Bernard Mandeville

First published Mon Jun 3, 2024

Bernard Mandeville (1670–1733), an Anglo-Dutch physician and philosopher, achieved fame through his notorious work The Fable of the Bees: Or, Private Vices, Publick Benefits. He is most well-known for arguing that economic prosperity depends upon harnessing individuals’ self-interested and even vicious passions, an idea which outraged his contemporaries and has subsequently led to him occupying an important place in the history of economic thought. The Fable of the Bees is a far more wide-ranging work, however, which offers incisive explorations of human nature, the passions, and the origins of moral and social norms. In addressing these topics, Mandeville made major contributions to the history of moral and social philosophy, and was a significant influence on many eighteenth-century philosophers, including David Hume, Jean-Jacques Rousseau, and Adam Smith. More recently, Mandeville’s ideas on the gradual evolution of moral norms and social institutions have been taken up by theorists of spontaneous order, following F. A. Hayek.

1. Life and Works

Born on 15 November 1670, in Rotterdam, the Netherlands, Bernard Mandeville hailed from a respected family of Dutch physicians, merchants, and political officials. He studied at Leiden University, known for its scholarly contributions to Cartesian and experimental philosophy. After earning degrees in philosophy and medicine, specializing in the connection between digestive disorders and psychology, Mandeville migrated to the British Isles, possibly due to his family’s involvement in the Costerman Riots of 1690 (Dekker 1992). In London, Mandeville worked as a physician from 1693, focusing on nervous disorders. He died in Hackney in 1733. Despite the fame that he had achieved by the end of his life, relatively little is known about his views beyond those that appear in his published works, due to the scarcity of personal correspondence or other available archival materials. Indeed, even identifying Mandeville’s published works is not without its challenges, since many originally appeared anonymously and, in some cases, his authorship was established only in the early decades of the twentieth century (see especially Kaye 1921; Anderson 1935).

In 1705, Mandeville published The Grumbling Hive: Or, Knaves Turn’d Honest, a poem describing a wealthy bee community that seeks to root out all vice from the hive, which serves as an allegory illustrating the disastrous consequences that would follow any successful attempt to impose a moral reformation on an opulent nation like England. The poem challenged the prevalent “public spirit” ideology associated with civic humanism at the turn of the eighteenth century, ridiculing the notion that our benevolent or virtuous qualities lie behind social order and prosperity. In addition to the Grumbling Hive’s doggerel couplets, poetry featured prominently in Mandeville’s early literary endeavors, both in the form of translations and original verses, such as The Pamphleteers: A Satyr (1703), Aesop Dress’d: Or a Collection of Fables Writ in Familiar Verse (1704), and Typhon; Or the Wars Between the Gods and Giants: A Burlesque Poem (1704). A little later in his career, Mandeville compiled a collection entitled Wishes to a Godson, with Other Miscellany Poems (1712).

As his years in London progressed, Mandeville began to venture into prose publishing. The Virgin Unmask’d (1709) is one of his boldest yet least well-known works. It comprises nine dialogues between a young lady and her aunt, who discuss a range of topics from the inequalities between the sexes to matters of political economy and statecraft in European politics. Throughout his writings, Mandeville would maintain a keen interest in the role of women in society and the double standards they face in various aspects of life. This is a theme that he continued to explore in his wide-ranging contributions to the periodical The Female Tatler, consisting of thirty-two issues published in 1709–1710, which were written in response to the campaign for moral reform being advanced by Richard Steele in The Tatler. In these contributions, Mandeville analyzed the standards of female and male honor for the first time in print, along with many other topics to which he would later return, such as dueling, the social functions of pride and vanity, and the naturalistic origins of civil society (see Goldsmith 1985: 35–46; Peltonen 2003: 263–302).

A Treatise of the Hypochondriack and Hysterick Passions, first published in 1711 and later in an expanded edition (with a slightly different title) in 1730, brought Mandeville wider recognition and remained a notable reference point amongst physicians well into the late eighteenth century (Simonazzi 2016: 63–66). It also facilitated Mandeville’s entry into London’s medical circles, guided by the eminent physician and naturalist Sir Hans Sloane. In the Treatise, Mandeville employs a dialogue format to engage patients directly, highlighting the importance of their active participation in therapy. He examines the relationship between socioeconomic status and hypochondria, arguing that wealth, with its attendant fears and desires, contributes to the loss of animal spirits and psychosomatic ailments. The Treatise addresses broader philosophical themes beyond its focus on medical matters—while also offering some suggestive autobiographical remarks—and is thus a key text for understanding how Mandeville sought to combine a satirical and polemical approach with his wider scientific and philosophical goals (Hilton 2010).

In 1714, Mandeville republished The Grumbling Hive as part of a larger work entitled The Fable of the Bees: Or, Private Vices, Publick Benefits, with the subtitle announcing the idea for which he is now most famous. The book contained a series of short essays, or “Remarks”, which purport to explain some of the main ideas from the original verse, along with an essay entitled “An Enquiry Into the Origin of Moral Virtue”, where Mandeville attributes the development of our ideas of virtue to skillful politicians who harnessed pride and shame to promote socially desirable behavior.

Mandeville’s next major work, Free Thoughts on Religion, the Church, and National Happiness (1720; expanded 1729), delves into theological matters and criticizes the role of the church in fostering persecution and intolerance. In this work (and elsewhere) Mandeville borrows extensively from Pierre Bayle, one of the great champions of religious toleration in seventeenth-century Europe. Mandeville advocates for a civil religion where the clergy would be salaried and under the authority of the government, on the grounds that this would promote tolerance and moderation. Free Thoughts remains a somewhat puzzling work. It discusses political and religious history in some depth, setting itself apart from Mandeville’s dialogue-style compositions by adopting a more serious and less distinctive tone. Certain chapters were published independently in Whig periodicals of the time, underscoring Mandeville’s intention to wield practical political influence. Indeed, Mandeville published several political pamphlets throughout his literary career, including An Enquiry into the Causes of the Frequent Executions at Tyburn (1725), which initially graced the pages of a prominent Whig periodical before being reprinted on other occasions in eighteenth-century newspapers. Other pamphlets, such as The Mischiefs that ought Justly to be Apprehended from a Whig-Government (1714) and A Modest Defence of Publick Stews (1724), have also been attributed to Mandeville.

Mandeville’s ideas generated increased controversy following the publication of a revised edition of The Fable of the Bees in 1723, which included additional remarks and two new lengthy essays. The first of these advances a scathing critique of the charity school movement and provides a revealing insight into Mandeville’s views on the working poor, while the second attacks the philosophy of Anthony Ashley Cooper, Third Earl of Shaftesbury, who is portrayed as Mandeville’s principal philosophical adversary. The 1723 edition was presented by the Grand Jury of Middlesex as a work that promoted irreligion and immorality. Mandeville defended himself against these charges by publishing A Vindication of the Book in 1724, which was appended to subsequent editions of the Fable. During this period, his friend Lord Macclesfield’s corruption trial further contributed to the tumultuous atmosphere surrounding Mandeville’s reputation.

In 1729, six years after the scandal over the Fable had propelled him to fame, Mandeville published The Fable of the Bees, Part II, which takes the form of six lengthy dialogues mainly between the characters Horatio and Cleomenes. This work showcases Mandeville’s most developed analysis of human nature and society, and, while few thinkers engaged with it explicitly, it appears to have influenced important philosophical trends in European thought, and especially in the Scottish Enlightenment. In his last major work, An Enquiry into the Origin of Honour, and the Usefulness of Christianity in War (1732), Mandeville resumes the dialogues between Horatio and Cleomenes to explore the role of self-liking in the development of honor codes, revealing how this passion had been exploited by different political powers, such as the Church of Rome. He argues that honor, though incompatible with virtue and religion, served as a hierarchical principle and social tie that was central to understanding the European politics of his day.

In 1732, Mandeville also published A Letter to Dion, in response to George Berkeley’s criticisms of the Fable. Mandeville protested that his critics had frequently misrepresented his ideas and intentions, in part so that they could divert attention from the ways in which the Fable exposed their own hypocrisy and moral shortcomings (Tolonen 2022). To some extent, however, Mandeville’s paradoxical and satirical style invited criticism and perhaps even misunderstanding. He did not write systematic philosophical treatises, which has posed considerable obstacles for both his contemporaries and later readers who have attempted to grasp his overall philosophical stance. Nonetheless, and as we shall see, his works are characterized by a sustained and serious attempt to improve our understanding of a wide range of social and political phenomena through an in-depth analysis of human nature.

2. Human Nature

Mandeville’s account of human nature proved extremely controversial in the eighteenth century. Some of his most provocative ideas challenged widely held assumptions about what distinguishes humans from other animals, and he was often taken to have followed in the footsteps of another notorious philosopher, Thomas Hobbes, in reducing all human behavior to some form of self-love. Yet, as David Hume (1739–1740 [2000: 5]) famously remarked, Mandeville can also be seen as part of a tradition of philosophers, following John Locke, who played a pivotal role in putting “the science of man on a new footing” by deriving general principles about human nature from careful observation and experience.

Mandeville outlines an approach along these lines in A Treatise of the Hypochondriack and Hysterick Passions, where he claims that human knowledge “can only come a posteriori” (TH 100). He disparages physicians who propound abstract systems based upon reason alone, without seeking empirical support for their speculations, and instead argues that the art of the physician is grounded upon practical knowledge, which involves observing patterns from one’s accumulated experience and offering plausible hypotheses that can explain the available evidence (TH, especially 61–63, 91). Mandeville sometimes presents his approach in The Fable of the Bees in similar terms, claiming that even when he offers speculative conjectures to account for obscure social phenomena, his reasonings are nonetheless based on “the plain Observations which every body may make on Man” (FB II, 128).

Observing human nature accurately, however, is no easy task. Mandeville suggests that many people go astray either by moralizing about how we should behave, rather than focusing on how we really do behave (FB I, 39), or by assuming that we possess certain qualities that elevate us above other animals. The latter concern is especially evident in Mandeville’s changing views on whether humans possess an immaterial soul (see Simonazzi 2008: 119–128). While studying at the University of Leiden, Mandeville had written a dissertation (Disputatio Philosophica de Brutorum Operationibus [1689]; translated in McKee 1991) endorsing the Cartesian view that non-human animals are incapable of anything approaching human consciousness, yet he would increasingly come to repudiate this position as he sought to uncover the more animalistic aspects of human nature (Callanan 2015). We are conscious of thinking ourselves, so if we assume that matter is incapable of thought then it makes sense to conclude that we possess an immaterial soul. Yet Mandeville argues that our struggle to comprehend the idea of thinking matter reveals more about the limitations of human knowledge than it does about the properties of matter. The notion that an immaterial soul can act upon the body (and vice versa) poses at least as many difficulties as the idea that matter can produce thought and consciousness. What is more, Mandeville stresses that the reason many philosophers have insisted that we possess an immaterial and immortal soul is not because this is the most plausible inference to draw from a thorough examination of human nature, but rather because it is a pleasing idea that makes us feel better about ourselves. It is an idea that flatters our self-love and pride, in other words, which means that most people will be inclined to endorse it even in the absence of any compelling evidence (TH 59–60, 100–102; FB I, 230).

2.1 Reason and the passions

Mandeville similarly casts doubt on the notion that human conduct is governed by reason. In “An Enquiry Into the Origin of Moral Virtue”, he offers a speculative account of how the lawgivers who first established society could have persuaded people to resist their natural appetites and concern themselves with the public interest. The chief tool at the lawgivers’ disposal was flattery: they

extoll’d the Excellency of our Nature above other Animals … [and] bestow’d a thousand Encomiums on the Rationality of our Souls. (FB I, 43)

Those people who indulged their natural appetites without regard to anyone else were compared to animals, whereas those who resisted their inclinations and strived to promote the peace and welfare of society were praised as belonging to a higher class of people. The self-denial that such people practiced, however, was motivated by the pride they took in being regarded as members of the superior class (FB I, 42–44). While we like to believe that we have a rational soul that distinguishes us from other animals, then, what really sets humans apart is the extent to which our desire to be thought of in a certain light drives so much of our behavior—and that desire is rooted in the passions.

Mandeville describes humans as “a compound of various Passions”, with our behavior determined by the most prominent passion on any given occasion (FB I, 39). He adopts a broadly Hobbesian conception of the will, as “the last Result of deliberation”, and contends that we (mistakenly) take our will to be free because of the difficulties involved in identifying our motivating passions. Although someone might believe that they are choosing freely, their judgement is always “over rul’d by a predominant Passion” that could have been resisted only by a stronger one (FT 61–62). Even when people draw on relevant knowledge before acting, or follow the dictates of reason, they are still “compell’d so to do by some Passion or other”, much as those who act in unreasonable ways are led to do so by different passions. On Mandeville’s account, then, all “Human Creatures are sway’d and wholly govern’d by their Passions” (OH 31).

Many of Mandeville’s contemporaries found this view of human nature deeply objectionable, for precisely the reasons that he had anticipated: it dissolves what were often taken to be the most important distinctions between humans and other animals. As William Law (1724: 4) complained, Mandeville’s depiction of humans as a compound of various passions “seems to suit a Wolf or a Bear, as exactly as your self, or a Grecian Philosopher”. Law protested that Mandeville’s analysis could not account for the extent to which humans engage in thought, in ways that set us apart from other animals. Yet Mandeville’s more subtle point is about what drives our reasoning. He does not deny that we are capable of thought and reflection, but he presents reason as subservient to the passions. Indeed, he maintains that we often deploy our reason to justify what we have already done, rather than using it to determine our actions in the first place. It is the passions that guide our reason, in this respect, with self-love “furnishing every individual with Arguments to justify their Inclinations” (FB I, 333). As Arthur Lovejoy observed in 1922, in uncovering the many subconscious motivations that lead us to rationalize our actions, Mandeville’s “chief significance” may be understood in terms of his contribution to the history of social psychology (personal letter to Kaye given in the notes to FB II, 452).

2.2 Psychological egoism

It is one thing to claim that humans are creatures of the passions; it is quite another to insist, as Mandeville also does, that “all Passions center in Self-Love” (FB I, 75). Mandeville can thus be taken as a proponent of what, in the eighteenth century, was sometimes called the “selfish system”, a position which today is better known as psychological egoism (but on the limitations of using this term to capture Mandeville’s position, see Maurer 2019: 58–85).

Mandeville regularly seeks to explain how acts that appear to be motivated by other-regarding passions are in fact different manifestations of self-love. Suppose we see a baby that is about to drop into a fire. Mandeville does not doubt that we would immediately act to save the baby, but he does maintain that, in so doing, “we only obliged our selves”, for had the baby fallen then we would have felt “a Pain, which Self-preservation compell’d us to prevent” (FB I, 56). Mandeville allows that witnessing the suffering of others causes us pain and anxiety (FB I, 254–255), yet he argues that our pity ultimately derives from self-love, or self-preservation. Elsewhere, Mandeville similarly claims that a mother’s natural love for her child originates in self-love (FB I, 75). Even when we care deeply about other people, then, Mandeville still presents the passions in question as manifestations of self-love.

In these cases, it might be objected that Mandeville’s position involves disingenuously redescribing other-regarding passions in terms of self-love. In challenging the selfish system in the 1720s—quite possibly with Mandeville in his sights—Joseph Butler (1726 [2017: 94]) retorted that “this is not the language of mankind”. Passions such as pity and parental love are clearly not selfish passions, since their satisfaction depends upon the wellbeing of other people, not merely our own. Similar objections to the self-love thesis would be raised in turn by Francis Hutcheson, David Hume, and Adam Smith, amongst others, who suggested that attempts to root all passions in self-love relied more upon linguistic sophistry than philosophical insight.

In other cases, however, Mandeville takes a different approach to exposing the depths of self-love by focusing on our desire for social esteem. The key passions here are pride and shame, which work closely together and result in us becoming preoccupied with our reputation and relative standing in comparison to other people. Where pride leads us to desire praise and social approbation, shame leads us to fear disapproval and criticism. Mandeville argues that these passions lie behind a remarkable amount of human behavior, motivating us to regulate our own conduct in accordance with prevailing social norms and expectations. These passions are so powerful that they will sometimes outweigh the fear of death, as is best illustrated by the example of dueling, where the fear of shame leads men of honor to imperil their lives in order to preserve their social standing and avoid being thought cowardly (FB I, 334; FB II, 87–96). In less extreme cases, pride and shame habitually lead us to conceal other passions that would be met with social disapproval, and they are therefore central to Mandeville’s explanation of why we regularly act in ways that appear to be public spirited, even when our motivations are ultimately self-centered.

2.3 Self-love and self-liking

In the first volume of the Fable, Mandeville contends that all passions originate in self-love. Yet in both the second volume and its sequel, An Enquiry into the Origin of Honour, he draws a distinction between self-love and self-liking (FB II, 129–134; OH 3–8). The idea that all human action can be reduced to self-love came under sustained attack from philosophers such as Butler and Hutcheson in the 1720s, and Mandeville may well have introduced the distinction in response (Tolonen 2013: 49–65).

The concept of self-liking can helpfully be understood in relation to Mandeville’s (earlier) account of pride. In the first volume of the Fable, Mandeville claims that pride is the faculty by which we overvalue ourselves (FB I, 124), while also equating pride with the concern we have for our own reputation (FB I, 146). But why, if we overvalue ourselves, do we care so much about our reputation, which is based on how others view us? In the second volume of the Fable, Mandeville supplies a more complete answer to this question by introducing the concept of self-liking. He now describes self-liking (rather than pride) as the “Instinct, by which every Individual values itself above its real Worth”. As we are conscious that we overvalue ourselves, however, this instinct is accompanied by a sense of uneasiness, which leads us to desire the approbation of other people to “strengthen and confirm us in the good Opinion we have of ourselves” (FB II, 130). The approval of other people, then, eases the apprehension that arises from overvaluing ourselves.

Mandeville clarifies that self-liking is the underlying cause of passions such as pride and shame (FB II, 131–132; OH 3–4, 12–13). Where self-love explains why we are concerned with matters of sustenance and security, self-liking explains why we care about our reputation and social standing (FB II, 133–134). The significance and bearing of the distinction between self-love and self-liking for Mandeville’s wider philosophy remains a matter of debate, with scholars disagreeing on the extent to which it constitutes a refinement or a repudiation of Mandeville’s earlier self-love thesis, and on whether the introduction of self-liking reflects a more general change in the character of his moral and social philosophy between the different editions of the Fable (see especially Hundert 1994: 53–55, 137–139; Tolonen 2013: 41–102; Maurer 2019: 60–64; Douglass 2023: 35–38, 62–67).

3. Moral Philosophy

The area of Mandeville’s thought that has generated the greatest debate is undoubtedly his moral philosophy. Amongst many competing views, he has been read as a sceptic who aims to expose morality as a political trick while subverting the prevailing moral standards of his day, as a moral rigorist who seeks to demonstrate that much of our behavior falls considerably short of the demands of virtue, and as a utilitarian who holds that what really matters is the consequences of our actions and not the motives behind them (for an extensive survey, see Monro 1975: 178–248). Our aim presently is not to pass judgement on the validity of these or other interpretations. Instead, we focus on some of the key questions and puzzles that arise from the most influential statement of Mandeville’s moral philosophy, “An Enquiry Into the Origin of Moral Virtue”, in which he explains how humans could have acquired ideas of virtue and vice without knowledge of revealed religion.

3.1 The origin of moral virtue

In setting out his account of the origin of virtue, Mandeville addresses the problem of what leads us to act in ways that advance the interests of other people and the community. As we have seen, Mandeville thinks that we are fundamentally self-centered creatures, which means that we would only resist our natural appetites and inclinations if we anticipate some personal gain from doing so. Instead of providing individuals with tangible goods, Mandeville suggests that “lawgivers”—a broad concept that often encompasses those with the authority to establish moral rules—would have used praise and contempt as foundational tools to civilize humanity. Those who resist their selfish inclinations and act in ways that benefit others would be rewarded with praise, while those who indulge their appetites without regard to the public good would be held in contempt. It is on this basis, Mandeville argues, that everyone would have come to agree on definitions of virtue and vice. All acts where someone gratifies their appetites in a way that could prove socially detrimental would be counted as vices, with the term virtue reserved for acts where someone resists their natural impulses and endeavors “the Benefit of others, or the Conquest of his own Passions out of a Rational Ambition of being good” (FB I, 42–49).

On this account, we hold certain ideas of virtue and vice only because doing so is in everyone’s interest. Where those who approximate this standard of virtue have an interest in being esteemed as virtuous, those who fall short of this standard nevertheless have an interest in encouraging others to perform acts from which they benefit. Mandeville maintains that the earliest formulation of these ideas was an invention of ambitious lawgivers or politicians who wanted to govern people more easily. He describes the distinction between virtue and vice as “the Contrivance of Politicians”, and memorably declares that “the Moral Virtues are the Political Offspring which Flattery begot upon Pride” (FB I, 50–51). These assertions outraged many of Mandeville’s contemporaries, who accused him of bringing the idea of virtue into disrepute by denying the reality of moral distinctions. Mandeville’s explanation of how we acquire notions of virtue and vice implicitly rejects views of morality widely held at the time, such as the idea that we have an innate moral sense that allows us to understand the distinction between right and wrong, or that moral obligations can be deduced by right reason as precepts of natural law. By contrast, his critics argued, Mandeville’s account presents our ideas of virtue and vice as arbitrary, in the sense that these notions are dependent upon human will and agreement alone, rather than being based on any immutable or eternal standards (see e.g., Fiddes 1724: xvi; Law 1724: 22–23; Bluet 1725: 108–109, 136). This worry was exacerbated by the fact that Mandeville elsewhere flirts with moral relativism, highlighting examples of how moral codes vary in different cultures to challenge the idea that virtue and vice are “permanent Realities that must ever be the same in all Countries and all Ages” (FB I, 324, 330–331).

As his critics also pointed out, the role of wise lawgivers or politicians in Mandeville’s account is somewhat question-begging, as it remains unclear how they attained the knowledge required to civilize everyone else (e.g., Bluet 1725: 25–28). Yet Mandeville’s later works do not rely on these figures to anywhere near the same degree, and, when they are invoked, he explains their inventions as the joint labor of numerous people over many ages (OH 40–41). He still maintains that humans do not naturally possess any equitable or reasonable notions of right and wrong (FB II, 223–224), arguing instead that we would have come to acquire such notions only through a long period of socialization. He also insists that this explanation does not involve denigrating virtue, as his critics had objected. Comparing the excellence of virtue to axioms of mathematics, Mandeville allows that it makes sense to call these eternal truths in a figurative sense, but the key point is that a great deal of learning is needed to discover them. To stress the difficulties involved in arriving at these truths, however, is not to deny their existence (OH vii–viii).

One way of understanding Mandeville’s position is that, given certain background facts about human nature and social interaction, ideas of virtue and vice are necessary for societies to function effectively. The distinction between virtue and vice is socially advantageous, in other words, and we must have come to understand moral concepts in a certain way to facilitate social order and cooperation. If this way of reading Mandeville’s position helps to evade the worry that he denied the reality of moral distinctions, it may nonetheless run into tension with his infamous “private vices, public benefits” thesis (see Bluet 1725: 23–24). On the one hand, The Grumbling Hive verse suggests that if vices were rooted out of society and everyone became virtuous then economic and social ruin would ensue. On the other hand, Mandeville argues that ideas of virtue and vice are required to ensure that we live peacefully together. Even if these two strands of his thought can be reconciled, doing so is far from straightforward (for further discussion, see Monro 1975, 203–209).

3.2 Is virtue possible?

Mandeville’s definitions of virtue and vice admit of many ambiguities, giving rise to debates about whether he has a consistent account of the requirements of virtue, and, if so, whether those requirements place virtue beyond human reach (see Colman 1972; Douglass 2020). Leaving aside the question of his sincerity, for the moment, two features of his expressed position are relatively uncontroversial. First, virtuous actions require self-denial. This is clear from Mandeville’s initial definition of virtue (FB I, 48–49), and it is a point that he emphasizes repeatedly when setting his ideas out against Shaftesbury (e.g., FB I, 323, 331; FB II, 108–109). Second, whether an act is virtuous depends on the motive from which someone acts (FB I, 56, 260–261). While this much is straightforward, complications soon arise once we start to interrogate these requirements further.

Consider self-denial. How much self-denial is required for an act to be virtuous? Acting “contrary to the impulse of Nature” (FB I, 48) might not be too demanding if it involves nothing more than resisting one’s immediate appetites. Yet more is presumably required to conquer one’s passions. At one point Mandeville claims that virtue requires “a Victory over the Passions”. It is this victory over the passions that distinguishes real virtue from “Counterfeited Virtue”, which is merely the “Conquest which one Passion obtains over another” (FB I, 230, also 405). When we act in ways that benefit others out of pride or shame, for example, this does not count as the victory over the passions required for real virtue, but only the conquest of one passion over another that characterizes counterfeited virtue. This is why good manners and politeness have little to do with real virtue (FB I, 79; FB II, 146, 281). How, then, can we obtain the victory over the passions required for real virtue? If all our actions are governed by our passions, as Mandeville maintains, then it follows that a victory over the passions is impossible—at least without divine assistance (FT 24; OH 56, 99–100). Notice, however, that even if real virtue is beyond human reach, this does not imperil the widespread practice of counterfeited virtue, where people act in ways that appear to be public-spirited because they desire social esteem.

These considerations relate closely to the question of the motive behind virtuous acts. What counts as a virtuous motive? Mandeville sometimes implies that acting from self-love cannot be “truly Virtuous” (FB I, 133), from which it would follow (insofar as we read Mandeville as endorsing psychological egoism) that we can never act from truly virtuous motives. At other points, he stresses the importance of acting out of “a Rational Ambition of being good” (FB I, 49, 260), without spelling out precisely what this entails. If it merely involves reflecting on whether your action is likely to benefit society before deciding whether to perform it, then this level of rational reflection is compatible with the presence of self-centered motives, such as pride. After all, we are more likely to receive the praise that will satisfy our pride if we perform acts that benefit society. If, however, acting from a rational ambition of being good requires being motivated by reason alone, without being affected by one’s passions, then this is beyond the reach of creatures governed by their passions. Whether or not real virtue is possible, on Mandeville’s account, thus depends on how some of the more ambiguous clauses in his definition are interpreted. At times Mandeville seems happy to leave the reader guessing, sometimes observing (against Shaftesbury) that it is no “Affront to Virtue to make it inaccessible” (FB I, 23), while in other places defending himself against this very charge (e.g., FB II, 50, 336).

3.3 The question of sincerity

Given the ambiguities, equivocations, and perhaps even contradictions in Mandeville’s analysis of virtue, it is unsurprising that readers remain divided over how to make sense of his position. The main source of disagreement, however, is not so much the question of Mandeville’s consistency as that of his sincerity. He says that the Fable “is a Book of severe and exalted morality, that contains a strict Test of Virtue” (FB I, 404–405), but is this what he really means? Many of his contemporaries took the Fable to be a celebration of vice and an attack on virtue and Christianity, with Mandeville’s claims to the contrary treated as an insincere guise adopted to deflect criticism and censure.

The main reason Mandeville’s sincerity has frequently been doubted is that he appears to revel in highlighting the most scandalous implications of his own analysis. His tone is often humorous or playful, and, despite what he says, if the road to worldly prosperity and glory diverges from the road to virtue, then Mandeville seems relatively untroubled by the fact that we invariably choose the former. Indeed, he repeatedly criticizes those—especially the clergy—who complain about the moral degeneracy of society while being far from paragons of virtue themselves. That Mandeville aimed to expose the hypocrisy of such people is beyond doubt, yet it is less clear what the implications are for understanding his own moral philosophy. Some commentators have read Mandeville as a libertine or hedonist, whose rigoristic definition of virtue was insincere and adopted solely for satirical purposes (e.g., Viner 1953 [1991: 178–182]; Harth 1969; Nieli 1989). Others, by contrast, have not only taken Mandeville’s rigorism seriously, but even suggested that he saw his philosophy as resting firmly on Christian foundations (e.g., Chiasson 1970; Crisp 2019: 60–73). Another influential view is that there is a genuine tension between Mandeville’s rigoristic conception of virtue and the more general empiricist bent of his philosophy, with the latter aligning more closely with utilitarianism (Kaye 1924a: lii–lvi).

When approaching these debates, it is helpful to consider the scope of Mandeville’s moral philosophy and its relationship with his social and political ideas. In theory, at least, one could be a moral rigorist at the level of individual ethics and nonetheless think that utilitarian concerns are more appropriate in the political sphere—the key point, for Mandeville, is that political questions should be evaluated without relying on any particular theory of individual ethics (see Maxwell 1951). More generally still, it is worth recalling that one of Mandeville’s main goals was not to tell us how we ought to behave, but to explain how we do behave (FB I, 39). Insofar as this goal applies to his moral philosophy, we will likely go astray if we assume that Mandeville was concerned with defending a particular ethical position that we should strive to identify. His moral philosophy may be better understood as an investigation into the role that moral concepts, such as virtue and vice, play in our social lives. This explanatory project, which seeks to make sense of moral ideas as social phenomena, extends well beyond his conceptions of virtue and vice to encompass a wide range of social and political norms.

4. Social and Political Norms

Mandeville was a keen observer of social and political norms. While this is evident throughout his writings, the evolutionary accounts of various social phenomena that he develops in his later works constitute his most original and significant contribution to social philosophy. Central to his analysis is the relationship between the passions and the emergence of larger societal structures. This relationship is also evident in his analysis of gender, religion, and economics, which we consider here as illustrative examples of how Mandeville’s underlying account of human nature informs his wider study of society and politics.

4.1 The evolution of civil society

In The Fable of the Bees, Part II, Mandeville offers an evolutionary account of the origin of society that aims to explain how humans could have acquired the capacity to govern other people and learned to regulate their passions in ways that avoid conflict. Rather than operating with a stark dichotomy between the state of nature and civil society, Mandeville charts the various stages of a much lengthier developmental process, starting from a primitive society and gradually progressing towards the establishment of laws and norms of politeness over many centuries.

The most basic social unit, for Mandeville, is the primitive family, and he identifies three steps that would have led families to start working together before eventually forming civil societies. The first step is the fear of wild animals, which would have incentivized families to unite for purposes of common defense. As humans also pose a considerable threat to one another, the second step is fear of other humans who seek to domineer over everyone else. At this stage humans would have divided into different bands, with band leaders slowly learning through a process of trial-and-error how to govern their subjects. The third and final step is the invention of written laws, which is necessary for stable government and long-term peaceful coexistence (FB II, 266–269).

A civil society is one governed in accordance with written laws. Crucially, it is only at this juncture that human interactions would be regulated by any meaningful notions of justice. Prior to being educated and socialized, Mandeville claims that we would consider it just to take possession of anything we can, and unjust to be deprived of anything we possess—a bare bones notion of justice that would be incapable of resolving any disagreements or quarrels (FB II, 200). Written laws are required before justice can be administered equitably and reliably, and it is likewise only after many generations that we would be “led into the Method of thinking justly” (FB II, 219, also 236). Once laws that protect personal safety and private property are instituted, everything else falls into place. In particular, individuals enjoy a level of security that allows them to pursue the objects of their self-love more industriously through the division of labor (FB II, 283–284, 300). While Mandeville denies that there is any natural motive that prevents people from taking others’ possessions, the establishment of written laws and property rights creates a framework that incentivizes individuals to respect these boundaries.

Where justice is especially important for safeguarding the objects of our self-love, polite social norms allow us to cultivate self-liking in mutually beneficial ways. Mandeville claims that norms of politeness gradually arise once markets for luxury goods develop (FB II, 147), yet the example most familiar to his readers would have been the complex sport of upper-class manners observed in many of the European societies of his day. The most effective way to gain the good opinion of others and thereby satisfy our self-liking is through mutual discretion. Given that we all hold inflated views of ourselves, it is inadvisable to display our self-liking openly in public. Flattering other people and playing down our own qualities thus constitutes the height of good manners, with the politest people knowing

not only to deny the high Value they have for themselves, but likewise to pretend that they have greater Value for others, than they have for themselves. (FB II, 145)

Social norms of politeness thus generate a positive cycle that nurtures everyone’s self-liking by adopting various means to please others while concealing our true motives and high opinions of ourselves.

Mandeville’s historical narratives show how the passions central to human nature give rise to social institutions that promote prosperity. Much of this development occurs unconsciously and unintentionally, with individuals unaware of their role in shaping social institutions. For example, we learn norms of politeness through emulation and experience, without understanding either the social function that politeness serves or even the underlying motives from which we act. This is often accomplished without any reflection or foresight; over a great deal of time, we “fall as it were into these Things spontaneously” (FB II, 139). Mandeville explains the origin of languages in terms of a similar process. He speculates that speech must have first been developed with the objective of persuading and displaying superiority over other people, even though language would subsequently come to serve many other purposes (FB II, 289–295). The invention of written laws, for instance, became possible only once language had advanced to an adequate level, and as language becomes increasingly complex it facilitates the refinement of norms of politeness.

Once civil society is established, Mandeville thinks that the government has a crucial role to play in maintaining social order. That role, however, does not involve radically transforming the political and social institutions that have developed over time, but rather ensuring that those institutions continue to function effectively. A well-constituted society is analogous to a well-designed clock, in this respect, which will continue to operate by itself so long as people remember to wind it up. This means that civil societies can be governed effectively by people who do not possess any extraordinary knowledge or virtues (FB II, 322–324). Civil society is a complex arrangement and those who tamper with its roots—by clamoring for a moral reformation, for instance—will invariably do more harm than good. Mandeville develops this line of thought further elsewhere, claiming that, rather than depending upon the qualities of virtuous politicians, the best constitution is that “which provides against the worst Contingencies … and preserves itself firm and remains unshaken, though most Men should prove Knaves” (FT 167). In advancing this case, Mandeville breaks sharply from the classical republican tradition that had stressed the importance of civic virtue in public life, instead setting out an approach to understanding politics now more often associated with Hume’s analysis of constitutional government (Moore 1977: 824–826).

4.2 Gender

On Mandeville’s evolutionary account of society, the variation we observe in norms and behavior is a result of education and socialization, with human nature remaining constant throughout. There is no difference, he claims, “between the original Nature of a Savage, and that of a civiliz’d Man” (FB II, 214); they both possess the same passions, but these are cultivated differently due to the social environments in which they are raised. Much the same applies when it comes to his analysis of gender roles, and across his works Mandeville challenges many of the assumptions held at the time regarding the supposedly natural differences between the sexes.

Mandeville’s views on women are not especially well-known (although for notable contributions, see Goldsmith 1986; O’Brien 2009: 19–27; Branchi 2022: 38–55). In part, this is because some of his most striking contributions are found in his least famous works. In both The Virgin Unmask’d and his contributions to The Female Tatler, Mandeville adopts a dialogue format with a range of female characters expressing many of his most important ideas. In the “Preface” to the former, he announces that his aim “is to let young Ladies know whatever is dreadful in Marriage”. Every married woman, one of his characters declares, is “a Slave to her Husband”, with the respect and affection that men display towards women being no more than an outward show that serves to conceal the reality of subordination (VU 127–128). As well as exposing the extent—and sometimes brutal violence—of women’s oppression in the domestic sphere, the female interlocutors in The Virgin Unmaks’d also discuss Louis XIV’s politics in considerable detail, with Mandeville thereby implying that educated women can analyze the public sphere with a level of insight that many of his contemporaries would have considered the preserve of men alone. In a similar vein, some of Mandeville’s contributions to The Female Tatler return to the idea that marriage is akin to slavery, while also providing examples of women who have excelled in learning, valor, and other such qualities. The reason so few women have been recognized as great or virtuous is simply that they live under “the Injustice and Tyranny of the Men”, who, like all conquerors, endeavor to keep their captives ignorant for fear of otherwise losing their dominion (EFT, especially 171–174).

Mandeville’s views on women do not always point so straightforwardly in a feminist direction, as is most evident in the considerations that he raises for tolerating sex work as a lesser evil (on which, see Rosenthal 2006: 42–69; Nacol 2015). In the Fable, Mandeville approaches this topic in terms of sacrificing one group of women to preserve the chastity and social status of another, since lustful men will inevitably find some way of satisfying their carnal desires, and the language that he uses to describe sex workers hardly invites much sympathy with their plight (FB I, 95–100). This is a topic that is explored further in A Modest Defence of Publick Stews—a pamphlet published anonymously in 1724 that is now widely attributed to Mandeville (although for evidence raising doubts about this attribution, see Ryan, Mahadevan, & Tolonen 2023: 41–46)—which sets out a case (whether sincerely or not) for the provision of public brothels. Up to a point, at least, A Modest Defence does show a little more concern for the welfare of sex workers, who would be less exposed to violence and disease if their trade was legalized and regulated.

A recurring theme throughout Mandeville’s various discussions of women is the way that norms of chastity and female modesty are socially constructed and inculcated in young girls from a very early age. Girls are taught to feel ashamed of displaying their legs, for example, long before they could have any understanding of why this is deemed inappropriate. There is nothing natural about the different standards of modesty for men and women, Mandeville maintains, which should instead be understood as the consequence of education alone (FB I, 72–73). Chastity is the basis of female honor in much the same way as courage is the basis of male honor. Where soldiers risk their lives in battle for fear of being thought cowardly, educated women fend off the advances of men, while resisting their own sexual desires, for fear of being thought promiscuous. Even if these examples strike readers today as somewhat archaic, they nonetheless serve to illustrate Mandeville’s broader point: shame is the underlying passion that leads all of us to care deeply about our reputation, even though what is taken to be shameful is determined by the prevailing social norms and will thus vary in different times and places, and amongst those of different social status.

4.3 Religion

Many of Mandeville’s contemporaries considered him a deeply irreligious thinker, largely because they took him to be celebrating vice against all religious and moral precepts. Yet his views on religion are far more complex and nuanced. In his later works, Mandeville argues that humans are naturally disposed towards religious belief. The seed of religion is one of our natural passions: fear of an invisible power. Uneducated humans, with no knowledge of revealed religion, would live in fear of unexpected phenomena that could threaten their existence, such as extreme weather conditions or diseases. From a young age, Mandeville observes, we all anthropomorphize the world around us and assume that even inanimate things feel and think as we do, so the idea that there is some intelligent agency behind natural phenomena comes very easily to us. We are also especially inquisitive in relation to things that harm us, and we would soon seek an explanation for anything that imperils our survival. Without any scientific understanding of the processes at work, however, uneducated humans would assume that dangerous natural phenomena are caused by an invisible power, leading them to extend their fear of the phenomena to the invisible power itself. There could be as many invisible powers as there are phenomena in question, which is why polytheism has been so common throughout human history. As the fear of an invisible cause is ingrained in human nature, Mandeville claims that it persists in all civilized societies and that no religion can dispense with this natural seed (FB II, 207–214).

Mandeville’s account of the origin of natural religion has significant political implications. One is that “no Nations can be govern’d without Religion”. Those who deny the existence of an invisible cause will not be believed by the multitude, so anyone who hopes to govern a society must humor our fear of an invisible cause and turn it to their own advantage. The main temporal benefit of religion is in promoting civic allegiance, as no one’s word can be relied upon if they do not fear some form of deity (OH 21–25). Even if the tie of religion might not be strong enough to govern everyone—hence the need for codes of honor in early-modern Europe—Mandeville’s account of the natural seed of religion precludes the possibility of a society of atheists.

While religion can have civic benefits, Mandeville was well aware that it often serves the ends of persecution and schism, amongst other evils. These are concerns that he discusses most fully in Free Thoughts on Religion, which attacks priestcraft and makes the case for tolerating all religious sects that recognize the authority of the government in matters of church and state (FT 140). Mandeville lays much of the blame for religious conflict with the clergy, while often aiming to reveal that they are just as vice-ridden as the laity. This involves little more than an application of his wider account of human nature. As “Pride and Ambition are so riveted in our Nature”, any group of people will seek to dominate and tyrannize others if given the opportunity to do so (FT 156). The clergy are certainly no exception, in this regard, and governments should therefore be extremely wary about entrusting any civil powers to the church. Mandeville’s analysis of the clergy is a good illustration of one of the broader political implications of his account of human nature: exposing the hypocrisy and self-centered motives behind our actions is one way of undermining the standing of those who appeal to their own moral credentials to wield power over others (see Douglass 2023: 117–118).

4.4 Economics

Throughout the twentieth century, there was much debate about whether Mandeville should be classified as a proponent of laissez-faire or mercantilist economic doctrines (for critical overviews, see Landreth 1975; Rashid 1985; Prendergast 2016, 104–112). Evidence supporting both interpretations can be found, and Mandeville may have changed his position to some extent between different editions of the Fable, shifting from a more laissez-faire position when analyzing economic demand to a more mercantilist one when examining labor supply (Dew 2005). Indeed, one area where his economic thinking closely intersects with his broader social and political philosophy concerns his views on the working poor.

In defending the thesis that private vices lead to public benefits, Mandeville maintains that the advantages of commercial prosperity extend to the lowest classes in society, with the poorest members of flourishing states enjoying more of the comforts of life than even the richest classes in less economically-developed societies (FB I, 169–172). Yet Mandeville does not support the liberal reward of labor—as David Hume and Adam Smith would later do—and instead endorses a version of the utility of poverty thesis. While the poor should have enough to survive, Mandeville argues that the state benefits more if the poor spend their entire income, rather than being able to build up savings. The poor are generally “more prone to Ease and Pleasure than they are to Labour”, and thus will only work if driven to do so by immediate necessity (FB I, 192–194). What is more, it is important that the poor are kept uneducated and do not acquire aspirations that will only be disappointed by striving to emulate the more affluent classes. The poor will be happier with their lot if their expectations are not raised beyond what they can ever hope to attain (FB I, 287–290).

As these remarks indicate, not only does Mandeville recognize that the societies of his day were demarcated into different socioeconomic classes, but he also holds that it is unrealistic—and even undesirable—to try to change this. He argues that maintaining clear class distinctions would protect the self-esteem of the working poor, who comprised most of the population. By ensuring that the lower classes do not compare themselves to those above them on the social ladder, their self-image could be preserved, leading to greater happiness and satisfaction with their condition. There is nothing egalitarian about the way that the economy of esteem plays out in Mandeville’s social vision.

One striking feature of Mandeville’s analysis of the working poor is that he does not allow that the desire for social standing and esteem could reliably motivate people to perform menial labor. Given the importance that he elsewhere accords to pride, envy, and emulation in stimulating the demand for luxury goods, Mandeville’s discussion of the motivations of the laboring poor may seem at odds with his more general account of human nature (Pongiglione & Tolonen 2016: 89–93). Adam Smith (1759 [1976: 50]) would later remark that it “is chiefly from this regard to the sentiments of mankind, that we pursue riches and avoid poverty”, and the thought that what drives the economy is not the desire for material possessions as much as the status and good opinion that wealth confers fits well with much of Mandeville’s analysis of human nature. When it comes to the working classes, however, he contends that it is only economic necessity, and not the desire for social esteem, that can secure the labor supply of a prosperous economy.

5. Legacy

The Fable of the Bees was one of the most scandalous books published in eighteenth-century Europe. Beyond the work’s notoriety, however, it played an important role in the development of social and moral philosophy throughout the century, and, while not so widely read subsequently, it continued to attract the attention of some of the most famous philosophers and social scientists in the nineteenth and twentieth centuries (for wide-ranging surveys, see Kaye 1924a: cxiv–cxlvi; Hundert 1994: 237–249).

5.1 Eighteenth-century reception

Although the public reception of Mandeville’s work in 1720s Britain was largely hostile, it swiftly elevated him to fame (for a collection of responses, see Stafford 1997). By 1732, over 300 reports on the Fable had appeared in the British press (Revolti 2016), and Benjamin Franklin sought to meet Mandeville when he came to London in 1725. A strong case can also be made that Mandeville’s mature philosophy proved very influential in the Scottish and wider European Enlightenment, with some of his key ideas being developed by David Hume, Jean-Jacques Rousseau, and Adam Smith, amongst others (see, e.g., Castiglione 1986; Goldsmith 1988; Hundert 1994; Robertson 2005: 256–324; Heath 2014). Even when these philosophers criticized Mandeville directly, they appear to have adopted some of his key insights about the evolution of social norms and the importance of passions such as self-liking (or, in Rousseau’s lexicon, amour-propre) that lead us to care deeply about our social standing.

Reviewing Rousseau’s Discours sur l’origine et les fondements de l’inégalité parmi les hommes, Smith (1756 [1980: 250]) claimed that “the second volume of the Fable of the Bees has given occasion to the system of Mr. Rousseau”, noting that they both denied natural sociability and set out accounts of how humans gradually come to acquire the qualities required to live together in society. Indeed, one of the most striking features of Mandeville’s conjectural history of society is that it implicitly rejects the social contract approaches associated with political philosophers like Thomas Hobbes and John Locke, and instead places much more emphasis on how conventions of justice and politeness could have emerged over time—an approach that would be developed further and more famously in Hume’s A Treatise of Human Nature (Tolonen 2013). Similarly, Mandeville’s naturalistic explanation of how language first developed may well have influenced Étienne Bonnot de Condillac and helped to shape subsequent debates on the origin of language (Kaye 1924b; Schreyer 1978; Hundert 1994: 86–115).

In these respects, The Fable of the Bees is a quintessentially Enlightenment text. It offers a naturalistic account of the origins of society and morality, without appealing to God-given natural law, in the vein of Locke, or to any strong (and sometimes theologically grounded) assumptions about the reach of human benevolence—the very assumptions to which Francis Hutcheson would appeal, as one of Mandeville’s most trenchant critics. When confronted with serious religious thinkers like Hutcheson and especially George Berkeley, Mandeville reaffirmed his intellectual integrity and claimed that the outrage caused by the Fable was largely due to people criticizing it without having read it carefully. He insisted that the Fable should be read as “a Philosophical Disquisition into the Force of the Passions, and the Nature of Society” (LD 54–55), and it appears to have had the greatest philosophical impact amongst those who did take it seriously in these terms, such as Hume and Smith.

Mandeville’s economic ideas also proved influential in the eighteenth century, not least in France, where his ideas on luxury were taken up by Jean-François Melon and Voltaire (Hont 2006). French translations of some of Mandeville’s texts, including Free Thoughts on Religion, appeared even before his rise to fame following the 1723 edition of the Fable. The French press extensively reviewed and discussed his works, especially once a full translation of both parts of the Fable was published in 1740 (Muceni 2015). While the influence of Mandeville’s ideas was greatest in eighteenth-century Britain and France, his works also received wider attention throughout the century, including in Germany (Fabian 1976) and the Dutch Republic (Hengstmengel & Verburg 2023).

5.2 Nineteenth-century reception

Mandeville’s ideas continued to captivate the minds of important thinkers during the nineteenth century, sparking debates that extended into the twentieth century and beyond. For example, Karl Marx (1867 [1976: 764–765]) quoted at length from Mandeville’s discussion of the utility of poverty, which he regarded as a brutally honest assessment of the extent to which a thriving capitalist economy depends upon a poor underclass being kept at subsistence level. In addition, Marx (1867 [1976: 475]) claimed that parts of Adam Smith’s analysis of the division of labor were “copied almost word for word” from Mandeville. Other influential thinkers also turned to Mandeville’s ideas for insights into explaining complex societal phenomena. In particular, his attempts to naturalize social norms and institutions by charting their historical origins gave rise to questions about the relationship between individual behavior and collective outcomes that would dominate later social science, and which were taken up in very different ways in (for example) Thomas Malthus’s work on population dynamics and Jeremy Bentham’s account of utilitarianism (Gaukroger 2016: 267–302). Perhaps most notably, Charles Darwin appears to have read the second volume of the Fable closely and may have drawn inspiration from Mandeville’s conjectural history when developing his own evolutionary theory, recognizing its relevance for thinking through how unintended consequences and gradual change could relate to processes of natural selection (Alter 2008).

The nineteenth century also witnessed more systematic attempts to categorize Mandeville’s thought. This intellectual endeavor found fertile ground in Germany, where a flourishing school of scholarship emerged around Mandeville’s ideas in the later part of the century. One notable milestone was Paul Sakmann’s seminal work, Bernard de Mandeville und die Bienenfabel-controverse (1897), to which F. A. Hayek would later acknowledge a significant debt (Nolan 2016). Parallel to the burgeoning interest in Germany, the categorization of Mandeville’s intellectual contributions also gained momentum in Britain. Mandeville’s impact endured throughout the nineteenth century in England, as is evident from references to him in general magazines and other thinkers’ works, especially in relation to discussions of ethics, economics, and human behavior. One staunch advocate of Mandeville was James Crossley, a celebrated collector and champion of Epicurean moral philosophy, who actively fostered dialogues around Mandeville’s writings, consolidating his prominence in the intellectual milieu of the time (Tolonen 2010: 29). Mandeville’s importance to the history of moral philosophy was further established with the publication of Leslie Stephen’s Essays on Freethinking and Plainspeaking (1873: 243–278) and The History of English Thought in the Eighteenth Century (1876: 15–46), which presented Mandeville and Shaftesbury as occupying the poles between which subsequent British moral philosophy had to navigate.

5.3 Twentieth-century reception

As the twentieth century dawned, Mandeville’s works had become rare physical artefacts and it was difficult to obtain copies of his books. Frederick Benjamin Kaye played a key role in remedying this and catalyzing Mandeville’s reception. His two-volume edition of The Fable of the Bees—first published in 1924 by the Clarendon Press and later reissued by the Liberty Fund in 1988—reshaped the landscape for reading Mandeville. Kaye’s impact was so substantial that it rendered much earlier scholarship almost inconspicuous, with his edition also playing an indispensable role in making Mandeville’s ideas more accessible to contemporary students and scholars ever since.

In the early decades of the twentieth century, Mandeville’s ideas continued to be discussed amongst a range of different scholarly audiences. At one point Mandeville had suggested that humans would be unwilling to kill animals for food were it “not for this Tyranny which Custom usurps over us” (FB I, 173), and the renowned early twentieth-century Finnish sociologist, Edvard Westermarck, even identified Mandeville as an advocate of vegetarianism (1939: 392). In the Anglophone world, however, Mandeville’s ideas were most often invoked in debates about the history of economic thought. Kaye (1924a: cxxxix) had claimed that “Mandeville maintains, and maintains explicitly, the theory at present known as the laissez-faire theory”, yet this interpretation was soon contested by some of the most prominent economists of the period. In The General Theory of Employment, Interest, and Money, John Maynard Keynes (1936 [2018: 319–322]) included Mandeville in his survey of the history of mercantilist economic doctrines, stressing the importance of consumption rather than saving in Mandeville’s explanation of economic growth. It was Jacob Viner (1953 [1991: 183–184]), however, who did most to challenge Kaye’s claim by presenting Mandeville as “a convinced adherent of the prevailing mercantilism of his time”.

In aiming to add nuance to and ultimately move beyond the mercantilism/laissez-faire debate, Nathan Rosenberg (1963) and F. A. Hayek (1966) sought to recover and foreground the evolutionary aspects of Mandeville’s account of social development. Amongst Mandeville’s more famous twentieth-century readers, no one has taken his social philosophy as seriously as Hayek. In a talk delivered to the British Academy’s “Master-Mind” lecture series, Hayek (1966: 126) played down the importance of Mandeville’s economic ideas and instead credited his work with marking “the definitive breakthrough in modern thought of the twin ideas of evolution and of the spontaneous formation of an order”. According to Hayek, Mandeville understood that people are biased and neither foresee nor understand the macro-level consequences of their individual actions. Hayek saw this propensity for self-deception as a reason not to trust any individual, no matter how enlightened, to guide society towards a centrally planned future. In line with Mandeville’s thinking, Hayek criticized constructivist rationalism and what he took to be the wrong kind of individualism rooted in excessive faith in human reason. Hayek thus followed Mandeville in emphasizing the limitations of human knowledge and, on this basis, advocated for the decentralized decision-making that takes place in the market.

For Hayek, spontaneous orders are well-structured social patterns that seem like they must have been designed by an omniscient mind, but which are in fact the unplanned and uncoordinated outcomes of countless individuals’ actions. Hayek regarded Mandeville’s social philosophy as exemplifying a more general theory that explains how a coherent aggregate structure can emerge accidentally from the actions of individuals, regardless of whether those actions are altruistic or egoistic. Hayek therefore saw Mandeville as an important precursor of his own ideas on the spontaneous evolution of rules and institutions within an equilibrating economic system. Mandeville might not have fully grasped the extent of his own discovery, according to Hayek, but he set a line of thought in motion that would be developed more extensively in the Scottish Enlightenment. The highest accolade that Hayek (1966: 139) could grant Mandeville was that “he made Hume possible”. More generally, Mandeville’s emphasis on individualism and economic self-interest resonated with Hayek’s belief in the role of self-interest in economic coordination. Even if Mandeville’s views were rooted in the mercantilist tradition, then, his exploration of the mechanisms through which self-interest can contribute to the public good would influence later classical liberal thinkers.

The final three decades of the twentieth century witnessed a significant increase in scholarly interest in Mandeville, with several important book-length studies appearing in English, French, and Italian (Monro 1975; Primer 1975; Horne 1978; Carrive 1980, 1983; Scribano 1980; Goldsmith 1985; Jack 1987; Schneider 1987; Hundert 1994; Prior 2000). As a result, Mandeville’s significance to the history of philosophy is now recognized within specialist circles, despite the fact that he is mainly remembered more widely for his infamous “private vices, public benefits” paradox. Even amongst historians of philosophy, attention has been mostly focused on The Fable of the Bees and there remains relatively little research dedicated to some of his lesser-known works, such as The Virgin Unmask’d, A Treatise of the Hypochondriack and Hysterick Passions, and An Enquiry into the Origin of Honour, which merit greater study if we are to fully appreciate the depth, range, and social implications of Mandeville’s philosophical investigations into human nature and society.


A. Works by Mandeville

Texts cited above and our abbreviations of them are as follows:

  • [EFT] By a Society of Ladies: Essays in the Female Tatler (Primary sources in political thought), Maurice M. Goldsmith (ed.), Bristol: Thoemmes Press, 1999.
  • [FB] The Fable of the Bees: or, Private Vices, Publick Benefits, London, part I in 1714/1723; part II in 1729. New edition in two volumes, F. B. Kaye (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1924. This edition reprinted by Indianapolis: Liberty Fund, 1988. Page numbers from the 1924/88 edition. [Mandeville 1714/23 [1988 volume 1] available online and Mandeville 1729 [1988 volume 2] available online]
  • [FT] Free Thoughts on Religion, the Church, and National Happiness, London, 1720/1729. New edition, Irwin Primer (ed.), New Brunswick, NJ: Transaction Publishers, 2001. This edition reprinted London/New York: Routledge, 2017. Page numbers from the 2017 edition. doi:10.4324/9781351326643
  • [LD] A Letter to Dion, Occasion’d by his Book call’d Alciphron, or The Minute Philosopher, London: J. Roberts, 1732. [LD available online]
  • [OH] An Enquiry into the Origin of Honour, and the Usefulness of Christianity in War, London: John Brotherton, 1732. [OH available online]
  • [TH] A Treatise of the Hypochondriack and Hysterick Diseases, third edition, London, 1730. New edition, Sylvie Kleiman-Lafon (ed.), Cham: Springer, 2017. Page numbers from the 2017 edition. doi:10.1007/978-3-319-57781-4
  • [VU] The Virgin Unmask’d: or Female Dialogues Betwixt an Elderly Maiden Lady, and her Niece, On Several Diverting Discourses on Love, Marriage, Memoirs, Morals, &c. of the Times, London: J. Morphew and J. Woodward, 1709. [VU available online]

B. Other Primary Literature

  • Bluet, George, 1725, An Enquiry whether A general Practice of Virtue tends to the Wealth or Poverty, Benefit or Disadvantage of a People? London: R. Wilkin. [Bluet 1725 available online]
  • Butler, Joseph, 1726 [2017], Fifteen Sermons Preached on the Rolls Chapel, London: James and John Knapton. Collected and annotated in Fifteen Sermons Preached at the Rolls Chapel and Other Writings on Ethics, David McNaughton (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Fiddes, Richard, 1724, A General Treatise of Morality, Form’d upon the Principles of Natural Reason only. London: S. Billingsley. [Fiddes 1724 available online]
  • Hume, David, 1739–1740 [2000], A Treatise of Human Nature, London: John Noon. Reprinted with David Fate Norton and Mary J. Norton (eds), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Keynes, John Maynard, 1936 [2018], The General Theory of Employment, Interest, and Money, New York: Harcourt Brace. Reprinted Cham: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Law, William, 1724, Remarks upon A Late Book, entituled, The Fable of the Bees, or Private Vices, Publick Benefits, London: Will. and John Innys. [Law 1724 available online]
  • Marx, Karl, 1867 [1976], Das Kapital. Kritik der Politischen Ökonomie, Volume 1, Hamburg: Otto Meisner. Translated as Capital: A Critique of Political Economy, Volume 1, Ben Fowkes (trans.), London/New York: Penguin Books.
  • Smith, Adam, 1756 [1980], “A Letter to the Authors of the Edinburgh Review”, Edinburgh Review, From July 1755 to January 1756, Edinburgh. Collected in his Essays on Philosophical Subjects, with Dugald Stewart’s “Account of Adam Smith”. The Glasgow Edition of the Works and Correspondence of Adam Smith, W. P. D. Wightman, J. C. Bryce, and I. S. Ross (eds), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 242–256.
  • –––, 1759 [1976], The Theory of Moral Sentiments, Edinburgh: Alexander Kincaid and J. Bell. Reprinted with D. D. Raphael and A. L. Macfie (eds.), Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Stafford, J. Martin (ed.), 1997, Private Vices, Publick Benefits? The Contemporary Reception of Bernard Mandeville, Solihull: Ismeron
  • Stephen, Leslie, 1873, Essays on Freethinking and Plainspeaking, London: Longmans, Green. [Stephen 1873 available online]
  • –––, 1876, History of English Thought in the Eighteenth Century, Volume 2, London: Smith, Elder & Co.
  • Westermarck, Edward, 1939, Christianity and Morals, London : K. Paul, Trench, Trubner & Co.

C. Literature on Mandeville

  • Alter, Stephen G., 2008, “Mandeville’s Ship: Theistic Design and Philosophical History in Charles Darwin’s Vision of Natural Selection”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 69(3): 441–465. doi:10.1353/jhi.0.0000
  • Anderson, Paul Bunyan, 1936, “Splendor out of Scandal: The Lucinda-Artesia Papers in The Female Tatler”, Philological Quarterly, 15: 286–300.
  • Branchi, Andrea, 2022, Pride, Manners, and Morals: Bernard Mandeville’s Anatomy of Honour (Brill’s Studies in Intellectual History, 334), Leiden/Boston: Brill. doi:10.1163/9789004428430
  • Callanan, John J., 2015, “Mandeville on Pride and Animal Nature”, in Bernard de Mandeville’s Tropology of Paradoxes (Studies in History and Philosophy of Science 40), Edmundo Balsemão Pires and Joaquim Braga (eds), Cham: Springer International Publishing, 125–136. doi:10.1007/978-3-319-19381-6_10
  • Carrive, Paulette, 1980, Bernard Mandeville: passions, vices, vertus (Bibliothèque d’histoire de la philosophie), Paris: J. Vrin (in French).
  • –––, 1983, La philosophie des passions chez Bernard Mandeville, Paris: Didier. Reprint of her doctoral thesis, 1979.
  • Castiglione, Dario, 1986, “Considering Things Minutely: Reflections on Mandeville and the Eighteenth-Century Science of Man”, History of Political Thought, 7(3): 463–488.
  • Chiasson, Elias J., 1970, “Bernard Mandeville: A Reappraisal”, Philological Quarterly, 49(4): 489–519.
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We would like to thank Andrea Branchi and John Callanan for helpful feedback on a draft of this entry.

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