Supplement to Moral Sentimentalism


Already early sentimentalists compared moral properties to other mind-dependent properties. Locke had distinguished between primary qualities, properties that can be conceived of independently of our responses to them, and secondary qualities, which was his term for “powers to produce various sensations in us” (Locke 1694 [1975]: 2.8.10). Hutcheson pointed to this distinction in somewhat misleading terms by saying that

we must remember that of the sensible ideas, some are allowed to be only perceptions in our minds, and not images of any like external quality, as colours, sounds, tastes, smells, pleasure, pain. (Hutcheson 1728: 177)

He claimed that moral approbation belonged to the same category as the latter. Hume picked up the point in almost exactly the same language, saying that

Vice and virtue … may be compared to sounds, colours, heat and cold, which, according to modern philosophy, are not qualities in objects, but perceptions in the mind. (T 469)

These early sentimentalist accounts are somewhat confusing, and can also be read as a kind of projectivism: virtue and colour are not qualities of actions or objects, but only exist in the perceiver’s mind. But that wasn’t Locke’s view: secondary qualities are properties of objects, albeit powers of producing responses in perceivers. Hume did, occasionally, use this kind of language, too, saying that

these two particulars are to be consider’d as equivalent … virtue or the power of producing love or pride, vice and the power of producing humility and hatred. (T 575)

Such properties are neither brutely out there nor only in our minds, but arise in the interaction between the subject and the object. Whether they are ‘real’ is not a particularly interesting question – on some disambiguations, the answer is yes, on others no. (For sophisticated efforts, see Pettit 1991 and Wright 1992; see also the entry on moral anti-realism.)

It has become common to express the kind of mind-dependence at issue in terms of response-dependence. Here is a basic schema for such accounts:

Necessarily/a priori, an action x is M if and only if subject S would have response R to x in circumstances C.

There is an immense variety of actual and possible theories fitting this schema, given that the subject, response, and circumstance variables can be filled in in many different ways. Most are patently absurd (consider “necessarily, an action is wrong if and only if J. Edgar Hoover would snicker at it first thing in the morning”). The variants that will be considered below involve substituting for S subjects as they are, non-normatively idealized subjects, and virtuous or good subjects, respectively.

Suitable circumstances C will depend on what kind of subject is at issue. The important feature in response-dependence accounts is that the circumstances are not specified in terms of whatever it takes to get it right. After all, take a mind-independent property such as being circular. It is a priori true that a shape is circular if and only if we would believe it is circular, were we perfect circularity trackers observing it in perfect circularity-tracking conditions. If we meet the conditions on the right-hand side, there is no conceptual room for error: we are guaranteed to get it right. But in the case of a mind-independent property, this is only because we define the subject and conditions in terms that presuppose there are mind-independent truths about shapes (the right-hand side refers to tracking circularity).

When the property is genuinely response-dependent, such as being disgusting, a corresponding claim is a priori or necessarily true without a whatever-it-takes specification. If the link between responses and properties is a priori knowable, then the equation expresses some kind of conceptual or analytical truth. David Lewis, for example, says that his version of the response-dependence equation is equivocally analytical – analytically true under some precisifications of the relevant ordinary concepts (Lewis 1989: 130). But some take the equation to be a posteriori necessary truth, and are thus not committed to a claim about our ordinary concepts.

The responses R may be thought of as the same sort of moral sentiments or valuing attitudes that non-cognitivists appeal to. One challenge is that it appears that the same action may cause or merit many different responses, depending on the context, so specific emotions and properties are not paired (Koons 2003: 280). A basic rejoinder is to say that blame or disapprobation, for example, is constituted by a spectrum of responses that do indeed vary from context to context. According to Jesse Prinz, which emotion constitutes blame depends on who is blamed and for what (2006: 34). For example, violations of a perceived natural order arouse disgust when committed by others, and shame when committed by oneself.

It is also possible to substitute judgment or belief in the response slot. Indeed, Crispin Wright argues that it is preferable to do so, given that the relevant experiences will be conceptually informed, such that someone who lacks the concept of being funny will not be capable of amusement, for example (Wright 1988: 13). This is controversial, and would rule out certain reductive explanatory projects. Lewis points out that if valuing were just believing, there would be “no conceptual reason why valuing is a favourable attitude” (Lewis 1989: 115).

There are a number of general motivations for accepting a response-dependence (RD) account of some sort. In contrast to non-naturalism, RD accounts aspire to be naturalistic. They do not assume that moral facts are sui generis or knowable by some kind of non-empirical intuition. They also do not assume that moral facts are brute: there is a kind of explanation for why some moral standards are correct (they would be endorsed from the relevant perspective). Some response-dependence views are reductive: moral facts are identified with natural facts of a certain kind, such as dispositional facts. Others are non-reductive: normative terms appear on both sides of the equation, so it only elucidates relations among different kinds of normative concepts or properties (Wiggins 1987). (Whether this suffices for naturalism is debatable.)

In contrast to mind-independent naturalism, RD accounts deny that moral properties can be identified with response-independent natural properties. One reason to do so is the alleged heterogeneity or natural shapelessness of moral and evaluative properties. (This is related to McDowell’s (1979) point about the uncodifiability of ethics.) As Prinz puts the challenge,

Immoral acts comprise a hodgepodge: lying, stealing, hoarding, hurting, killing, neglecting, harassing, polluting, insulting, molesting, vandalizing, disrespecting, and so forth. What do these things have in common other than the fact that we frown on all of them? (Prinz 2007: 48; cf. Wiggins 1987: 193)

Put modestly, the argument is that mind-independent naturalists must pay the cost of subscribing to wildly disjunctive properties.

Further, even if there is a non-disjunctive pattern to be found at the natural level, RD accounts distinguish between the property of being right (the response-dependent property) and a right-making property (a response-independent property). Maximizing utility may be what makes an action right, but it is distinct from rightness itself. One indication of this is that if our moral concepts were concepts of natural properties, disagreements about their application would necessarily involve conceptual error on someone’s part. But it seems that a utilitarian and a Kantian may both be conceptually competent while disagreeing about what is wrong. The concepts are essentially contestable: the focus of moral disagreement is whether the action in question causes or merits the pertinent response, not what response-independent properties it has (Wiggins 1987: 198).

Finally, response-dependence accounts bear some resemblance to constructivist views of moral truth. Constructivists, too, believe that moral and perhaps other normative facts depend on certain responses of ours under certain conditions. But for them, such facts depend on the responses of rational agents or those who follow norms of practical reasoning in suitable conditions (for a general account, see James 2007). Roughly, something is wrong, for example, if and only if (and because) anyone would agree to a norm prohibiting it in virtue of being reasonable or rational. Since the real work in determining the relevant facts is done by the putative norms of practical reason rather than our emotional or conative responses, constructivist theories form an importantly different category. Sentimentalists reject these views because of content scepticism about practical reason (see Anti-Rationalism Supplement).

Copyright © 2021 by
Antti Kauppinen <>

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