic intuitions, the less we’re learning about knowledge, the less we’re seriously engaged with answering the skeptic, and the less we stand to gain any substantial epistemic advice (beyond, “keep believing more or less what you already believed”) (1995: 239). So foundationalism, in whatever form, “is an idea which [has] simply failed to work out” (1995: 239).
A different line of response to the non sequitur objection is simply to grant the point, but observe that, Quine’s arguments notwithstanding, more recent naturalists have not been motivated by the failure of Cartesian epistemology. Rather, they have sought to find an alternative to what was seen as a stagnating or otherwise unsatisfactory traditional approach. For instance, failed attempts to solve the Gettier problem by requiring more, and more subtle, logical relations among propositions, seemed to ignore the fact that, unless the subject’s psychology aligns with the suggested requirements, the proposed analysis will fail (Kitcher 1992: 59–60). Thus, Goldman’s early causal theory of knowing—an early appearance of NE in the aforementioned Roth & Galis volume—was expressly presented as an alternative to
a well-established tradition in epistemology, the view that epistemological questions are questions of logic or justification, not causal or genetic questions. (Goldman 1967: 82)
Along the same lines, when, at the end of his “Discrimination and Perceptual Knowledge”, Goldman contrasts his approach with that of Descartes, it’s not the latter’s infallibilism that gets special attention, but rather issues of a broadly explanatory-methodological nature:
The trouble with many philosophical treatments of knowledge is that they are inspired by Cartesian-like conceptions of justification or vindication. There is a consequent tendency to overintellectualize or overrationalize the notion of knowledge. In the spirit of naturalistic epistemology, I am trying to fashion an account of knowing that focuses on more primitive and pervasive aspects of cognitive life, in connection with which, I believe, the term “know” gets its application. A fundamental facet of animate life, both human and infra-human, is telling things apart, distinguishing predator from prey, for example, or a protective habitat from a threatening one. The concept of knowledge has its roots in this kind of cognitive activity. (Goldman 1976: 102)
Other naturalistic treatments of knowledge were similarly motivated. For instance, Dretske’s (1981) information-theoretic account was an attempt to move beyond justification-centered accounts of knowledge—accounts which took it for granted that knowledge required justification, the task then being to find what special combination of other ingredients must be added to yield knowledge. According to Dretske, such an approach faces “a variety of crippling objections” (1981: 85). In addition, “[t]he concept of justification (or some related epistemic notion) is often taken to be primitive”, with theorists using
firmer intuitions about when, and whether, someone knows something to determine when, and whether, someone has a satisfactory level of justification. (1981: 249)
Finally, like Goldman, Dretske associates justificationist accounts of knowledge with a tendency to over-intellectualize epistemic phenomena, to focus on “fancier” cases of knowing, cases which bring in (what he sees as) extraneous factors. The result is that the theorist is left having to reject some very clear cases of knowledge—in children, non-human animals, and unreflective adults—as not genuine knowledge at all (Dretske 1991). His own account of knowledge,
is an attempt to get away from the philosopher’s usual bag of tricks (justification, reasons, evidence, etc.) in order to give a more realistic picture of what perceptual knowledge is. (1983: 58)
The same kind of broad methodological concerns are evident as well in naturalistic accounts of justification (warrant, etc.), rather than knowledge. Goldman’s reliabilism about justification (1979), for example, has among its starting points a critique of “ahistorical”, apsychological accounts of justification—i.e., accounts which state conditions on a belief’s being justified
without restriction on why the belief is held, i.e., on what causally initiates the belief or causally sustains it. (1979: 112)
Also worth noting here are a pair of more strictly meta-epistemological desiderata Goldman announces at the start of the same paper. The first is that an account of justification should be “substantive”—i.e., that it should specify in non-epistemic terms when a belief is justified (p. 105). This recalls, of course, meta-epistemic NE (Section 1.2)—i.e., the thought that evaluative epistemic properties are, or must be, reducible or otherwise appropriately related to (e.g., supervene on) “natural” properties. And it is sometimes suggested that this—the demand, as Maffie puts it, that “epistemic value [be] anchored to descriptive fact, no longer entering the world autonomously as brute, fundamental fact” (1990a: 284)—is central to the debate over NE (ibid.; Steup 1996: 185–6). According to Kim, that epistemic properties do plausibly supervene on “natural facts” is what makes normative epistemology possible, and naturalistically respectable, even if no reduction is forthcoming:
…is there a positive reason for thinking that normative epistemology is a viable program?…. The short answer is this: we believe in the supervenience of epistemic properties on naturalistic ones, and more generally, in the supervenience of all valuational and normative properties on naturalistic conditions…. That [a given belief] is a justified belief cannot be a brute fundamental fact unrelated to the kind of belief it is. There must be a reason for it, and this reason must be grounded in the factual descriptive properties of that particular belief. Something like this, I think, is what we believe. (Kim 1988: 399)
As others have observed, however, it is doubtful that the question of whether epistemic properties at least supervene upon natural properties—hence, meta-epistemic NE, as written—sheds much light on the NE-vs-TE controversy (see Foley 1994: 243–244; Feldman 2012: Section 4; Maffie 1990a: 289; Kappel 2011: 839). For virtually everyone on both sides of that debate can be seen as agreeing that epistemic properties supervene. (The notable exception here is Lehrer 1997.) For example, Chisholm, who is hardly thought to be an advocate of NE, is explicit in holding that epistemic facts supervene on non-epistemic ones (1989: 42–43; cf. 1957: 31–39; 1982: 12)—for instance, that being appeared to in certain ways makes it evident to S that he is appeared to by an F, or makes S justified in believing that there is an F before him. And Feldman (2012) argues that evidentialism—which is usually regarded as an instance of TE, not NE—respects supervenience as well. (Evidentialism has it that what determines whether one is justified is a function of the evidence possessed, where one’s evidence, on the view Feldman himself favors, is some combination of one’s experiences, memories and other beliefs.)
So we do not yet have a plausible candidate, in the vicinity of meta-epistemic NE, of something on which proponents of TE and NE might clearly divide. Taking Goldman as our representative of NE, we find a suggestion in his second desideratum—namely, that an account of justification be genuinely explanatory, or “appropriately deep and revelatory” (1979: 106). He writes:
Suppose, for example, that the following sufficient condition of justified belief is offered: “If S senses redly at t and S believes at t that he is sensing redly, then S’s belief at t that he is sensing redly is justified”. This is not the kind of principle I seek; for, even if it is correct, it leaves unexplained why a person who senses redly and believes that he does, believes this justifiably. (1979: 106)
So, while the stated Chisholmian principle itself respects supervenience—what’s mentioned in its antecedent is, plausibly, wholly psychological—it fails to be genuinely illuminating. As Feldman says, Chisholm holds that, underlying particular epistemic facts such as the one Goldman mentions are “principles of evidence other than the formal principles of deductive logic and inductive logic” (Chisholm 1977: 67) which are themselves fundamental. Further, Feldman continues, something similar is true of traditionalists more generally:
In addition to facts about particular people being justified in believing particular propositions, [traditionalists] are committed to the existence of epistemic facts about what beliefs are supported by a particular body of evidence. It remains unclear whether these are natural facts. Traditionalists often regard these facts as necessary truths, and it is their necessity that enables evidentialists to endorse the supervenience thesis. [On standard definitions of supervenience, necessary truths supervene on any facts—so, trivially, they supervene on natural facts.]….[But it] is legitimate to ask whether they count as natural facts. (Feldman 2012: Section 4)
However, regardless of the answer to the latter question, construed as a metaphysical query, it is clear that the relevant meta-epistemological concern of Goldman’s, at least, is methodological: he wants to explain justification, and thinks that an appeal to the reliability of the processes which generate and sustain a belief, for example, does just that, whereas an appeal to Chisholmian—or, presumably, evidentialist—principles does not. Similar concerns would apply to Chisholm’s (1977) taking reasonableness as primitive and casting other central epistemic notions in terms of it (as Lehrer would later do; see his 1990: 127): while this is compatible with there in fact being some naturalistic basis for reasonableness—i.e., with reasonableness being part of the real, natural world—the resulting account would not be “appropriately deep and revelatory”.
Of course, opponents of NE may contest this claim and hold that there just are brute epistemic principles and sui generis epistemic properties—as Chisholm, Lehrer, and perhaps many other traditionalists believe (Fumerton, e.g., is quite explicit about this; 1988: 454–455). And, as Feldman (2012: Section 4) notes, the disagreement here appears to be over what is natural, as opposed to over whether extra-natural facts exist. Nevertheless, the present point is that the attempt to avoid any such fundamental epistemic properties or principles in one’s theorizing appears to be a real difference between NE and TE, and seems to be of more central importance than a concern for reduction-or-supervenience per se. In any case, it should now be clear that current naturalists are not directly inspired by the failure of specifically Cartesian epistemology. So even if it’s a mistake on Quine’s part to represent NE as having such a source, that point does not seem directly relevant here.
(2) Turning now to the circularity objection, Quine himself addresses it when he says:
If the epistemologist’s goal is validation of the grounds of empirical science, he defeats his purpose by using psychology or other empirical science in the validation. However, such scruples against circularity have little point once we have stopped dreaming of deducing science from observations. (1969b: 75–76)
Moreover, this rejoinder aside, it may be that “we should expect question begging when the issue concerns our most fundamental methods of inquiry” (Foley 1994: 256). Further, there is no guarantee anyway that a given method will vindicate itself—a method may generate evidence that undermines its own reliability (ibid.). Finally, just when (if ever) circularity is epistemically bad, and why, is a matter of some controversy. (For general discussion and references, see Lammenranta n.d. in Other Internet Resources; see too Kappel 2011: 843.)
(3) Broadly similar remarks have been suggested in reply to the objection that Quine’s response to skepticism is unsatisfactory. While that response may involve blatant circularity, for the reasons just given it’s an open question whether that circularity is vicious. Further, Quine claims, in pointing out that skeptical doubts are scientific doubts, he did not take himself to be refuting the skeptic or subjecting skepticism to a reductio (1975: 68). More generally, questions might be raised about the underlying assumption that responding to the skeptic in such a way as to not beg any questions is an achievable end to begin with, and so whether it is something that deserves as much attention as it has traditionally been afforded. Here, proponents of NE diverge somewhat. Kornblith states that the project of responding to the skeptic is “a dead end” (1999: 166). In a similar vein, Kitcher says that “[s]keptics who insist that we begin from no assumptions are inviting us to play a mug’s game” (1993: 35). Dretske (1970, 1981) is more conciliatory, offering an explanation that grants certain skeptical claims their power, even correctness, while defending our knowledge nonetheless. And both Goldman (1986: 39–41, 55–57; 1976: 101) and Pollock (1986: 1–7) take it to be a task of epistemology to address skepticism—even if our goal therein is to understand and learn from skepticism rather than to refute it, and even if the topic deserves less attention than it has historically received.
(4) Kornblith sums up the normativity objection as follows: “Epistemology without normativity…is just Hamlet without the prince of Denmark” (1995: 250). As we saw above, it looks as though handing epistemology off to psychology (replacement NE) makes epistemology a purely descriptive enterprise (hence, yields eliminative NE). Certainly, Quine is hardly friendly to epistemology as standardly practiced. For example, he thinks that, as it’s usually understood, the notion of knowledge is so beset by imprecision that, for theoretical purposes, we should “give [it] up… as a bad job” (1989: 109; see too Johnsen 2005: 92–93). And no doubt “Epistemology Naturalized” encourages the standard interpretation of Quine as jettisoning a concern for normative epistemic matters. Nonetheless, as recent commentators have pointed out (see, e.g., Foley 1994 and Johnsen 2005; both cite numerous examples of the standard interpretation), in his later work, Quine insists that “[t]he normative is naturalized, not dropped” (1990: 229). He writes:
Naturalization of epistemology does not jettison the normative and settle for the indiscriminate description of ongoing procedures. For me normative epistemology is a branch of engineering. It is the technology of truth-seeking, or, in a more cautiously epistemological term, prediction. Like any technology, it makes free use of whatever scientific findings may suit its purpose. It draws upon mathematics in computing standard deviation and probable error and in scouting the gambler’s fallacy. It draws upon experimental psychology in exposing perceptual illusions, and upon cognitive psychology in scouting wishful thinking. It draws upon neurology and physics, in a general way, in discounting testimony from occult or parapsychological sources. There is no question here of ultimate value, as in morals; it is a matter of efficacy for an ulterior end, truth or prediction. The normative here, as elsewhere in engineering, becomes descriptive when the terminal parameter is expressed. (Quine 1986: 664–665)
For Quine, then, epistemic normativity is simply a matter of instrumental efficacy towards the relevant end—viz., truth or prediction. Thus, normative epistemology “gets naturalized into a chapter of engineering: the technology of anticipating sensory stimulation” (1992: 19). He continues:
The most notable norm of naturalized epistemology actually coincides with that of traditional epistemology. It is simply the watchword of empiricism: nihil in mente quod non prius in sensu. This is a prime specimen of naturalized epistemology, for it is a finding of natural science itself, however fallible, that our information about the world comes only through the impact of our sensory receptors. And still the point is normative, warning us against telepaths and soothsayers. (Quine 1992: 19)
(5) So Quine does have an account of epistemic normativity after all, and thus a response to the normativity objection to (his version of) NE. And yet, one might see that response as inviting once again the charge of self-defeat. For example, one might wonder why it is truth, or prediction—rather than pleasure, say, or monetary gain—that is the epistemic end. Is that a result of science, discovered a posteriori (compare Foley 1994: 249)? A friend of TE is likely to see it, rather, as a conceptual truth that is knowable, intuitively, a priori. Similarly, one can wonder whether natural science per se really does underwrite the putative empiricist “watchword”. Much recent developmental psychology, for instance, seems to suggest that at least some empirical “knowledge” (or empirical “theories” or “assumptions”) is native, rather than sensorily acquired (see Samet and Zaitchik 2014 for an overview).—Not that such a contrary finding, or theoretical disagreement on the matter within the relevant sciences, would itself pose a problem for Quine’s general approach to NE. The relevant point, rather, is that the matter and disagreement in question are theoretical, and that it is not immediately clear whether it is something that can be settled without the help of “old-fashioned” methods such as armchair reflection, some of it perhaps a priori, on the relevant data and issues. (The present worry could be developed along other lines—e.g., that natural science presupposes that truth or prediction is the end, that the senses are what give us information about the world, etc. This would take us back to worries about circularity. As we’ve already seen, there is inter-play between the concerns to which NE gives rise.)
Nonetheless, while he is best-known for taking psychology—and, what’s more, behavioristic psychology (“neural receptors and their stimulation rather than sense of sensibilia” (Quine 1992: 19))—to be the successor to TE, Quine has a very broad conception of science. Science for Quine includes humble, everyday common sense thinking, after all. Further, while he sometimes speaks of one discipline replacing another, Quine also expresses his idea in terms of the “rubbing out” (1969b: 90) or “blurring” (1995: 257) of disciplinary boundaries such as that between epistemology and science. Finally, given his rejection of analyticity, his consequent rejection of the a priori, and his holism about both meaning and confirmation, it is quite unclear how Quine could maintain any hard and fast distinction between philosophy and science (Gregory 2006: 660). For these reasons, it is unclear whether the entirety of traditional philosophical methods per se would—or could—be excluded from a respectable Quinean epistemology. Unfortunately, Quine himself does not provide a clear and direct account of what, notwithstanding the rejection of the a priori, might indeed remain of TE and its method within “epistemology naturalized”.
Where we are left, then, is needing a way of understanding how, within the constraints of NE, truth (or prediction) comes to be fixed as the epistemic end, such that the normativity objection can be fully met. More generally, we need some respectable naturalistic version of traditional philosophical methods (reflecting on cases, consulting our intuitions, and so on), or of alternative methods closely approximating them. For it seems that it is only if we have something playing those methods’ usual role—constructing and arbitrating between theories, directing our more obviously empirical inquiries, and so on—that the charge of self-defeat can be avoided.
Both of these matters—the ability of NE to account for epistemic normativity, and to accommodate or find a suitable replacement for the traditional philosophical methodology that some see as indispensable to epistemological theorizing—are at the center of current debate both about, and within, NE. Over the next two sections we consider two prominent means of addressing these matters—those offered by Hilary Kornblith and by Alvin Goldman—and the challenges that each faces.
4. Epistemology as “Thoroughly Empirical”
4.1 Knowledge and Epistemology
Unlike Quine, Kornblith retains knowledge as a central epistemological notion. However, his position departs dramatically from TE in how it understands the nature of epistemological investigation. Here, in both its proper target and its methods, epistemology is held not to be as TE and its practitioners portray them. As to the first, recall (Section 1.3) that a, if not the, central task of analytic epistemology following the demise of logical empiricism was “the analysis of knowledge”, by which was meant the attempt to provide an analysis, typically in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions, of the concept of knowledge. (See, for instance, the various papers in the aforementioned Roth and Galis volume.) Against this, it is suggested that the concept of knowledge is of little if any theoretical interest; it is no more the proper target of epistemological theory than the concept of aluminum is a worthy target of inquiry for one trying to understand various metals. Likely, Kornblith says, our concept of knowledge is defective in various ways anyway. (For example, in spite of its now near-universal rejection among epistemologists, the idea that knowledge required certainty enjoyed the favor of many, and is arguably still attractive among many non-philosophers.) What epistemologists should seek is “to provide an account of a certain natural phenomenon, namely, knowledge itself” (1999: 161). “It is the investigation of knowledge as a phenomenon in the world”, he writes, “which distinguishes naturalism from other approaches to knowledge” (1995: 245).
As to method, the epistemologist should proceed as would our imagined metallurgist: we begin by examining apparently clear cases of knowledge, and look to find what they have in common. Part of what happens here, very likely, is that we will reclassify some of these examples along the way. What emerges, however, is a picture of the true nature of knowledge. Specifically, and as is evident in the work of cognitive ethologists in particular—that is, those whose job it is to study intelligent animal behavior—what emerges is an essentially reliabilist picture, in which knowledge consists in
true beliefs that are reliably produced, that are instrumental in the production of behavior successful in meeting biological needs and thereby implicated in the Darwinian explanation of the selective retention of traits. (Kornblith 2002: 62)
Knowledge, on this view, is a natural kind, one that’s realized in both human and non-human animals. It has a particular nature, and a particular causal-explanatory role in our general understanding of the life and success of certain types of biological organisms. In better understanding that place, and through an empirical investigation of
the various mechanisms of belief production and retention, we may determine where we are most in need of guidance, and what steps can be taken, given our capabilities, to overcome our shortcomings. (Kornblith 1999: 163; on NE and epistemic improvement, see too Kornblith’s 1994b)
So, both at the stage of understanding the worldly epistemological target, and in recommending possible improvements to our epistemic strategies, “a proper naturalistic epistemology is empirical all the way down” (Kornblith 1995: 243). While epistemology thus has no distinctive method, there is a sense, Kornblith thinks, in which it retains its autonomy:
Questions about knowledge and justification, questions about theory and evidence, are...legitimate questions, and they are ones in which philosophy has a special stake….If the autonomy of a discipline consists in dealing with a distinctive set of questions, or in approaching certain phenomena with a distinctive set of concerns, then philosophy is surely an autonomous discipline. There is no danger that these questions and concerns will be somehow co-opted by other disciplines. (Kornblith 2002: 26)
4.2 Epistemic Normativity
While Kornblith thus denies that epistemology is to be replaced by some other discipline(s) (replacement NE), it is perhaps less clear what becomes of the normativity of epistemology on his view. Unlike Quine as he is standardly interpreted—but as appears to be Quine’s view in later writings—Kornblith is “quite sympathetic with the suggestion that the normative dimension of epistemological inquiry is essential to it” (Kornblith 1995: 250). And Kornblith, like reliabilists generally, portrays truth (true belief) as the epistemic goal—much as Quine, in describing his view of the normative dimension of epistemology (Section 3), presumes that truth (or prediction) is “the terminal parameter”. But how is that fact established, such that a “thoroughly empirical” (1995: 250) epistemology can, after all, retain the normative dimension of TE?
One response to this question is that epistemic norms have a “practical grounding” (Kornblith 1993b, 2002). While it is compatible with the possible intrinsic value of true belief (Kornblith 2002: 161, 373), such an account features its instrumental value. Importantly, however, the argument is not cast (just) in terms of the instrumental value of individual true beliefs; the central claim, rather, is that everyone “has pragmatic reasons to favor a cognitive system which is effective in generating truths” (2002: 156). This point can perhaps be best illustrated by considering an alternative naturalistic account of the source of epistemic normativity—the “pragmatist” account favored by Stephen Stich (1990, 1993).
According to Stich, there is nothing special about truth, and no reason to take it to be the epistemic goal. In fact, for pragmatists, there are no special cognitive or epistemological values at all—“[t]here are just values” (1993: 9). Good reasoning is a matter of effectively promoting your goals (what you value), whatever they are. Stich says that, “the pragmatist project for assessing reasoning” proceeds by determining one’s goals—what one wants to achieve—and then identifying the reasoning strategies that others have successfully employed in achieving those same goals (ibid: 9–10). However, it is hard to see how this is to be done unless one has some reliable cognitive systems or strategies in place. That is, even if happiness, say, rather than true belief, is what one really values, in order to effectively pursue that goal one will need some way of determining how best to achieve it. One will need, that is, a (reasonably) reliable cognitive system—or, to put it in more traditional terms, one will need some reliable faculties. Further,
[p]recisely because our cognitive systems are required to perform evaluations relative to our many concerns, and to perform these evaluations accurately, the standards by which we evaluate these cognitive systems themselves must remain insulated from most of what we intrinsically value, whatever we may value. (Kornblith 2002: 158)
So, whatever else one cares about, one has an interest in—one should care about—having a cognitive system (or systems) that produces true beliefs reliably; and one has an interest in—a reason to care about—evaluating, not just individual beliefs, but our various systems and methods for producing them, in terms of their reliability. “And this”, as Kornblith says, “is precisely what epistemic evaluation is all about. Truth plays a pre-eminent role here” (2002: 158).
Whether one finds the preceding account of the grounding of epistemic normativity satisfactory will depend largely upon how one conceives of epistemic normativity, even normativity generally, to begin with. For example, the above argument seems to rely upon the instrumental or means-end norm. Speaking of his own view, which is in this respect similar to Kornblith’s, Maffie says:
epistemology is normative only within the framework of instrumental reason and…its normativity is parasitic upon that of the latter. (1990b: 333)
There is debate, however, about the nature and status of instrumental reason, as well as about whether a reliance upon it should be acceptable to a naturalist. (See, e.g., Hampton 1992, Dreier 2001, Siegel 1990; for general discussion, see Wallace 2014.) So too, some philosophers regard epistemic norms as categorical—as binding on any rational agent, regardless of the goals or desires which s/he happens to have (Kelly 2003: 616, 621). Now, there are no specific goals or desires that one must have in order to be so bound, according to Kornblith: his argument requires only that one have some goals. Since this condition is fulfilled in all normal humans the hypothetical norm—“If you have some desire or goal you wish to satisfy or attain, seek the truth”—is in effect a categorical one (it is “universal”, as Kornblith puts it; 2002: 161). However, some may find even this still too contingent a ground upon which to base epistemic norms. (Compare Husserl’s and Frege’s concerns about the intrusion of psychology into logic and mathematics; Section 1.3.) Others, on the other hand, may doubt whether TE itself has ever been able to provide any entirely unconditional recommendations (e.g., Grandy 1994: 345). And Kornblith, like other naturalists, is bound to question whether attempting to understand epistemic normativity while setting aside such obvious and inescapable facts as that we do have goals and desires is likely to yield any useful insight into our actual epistemic situation (see, e.g., Kornblith 1995: 251, and Wrenn 2006: 73, commenting on Goldman 1986).
4.3 Intuitions and the A Priori
As we saw previously, one prevalent form of the self-defeat objection to NE is that it inevitably itself relies upon “[t]he a priorism involved in the traditional sort of armchair methodological research” (Kaplan 1994: 359) and that it makes use of “the very sorts of epistemic intuitions which the naturalists are so eager to disparage” (ibid.: 360; cf. Almeder 1990: 266–267). In this way, EN itself requires or presumes the legitimacy of appeals to a priori or “armchair” intuition, such appeals being a key element of “the standard justificatory procedure” in philosophy (Bealer 1992). So the position of the proponent of NE is self-defeating—“it seeks to justify naturalized epistemology in precisely the way in which, according to it, justification cannot be had” (Siegel 1984: 675).
According to the form of NE currently being considered, a reliance on intuitions, particularly in the early stages of inquiry, may be practically necessary. However, it may be argued that “the method of appeals to intuitions is…easily accommodated within a naturalistic framework” (Kornblith 2002: 12). Thus, were you to describe to me a certain animal you observed in your back yard, I might naturally and correctly judge it to have been a squirrel. Clearly, this does not involve or require any a priori insight on my part; it simply reflects some easily gotten knowledge about the relevant local fauna. In the same way, Kornblith thinks, our seemingly spontaneous judgments about whether this or that actual or hypothetical case constitutes an instance of knowledge is an a posteriori judgment, backed by our already-acquired knowledge of the relevant worldly epistemic phenomenon. So “appeals to intuition do not require some non-natural faculty or a priori judgment of any sort….The practice of appealing to intuition has no non-natural ingredients” (2002: 21).
What of the charge that, in presenting various philosophical arguments, the naturalist is tacitly relying upon various principles of good reasoning, themselves known only a priori (e.g., BonJour 1994)? One obvious response is that this begs the question. On a reliabilist view, the legitimacy of the relevant principles of reasoning—what makes them good principles—is a function of whether they are, in fact, reliable. They needn’t be known to be such, much less must they be known to be such a priori (Kornblith 2002: 21–23; 1995: 252). So the objector “is simply taking for granted certain constraints on good reasoning which the naturalist rejects” (1995: 253). Moreover, there is the concern that such constraints, if consistently applied, would rarely if ever be satisfied. Insofar as they have such skeptical consequences, such constraints cannot be reasonable (1995: 253; 2006: 347–348).
As with his response to the normativity problem, there are questions as to whether Kornblith’s attempt to diffuse the self-defeat objection is successful. For example, both BonJour (2006) and Siegel (2006) have replied to Kornblith’s arguments, claiming that the threat of self-defeat is as strong as ever. For instance, Siegel claims that “it is unclear how [Kornblith’s] appeal to reliabilism can be justified without either contravening naturalism or presupposing it” (2006: 246–248; cf. Kappel 2010: 845). Or, to take another example, Kornblith at one point says in passing that “knowledge is, surely, more than just true belief” (2002: 54), and a proponent of TE might wonder what justifies that claim. Of course, it is not difficult to imagine how Kornblith is apt to respond to such worries—that knowledge involves reliably produced true belief is an empirical discovery, arrived at by studying apparently clear cases of the phenomenon. There may be some circularity here, but no more than is involved in Siegel’s or BonJour’s pointing to some cases and saying, with the presumed backing of rational insight, that they reveal what knowledge (justification, rationality, etc.) really is.
Obviously, there is to be no fast and easy resolution of this debate—not least because the nature of status of the a priori, as well as what is required for knowledge, for example, are themselves hotly contested. (For general discussion of the a priori, see Russell 2014; for a representative sampling of current work on the topic, see Casullo and Thurow 2013. Ichikawa and Steup 2014 provide an overview of issues surrounding knowledge.) For our purposes, however, what is especially noteworthy is that some of the very same worries as Siegel and BonJour register about Kornblith’s attempt to cast epistemology as “empirical all the way down” have been voiced by Alvin Goldman, himself an extremely prominent advocate of NE:
Where does the assertion that knowledge is “more than just true belief” come from? What licenses it? Surely it doesn’t come from cognitive ethology. It would have to come, one supposes, from a semantico-conceptual account of the term “knowledge”. But many would say that this is precisely what philosophy, in its analytic phase, aims to provide. So that job is not taken over by biological science, as Kornblith often suggests that it is. (2005: 407)
5. A Moderate Naturalism
5.1 Conceptual Analysis, Intuitions, and Epistemological Methodology
As the passage just quoted suggests, Goldman sees conceptual analysis and appeals to intuition as playing an ineliminable role within epistemological practice. While, as noted above, within TE such an analysis has standardly taken the form of a search for necessary and sufficient conditions, Goldman is dubious of that specific approach (e.g., 1986: 38–39, 2015, 2007: 23 and papers there cited). Nonetheless, he insists that “armchair” conceptual investigation must be the starting point of epistemological theorizing. For this reason he is dubious that a satisfactory epistemology can be entirely concerned with “extra-mental phenomena”. In his most recent writing on the subject, Goldman frames the problem (as he sees it) for Kornblith’s view as follows:
…for a given analysandum, there will often be multiple candidates for being the relevant extra-mental phenomenon. If we set out to study knowledge empirically, as Kornblith instructs us, we will have an excess of candidate extra-mental phenomena. Starting with Kornblith’s preferred candidate, there is the set of states that consist in a creature believing a true proposition as a result of using a reliable process. Second, there is the set of states that consist in a creature believing something true (period). Third, there is the set of states consisting in a creature believing a proposition justifiedly (without its being true). Finally, there is a host of additional candidates, each corresponding to a different theory that was floated in response to the Gettier problem. Which of these many candidate extra-mental phenomena should philosophers of knowledge seek to investigate empirically? And how should they choose the one that is really knowledge?
What emerges here is that the epistemologist would need some prior method for choosing the right extra-mental phenomenon. And it seems inevitable that the method for making this choice will have to be something like the traditional one of consulting speakers’ judgments about which states qualify—“intuitively”—as states of knowing. In short, a prior method is needed to pick out which set of extra-mental events in the world should be the target of a Kornblithian empirical investigation. Without such a prior method, the epistemologist would be like a blind man sent on a mission without a guide, or guide dog, to help him. Without a guide, how can one select the relevant extra-mental phenomenon? But Kornblith seems intent on denying the epistemologist any such guide. (Goldman 2015)
Given that it is anchored in precisely the sort of intuitional methodology and conceptual investigation that is characteristic of TE, Goldman’s approach does not of course face any immediate threat of (apparent) self-defeat. In what respect, though, is the view naturalistic? In one place, Goldman characterizes his preferred form of naturalism—he calls it “moderate naturalism”—as the combination of two theses. The first thesis states his commitment, which we encountered above (Section 3.2), to a psycho-etiological approach to understanding justification (warrant, etc.). The second embodies his own view as to how, or how far, the methodology of TE needs to be altered and its autonomy modulated (see the discussion of methodological NE in Section 1.2 above):
- All epistemic warrant or justification is a function of the psychological (perhaps computational) processes that produce or preserve belief.
- The epistemological enterprise needs appropriate help from science, especially the science of the mind. (Goldman 1999a: 26)
What sort of help from science might philosophy need? In Epistemology and Cognition (1986) Goldman presents a “two-stage” model of epistemological inquiry: the first involves traditional armchair, conceptual analysis to determine the key contours of the relevant concepts (according to Goldman, it reveals the centrality of considerations of reliability thereto); thereafter it is (or should be) epistemology’s task to determine “which cognitive processes are available and reliable”; and it is here, at this second stage, that “collaboration with the empirical science of psychology, or cognitive science” is needed (2005: 408).
Note: (A) here states that justification is a function of the psychological processes that produce or preserve belief. It represents a commitment to a certain form or degree of psychologism (Section 1.3). It does not state that all such justification is a posteriori: Goldman rejects the sort of strongly empiricist brand of NE that Kornblith and Quine embrace,  and he takes pains to argue that his own reliabilist way of underwriting (A) is perfectly compatible with the existence of a priori justification (see his 1999a). (Kitcher too has suggested “that the concept of a priori knowledge can be embedded in a naturalistic epistemology”; 1980: 4.) And in his Epistemology and Cognition (1986), for example, Goldman appears to regard the conceptual analysis and consulting of intuitions that he sees as essential to epistemology as itself a priori (see 1989: 143).
In more recent work (Goldman 1999a, 2005, 2007; Goldman & Pust 1998), however, Goldman has suggested that the conceptual work characteristic of epistemological theorizing is a form of a posteriori, empirical investigation. For example, conceptual analysis typically involves the eliciting (or “testing”) of intuitions—a sample case is presented, and the epistemologist asks himself (or others) whether s/he thinks that the subject therein possesses knowledge. Rather than seeing this as individuals’ employing some special faculty geared towards answering non-empirical questions, it can be seen as the employment of an essentially experimental, “proto-scientific method” (2005: 408), geared towards the discovery of facts about the “experimenter’s”, or others’, epistemic concepts. On this view, even the consultation of one’s own intuitions is thoroughly empirical:
Classificational intuitions should not be assimilated to mathematical or logical intuitions. They are somewhat more like introspections or readouts of one’s own internal states, in this instance, the classificational implications of one’s own concepts. Although they are not perceptual, they share some features with observations….even intuition-based evidence of the first-person kind is not a priori evidence. Moreover, optimal use of one’s intuitions to arrive at theories of the contents of concepts, or the meanings of predicates, should take account of semantical and psychological theory, both empirical rather than a priori disciplines. (Goldman 2005: 409)
In thus (re)casting conceptual analysis and the consulting of intuitions as an empirical endeavor, Goldman is moving away from Bealer (1992) and BonJour (1994), for example, who take it as obvious that the conceptual orientation characteristic of traditional epistemological practice marks it as a priori. Just as importantly, Goldman is here moving closer to Kornblith. According to Goldman, while a reliance on intuitions, especially in connection with the project of analysis, constitutes an obvious difference between philosophical methodology and the methodology of empirical science, that methodology is still empirical. In this respect, philosophical methodology is not distinctive after all. It can appear to be such only because philosophical investigation, at least in its initial stage, has as its target the empirical examination of our concepts. It is his insistence upon the latter—that the target of armchair empirical investigations are concepts, rather than any extra-mental epistemic phenomena themselves—that remains the crucial point on which Goldman and Kornblith disagree.
5.2 Intuitions, Norms, Experiments
Given that his moderate naturalism has him (agreeing and) disagreeing with certain elements of both TE and more “radical” naturalisms, it is not surprising that Goldman’s position has come in for criticism from both sides. Thus, for example, Feldman (1999, 2012) and BonJour (1994) voice doubts about whether more modest forms of NE are both interesting and correct—whether, that is, plausible instances of the relevance of (e.g.) psychology to epistemology aren’t already accommodated by TE, and whether any genuinely newsworthy bearing of (e.g.) psychology on epistemology really is likely. (Goldman offers a direct response to BonJour at 1999: 26–27; and many of Kornblith’s arguments on behalf of naturalism—e.g., his 1995 and 2001—can be read as a response to such objections.) Once again, however, perhaps more interesting for our purposes is the internecine objection: according to Kornblith, the importance Goldman places upon conceptual analysis stands in the way of his offering a plausible account of epistemic normativity.
In his review of Kornblith’s 2002 book, Goldman writes that “[o]n the question of the basis of epistemic norms, he [Kornblith] has a very insightful and probing discussion” (2005: 409)—see the brief discussion thereof in Section 4.2 above. And, of course, Goldman is hardly averse to seeing true belief as having the sort of instrumental value that Kornblith’s account of epistemic normativity features. However, as Kornblith writes, “in Epistemology and Cognition, empirical concerns play no role at all in explaining the source of epistemic normativity” (2002: 140–141). On that account, rather, it is at the foundational conceptual stage of epistemology that normativity gets a foothold: our epistemic assessments are evaluative (Goldman 1986: 20), and give pride of place to reliability considerations, owing to the contents of the concepts which are deployed therein. In short, Kornblith says, on Goldman’s (1986) account “[n]ormative force seems to derive from semantic considerations alone” (Kornblith 2002: 142). According to Kornblith, however, such a semantic grounding for epistemic normativity is unsatisfactory. In effect, it simply pushes the problem back: why should we care about the concepts—hence, the epistemic standards—that we actually have (2002: 142–145)?
As Kornblith acknowledges, he is not the first to raise such concerns about the normative standings of results obtaining via the conceptual analysis that is characteristic of TE. Stich (1990: 92–93), for example, has raised them previously. As Stich’s discussion makes clear, what would make the envisaged problem pressing is if there were, in fact, genuine diversity in our cognitive processes, epistemic standards, and/or our intuitions about cases. After all, so long as our actual epistemic concepts and evaluations are broadly reliabilist—so long as
[e]xamining folk epistemic concepts…reveal[s] how truth (true belief) is a primary basis for epistemic evaluation and epistemic achievement (Goldman 2007: 22)
—there is at the very least an important consilience between the results yielded by our conceptual investigation and the account of epistemic normativity that Kornblith favors.
Hence the significance of certain results claimed to have been obtained within “experimental philosophy” (x-phi), itself a recent movement within naturalistic philosophy. For, according to some theorists, there is in fact widespread diversity in epistemic intuitions—both within individuals (Swain, Alexander, and Weinberg 2008) and between groups, even (as Jennifer Nagel puts it) “along such epistemically scary fault lines” (Nagel 2012: 495) as ethnicity (Weinberg, Nichols, and Stich 2001) and gender (Buckwalter and Stich 2011). According to those working within x-phi’s “negative” program, (putative) results such as this reveal that there is something deeply flawed about the method of using intuitions to inform one’s philosophical theory. This is the lesson that Bishop and Trout take away from such reported results as well. As they see it, while practitioners of “Standard Analytic Epistemology” (SAE) typically regard NE as unable to accommodate epistemic normativity, it is in fact they who are engaged in a purely descriptive project—namely, the project of giving information
about the reflective epistemic judgments of a group of idiosyncratic, non-representative people who have been trained to use highly specialized epistemic concepts and patterns of thought. (Bishop and Trout 2005a: 704)
If we want a genuinely normative epistemology, Bishop and Trout suggest (2005a,b), we should abandon SAE altogether and look directly to the empirical findings of “ameliorative psychology”, which promises to give us insight into how we can reason better. The feasibility of this project has been challenged, and on much the same grounds as Goldman (e.g.) objects to Kornblith’s view—namely, because of the apparent indispensability to even an empirically-minded epistemology of a reliance upon intuitions, for instance concerning what the relevant standard of epistemic goodness is (e.g., Stich 2006). And yet, if the studies mentioned above are correct, it’s not clear what kind of authority we should grant such intuitions – or, more generally, the results of armchair philosophical methods such as are found within both TE and Goldman’s brand of “moderate naturalism”.
However, those studies have been challenged. For instance, Sosa 2005, Goldman 2010, and Williamson 2013 raise concerns about the interpretation and significance of the reported data (and, to some extent, about the merits of x-phi itself). Just as importantly, others working within an experimental framework have raised questions about those data themselves. Thus, while Weinberg, Nichols, and Stich (2001), for example, claimed to find significant cross-cultural variation in people’s epistemic intuitions, several recent studies (Nagel et al. 2013, Seyedsayamdost 2015, Kim and Yuan 2015) have failed to replicate those results. (See too Nagel 2012, 2013; Nagel and Boyd 2014.) In fact, in his most recent work on the subject, Stich – along with his coauthors (see Machery et al. 2015) – has argued for the cross-cultural robustness of certain epistemic intuitions, suggesting that these “may be a reflection of an underlying innate and universal core folk epistemology.” Like NE itself, x-phi raises pressing issues about philosophical methodology and remains the focus of lively debate. The most recent findings just mentioned, however, illustrate how x-phi per se is not at odds with the more traditional concerns and methods that Goldman’s moderate naturalism, for example, incorporates: an epistemological theory’s being informed by conceptual investigation, or by intuitive judgments, does not automatically fate it to being parochial and therefore of only limited interest.
6. Other Topics and Approaches
The discussion of the past few sections has focused on the views and arguments of select figures within NE. The rationale for this focus has been twofold: first, because the positions and figures in question have been at the forefront of recent discussions of NE; and second, because the general epistemological affinity between Kornblith and Goldman in particular (i.e., their common adherence to reliabilism) has allowed us to isolate and appreciate both the central challenges to NE and some of the major points of difference among its advocates. Once again, however, the selective focus above should not obscure the fact that many other naturalistic epistemological theories have been offered (Section 1.2). Thus, for example, in addition to reliabilist (Goldman, Kornblith), pragmatic (Stich), and information-theoretic (Dretske) views, teleo-functional thinking has been used in proffered accounts of both knowledge (Millikan 1984) and epistemic entitlement (Graham 2012). Pollock (1986, 1987), and Pollock and Cruz (1999), seek to understand epistemic justification in terms of conformity to procedural norms of belief-formation, the correctness of which is ensured by the contents of the relevant concepts. And others—“nonfactualists” such as Field (1998), and “expressivists” such as Chrisman (2007)—regard the use of epistemic terms, and the explicit endorsement of specific epistemic norms and evaluations, as essentially a matter of expressing one’s attitudes, pro and con. These and other specific views represent other ongoing attempts to understand various epistemic concepts and/or phenomena in a naturalistic manner. While each faces distinct challenges, qua naturalistic views, the most pressing issues facing them are those discussed above.
In addition to such positions with regard to specific epistemic matters, there are other regions of epistemology in which NE figures prominently. This final section briefly describes three further such areas—social epistemology, feminist epistemology, and the debate over (epistemic) rationality.
6.1 Social epistemology
As we have seen, NE is motivated by a variety of concerns about the methods and ideals of TE—for instance, a reliance upon the a priori, an apsychological, “current time slice” (Goldman 2011) approach to understanding knowledge or justification, a tendency to overlook or idealize the resources and abilities that actual epistemic subjects possess, and so on. Another aspect of TE that has recently come under much scrutiny is its tendency to treat subjects in rather individualistic terms—i.e., as divorced from their social environment. This too is seen as a serious distortion, given that people’s lives, epistemic and otherwise, are importantly shaped by social forces. (Indeed, according to some, even this way of putting it is misleading, since it paints individuals as explanatorily prior to the social in epistemic matters.) Worth noting here is that even paradigm instances of NE might be charged with being unduly focused on the individual—e.g., with looking to individual psychology as being especially relevant to epistemology, at the expense of areas of empirical study with a more social orientation (cf. Grandy 1994: 346–348).
Social epistemology (SE) is a large and diverse area of research aimed at countering the individualism of TE by studying epistemic phenomena from a properly social perspective. (Sample overviews of SE are Schmitt 1994 and Goldman and Blanchard 2015. Goldman and Whitcomb 2011 is an up-to-date collection of papers on SE; and Lackey 2014 is a volume of new papers on collective epistemology specifically.) Just as with NE, different specific theories and theorists within SE maintain closer or more distant relations to TE. Some social epistemologists maintain a view of the individual as the primary locus of epistemic achievement, for example, while others treat entities other than individuals, such as groups or corporations, as having epistemic properties. Some theorists evaluate various social processes and institutions in terms of some more general, non-social feature (e.g., reliability), while others think that the relevant good-making features are not so reducible. Some retain truth as the primary epistemic goal; others propose some non-traditional goal. And so on. Across these various approaches, however, many practitioners within SE are motivated by concerns similar to those that animate NE, and many of the forms and themes within NE (Section 1.2) appear here as well. (In terms of the theoretical choice points mentioned just above, Goldman 1999b, for example—as he does with respect to NE per se—tends to occupy the more “conservative” positions; the SE of Martin Kusch 2002, for instance, rejects many of the core assumptions of TE; and Helen Longino’s 2002 views are, arguably, intermediate between the two.)
6.2 Feminist epistemology
As the reference to Longino in the previous (sub)section suggests, there is a continuity between the issues and concerns addressed within SE and those addressed within feminist epistemology (FE). (For overviews of the latter, see Anderson 2012; Grasswick 2013, esp. Section 1; and Janack n.d. in Other Internet Resources). Like SE (and NE), of course, FE is a broad category, within which many diverse projects and positions are assayed. As Longino puts it,
There is no single feminist epistemology. Instead there are a plethora of ideas, approaches, and arguments that have in common only their authors’ commitment to exposing and reversing the derogation of women and the gender bias of traditional formulations. (1999: 331)
Nonetheless, like SE and NE, historically FE has been motivated by concerns about the ideals and assumptions built into TE—albeit, of course, from a distinctly feminist perspective. Thus, for example, traditional notions of reason and objectivity have been subjected to critical scrutiny, on the grounds that they embody (usually tacitly) certain characteristically masculine ideals, such as a separation from other people, from the object of knowledge, and from one’s own body and the socio-cultural milieu. (Not surprisingly, here, once again, Cartesian assumptions and aspirations come in for special critical attention.)
Against this general background, many theorists adopt a more or less naturalistic approach to the subject matter—focusing on particular features of the actual epistemic situation and drawing from a diverse range of areas of empirical study (psychology, gender studies, sociological and historical studies, and others). Among such NE-minded philosophers, however, different theorists once again stake out different positions. Thus, for example, a number of feminist epistemologists (e.g., Antony 1993, Campbell 1998, Nelson 1990) draw upon Quine’s work. Just as in NE, however, others (e.g., Clough 2004, Code 1996) argue that a different sort of naturalistic approach is to be preferred—sometimes, on grounds familiar from those discussed earlier; sometimes, because of specifically feminist concerns. So too, just as in both NE and SE, there is disagreement about how much of the original framework of TE—which of its concepts, concerns, and assumptions—should be retained, and how certain of its elements might need to be recast so as to render them acceptable.
6.3 Rationality debates
In addition to being of central interest within TE, rationality is central to our self-conception: Aristotle held that we are “rational animals”, a presumption built into the very name of our species (“homo sapiens”); and the thought that humans are rational, perhaps distinctively so, appears to be part of the popular fabric of thought about ourselves. There is long-standing disagreement among epistemologists as to the nature of epistemic rationality (“rationality”)—which, on one understanding, is distinguished from other forms of rationality by being concerned with the effective pursuit of the distinctively cognitive-epistemic end of true belief. There has also recently arisen heated debate—often termed “the Rationality Wars”—among psychologists and philosophers of psychology concerning what we should say in the face of empirical findings about humans’ apparently disappointing performance on certain “reasoning tasks”. According to some, those results force us to confront the possibility that humans may in fact be quite irrational. According to others, such results, together with a psychologically realistic view of how human reasoning actually proceeds, point up the need to revise standard views of what rationality involves. (Much of the resulting debate recapitulates, in broad terms, the debate within TE as to the nature of justified, or rational, belief.)
For example, well-known experimental findings—e.g., those of Tversky and Kahneman (1982) concerning probabilistic reasoning, and those of Wason (1968) concerning deductive reasoning—cannot be taken to illustrate failures in rationality unless we assume what Stein (1996) calls “the Standard Picture” (SP):
According to this picture, to be rational is to reason in accordance with principles of reasoning that are based on rules of logic, probability theory and so forth. If the standard picture of reasoning [rationality] is right, principles of reasoning that are based on such rules are normative principles of reasoning, namely they are the principles we ought to reason in accordance with. (Stein 1996: 4)
According to some, rather than suggesting that humans are irrational, the relevant findings (among many other considerations) give us good occasion to ask whether it is reasonable to see “the Standard Picture” as providing the relevant normative standard. Discussion of the ensuing debate would take us too far afield here (but see note 27). For present purposes, it suffices to note that it shares many features with the debate within and about NE. Empirical results and considerations of psychological feasibility play a large role within the rationality debate, and many of the facts and factors appealed to by friends of NE in their critique of TE (see Sections 1.2 and 3.2 above, e.g.) reappear here either as criticisms of SP, or as proffered constraints upon an adequate conception of rationality. Finally, as with debates within and about NE generally, discussions of rationality involve appeals to both normative and psychological considerations, with many of the most contested issues having to do with how best to balance their sometimes-competing claims.
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Other Internet Resources
- Feldman, Richard, “Epistemology Naturalized,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2012 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/sum2012/entries/epistemology-naturalized/>. [This was the previous entry on naturalized epistemology in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy — see the version history.]
- Janack, Heidi, n.d., “Feminist Epistemology,” Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
- Lammenranta, Markus, n.d., “Epistemic Circularity,” Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
- Wrenn, Chase B., n.d., “Naturalistic Epistemology,” Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
The author thanks an anonymous referee, Alvin Goldman, Hilary Kornblith, Joshua Knobe, and Elena Holmgren for helpful comments, suggestions, and general discussion.