Moral Sentimentalism

First published Wed Jan 29, 2014; substantive revision Thu Nov 11, 2021

For moral sentimentalists, our emotions and desires play a leading role in the anatomy of morality. Some believe moral thoughts are fundamentally sentimental, others that moral facts are related to our sentimental responses, or that emotions are the primary source of moral knowledge. Some believe all these things. The two main attractions of sentimentalism are making sense of the practical aspects of morality, on the one hand, and finding a place for morality within a naturalistic worldview, on the other. The corresponding challenges are accounting for the apparent objectivity and normativity of morality. Recent psychological theories emphasizing the centrality of emotion in moral thinking have prompted renewed interest in sentimentalist ethics.

1. The Many Moral Sentimentalisms

Consider the following story related by Frans de Waal:

J. lives in a small seaside town in France, where he is known as the handyman he is. He can build an entire house with his own hands, as he is skilled in carpentry, plumbing, masonry, roof work, and so on. […] Being extremely nice, J. usually dispenses advice or lends a helping hand. One neighbor, whom he barely knew, kept asking about how to put a skylight in his roof. […]

J. spent from morning until late evening with the neighbor, basically doing the job on his own (as the neighbor could barely hold a hammer, he said), during which time the neighbor’s wife came, cooked, and ate lunch (the main meal in France) with her husband without offering J. anything. By the end of the day, he had successfully put the skylight in, having provided expert labor that normally would have cost more than six hundred euros. J. asked for nothing, but when the same neighbor a few days later talked about a scuba diving course, and how it would be fun to do together, he felt this opened a perfect occasion for a return gift, since the course cost about 150 euros. So J. said he’d love to go, but unfortunately didn’t have the money in his budget. By now you can guess: The man went alone. (de Waal 2009: 174–175)

If we assume the story is true and leaves nothing of importance out, we’re likely to have two kinds of response to it: we have a negative feeling of some sort towards the neighbour, and we think that the neighbour acted wrongly towards poor J. Roughly speaking, sentimentalists think that these two responses are intimately related, with the feeling in the driving seat. Since different theories in the sentimentalist family make use of different responses, this entry will adopt a liberal definition of a ‘sentiment’ that includes non-cognitive attitudes and states of all kinds – emotions, feelings, affects, desires, plans, and dispositions to have them.

This core idea gives rise to many questions. One is explanatory: Why do we think that the neighbour did something wrong? Explanatory sentimentalists believe that moral thoughts are fundamentally explained by sentiments or emotions. The second kind of question is constitutive: What does our thought that the neighbour did something wrong consist in? That is, what kind of thought is it? Is it more like believing that Pluto is a planet or like wanting to hit an uncooperative computer? Judgment sentimentalists believe that moral judgments are constituted by emotional or non-cognitive responses, at least in part, or alternatively are judgments about emotional responses or the tendency of something to give rise to them. Some judgment sentimentalists are also expressivists, who believe that the meanings of moral terms must be accounted for in terms of associated non-cognitive states.

Third, assuming that we’ve got it right, what kind of fact if any makes our thought that the neighbour acted wrongly true? Is the wrongness of the action a projection of our sentiments? If it is a fact, is it like the fact that the square of the hypotenuse is the sum of the squares of the other two sides of a right triangle, or like the fact that water is H2O, or perhaps more like the fact that rotten food is disgusting? For metaphysical sentimentalists, moral facts have to do with our sentimental responses, or moral and evaluative concepts are concepts of properties of causing or warranting sentimental responses. Finally, we’re pretty confident of our judgment. But even if we assume we know all the pertinent empirical facts, how do we know that what the neighbour did is wrong? What if someone disagrees? How can we justify our verdict? Epistemic sentimentalists believe that sentimental responses of a suitable kind play a central role in moral justification or understanding.

These sentimentalist views are logically independent of each other. One indication of this is that they contrast with different views. Epistemic and possibly explanatory sentimentalist views contrast with rationalist and intuitionist views, according to which we can acquire moral knowledge by reasoning or intuition, respectively, rather than via emotion. Some, though not all, judgment sentimentalist views contrast with cognitivist accounts of moral judgment. Metaphysical sentimentalist views, in turn, contrast with error theory and mind-independent moral realism in naturalist and non-naturalist variants.

2. Explanatory Sentimentalism

It is not uncommon for contemporary philosophers to see sentimentalism as a theory of moral judgment or facts. But classical sentimentalists considered the primary question to be a moral psychological one: What feature of human nature – reason, sentiment, or intellectual intuition – explains why we approve of something or blame someone? (See David Hume’s Treatise of Human Nature (T), 456 and Adam Smith’s The Theory of Moral Sentiments (TMS), 312–313.) Some of their main arguments were introduced in the context of this explanatory question, which lies on the border between philosophy and what is now the empirical science of psychology.

2.1 Moral Sense Theories

While the importance of emotion in ethical thought has been recognized by philosophers at least since Aristotle and Mencius, the roots of the modern sentimentalist tradition in ethics go back to early 18th century debates in Britain. Anthony Ashley Cooper, better known by his title as the Earl of Shaftesbury, introduced the notion of a moral sense in his Inquiry Concerning Virtue, or Merit. According to Shaftesbury, the primary object of moral evaluation is the “affection” or motive behind the action. Such affections can, by reflection, become the object of a second-order affection:

In a Creature capable of forming general Notions of Things, not only the outward Beings which offer themselves to the Sense, are the Objects of the Affection; but the very Actions themselves, and the Affections of Pity, Kindness, Gratitude, and their Contrarys, being brought into the Mind by Reflection, become Objects. So that, by means of this reflected Sense, there arises another kind of Affection towards those very Affections themselves, which have been already felt, and are now become the Subject of a new Liking or Dislike. (Shaftesbury 1699–1714: 16)

Moral approval is explained by (and perhaps consists in) this sort of second-order liking, which Shaftesbury usually designates the ‘Sense of Right or Wrong’. This sense is innate or natural, and can be displaced only by “contrary habit and custom” (1699–1714: 25), although it may on occasion be overcome by “rage, lust, or any other counterworking passion” (1699–1714: 35). On Shaftesbury’s view, what it approves of are natural or public affections, which are the beautiful and harmonious motives tending towards the good of the whole system of rational creatures. To be virtuous, a creature must not only do the right things, but exercise its moral sense and act for the very reason that something is worthy and honest (1699–1714: 18). That’s why even the kindest dog can’t be virtuous, as long as it lacks the ability to reflect on its affections and act on the resulting affect.

Frances Hutcheson fills in Shaftesbury’s sketch to some extent. His argument for the existence of a moral sense draws on his rejection of rationalism and intuitionism (see Supplement on Anti-Rationalist Arguments). Since we don’t approve of actions because of self-interest or self-evidence, something else must explain our convictions. According to him, a sense is a “determination of the mind, to receive any idea from the presence of an object which occurs to us, independent of our will” (1725: 90). There are many more such senses than traditionally acknowledged. Since moral ideas arise spontaneously, Hutcheson concludes we have a moral sense,

a determination of our minds to receive amiable or disagreeable ideas of Actions, when they occur to observation, antecedent to any opinions of advantage or loss to redound to ourselves from them. (1725: 100)

The moral sense, though not moral ideas, is innate, as can be seen from the sentiments of small children when they begin to respond to actions (1725: 145–146).

On Hutcheson’s early (and best known) view, what the moral sense approves of is above all “the general calm desire of the happiness of others”, in distinction from particular benevolent passions like love and compassion (1728: 175). On this picture, in contrast to Shaftesbury, the motive of morally praiseworthy actions is benevolence and not the thought that the action is obligatory or that it would be approved of by the moral sense itself. In Hutcheson’s terminology, moral sense is the source of justifying reasons, but not exciting reasons. (For the development of Hutcheson’s views, see Bishop 1996).

Some key features of these early sentimentalist theories are shared by the psychologist Jonathan Haidt’s (2012) contemporary model. Haidt’s starting point is an increasingly common distinction in psychology between two kinds of cognitive process. Type I or intuitive processes are automatic, effortless, fast, often associative, parallel, affective, and often modular (that is, making use of only domain-specific information). We are only conscious of their outputs, not the processes themselves. (They are thus parallel to Hutcheson’s ‘senses’.) Type II ‘reflective’ or ‘reasoning’ processes are, in contrast, conscious, effortful, slow, memory-taxing, sometimes inferential, rational, and linear processes. As is common in psychology, Haidt uses the term ‘intuition’ for beliefs that result from the intuitive processes.

Haidt’s empirical claim is that moral judgments are for the most part intuitions proximally caused by gut reactions, quick and automatic flashes of affect. In support of this, manipulating affect has been shown to make a difference to people’s judgments (Wheatley and Haidt 2005), and areas of the brain associated with such affective responses found active when people make judgments (e.g., Greene and Haidt 2002; Moll, de Oliveira-Souza, and Eslinger 2003). Further, in some studies, people are easily dumbfounded when challenged on their moral views: they cannot (Haidt claims) give reasons for why they disapprove of harmless sibling incest, for example (Haidt 2001). On Haidt’s somewhat pessimistic picture, the role of reason is for the most part lawyerly rationalization of the pre-existing gut reactions, in particular in a social context. In the same vein, Joshua Greene (2008) claims on the basis of brain imaging and reaction-time data (Greene et al. 2001), among others, that it is in particular deontological judgments, such as the thought that it is wrong to kill one person as a means to save five, that are driven by affective gut reactions, which philosophers like Kant subsequently try to rationalize. Greene holds that utilitarian judgments, in contrast, result from conscious reasoning. However, Guy Kahane (2012) argues persuasively that once we look at broader data, we see that the difference between Type I and Type II processes corresponds to the difference between intuitive and counterintuitive judgments rather than deontological and utilitarian content.

Where the early sentimentalists gesture towards divine providence when it comes to explaining why we have a moral sense and why it approves of things like benevolence, Haidt’s story appeals to evolution. He believes we are pre-programmed to respond to suffering with compassion, the arrogance of subordinates with contempt, cheating with anger, and impurity with disgust, for example. These culturally fine-tuned affective responses are in turn distally explained by having been evolutionary “adaptations to long-standing threats and opportunities in social life” of our ancestors (Haidt 2012).

One challenge for Haidt’s view is that unlike classical sentimentalist views, it doesn’t distinguish between moral and non-moral evaluations. When talking about intuitions in his sense, he says that

the brain has a kind of gauge (sometimes called a “like-ometer”) that is constantly moving back and forth, and these movements, these quick judgments, influence whatever comes next. (Haidt and Björklund 2008: 186–187)

But we don’t regard everything we dislike, or even everything that makes us angry, as morally wrong. The story is at least incomplete. Further, as a psychologist, Haidt naturally offers no a priori arguments against the possibility of reason yielding moral verdicts. All he can claim is that people don’t usually engage in reasoning first. Even if that is true, it doesn’t follow that people’s judgments are not shaped by reasoning or that they are insensitive to reasons. Indeed, Daniel Jacobson (2012) points out that the evidence that people lack reasons for their judgments is in fact very thin. In Haidt’s most famous example, even harmless sibling incest involves a significant risk of suffering emotional repercussions (Railton 2014: 849). The vibe at your sister’s wedding three years later might not be quite the same. People might not be able to immediately articulate such reasons, but that doesn’t show that they were not responding to them. Rather than being mere rationalization, post hoc reasoning might then be a process of trying to articulate the considerations one’s intuitive judgments were responsive to.

Recently, Joshua May (2018) has challenged the primacy of affect in moral thought on empirical grounds. He argues that the best evidence we have supports only a more modest role for emotions as facilitating (or hindering) information processing. May notes that manipulating incidental emotions – that is, emotions that are not directed towards or aroused by the object of moral judgment, such as disgust caused by foul odors (Schnall et al. 2008) – has only been found to have minor effects. He rightly points out that such scarce and minor effects don’t support any claims about a leading or essential role for affect in moral judgment. Following Heidi Maibom (2005), he also argues that problems in the moral judgment of psychopaths are better explained by rational rather than emotional deficits.

May holds that instead of mere feeling, moral judgments are typically explained by reasoning, albeit often reasoning of an automatic and unconscious Type I variety. He supports this claim by appeal to many studies that suggest that moral judgments are sensitive to features like intentionality (see Young and Tsoi 2013 for an overview) and the use of personal force (see Greene et al. 2009), and more generally the extent of attributed agential involvement. As May summarizes the view, “We often rapidly infer the moral status of an action in part by relying on general principles that identify as morally relevant various features of agents, actions, and outcomes…. This is a matter of reasoning or inference, whether implicit, explicit, or some combination of the two across time” (2018: 70).

While May’s data and arguments are a healthy corrective for some exaggerated forms of explanatory sentimentalism, such as Haidt’s, it is unclear how much sentimentalists should worry about them. After all, the key evidence for explanatory sentimentalism is not meant to come from incidental emotions, but from the fact that we, say, disapprove of the sort of things that independently arouse negative emotion. The sentimentalist can relatively easily explain the targets of our condemnation by appealing to independent emotional reactions, while for the rationalist, it is merely a coincidence that apes get mad about the very same sort of things that our reason tells us to disapprove of. And it is compatible with explanatory sentimentalism that people first reason (consciously or not) about non-moral facts and then respond with emotion, which is still needed to cross the gap between non-moral and moral judgment. As Hume has it, although sentiment renders the final verdict, “in order to pave the way for such a sentiment, and give a proper discernment of its object, it is often necessary, we find, that much reasoning should precede, that nice distinctions be made, just conclusions drawn” (1751: 15).

2.2 Sympathy/Empathy-Based Theories

What is distinctive of David Hume and Adam Smith is that although they occasionally use the term ‘moral sense’, they do not take it to be a primitive, innate capacity, but rather aim to explain its workings in terms of more basic mechanisms, in particular what they call ‘sympathy’. In contemporary use, the term is often used for a kind of concern for another. But Hume, Smith, and Sophie de Grouchy (1798), in different ways, used it for sharing what another feels. The contemporary term for this kind of mechanism is empathy (for the distinction between sympathy and empathy, see Darwall 1998; Sober and Wilson 1998; Fleischacker 2019). This section will nevertheless use the older term, since what the classical sentimentalists talk about isn’t always quite ‘empathy’ either.

Following Hutcheson, Hume rejects reason or reasoning as the source of moral distinctions (judgments or facts). Briefly, he believes that reason alone cannot motivate us in the way that morality does (motivation scepticism), and that reasoning alone cannot tell us what’s right or wrong (content scepticism). For discussion, see Supplement on Anti-Rationalist Arguments.

On Hume’s positive account, moral approval is caused, if not constituted, by pleasure of a special kind, or a form of love towards the agent when considering their character impartially:

’Tis only when a character is considered in general, without reference to our particular interest, that it causes such a feeling or sentiment, as denominates it morally good or evil. (T 472)

But why does contemplation of a character without reference to our own interest give us pleasure in the first place? Not because we’re simply equipped with an innate moral sense, but because of the operation of sympathy, which offers a more parsimonious and systematic explanation of the phenomena. For Hume, its mechanism is a kind of analogical association from the effects of a passion to their cause or vice versa, which generates the same passion in the observer (T 576). Grouchy observed that the importance of memory in this process has political implications: the privileged who skip the “school of pain and adversity” will be lacking in compassion (1798: 62). On Hume’s account, once the pleasures and pains of others are communicated to us, we are ourselves pleased in a special way when contemplating those durable character traits that reliably please others. This special kind of pleasure ‘denominates’ the trait as virtuous or vicious:

When any quality, or character, has a tendency to the good of mankind, we are pleased with it, and approve of it; because it presents the lively idea of pleasure; which idea affects us by sympathy, and is itself a kind of pleasure. (T 580)

Hume notes two ways in which our moral approval diverges from what causes sympathetic pleasure, however. First, what comes naturally to us is taking on the feelings of the near and the dear, those who are close to or similar to us and those we care about. (This observation of bias inherent in empathy has recently been rediscovered by Prinz 2011 and Bloom 2017.) Yet we can also approve of the virtues of distant strangers, even enemies. Second, we sometimes approve of “virtue in rags”: an honest and generous person, who is (say) imprisoned and thus in no position to benefit others, is not considered morally worse than someone with the same traits who actually does please those around her.

Hume’s answer to these challenges is that we correct our initial responses for bias and the influence of moral luck, as well as our present disposition – not because we aim for some standard that is independent of our responses, but because of “many contradictions to our sentiments in society and conversation” (T 583) that result from relying on “momentary appearances” (T 582). After all, when someone uses moral language and calls someone “vicious”, “odious”, or “depraved”, she “expresses sentiments, in which, he expects, all his audience are to concur with him” (Hume 1751: 75). It is this expectation of concurrence characteristic of moral sentiments that pushes us towards a “common point of view” (ibid.) in moral judging, a point of view that abstracts from our particular interests, current disposition, and relation to the agent, and focuses on the effects of the person’s character traits on people around them (T 602–3) (see Sayre-McCord 1994).

Adam Smith presents a different theory about the nature and mechanisms of sympathy and consequently moral and evaluative approval. For Smith, the key mechanism of sympathy is imaginatively projecting oneself in another’s position, or what would now be called simulation (Gordon 1995), rather than mere emotional contagion, association, or inference. In Smith’s official definition, sympathy consists in concord between what one takes the other to actually feel and what one feels oneself as a result of putting oneself in the other’s shoes. Approbation is the pleasant feeling that results from perceiving this rough coincidence (TMS 56 note a), perhaps because it simultaneously confirms our common humanity and the distinctness of our perspectives (Fleischacker 2019, 28–31). Although this account of ‘sense of propriety’ is sometimes described as Smith’s theory of moral judgment, he regards it as a perfectly general account of evaluation, encompassing belief, sense of humour, or business decisions. When it comes to judgments of moral merit or demerit, or the qualities of deserving praise or blame, what counts is our sympathy with the gratitude and resentment of those affected by the action, on the one hand, and with the agent’s motives, on the other. Like Hume, Smith recognizes that moral approval requires departing from one’s personal point of view:

But [resentment and gratitude], as well as all the other passions of human nature, seem proper and are approved of, when the heart of every impartial spectator entirely sympathizes with them, when every indifferent by-stander entirely enters into, and goes along with them. (TMS 81)

The figure of an impartial spectator also plays a key role in Smith’s account of self-directed moral judgment or conscience. Because we want others to sympathize with us (and thus approve of us), we strive to bring our passions to a level that an imagined informed and impartial spectator could sympathize with (Kopajtic 2020). Antti Kauppinen (2010: 236–239; 2014a) argues that this can be seen in contemporary psychological terms as a form of emotion regulation by means of refocusing attention and reappraising the meaning of the action.

Michael Slote’s recent sentimentalist account picks up the thread of empathy/sympathy-based theories, along with Hutcheson’s emphasis on benevolence. Slote’s claim is that moral approval is constituted and explained by empathizing with an agent’s motives:

[I]f agents’ actions reflect empathic concern for (the well being or wishes of) others, empathic beings will feel warmly or tenderly toward them, and such warmth and tenderness empathically reflect the empathic warmth or tenderness of the agents. … [S]uch empathy with empathy … also constitutes moral approval, and possibly admiration as well, for agents and/or their actions. (Slote 2010: 34–35)

Some people’s actions exhibit empathy toward others. This empathy is a warm feeling. When we empathize with the agent, we come to share this warm feeling. And this empathic warm feeling constitutes moral approval. In contrast, unempathetic actions manifest a coldness towards others. Since moral approval and disapproval “enter into the making of moral judgments”, Slote believes empathy can explain our intuitions and judgments.

Slote’s account has been criticized from within the sentimentalist camp. Jesse Prinz (2011) notes that the view has difficulty with disapproval: failure to empathize is not the same thing as disapprobation, nor does it have the same kind of motivational effect. Julia Driver (2011) points out that people with empathy deficits can nevertheless morally approve or disapprove of things. Slote’s view also faces challenges of both necessity and sufficiency, in that it seems possible that we approve of un-empathic actions (such as doing something out of a sense of duty, or doing the right thing for the wrong reason), and that there are empathetic actions we don’t approve of (such as empathy-motivated helping of one victim at the expense of many others who are less close or similar to the agent).

Empathic feelings may enter into the explanation of moral judgment more indirectly, however. Shaun Nichols’s (2004) version of sentimentalism shares the Humean ambition of explaining moral thought without assuming an innate moral capacity or sense. Instead, Nichols assumes that normal people have a generic capacity to be guided by norms or rules of various kinds, and certain non-moral emotional dispositions, such as the disposition to have an aversive response to suffering in others. His hypothesis is that we regard a rule-violation as moral (and thus wrong independently of what anyone tells us to do) rather than conventional (something that owes its status to being prohibited by some local de facto authority) when the rule in question is affect-backed, that is, when it prohibits actions of a type that we independently have a negative emotional reaction towards (Nichols 2004: 62).

One important source of support for this claim is that people who lack the relevant affective response, such as psychopaths, appear to fail at distinguishing between moral and conventional rules, even if their rational capacities are intact (cf. Aaltola 2014). At the same time, Nichols holds that particular moral judgments can be simply applications of affect-backed rules, and don’t require on-line affective response. This indirect explanatory sentimentalism was anticipated by some earlier sentimentalists. Adam Smith noted that we make the “greater part of” our moral judgments on the basis of general rules, which are for him based on induction from emotional responses to particular cases (TMS 377). Similarly, Grouchy holds that reflection generates abstract and general moral sentiments, which we obey “without thinking back to the way in which they were first formed and all that justified them” (1798: 112). Edward Westermarck held that many judgments are “applications of some accepted general rule”, whose acceptance is ultimately explained by the existence of an “emotional sanction” in the judge’s mind (Westermarck 1906: 6).

Nichols believes that his sentimental rules account also offers an explanation of universality of certain norms. We do not have to assume that people have an innate tendency to regard causing harm to innocents as morally wrong. Instead, it is plausible that of the various norms that different societies have come up with, those that resonate with our non-moral emotional dispositions enjoy a higher ‘cultural fitness’ (Nichols 2004: 127) and thus become more prevalent over time. Since we can account for (nearly) pan-cultural moral rules as well as moral judgment without appeal to dedicated innate mechanisms, Nichols (2005) concludes that morality is an evolutionary by-product rather than an adaptation.

3. Judgment Sentimentalism

Sentimentalism is commonly understood as a thesis about moral judgments or concepts. Moral thought involves or refers to our sentiments, and moral language somehow or other expresses or refers to sentiments. Judgment sentimentalism comes both in non-cognitivist and cognitivist varieties.

3.1 Non-Cognitivist Sentimentalism

On pure non-cognitivist views, moral thoughts are constituted by sentiments. To think that X is wrong is, at least in part, to have a negative sentiment towards X, or perhaps to have a higher-order positive attitude towards a negative sentiment towards X. Here is the most famous argument in favour of non-cognitivism:

The Argument from Internalism

  1. Moral judgments are intrinsically at least defeasibly motivating. (Weak Internalism)
  2. Only non-cognitive psychological states with a world-to-mind direction of fit are intrinsically motivating; beliefs, which have a mind-to-world direction of fit, do not alone motivate (The Humean Theory of Motivation).
  3. So, moral judgments are (at least in part) constituted by non-cognitive psychological states.

The argument is clearly related to arguments from practicality against rationalism (see the Anti-Rationalism Supplement). The first premise postulates an internal connection between moral judgment and motivation. Weak Internalists believe, roughly, that judging that I morally ought to stop downloading movies entails that I have at least some motivation to stop downloading movies. Otherwise I don’t genuinely regard the action as morally wrong. My moral convictions are manifest in my motivational tendencies, if not always in action. Why? Basically, because the point of thinking in moral terms isn’t to discover some facts about the universe, but to get ourselves to act in ways that allow us to live together and reap the benefits of cooperation. Simon Blackburn (1988) and Allan Gibbard (1990) point out that any evolutionary benefits moral thought might have depend on its practicality. (See also Lenman (1999) and the entry on Moral Motivation.)

The second premise of the argument is a thesis in the philosophy of mind. Some mental states, like descriptive beliefs, represent how things are, and have a mind-to-world direction of fit. Other mental states are not descriptive, though they may have the same propositional content as beliefs. If you want your car to work and notice that it refuses to start, your desire does not tend to go out of existence, unlike your belief that your car is working (Smith 1987). Rather, it moves you to do something you believe would make the car work, such as call a mechanic. It has a world-to-mind direction of fit. Although particular ways of drawing the distinction remain controversial (see e.g. Sobel and Copp 2001; Frost 2014), the key idea that descriptive beliefs themselves are motivationally inert is widely accepted.

Finally, the conclusion comes in different strengths. Traditional non-cognitivists believe that moral judgments simply are non-cognitive states. But what kind of states? They are clearly not mere desires, since we can desire things we don’t regard as desirable. Early non-cognitivists talked about a special ‘ethical feeling’ (Ayer 1936), identified in phenomenological terms. But there doesn’t seem to be any common phenomenological character to all the various moral thoughts we have. So contemporary non-cognitivists appeal to the functional role of moral attitudes instead, to their distinctive part in our overall psychology. Blackburn’s (1998) idea is that moral thoughts involve higher-order attitudes towards desires and preferences. When I morally disapprove of polluting the environment, I don’t just desire not to pollute -- I also applaud others who are averse to it and dislike those who fail to share my desire (Blackburn 2002: 125). When I morally disapprove of something, I also have these higher-order attitudes towards my own attitudes: I prefer not to prefer what I disapprove of, which explains a defeasible link to motivation.

Gibbard (1990), in turn, identifies narrowly moral judgments with judgments about the rationality of guilt and resentment. To think that stealing is wrong, for example, is to think it rational to feel guilt for stealing and resent others for stealing (in the absence of conditions like ignorance or force that excuse the agent). To think that something is rational or makes sense, in turn, is to accept norms that permit it. On Gibbard’s original account, norm-acceptance is a basic kind of non-cognitive state, an evolutionary adaptation for linguistically achieved coordination that is not analyzable in terms of other attitudes (1990: ch. 4). It is non-cognitive, because it is essentially a motivational tendency to act or feel in ways that we are prepared to avow in discussion about what to do. In later work, he considers normative thoughts as contingency plans that settle what to do in actual and non-actual situations (Gibbard 2003). These thoughts are defeasibly motivating, just as the Argument from Internalism requires.

3.2 Expressivism

The above argument concerns moral judgment as a psychological state, a kind of thought. But the term ‘judgment’ is sometimes also used for linguistic utterances. Likewise, the term ‘non-cognitivism’ is also used for a thesis about moral language. To minimize confusion, this entry will talk about moral terms, utterances, and sentences when it comes to linguistic entities, and reserve the term ‘expressivism’ for the linguistic thesis. Bearing these terminological stipulations in mind, any argument for non-cognitivism can be extended to an argument for expressivism with the addition of some deceptively simple premises:

  1. The meaning of a sentence is determined by the mental state it expresses. (Metasemantic Psychologism)
  2. Moral sentences express moral judgments.
  3. So, moral sentences express (at least in part) non-cognitive psychological states.
  4. So, the meaning of moral sentences is determined (at least in part) by non-cognitive psychological states.

Premise 4 is the key addition. It is not the only way to arrive at a broadly expressivist theory in ethics – earlier forms, such as emotivism (Ayer 1936; Stevenson 1944) and universal prescriptivism (Hare 1952) relied on the problematic assumption that the meaning of a sentence is to be understood on the basis of the effects it is used to achieve or the speech act it is used to perform. Metasemantic Psychologism doesn’t make this assumption, but simply derives the meaning of linguistic expressions from the thoughts that they express, rather than their truth-conditions or the possible worlds they rule out, as standard semantics does (Gibbard 1990: 92)

It is essential to understanding expressivism that expressing a thought is not the same thing as reporting a thought – when I say “The sun is shining”, I express my belief that the sun is shining, rather than reporting it, for which I’d have to say “I believe that the sun is shining.” Mark Schroeder (2010) has recently emphasized that the core expressivist claim is that the sentence “Murder is wrong” is related to disapproval of murder in just the same way as the sentence “The sun is shining” is related to the belief that the sun is shining, whatever that is. The only difference is that the expressed state is non-descriptive. This has significant semantic consequences, to be sure. Famously, since non-descriptive states lack truth-conditions, (pure) expressivists cannot explain the inferential relations among them in the usual way, but rather in terms of agreement or disagreement in attitudes (Stevenson 1937, Gibbard 2003). Attempts to do so have proven controversial, to say the least. For discussion, see the entry on Moral Cognitivism vs. Non-Cognitivism.

Although it is definitive of expressivism that the meanings of moral sentences are explained without appealing to their truth-conditions, it is important to note that contemporary expressivists do not deny that it makes sense to talk about moral truth or even moral facts. But for them, doing so is just a different way of expressing first-order ethical views. As Blackburn puts it:

To say that an ethical view is true is just to reaffirm it, and so it is if we add the weighty words ‘really’, ‘true’, ‘fact’, and so on. To say that it is objectively true is to affirm that its truth does not vary with what we happen to think about it, and once more this is an internal, first-order ethical position. (Blackburn 1998: 296)

Making sense of the action-guiding character of moral language is not, of course, the only motivation for expressivism. Another important part of the case for it is the Argument from Moral Supervenience, originally made by Blackburn (1971; 1985), which claims, roughly, that expressivists can best explain why it is a conceptual truth that descriptively identical worlds must be morally identical. For more, see the entry on Supervenience in Ethics.

3.3 Cognitivist Sentimentalism: Subjectivism and Ideal Dispositionalism

Sentimentalists need not think that moral judgments just are sentiments or attitudes of some sort. Cognitivist sentimentalists think they are descriptive beliefs about sentiments or the disposition to cause sentiments. (I’ll explore further varieties below.) The related semantic view is that moral sentences are about the speaker’s (or someone else’s) sentiments or dispositions to cause sentiments.

The simplest semantic account along these lines is Speaker Subjectivism, according to which the truth condition of an utterance of “Stealing is wrong” is that the speaker disapproves of stealing. This disapproval need not consist simply in a negative sentiment towards stealing, but may also be thought of as endorsement of a moral standard or norm that prohibits stealing. In other words, the speaker reports the same attitude that expressivists say the sentence expresses. This view is suggested by some things that Hume says, in particular the following:

[W]hen you pronounce any action or character to be vicious, you mean nothing, but that from the constitution of your nature you have a feeling or sentiment of blame from the contemplation of it. (T 469)

For Speaker Subjectivism, there is a non-cognitive element to moral judgment, but moral sentences can nevertheless be given standard truth-conditional semantics. Its attraction is thus making sense of judgment internalism without the need for non-standard semantics or metasemantics. A generalized version of Speaker Subjectivism is Metaethical Contextualism, according to which the standard relative to which something is said to be right or wrong need not be the speaker’s own, but is instead determined by the context of utterance, in something like the way that the context fixes the content of a tacitly indexical sentence like “Zheng is tall” (Dreier 1990; Björnsson and Finlay 2010). So just like in uttering “Zheng is tall”, we might say that Zheng is tall for a child, in uttering “Stealing is wrong” we might say that stealing is wrong by the standards you and I accept, for example.

A basic objection to these views is the Missing Disagreement Problem (Moore 1912). Suppose that Ann says “Eating people is wrong” and Beth, a committed cannibal, replies “No, eating people is not wrong.” According to simple Speaker Subjectivism, what Ann said is true if and only if Ann disapproves of eating people, and what Beth said is true if and only if Beth doesn’t disapprove of eating people. It can obviously be simultaneously true that Ann disapproves of eating people and Beth doesn’t, so their utterances don’t contradict each other. Indeed, since what Ann says is true on this picture, it looks like it should be possible for Beth to say “What Ann says is true, but eating people is not wrong”. So it seems they don’t disagree any more than if Ann had said “My name begins with an A” and Beth had said “No, my name begins with a B”. Yet they do, so Speaker Subjectivism has a problem.

Contemporary subjectivists and contextualists are well aware of this problem and offer various suggestions to solve it. For example, Gilbert Harman’s pragmatist response holds that when we say that something is wrong, we presuppose that the hearer shares our moral standards (Harman 2000: 36). Our conversation is about what follows from our standard, which is something something about which we can genuinely disagree.

Whatever we otherwise make of Harman’s suggestion, the pragmatic strategy appears to unduly restrict the scope of possible disagreement, since it is possible to disagree with people who are not part of the conversation (Björnsson and Finlay 2010). In response, subjectivists and contextualists sometimes give up the notion that disagreement consists of contradictory beliefs, and account for it in terms of the originally non-cognitivist notion of disagreement in attitude (e.g. Finlay 2017). Assume, for simplicity, that disapproval involves desire to have the agent punished, and approval a desire not to have the agent punished. Then, even if Ann’s and Beth’s utterances don’t contradict one another, they disagree in the sense that it is not possible to simultaneously satisfy the desires entailed by the truth of their sincere utterances when they issue a verdict on cannibalism. If Ann gets her way, Beth doesn’t, and vice versa.

Another question for Speaker Subjectivism is that the subject matter of the moral thought is not distinctively evaluative: if Ellen is a Presbyterian and thinks that stealing is wrong, the content of Ellen’s thought might be just that stealing is such as to arouse disapproval in Presbyterians. Someone else could have a thought with the same content without thereby making a moral evaluation of stealing (Egan 2012: 566). The evaluative aspect is external to the belief, and consists rather in something like identifying as a Presbyterian, which involves a desire-like attitude towards avoiding things that don’t fit the Presbyterian moral code. Consequently, there is no commitment to a distinct kind of evaluative fact. In Jamie Dreier’s (2009) view, this is an advantage rather than a problem for the account.

Ideal Dispositionalist views evade problems with Speaker Subjectivism with two moves. The first is idealization: the beliefs and sentences refer not to the speaker’s views, but to those of a suitably idealized subject (perhaps an idealized version of the speaker). At the level of logical form, ought claims may have a tacit argument place for a standard, just as for contextualists – but the standard is context-invariant. The second is dispositionalization: the reference is not to anyone’s actual sentiments, but to sentiments they would have in suitable circumstances. Suggestions of this type of view can be found in Hume and Smith – recall their talk of correcting our sentiments by reference to the common point of view or the impartial spectator’s response. Roderick Firth’s (1952) Ideal Observer Theory is a more contemporary variant of this kind of view. In general form, it is as follows:

To judge that X has a moral property is to believe that any ideal observer would have an ethically significant reaction to X in conditions ideal for doing so.

By an ‘ethically significant reaction’ Firth means

the kind of moral experience which we take to be evidence, under ideal conditions, for the truth of our ethical judgments. (Firth 1952: 326)

He leaves it open whether the reaction is sentimental, so there are possible variants of Ideal Observer Theory that are not sentimentalist. In specifying the characteristics of the ideal observer, Firth uses a ‘pragmatic methodology’ of

examining the procedures which we actually regard, implicitly or explicitly, as the rational ones for deciding ethical questions. (ibid. 332)

If we actually disqualify someone’s ethical verdicts because of ignorance of non-moral facts, failure to vividly imagine what something would actually be like, partiality, non-moral emotions, and inconsistency, this shows that we implicitly regard moral judgements as valid only when made by an omniscient, omnipercipient, impartial, dispassionate, consistent, but otherwise normal judge (ibid. 333–345). These are then the characteristics of the ideal observer.

Ideal Dispositionalist views avoid the Missing Disagreement Problem. For example, if Ann believes that any informed impartial spectator would disapprove of X and Beth believes it’s not the case that any informed impartial spectator would not disapprove of X, their beliefs contradict each other and they straightforwardly disagree.

However, this victory for idealized views is achieved by detachment from people’s own actual attitudes, which leads to the Missing Motivation Problem. The attraction that simple subjectivism, contextualism, and non-cognitivism share is that if moral thoughts consist in attitudes or beliefs about standards one endorses, their putative non-contingent connection to motivation is unproblematic. But how could beliefs about dispositions to cause sentimental responses in ideal subjects necessarily motivate ordinary thinkers, given the Humean Theory of Motivation (Mackie 1980: 69)? Some might have the desire to do what an impartial spectator would approve of, but what about those who don’t? As Richard Joyce (2013) has put it, it appears that one may be just as unmoved by such thoughts as by the belief that drunken Vikings would mock the performance of an action, and quite rationally so.

Michael Smith (1994; 1997) offers a distinctively rationalist response to this challenge by appealing to the idea that an agent is more rational in the sense of coherence if she is motivated to do what she believes her ideally rational and informed advisor would want her to do. It merits further exploration whether a sentimentalist view could make a similar move. For example, an Adam Smithian suggestion would be that an agent who believes that any impartial spectator would desire her to do A and fails to desire to A is less coherent than one who combines the belief with a desire to A. This assumes that our beliefs about an ideal spectator’s attitudes are inherently authoritative for us (and hence unlike beliefs about Vikings), as Smith indeed thinks.

3.4 Cognitivist Sentimentalism: Sensibility Theory and Neo-Sentimentalism

The cognitivist sentimentalist views discussed in the previous section appealed to beliefs about dispositions to cause sentimental responses in certain kind of subjects. The other main type of cognitivist view, sensibility theory, regards judgments as beliefs about merited responses (Wiggins 1987; McDowell 1998). Sensibility theory begins with an analogy with secondary quality concepts, such as colour concepts. These concepts, according to many, are concepts of mind-dependent qualities. Sensibility theorists believe they are partially analogous with value concepts, the difference being that value is

conceived to be not merely such as to elicit the appropriate ‘attitude’ … but rather such as to merit it. (McDowell 1985: 143)

When we conceive of value in this way, we perceive there to be a reason for, say, admiring or emulating someone (McDowell 1979).

This state of perceiving or conceiving of there being a reason is a belief of a unique and controversial sort. According to John McDowell (1978), it can explain a virtuous person’s action without the help of a related desire playing a causal role (although we can rightly attribute a desire to a person as a consequence of their being motivated by the perception of a reason). McDowell thus rejects the Humean Theory of Motivation (premise 2 in the Argument from Internalism). His arguments are inspired by his reading of Aristotle rather than the Early Modern sentimentalist tradition. Roughly, a virtuous person sees situations in a distinctive way (McDowell 1979: 73), so that certain features, like someone’s need to know something, are salient to her, while other concerns are silenced, and thus do not stand out as calling for action. This ‘moral vision’ (Murdoch 1970) then suffices to explain what the agent does.

A familiar objection is that it is possible for someone to share the virtuous person’s belief or “conception of the situation” but nevertheless lack the motivation. McDowell denies this:

[T]he relevant conceptions are not so much as possessed except by those whose wills are influenced appropriately. (McDowell 1978: 87)

One argument in favour of this is that there is a difference between being virtuous and being continent. Both kinds of agents do the right thing – for example, both remain faithful to their partner. But the continent agent has to struggle with competing desires that cloud their attention on the noble and the fine. She has to muster willpower to keep from temptation. The difference between her and the virtuous person, on this picture, is not in the first instance a conative one, but a difference in what is salient, which is simultaneously a cognitive and affective difference. In David McNaughton’s terms, “a way of seeing a situation may itself be a way of caring or feeling” (McNaughton 1988: 113). A consequence of this view is that the process of coming to appreciate practical reasons will involve shaping the agent’s motivational sensitivities and may itself be akin to a non-rational conversion rather than to rational deliberation from existing motives (McDowell 1995: 100–101).

Sensibility theories belong in the category Justin D’Arms and Daniel Jacobson (2000a) have labelled neo-sentimentalism. It is, officially, the view that evaluative concepts are concepts of appropriateness of sentimental responses. (As will be discussed in Section 4.3, neo-sentimentalists often make related metaphysical claims about evaluative properties.) That is, to think that something is shameful is to think that shame is appropriate or that there is sufficient reason for it. A key motivation for neo-sentimentalism is that making a judgment about desirability or shamefulness is distinct from desiring or being ashamed. The point of using and introducing normative concepts is to guide our attitudes rather than just express or report them. (See the entry on Fitting Attitude Theories of Value.)

3.5 Hybrid and Pluralist Approaches

Hybrid theories solve the problem of fitting together the representational and practical aspects of moral judgment by arguing that both cognitive and non-cognitive states are in play somehow: moral judgments have both a sentimental and a non-sentimental aspect. Several options have been explored recently, including hybrid expressivism, hybrid state theories, and moral thought pluralism, which will be discussed below.

Hybrid expressivism comes in many varieties. Perhaps the best-known is Michael Ridge’s ‘ecumenical expressivism’ (Ridge 2006). Take the judgment that I must tell the truth to the judge. As a first approximation, such judgment consists in approval of actions of a certain kind, and the belief that telling the truth to the judge is an action of that kind (cf. Barker 2000). Maybe I approve of actions that maximize utility, and believe that telling the truth to the judge maximizes utility. For Ridge (2014), the non-cognitive element is embracing a normative perspective that admits a set of standards as authoritative for practical reasoning (in this case, a utilitarian one), and the cognitive one an ordinary belief to the effect that those standards require telling the truth.

Ridge argues that this type of view accounts for the attractions of non-cognitivism, chiefly avoiding problematic ontological commitment to non-deflationary moral facts and explaining practicality. When they have a normative perspective that involves a desire-like attitude towards what they believe to be required by certain standards, practically rational agents form an instrumental desire to perform such actions. The cognitive element of the judgment, in turn, serves to explain the compositionality and inferential features of moral language in the familiar truth-conditional fashion. For other versions of expressivism that involve expressing suitably related desire-like states and beliefs, see especially Boisvert (2008), Toppinen (2013), and Schroeder (2013), and Fletcher and Ridge (eds.) (2014).

Jesse Prinz’s (2007) account of moral judgment can be classified as a hybrid state theory. The key to his view is his theory of emotions (Prinz 2004), according to which they are perceptions of patterns of bodily changes that represent what they are “set up to be set off by” – what it is their function to detect – just the same way as any other psychological states do on teleological theories of representation. For Prinz, a moral sentiment is a disposition to respond to certain actions with a range of self- and other-directed blame- or praise-constituting emotions, such as guilt, contempt, anger, and gratitude. A moral judgment consists in the emotion that results from activating a sentiment, such as anger at stealing or shame for fleeing. The anger represents stealing as being such as to cause disapprobation in the judge – that is, as morally wrong, according to Prinz’s relativist moral metaphysics (see Section 4.1). This means the judgment can be true or false (relative to a judge). It also motivates punishing the agent. Other emotions, and hence judgments, have different motivational effects – disgust may motivate to avoid the agent instead. An evident challenge to this view is thus the seeming possibility of our making non-emotional moral judgments, as well as having non-judgmental moral emotions.

Finally, moral thought pluralism, according to which different moral thoughts are constituted by different kinds of psychological state, is a very new approach, although Elizabeth Radcliffe (2006) argues that already Hume distinguished between two kinds of moral thought. Linda Zagzebski (2003) and Uriah Kriegel (2012) argue in different ways that there are two kinds of moral judgment, one of which contains an affective element. Kriegel’s suggestion is that moral judgments that result from automatic, non-conscious Type I processes consist in what Tamar Gendler (2008) labeled “aliefs”, cognitive states that affect our behavior even if they go against our conscious judgments. Moral judgments that result from conscious, effortful Type II thought are for Kriegel ordinary beliefs with an objectivist phenomenology. Since Kriegel accepts that ordinary beliefs don’t motivate on their own, on his view internalism is true only of moral aliefs. (For skepticism about aliefs, see Sinhababu 2017: 129–134.)

In a similar vein, Kauppinen (2013; 2015) distinguishes between moral intuitions or appearances, which are constituted by (typically emotional) manifestations of sentiments we expect others to share, and moral judgments, which are (implicitly) beliefs about what would be permitted, required, or recommended by standards an ideal subject would endorse. As with other appearances, the existence of moral thoughts that are not judgments is clearest in cases in which they clash with judgment, such as when it appears to Huck Finn that it is wrong to reveal where Jim is, though he believes he ought to do so. Kauppinen maintains that moral seemings have a distinctive and diverse phenomenological and motivational character (in contrast to, say, mathematical intuitions), which is best explained by their being sentimental in nature. Motivational internalism is thus true of moral appearances, as Kriegel holds for moral alief.

One important contrast with Kriegel is that for Kauppinen, moral appearances are not themselves judgments, but explain and potentially justify moral beliefs. Moral appearances are thus taken to be in this respect parallel to perceptual appearances – non-doxastic states that attract assent to their propositional contents (see Section 5.1). (Graham Oddie (2005) defends a view according to which desires constitute appearances of value, and play a similar epistemic role.) Since appearances often cause moral beliefs, the two kinds of thought often co-occur. But moral beliefs can be arrived at and held independently of moral appearances. This accounts for the force of motivational externalist objections and the possibility of amoralism (though on Kauppinen’s view, fully competent moral agents are motivationally and deliberatively sensitive to beliefs with such contents). Since the beliefs expressed by moral judgments are ordinary descriptive ones, there is no need for a separate moral semantics. Pluralist views thus split the difference between non-cognitivist and cognitivist sentimentalism: each is, broadly speaking, true of one important kind of moral thought (in contrast to hybrid views, according to which each thought has both non-cognitive and cognitive elements).

4. Metaphysical Sentimentalism

It is an appealing thought that moral (and other evaluative) facts and properties are not just brutely out there independently of human thought and sensibility. Take the evaluative property of being funny. How could something be funny, if no human being was ever amused by it? How could something be outrageous if it failed to generate any outrage when known about, even in those who care about the victim? For sentimentalists, value, including moral value, is anthropocentric (D’Arms and Jacobson 2006).

Sentimentalists agree with error theorists that sui generis, non-natural moral facts would be queer, and that mind-independent natural facts are unfit for the role of moral facts. Non-cognitivist judgment sentimentalists treat moral facts as projections of moral attitudes. Although there is excellent reason to think Hume wasn’t a projectivist, he gave one of the classic formulations in saying that taste

has a productive faculty, and gilding and staining all natural objects, borrowed from internal sentiment, raises in a manner a new creation. (1751: 88)

We take a sentimental response in ourselves, say envy, and attribute to the worldly object a feature it doesn’t really have, such as being enviable.

Error theorists treat this projection as much the same as the attribution of agency to planets in some cultures: a predictable false belief. Contemporary expressivists, in contrast, believe that attribution of moral facts and properties serves a purpose. It enables us to express our commitments in a way that provides a focal point for disagreement and debate. As discussed above, on deflationary views of truth and facts, it is a first-order question whether some attribution is in error or not (Blackburn 1998).

Most interestingly for moral metaphysics, many cognitivist judgment sentimentalists think that moral judgments refer to moral and evaluative facts that are metaphysically determined by some sort of sentimental responses. According to such views, moral properties are response-dependent in one way or another. For more, see the Response-Dependence Supplement.

4.1 Subjectivism and Relativism

The simplest way to link moral properties with our emotional or conative responses would be to say that what makes something wrong is that it is disapproved of, or bad that it is not desired. No one holds a view this elementary, since it entails that an undetected murder isn’t morally wrong, for example. It also leaves undetermined whose disapproval is at issue – what if one person disapproves of an action but someone else approves? What I’ll call Simple Dispositionalist Subjectivism improves on it by indexing moral properties to subjects and referring to dispositions to cause responses rather than actual responses. What makes something wrong-for-Mary, for example, is that Mary would disapprove of it, were she aware of it. A related relativist proposal is that something is wrong-for-Mary if and only if Mary accepts a normative standard or framework that prohibits it (Harman 1975).

Thus, according to Jesse Prinz,

An action has the property of being morally wrong (right) just in case there is an observer who has a sentiment of disapprobation (approbation) toward it. (Prinz 2007: 92)

(Recall that for Prinz a sentiment is a disposition to feel various emotions, so wrongness doesn’t hang on someone actually having a negative reaction to something.) But this claim is highly implausible, given that wrongness is unindexed. It is true of almost anything that someone will disapprove of it, and someone else will approve of it. Thus, female genital cutting, for example, is simultaneously both (absolutely) right and wrong. This is a steep theoretical cost.

Simple Dispositionalist Subjectivism seems to entail that if we were to begin to approve of slavery, slavery would come to be morally right – it would be true that we would respond to it positively when encountering it, say. But surely the correct description of such a scenario would not be that slavery has become right, but that we have become worse people (Broad 1944/5: 151). I call this the Missing Rigidity Problem. The Missing Fallibility Problem, in turn, is that a simple subjectivist view seems to leave insufficient room for mistakes about value. If what’s right is determined by what I approve, I can only be mistaken about what’s right if I’m mistaken about what I in fact approve. But it is very implausible that the remedy for moral mistakes is better introspection.

4.2 Ideal Dispositionalism

Paralleling the case of moral judgment, problems with Simple Subjectivism motivate a move to Ideal Dispositionalism. According to this type of view, the extension of moral or evaluative properties is determined by the sentimental responses of idealized subjects of some sort, or responses under idealized conditions. Consequently, the Missing Fallibility Problem is handily skirted: we can no doubt be mistaken about what an ideal observer would approve.

Ideal Dispositionalist views also avoid the Missing Rigidity Problem. Depending on the details, it may suffice to idealize the subject of the sentiments: maybe no impartial spectator would approve of slavery, even if the majority of people were to have a pro-slavery sensibility. In case the idealization process is path-dependent (so that the outcome depends on the unidealized initial sentiments of the subject), Ideal Dispositionalists may make a rigidification move (Wiggins 1987: 206). They can say that the starting point for idealization is constituted by actually normal sentiments, which include a strong desire not to be at the mercy of the good will of others, among others. Thus, rigidified ideal observers would disapprove of slavery, even if it became statistically normal to approve of it. Peter Railton (2003) objects to rigidification, because for him what is intrinsically good or bad for someone is relational, dependent on the match between their responses and their objects, much as sweetness and bitterness are. Changes in people’s sensibilities would change what’s good (or sweet) for them. Still, something like cruelty wouldn’t become right even if it were generally approved of, since for Railton, its wrongness hangs on badness of its consequences rather than our disapproval of it, and pain that people are averse to would still be bad for them.

Ideal Dispositionalism comes in several varieties, which often correspond to views about the content of moral judgment (Firth 1952; Lewis 1989; Smith 1994). Even if they avoid problems with fallibility and rigidity, there are a number of further challenges. Four will be discussed here.

First, the Euthyphro Dilemma derives its name from the Platonic dialogue in which Socrates argues against a version of Divine Command theory. Applied to ideal dispositionalism, it can be presented as follows:

  1. A subjectivist theory defines the subject whose responses determine the extension of evaluative properties either in evaluative terms, whose application presupposes mind-independent evaluative truths, or in non-evaluative terms.
  2. If the subject is defined in evaluative terms, the theory collapses into mind-independent realism: it presupposes the existence of at least some mind-independent evaluative truths.
  3. If the subject is defined in non-evaluative terms, her responses will be morally arbitrary and lacking in authority to determine the extension of evaluative properties.
  4. So, a subjectivist theory is either self-defeating (because of collapse into realism) or false (because of yielding arbitrary extensions for moral properties).

It is clear that subjectivist accounts with any kind of reductive ambition cannot embrace the first horn of the dilemma (see below for non-reductivist accounts). So it is the second horn that they must face. What exactly is the problem with it? According to Russ Shafer-Landau, it is that

it may be impossible to craft a set of [non-evaluative] constraints on attitude formation such that the emerging attitudes yield prescriptions that match up with our views about what constitutes paradigmatically moral and immoral behaviour (Shafer-Landau 2003: 41)

The challenge is that ideal observers, when defined in non-evaluative terms, might approve of bad things, like ethnic cleansing, which would counterintuitively entail that ethnic cleansing would be morally right. However, Shafer-Landau admits that there is no knock-down argument to the effect that any idealization in non-evaluative terms will yield counterintuitive results.

Perhaps the real challenge that the Euthyphro poses concerns the normative authority of the responses of any kind of subject defined in non-evaluative terms. One way to develop this challenge may be called the Missing Normativity Problem. Many believe that moral rightness or wrongness are categorically reason-giving features of actions. Everyone, regardless of their interests and desires, has a reason to refrain from morally wrong behaviour. Suppose, then, that to be wrong is to be such as to be disapproved of by any ideal observer. On a reductivist view, this is a natural property of the action, specified in non-normative terms. The challenge is: why would such a natural property be categorically reason-giving? Why should people care about doing only things that would not be disapproved of by a hypothetical spectator?

As Mark Johnston puts it,

To say that something would be valued under condition K is not thereby to commend it, but only to make a descriptive remark about its relation to certain psychological conditions. (Johnston 1989: 157; cf. Blackburn 1993: 274)

These challenges may be ways of spelling out the force of G. E. Moore’s (1903) famous Open Question Argument: since it makes sense to grant that some X would be disapproved of by any impartial, informed, but otherwise normal observer, but nevertheless deny that X is morally wrong, there is reason to think that being disapproved of by an ideal observer is not the same thing as being morally wrong. To be sure, the Open Question Argument is contentious, and there are a number of standard responses: perhaps the identity of the properties is a posteriori, like that of water and H2O (Brink 1989), or perhaps it is an unobvious conceptual truth that we can read off the platitudes surrounding our concepts (Smith 1994). (See the entry on moral naturalism.)

The third issue is the Indeterminacy Problem. Given a characterisation of an ideal observer, is there really such a thing as an action that would be approved of by any ideal observer, given divergence in pre-idealization attitudes? (Brandt 1955: 408) If ideal observers disagree, there is, according to the theory, no fact of the matter. This problem derives from an essential feature of idealized dispositional theories: the idealization begins from what people are actually like, and the process may not guarantee convergence in the relevant respects.

Finally, the Unmotivated Idealization Problem is that it is not obvious that the move from actual responses or dispositions to ideal dispositions has a rationale that is consistent with the core ideas of response-dependence theory. David Enoch (2005) has recently made a forceful case for this problem. He notes that if there are response-independent facts, it makes good sense to privilege responses of certain kind of subjects in certain conditions, because such features of subjects and conditions are conducive to tracking the response-independent facts. But that option is obviously closed for the ideal dispositionalist.

Enoch claims that there is no real alternative rationale that is not ad hoc or that doesn’t tacitly rely on response-independent realism. For example, appealing to our actual justificatory practice, in which we may privilege responses under full imaginative acquaintance, for example, is not an option, since that practice is itself best explained by the underlying assumption that there are mind-independent moral facts (Enoch 2005: 774). However, Hume might object that the rationale for stepping back from our actual sentimental responses is avoiding “continual contradictions in society and conversation” and other practical problems (see Section 2.2). If this is right, our actual justificatory practice and the privileged place it gives to reflectively corrected responses thus has an explanation and rationale that do not presuppose mind-independent evaluative facts. In this vein, Kauppinen (2014b, 580) holds that “An evaluative perspective is ideal or optimal when adopting it most reliably avoids the practical problems caused by the uncorrected attitudes”. (See also Sobel 2009.)

4.3 Sensibility Theory and Neo-Sentimentalism

For sensibility theories, an evaluative property is not a disposition to cause responses in us, but the property of meriting a response from us. A sensibility theory version of the response-dependence equation looks like this:

X is M if and only if X merits R / any virtuous subject S would respond to X with R in ideal circumstances

It is an obvious and familiar complaint against views of this type that the analysis is uninformative. After all, normative terms occur on both sides of the equation: the right-hand side refers to meriting and virtuous subjects. There is no attempt to reduce evaluative properties to non-evaluative ones. Neither responses nor properties have metaphysical priority, but are instead “siblings” (McDowell 1987). One argument in favour of this is the claim that the relevant response cannot be identified independently of the (concept of the) property (Wiggins 1987: 195). Sensibility theorists nevertheless claim that the non-reductive elucidation offers an advantage over primary quality views, according to which moral properties have no essential relation to us (see Cuneo 2001 for a response).

Sensibility theories are a species of what is often called a Fitting Attitudes (FA) Analysis of value (Rabinowicz and Rønnow-Rasmussen 2004). The general form of an FA analysis is the following:

X is E if and only if, and because, R is an appropriate or fitting response to X / there is sufficient reason to respond to X with R.

The ‘because’ indicates that the direction of metaphysical explanation is from fittingness of attitudes to the property, and not the other way: something is good because it is fitting to desire it, and not fitting to desire because it is good. This rules out views on which value and fitting attitudes go together, but claim that it is value that makes the attitude fitting and not vice versa. Some identify FA analyses with neo-sentimentalism, but this is a theoretically unhelpful classification, since many forms of FA analysis regard the appropriateness or fittingness of attitudes itself as either a mind-independent normative fact that can be intellectually intuited (such as Ewing 1948) or as a truth determined by what would be rationally or reasonably accepted (such as Scanlon 1998). These FA views thus significantly depart from the key motivations for sentimentalism, and are better classified as FA variants of non-naturalism and constructivism.

The specific features of sentimentalist FA analyses come out most notably in the responses that sentimentalists can give to the metaphysical echo of the Conflation Problem, namely the Wrong Kind of Reasons problem. This is the problem that what makes a response appropriate or gives sufficient reason for it may be something that has nothing to do with the relevant value. If an evil demon threatens to smite you unless you admire it for its threat, you may have sufficient reason to admire the demon (Rabinowicz and Rønnow-Rasmussen 2004). But that doesn’t mean the demon is admirable – quite the contrary. In the jargon, admiration is not a fitting response to the demon, since it is appropriate for the wrong kind of reason.

There are various proposals to distinguish between right and wrong kinds of reasons for attitudes, not all of which are sentimentalist (e.g., Parfit 2011). Justin D’Arms and Daniel Jacobson (2000b) present a distinctively sentimentalist alternative. Their piecemeal solution appeals to alethic standards of correctness derived from the content of the attitude in question. Assuming that an emotion has a cognitive component that presents or construes things as being in a certain way (see Section 5.1), it can be either accurate or inaccurate, depending on whether things are that way. The right kind of reasons for or against the attitude are those that bear on its accuracy. As they put it,

An emotional episode presents its object as having certain evaluative features; it is unfitting … when its object lacks those features. (2000b: 73)

The example D’Arms and Jacobson use is envy. According to them, it (broadly speaking) presents a rival in a negative light in virtue of having a desirable possession. The right kind of reasons bearing on whether a rival is enviable are thus those that have to do with what she possesses and its desirability relative to what you have. If a colleague gets a promotion you wanted, envy may be fitting in this sense, and consequently, given a fitting attitudes account of evaluative properties, the colleague will be enviable. This is the case even if envy is morally or prudentially inappropriate – the latter kind of reasons do not bear on the fittingness of envy.

An alternative development of the same sort of idea can be found in Christine Tappolet’s (2016) recent work. Tappolet holds that instead of formulating fittingness in terms of reasons or normative requirements of any kind, neo-sentimentalists can simply hold that, say, Pierre is admirable, if and only if admiration is correct in response to Pierre when contemplating him (2016: 87). Here correctness is a non-normative notion akin to truth: emotions present things as being in a certain way, and they are correct when things are indeed that way (see Section 5 for more discussion). Tappolet contrasts this kind of representational neo-sentimentalism with standard normative neo-sentimentalism. The former, as such, has no reductive ambitions – it relates value properties to correct responses, but doesn’t claim that Pierre is admirable because it is correct to admire him. If anything, it is the other way around, which is why Tappolet thinks that representational neo-sentimentalism is naturally paired with realism about value (see also Oddie 2016). While normative neo-sentimentalists take reasons for valuing to be provided by the non-evaluative properties of the target (which leaves open the possibility of reducing value to fitting attitudes), for Tappolet the reasons for evaluative attitudes are provided by values themselves. The outstanding question for the standard neo-sentimentalist strategy is accounting for fittingness or reasons without assuming response-independent values. Representational neo-sentimentalism, on the other hand, leaves emotions in a primarily epistemic role – as Tappolet has it, part of what it is to possess evaluative concepts is to realize that they are canonically applied and justified on the basis of emotional responses (2016: 99) (see again the discussion in the next section).

Interestingly, Adam Smith can be seen to offer a kind of naturalistic and sentimentalist account of fittingness in criticizing the intuitionist FA analyses of his time:

[T]here are some modern systems, according to which virtue consists in propriety; or in the suitableness of the affection from which we act, to the cause or object which excites it … None of those systems either give, or even pretend to give, any precise or distinct measure by which this fitness or propriety of affection can be ascertained or judged of. That precise and distinct measure can be found nowhere but in the sympathetic feelings of the impartial and well-informed spectator. (TMS 346)

A natural take on this is that Smith accepts the FA analysis that an action is wrong if and only if it is fitting to resent the agent for it, for example. But he then gives a distinctively sentimentalist cast to what it is for something to be fitting. This normative fact consists in the response being endorsed by an impartial and well-informed spectator (Kauppinen 2014b).

5. Epistemic Sentimentalism

Epistemic sentimentalists hold that (some) emotions are sources of moral knowledge or at least justification. Many of them believe the stronger claim that emotional experiences are necessary for coming to know basic moral truths, either because they are sources of foundational justification or because justified moral beliefs must cohere with certain emotional experiences. They thus reject both intuitionist views, on which adequate understanding of self-evident moral propositions suffices for justified belief (Audi 2013), and rationalist accounts according to which pure practical reason can yield moral knowledge. In the background are metaphysical and explanatory arguments to the effect that moral truths aren’t the sort of relations or facts that reasoning can discover (see the Anti-Rationalism Supplement). Note that this is not to deny that we can reason from basic moral truths to derivative ones, or that non-moral reasoning can’t play a role in moral knowledge. Nor need sentimentalists claim that knowledge of formal moral truths, like the transitivity of betterness, is grounded in emotions.

While epistemic sentimentalism has recently gained popularity, it’s good to bear in mind that its main claim is somewhat counterintuitive. It is a common thought that emotions can lead us astray in moral and prudential matters. We often come to realize retrospectively that we misconceived of a situation as a result of viewing it through the lens of jealousy, fear, or anger. It’s not just that emotions can lead us to act against our better judgment, but they can result in false and unjustified evaluative beliefs.

Philosophers, too, have often seen emotions as epistemically problematic. A very old thought that makes an appearance at least from Plato onwards is that they are disruptive in preventing and perverting rational consideration. To have this kind of effect, emotions need not have any cognitive content – they could just be mental or bodily disturbances.

More interesting criticisms of emotion do grant that they have cognitive content, but maintain that they are nevertheless apt to mislead us. Within the Western tradition, it is the Stoics who are perhaps the most famous for condemning ordinary emotions for this reason. In the background was their value theory, according to which only virtue is good (and only vice bad), while worldly things like illness or social success are indifferent (Long and Sedley 1987). Since for them, our ordinary emotions from sadness to anger and love are or involve judgments about the badness or goodness of worldly things that are really indifferent, they are false evaluative judgments, or impressions to assent to false judgments. A structurally similar picture is offered by Buddhists, who see especially negative emotions as arising from desires for and attachments to things that are not of genuine worth (Flanagan 2016).

Given these concerns with disruption and misleading, it is fair to say that epistemic sentimentalists have a presumption to overcome. The next sections examine some attempts to do so. The third subsection discusses the potential role of sentiments in epistemic contexts other than basic justification, in particular in cases of moral understanding and the possibility of acquiring moral knowledge by testimony.

5.1 The Perceptual Model

Talk of a moral sense suggests an epistemic picture according to which moral knowledge is similar to knowledge acquired by other senses. We simply attend to something real or imagined, and immediately, without any kind of reasoning, just know whether it’s right or wrong, just as we come to know the colour or shape of a car just by looking at it. And it is no doubt often the case that belief in the presence of the wrong-making natural properties (such as intentionally causing excruciating pain to a whimpering dog) triggers an emotional reaction in us. It is plausible, and supported by empirical data (see Section 2.1), that the emotional response often precedes and perhaps causes the moral judgment. But is it a perception or something analogous?

In the case of ordinary perceptual experience, an object instantiates an observable property, such as being red, and this causes us (in the right way) to have a corresponding phenomenal representation of the object, such as a visual experience of a red object in front of us (Audi 2013). Many believe that this experience is not itself a belief: I can believe that a stick in the water is straight while it nevertheless perceptually appears to me that it is not straight. However, ordinarily having a perceptual experience provides justification for a corresponding belief, either because it presents or represents things as being in a particular way (as epistemological internalists think) or because it reliably informs us of them being that way (as epistemological externalists think), or a combination of these. Epistemologists debate whether justification requires only the absence of defeaters or also some type of warrant to rule out skeptical scenarios, and what needs to be added for a true belief to amount to knowledge.

So is there such a thing as emotional moral perception? The answer depends, in part, on the nature of emotions. On Hume’s view, a passion is “an original existence” which “contains not any representative quality, which renders it a copy of any other existence” (T 415). If this is the case, then emotional experience cannot justify belief the same way contentful perceptual experience does. However, most contemporary epistemic sentimentalists reject Hume’s theory of emotions. Instead, they subscribe to some variety of a representational theory of emotions, motivated by the thought that emotions can be assessed as appropriate or fitting or even rational (de Sousa 1987). This suggests that emotions are about something – that they have intentional content.

One representational theory holds that emotions involve or consist in a judgment that the target of the emotion (such as flying on an airplane) has the property that is the formal object of the emotion (such as being fearsome or dangerous in the case of fear) (Kenny 1963; Lyons 1980). Sabine Roeser (2011) defends this type of account in the moral case. According to her, moral emotions are “at the same time both value judgments and affective states” (Roeser 2011: 149). On her view, they constitute intuitions just in the same sense as traditional intuitionists claim: they are direct apprehensions of non-natural states of affairs. (This is a clear case in which epistemic and metaphysical variants of sentimentalism come apart.) Any view of this type faces the challenge of explaining why our emotions would reliably track such non-natural facts. The other worry is that value judgments in general are not self-justifying, so it is not clear why judgments embedded in emotion would justify further belief.

In any case, it is a well-known problem with judgmental theories of emotion that emotions can be recalcitrant, that is, come apart from our judgments. We can be worried in spite of judging that everything is alright. Moreover, many think that children or animals can have emotions without possessing evaluative concepts, and thus without being capable of making evaluative judgments. Such considerations lead many to regard emotions as being or containing or being analogous to perceptual experiences (de Sousa 1987; Tappolet 2000, 2011; Helm 2001; Prinz 2004, 2007; Zagzebski 2003; Goldie 2007; Döring 2007; Wisnewski 2015). On this type of view, emotions and perceptual experiences have many common features: they are spontaneous (not under direct volitional control), informationally encapsulated (that is, relatively independent from the subject’s beliefs and desires), have a characteristic phenomenology, and have conceptual (and/or non-conceptual) content, thus representing or construing the world as being in a certain way without involving judgment or belief.

On perceptualist views, emotions are the closest thing we have to acquaintance with value – for example, as Adam Pelser puts it, “to experience something as funny just is to be amused by it” (2014: 112). Just as colour-blind people may know on the basis of testimony that an object is red without being acquainted with its redness, a person who is incapable of awe may learn from others that something is sublime while lacking an acquaintance with or direct access to its sublimity (ibid.). Analogous claims have also been defended about the nature of desire, which is held by many to be a non-doxastic appearance of the good (Stampe 1987; Oddie 2005; Tenenbaum 2007; Sinhababu 2017). Perceptualists tend to hold that the distinctive feature of emotional perception is that the content is evaluative, which in turn is often thought to explain the special phenomenology. However, Julien Deonna and Fabrice Teroni (2015) have recently argued that the evaluative character of emotions should be understood in terms of bodily attitudes rather than evaluative content (for criticism, see Mitchell forthcoming). (For more on debates about the nature of emotion, see the entry on emotion.)

Given the perceptualist metaphysical claim about emotions, many have argued for the following kind of epistemic thesis:

Epistemic Emotional Perceptualism (EEP): Emotions are sources of immediate (non-inferential) prima facie (or defeasible) justification for evaluative propositions. (cf. Carter 2019)

If Epistemic Emotional Perceptualism is true, emotions can play a foundational role in moral epistemology - they (or their contents) can potentially justify belief in moral propositions independently of the contents of one’s other beliefs, just as my perceptual experience as of a black dog in front of me can potentially justify belief in the corresponding proposition, regardless of what I believed before (see e.g. Döring 2007, Pelser 2014). To be sure, it is possible to hold a compromise position, according to which the justification provided by emotions is sufficient to justify belief only if it also coheres with one’s other beliefs, as van Roojen (2014) notes.

However, as Robert Cowan (2016) emphasizes, EEP isn’t entailed by perceptualism about emotion, since the metaphysical differences between emotions and paradigm perceptual experiences might make for an epistemic difference, as indeed many have argued. So it is worth asking just why emotions would be sources of justification, even if they are analogous to, or a distinct species of, perceptual experience. Christine Tappolet argues that since prima facie justification is such a minimal epistemic status, it is easy to attain: “If you are afraid of a dog, it is surely something that makes your belief that the dog is fearsome prima facie justified.” (Tappolet 2016: 40) However, if we are to be justified in believing on the basis of emotional experience, whatever justification they offer must be strong enough to suffice for belief. Some principled explanation for this is needed. The simplest way would be to hold that any appearance of things being in a certain way can yield sufficient, if defeasible justification, as Michael Huemer’s (2001) epistemic liberalism has it. Insofar as fear, for example, presents its target as being fearsome (or dangerous), it would justify the corresponding evaluative belief in the absence of defeaters (see Tucker (ed.) 2013).

While there is thus a plausible (if controversial) epistemic framework that would account for EEP, there are a number of serious challenges to it. After all, even proponents of the perceptualist account of emotion grant that there are a number of notable differences between emotions and sensory perceptual experiences (Tappolet 2016). Some of these differences may be epistemically relevant. To begin with, there seems to be an obvious difference in our everyday epistemic practice: we don’t typically ask for reasons for perceptual experiences, but we do ask for reasons for emotions (Brady 2013). For example, if you say you see a dog outside, I’m unlikely to ask “Why?”, while if you say you’re afraid of the dog, it makes perfect sense to ask the question. Conversely, if I ask you why you think the bridge is dangerous, you’re unlikely to say “Because I’m afraid of it”, while you might well appealing to having seen the dog outside to justify your belief that it is there. As Michael Brady puts it, unlike sensory perceptions, emotions raise rather than silence justificatory demands (2013: 110). What’s more, he maintains, if an emotion like fear justified belief about dangerousness, it would be objectionably self-justifying, since danger merits fear, and “The very fact that I am afraid of the dog cannot, by itself, be evidence that it is fitting or appropriate to be afraid of the dog” (Brady 2010, 123).

How might epistemic perceptualists respond? One possibility is to emphasize a salient difference between emotions and sense perceptions: emotions have cognitive bases in the subject’s perceptions or beliefs (Deonna and Teroni 2012: 24–25). For example, I’m not afraid of the dog in front of me unless I think there’s a dog in front of me, and believe that it may well hurt me. My fear is grounded in part in those beliefs or perceptions. One consequence is that the emotion itself is justified only if the cognitive bases are justified (even if not necessarily true) (Greenspan 1988). If so, emotional justification is dependent (Pelser 2014, Cowan 2018). Initially, this might look like bad news for EEP, since it appears to conflict with the thesis that emotions provide immediate justification for evaluative propositions. But note that while emotional justification may presuppose justification for belief in non-evaluative propositions (such as those concerning a dog’s proneness to attack), there is a gap between these inputs and the evaluative proposition that is the content of the emotional experience itself according to perceptualism (see Etcheverri 2019). I might be angry with you because I believe you told somebody about my peculiar hobby, but the anger itself doesn’t present you as having talked about my hobby, but rather your having wronged me. Even if it is as a matter of fact the case that my being wronged in this situation consists in your having revealed an embarrassing fact about me, it doesn’t follow that what justifies belief in the factual proposition suffices to justify the belief in the moral proposition. For all that’s been said about epistemic dependence on cognitive bases, my anger might provide additional, immediate justification for belief in the wrongness of your act. As Robert Cowan puts it, “when the cognitive base of an emotion is justified then emotions can justify beliefs with evaluative content, independently of having further justification for believing supporting evaluative propositions” (2018: 229).

The upside of epistemic dependence, then, is that it allows epistemic perceptualists to give a natural answer to the why-question challenges. If you ask me why I think the wolf is dangerous or why I think my friend’s act was wrong, I’ll cite the salient non-evaluative feature that makes the situation dangerous or the act wrong and thus justifies my emotion (as I see things), rather than the fact that I respond to it with an emotion. Through the lens of my emotion, so to speak, I regard this non-evaluative feature as grounding an evaluative truth concerning the target – it will seem so obvious to me that it’s not worth mentioning that, say, a dog’s being poised to attack merits fear.

How about the self-justification challenge? Jonathan Mitchell (2017) points out that in non-pathological cases, fear, for example, does present its target as calling for fear – otherwise the emotion isn’t intelligible to the subject herself. Plausibly, Brady is right that the evidence for dangerousness (meriting fear) isn’t the fact that I’m afraid, but the dog’s posing a threat to my interests. Nevertheless, my fear might make this fact’s reason-giving status available to me in the good case. The fear still wouldn’t be self-justifying, since the dog might not in fact pose a threat.

The problems for perceptualism don’t end with dependence on cognitive basis, however. There is reason to believe that emotions also depend on our desires or concerns (Roberts 2003). I’m only sad when you break an old vase if I wanted to keep it, or afraid of the growling wolf if I don’t want to be eaten. When it comes to belief or indeed perceptual experience, it’s a strike against justificatory standing if the state is influenced by a desire – as Markie (2005) observes in criticizing epistemic liberalism, if a rock seems like a gold nugget to you just because you really want it to be a gold nugget, this seeming doesn’t justify belief in its being a gold nugget. So why isn’t this sort of cognitive penetrability a problem for EEP? A natural way to get around the problem is to say that the desires or concerns underlying the emotional appearance must themselves be correct or justified. The problem with this suggestion is that one then needs a story of how desires are correct or justified that doesn’t itself appeal to emotional experience, which doesn’t seem compatible with emotions playing a foundational epistemic role (see Helm 2001 for a coherentist take).

Finally, while EEP tends to have an epistemological internalist flavor, perceptual experience in general is of course linked to the external world. In the case of sensory perception, causal links to the objects of perception play a role in explaining the reliability, and arguably the justificatory status, of perceptual experiences. Emotions don’t seem to be caused by the evaluative properties they represent, however – though if we consider how we go from proximal sensory stimulus to perception of objects, the difference between ordinary perceptual experiences and emotions may not be so large (Milona and Naar 2020). Causal relations may also explain why perceptual experiences have the contents they do.

An alternative line is to say that what causes the emotion isn’t an evaluative feature of the object – rather, what we literally perceive is the property that grounds the wrongness of the action, such as the shooting of a peaceful demonstrator by a police officer, and then respond to it with an emotional reaction, which construes the action as wrong. Imagination would work as well. If so, perhaps it is better to think of emotions as quasi-perceptual appearances that constitute moral intuitions rather than perceptions (Kauppinen 2013). This goes naturally with a view on which emotions (re)present their targets as having certain evaluative properties in virtue of their phenomenal character rather than etiology. The way an emotion feels is not irrelevant to how it construes its object (cf. Goldie 2000 on ‘feelings towards’ an object). The feelings involved in anger, for example, aren’t directionless sensations, but have a qualitative character in virtue of which anger presents its object as offensive (Kriegel 2014).

What about reliability? Again, many believe that ordinary perceptual experience justifies belief in part because it is generally reliable, even if its phenomenal features are also relevant to justification. In any case, moral knowledge requires more than justification and truth – as it is common to say these days, a belief must be safe (such that it could not easily have been the case that the person would have formed a false belief using the same method) to amount to knowledge (Sosa 1999, Williamson 2000). As noted earlier, some epistemic sentimentalists, such as Tappolet (2011), are not metaphysical sentimentalists, but rather realists about value. Those who hold a view of this type may argue, as Adam Carter (2019) does, that for emotional experiences to justify belief they must issue from a competence or skill, roughly a disposition to get it right when properly situated. Other epistemic perceptualists, such as Prinz (2007) subscribe to sentimentalist metaphysics. It is open to them to offer a constitutive explanation of the reliability of emotions: since the evaluative facts are constitutively linked to emotional responses, there is good reason to think emotional responses track them, at least in suitable conditions.

To be sure, even if moral perception (or sentimental intuition) is epistemically as good as sense perception, we know that in some circumstances our senses are not reliable. But how do we know which circumstances? This calibration challenge was already noted by Hutcheson:

But may there not be a right or wrong state of our moral sense, as there is in our other senses, according as they represent their objects to be as they really are, or represent them otherwise? So may not our moral sense approve that which is vicious, and disapprove virtue, as a sickly palate may dislike grateful food, or a vitiated sight misrepresent colours or dimensions? Must we not know therefore antecedently what is morally good or evil by our reason, before we can know that our moral sense is right? (Hutcheson 1728: 177)

Hutcheson’s response was to point out that even if moral sense can mislead, it doesn’t follow that reason is needed to provide a standard for it, or that it’s capable of doing so. After all, it’s not by reasoning that we fundamentally correct mistakes of colour perception. Rather, we try to ascertain which circumstances are conducive to properly functioning perception (perhaps by way of an a priori inquiry) and then try to place ourselves in such circumstances and look again. What the suitable circumstances in the moral case are like depends on the nature of moral facts. For relativists like Prinz (2007), the only thing that matters is that our reactions genuinely reflect our sentiments towards the action. For ideal dispositionalists, David Lewis offers a basic recipe:

To find out whether we would be disposed, under ideal conditions, to value it, put yourself in ideal conditions, if you can, making sure you can tell when you have succeeded in doing so. Then find out whether you value the thing in question, i.e., whether you desire to desire it. If you do, that confirms that it is a value. (Lewis 1989: 117)

For Lewis himself, the ideal conditions for valuing are those of full imaginative acquaintance with the object. For Hume and Smith, the ideal conditions of moral judging involve occupying the ‘common point of view’ or the perspective of an impartial and well-informed spectator. As discussed in Section 2.2, they both believe that achieving this requires sympathizing (or empathizing) with the feelings or reactive attitudes of those immediately affected while controlling for predictable distortions. Unless they are felt from the common point of view, our emotional responses will not reliably track the response-dependent moral facts.

5.2 Tracking Theories

Not all epistemic sentimentalists subscribe to the perceptualist model. One alternative is provided by John Allman and Jim Woodward (2008), who argue that moral intuitions (in the sense of immediate judgments resulting from what psychologists call System 1) involving emotional processing can reliably track moral facts after a suitable kind of implicit learning. They draw on empirical work on the development of expertise. In implicit learning, the learner, such as a novice nurse, is repeatedly exposed to certain cues, (such as babies manifesting different symptoms), makes certain decisions to act (giving certain kind of treatment to the baby), and then receives clear, independent feedback on whether the decisions were correct (the symptoms either go away or get worse) (Kahneman and Klein 2009). As a result, the learner may become an expert, who is able to respond immediately and appropriately to situations without necessarily being able to articulate why. Allman and Woodward’s suggestion is that a similar kind of training of our emotional responses is possible in the moral case.

More recently, Peter Railton has also highlighted conceptions of the affective system as “a flexible, experience-based information-processing system quite capable of tracking statistical dependencies and of guiding behavioral selection via the balancing of costs, benefits, and risks” (2014, 833) Just as laboratory rats have been found to develop action-guiding forward models that implicitly represent expected values of their options, our feelings can be attuned to possible rewards and punishments, and can be expected to color our evaluative perception.

The core challenge for this type of view is that there is a difference between training emotions to be responsive to potentially morally relevant information, such as

mental states of others and their likely behavior in interactive situations, as well as the likely consequences of such behaviour (Allman and Woodward 2008: 173),

and training them to be responsive to moral facts themselves. It is not clear whether there is any analogue to the unambiguous and independent negative feedback that a nurse receives after giving the wrong treatment in the case of making a mistaken moral judgment. Railton suggests that empathy might play such a role, noting that having a capacity to empathize and activating it in situ “appear […] to be important predictors of moral sensitivity and behavior” (2014: 844), for example by inhibiting violence. But while empathy can certainly give feedback about the (anticipated) responses of others, it is one thing to learn that others as a matter of fact, say, suffer because of or disapprove of what I did, and quite another to learn that such disapproval is merited. To attune affective responses to moral facts, it seems that it is the latter kind of feedback we would need.

5.3 Moral Understanding and Testimony

Whether or not emotions are a source of evaluative justification or knowledge, they might play a role in a different epistemic good, namely moral understanding, and, perhaps relatedly, help explain why our moral epistemic practices are different from many others. To begin with the latter, consider the following cases of testimony (based on Callahan 2018):

Nina wants to know whether the law permits deducting expenses incurred for charitable work when filing taxes. She asks a specialist, who tells her it’s okay. Nina thus comes to believe the law permits deducting the expenses.

Aleksi wants to know whether it is, as a rule, morally wrong to mislead others by omitting unfavorable details. He asks a wise friend, who says it is. Aleksi thus comes to believe that it is as a rule morally wrong to lie by omission.

Let’s stipulate that both Nina and Aleksi come to know what they wanted by testimony. (Set aside any general worries about testimonial knowledge, and assume that in both cases they have sufficient reason to trust the word of the person they’re asking.) It seems to many that while what Nina does is entirely unproblematic, there is something off, if not outright wrong, with Aleksi’s moral deference. More generally, one commonly accepted qualification is that moral deference is problematic when one forms a moral belief solely on the basis of testimony, instead of, for example, reflecting on the matter as a result of another’s expressing an opinion. Another common qualification is that problematic testimony concerns pure moral content whose truth doesn’t hang on empirical assumptions. It is not problematic to change one’s opinion about an impure moral matter on the basis of testimony that concerns a morally relevant empirical fact, as when someone comes to believe it is wrong to eat fish on the basis of being informed that fish feel pain (Fletcher 2016). In brief, it seems that you shouldn’t change your mind on a purely moral matter just because someone tells you (even if you have no particular reason to doubt them).

But what, if anything, is wrong with moral deference? Guy Fletcher argues that the link between sentiments and morality explains the unease. First, he holds that “Moral sentiments are at least difficult to form on the basis of pure, direct, testimony” (Fletcher 2016: 60). This parallels other cases: I can’t feel admiration for a painting just because you tell me it’s worth admiring, for example. Second, as discussed in Section 2, there are many metaethical views on which moral judgments either (partially or wholly) consist in sentiments or link up with sentiments. If so, testimony-based judgments are either impossible or defective. However, Laura Frances Callahan (2018) points out that if one did form moral sentiments purely on the basis of testimony, our sense that something fishy is going on wouldn’t go away. In fact, it would be even more alarming if someone came to be passionate about some moral matter just because somebody else said it was wrong!

A very different popular explanation of the problematic nature of moral deference appeals to the notion of moral understanding: while we can acquire moral knowledge by testimony, we will not (easily or at all) acquire moral understanding that way, and moral understanding is important for moral worth, or deserving credit for one’s action (Hills 2009). For Alison Hills (2016), moral understanding is a form of “cognitive control”, roughly the ability to grasp and articulate why certain features make an action (say) wrong, and consequently what would need to be different for it to be right. Callahan (2018) argues that having the kind of cognitive abilities that Hills highlights doesn’t suffice for moral worth, since possessing them is consistent with being motivated by features that are not reasons for acting. On her alternative sentimentalist account, moral understanding itself requires also having fitting affective and motivational responses towards the understood propositions and the relevant explanatory relationships (Callahan 2018: 451–452). For example, understanding that a practice is wrong because it’s racist involves a disposition to be angry or sad about it because it’s racist (or about the features that make it racist), and a willingness to abstain from or intervene in the practice. The problem with deference, then, is that it disincentivizes the sort of reflection and inquiry that would give rise to such responses in addition to the relevant cognitive abilities (Callahan 2018: 454–456; for a very different sentimentalist take, see Howard 2018).

Finally, even those who don’t believe that sentiments are constitutive of moral understanding may believe that they help bring it about. Thus, Brady (2013) argues that the positive epistemic role of emotions in morality consists largely in their role in motivating us to find out why some things are right or wrong.

6. The Many Moral Sentimentalisms (Reprise)

It was noted at the beginning that there are many things one can be a sentimentalist about. We are now in a position to make some observations about relationships among them. First, explanatory sentimentalism is clearly independent of the rest. It is perfectly possible that emotions play some significant role in explaining moral judgment, whatever such judgments or moral facts consist in, and whether or not they’re sources of moral knowledge. To be sure, if some simple form of judgment sentimentalism is true, emotions offer a kind of constitutive explanation of moral judgments – if I’m angry with you, this explains why I morally judge you’ve wronged me, because it constitutes my judgment. And explanatory sentimentalism clearly has epistemic implications. If emotions both explain our beliefs and justify them, our moral verdicts are vindicated. If, in contrast, emotions explain our beliefs but do not justify them – if explanatory sentimentalism is true but epistemic sentimentalism is false – we end up with a skeptical view.

Second, judgment sentimentalism has an evident kinship with metaphysical sentimentalism. This is so especially for those cognitivist versions according to which our judgments attribute response-dependent properties, which are metaphysically linked to our sentimental responses. But there are also contextualists for whom moral judgments describe ordinary natural properties, and fitting attitude theorists, for whom moral judgments are about the fittingness of attitudes, where facts about fittingness may themselves be non-natural truths.

Finally, epistemic sentimentalism is again in principle independent of other varieties: we’ve seen that one can be a mind-independent realist about moral properties while thinking that some suitable emotions provide access to moral truths. But if moral facts are constitutively related to our reactions and our judgments are about such facts, we will have a good a priori reason to think that beliefs based on suitable emotions would not easily mislead us and may thus amount to knowledge. While different forms of sentimentalism are separable from each other, they are thus mutually supportive, if held together.


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I want to thank Aino Lahdenranta, Lilian O’Brien, Michael Ridge, Ninni Suni, Valerie Tiberius, and Teemu Toppinen for helpful comments on the original and/or revised versions of this entry, and an anonymous SEP reviewer for exceptionally detailed feedback for revising it.

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