Religion and Political Theory
When the well-known political theorist Leo Strauss introduced the topic of politics and religion in his reflections, he presented it as a problem—the “theologico-political problem” he called it (Strauss 1997). The problem, says Strauss, is primarily one about authority: Is political authority to be grounded in the claims of revelation or reason, Jerusalem or Athens? In so characterizing the problem, Strauss was tapping into currents of thought deep in the history of political reflection in the west, ones about the nature, extent, and justification of political authority. Do monarchies owe their authority to divine right? Has God delegated to secular rulers such as kings and emperors the authority to wage war in order to achieve religious aims: the conversion of the infidel or the repulsion of unjust attacks on the true faith? Do secular rulers have the authority to suppress heretics? What authority does the state retain when its principles conflict with God's? Is the authority of the natural law ultimately grounded in divine law? These and other questions animated much of the discussion among medieval and modern philosophers alike.
With the emergence of liberal democracy in the modern west, however, the types of questions that philosophers asked about the interrelation between religion and political authority began to shift, in large measure because the following three-fold dynamic was at work. In the first place, divine-authorization accounts of political authority had lost the day to consent-based approaches. Political authority in a liberal democracy, most prominent defenders of liberal democracy claimed, is grounded in the consent of the people to be ruled rather than in God's act of authorization. Second, the effects of the Protestant Reformation had made themselves felt acutely, as the broadly homogeneous religious character of Western Europe disintegrated into competing religious communities. The population of Western Europe and the United States were now not only considerably more religiously diverse, but also deeply wary of the sort of bloodshed occasioned by the so-called religious wars. And, finally, secularization had begun to take hold. Both the effects of religious diversity and prominent attacks on the legitimacy of religious belief ensured that one could no longer assume in political discussion that one's fellow citizens were religious, let alone members of one's own religious tradition.
For citizens of contemporary liberal democracies, this three-fold dynamic has yielded a curious situation. On the one hand, most take it for granted that the authority of the state is located in the people, that the people are religiously diverse, and that important segments of people doubt the rationality of religious belief and practice of any sort. On the other hand, contrary to the predictions of many advocates of secularization theory, such as Karl Marx, Max Weber, and (at one time) Peter Berger, this mix of democracy, religious diversity, and religious criticism has not resulted in the disappearance or privatization of religion. Religion, especially in liberal democracies such as the United States, is alive and well, shaping political culture in numerous ways. Consequently, there very much remains a theologico-political problem. The problem, moreover, still concerns political authority, though now reframed by the transition to liberal democracy. If recent reflection on the issue is any guide, the most pressing problem to address is this: Given that state-authorized coercion needs to be justified, and that the justification of state coercion requires the consent of the people, what role may religious reasons play in justifying state coercion? More specifically, in a religiously pluralistic context such as one finds in contemporary liberal democracies, are religious reasons sufficient to justify a coercive law for which reasonable agents cannot find an adequate secular rationale?
This article considers the most important answers to these questions offered by recent philosophers, political theorists, and theologians. We present these answers as part of a lively three-way discussion between advocates of what we call the standard view, their liberal critics, and proponents of the so-called New Traditionalism. Briefly stated, advocates of the standard view argue that in contemporary liberal democracies, significant restraints must be put on the political role of religious reasons. Their liberal critics deny this, or at least deny that good reasons have been given to believe this. New Traditionalists, by contrast, turn their back on both the standard view and its liberal critics, arguing that religious orthodoxy and liberal democracy are fundamentally incompatible. To have a grip on this three-way debate, we suggest, is to understand that dimension of the theologico-political problem that most animates philosophical reflection in liberal democracies on the relation between religion and politics.
- 1. The Standard View
- 2. The Doctrine of Religious Restraint
- 3. Three Arguments for the Doctrine of Religious Restraint
- 4. Liberal Critics of the Doctrine of Religious Restraint
- 5. The Primary Concern Regarding the Doctrine of Religious Restraint
- 6. Rawls
- 7. A Convergence Alternative
- 8. The New Traditionalism
- 9. Summary
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. The Standard View
The standard view among political theorists, such as Robert Audi, Jürgen Habermas, Charles Larmore, Steven Macedo, Martha Nussbaum, and John Rawls is that religious reasons can play only a limited role in justifying coercive laws, as coercive laws that require a religious rationale lack moral legitimacy. If the standard view is correct, there is an important asymmetry between religious and secular reasons in the following respect: some secular reasons can themselves justify state coercion but no religious reason can. This asymmetry between the justificatory potential of religious and secular reasons, it is further claimed, should shape the political practice of religious believers. According to advocates of the standard view, citizens should not support coercive laws for which they believe there is no plausible secular rationale, although they may support coercive laws for which they believe there is only a secular rationale. (Note that not just any secular rationale counts.) We can refer to this injunction to exercise restraint as The Doctrine of Religious Restraint (or the DRR, for short). This abstract characterization of the DRR will require some refinements, which we'll provide in sections 2 and 3. For the time being, however, we can get a better feel for the character of the DRR by considering the following case.
2. The Doctrine of Religious Restraint
Rick is a politically engaged citizen who intends to vote in a referendum on a measure that would criminalize homosexual relations. As he evaluates the relevant considerations, he concludes that the only persuasive rationale for that measure includes as a crucial premise the claim that homosexual relations are contrary to a God-established natural order. Although he finds that rationale compelling, he realizes that many others do not. But because he takes himself to have a general moral obligation to make those political decisions that, as best he can tell, are both just and good, he decides to vote in favor of criminalization. Moreover, he tries to persuade his compatriots to vote with him. In so doing, he offers relevantly different arguments to different audiences. He tries to convince like-minded citizens by appealing to the theistic natural law argument that he finds persuasive. But he realizes that many of his fellow citizens are unpersuaded by the natural law argument that convinces him. So he articulates a variety of other arguments—some secular, some religious—that he hopes will leverage those who don't share his natural law theism into supporting his position. He does so even though he doubts that any of those leveraging arguments are cogent, realizes that many of those to whom he addresses them will have comparable doubts about their cogency, and so believes that many coerced by the law he supports have no good reason, from their perspective, to affirm that law.
Advocates of the standard view will be troubled by Rick's behavior. The relevantly troubling feature of Rick's behavior is not primarily his decision to support this particular policy. Rather, it is his decision to support a policy that he believes others have no good reason, from their perspective, to endorse. After all, Rick votes to enact a law that authorizes state coercion even though he believes that the only plausible rationale for that decision includes religious claims that many of his compatriots find utterly unpersuasive. In so doing, Rick violates a normative constraint at the heart of the standard view, viz., that citizens in a pluralistic liberal democracy ought to refrain from using their political influence to authorize coercive laws that, to the best of their knowledge, can be justified only on religious grounds and so lack a plausible secular rationale. Or, otherwise put, Rick violates the DRR. For the DRR tells us that, if a citizen is trying to determine whether or not she should support some coercive law, and if she believes that there is no plausible secular rationale for that law, then she may not support it.
The DRR is a negative constraint; it identifies a kind of reason that cannot itself justify a coercive law and so a kind of reason on which citizens may not exclusively rely when supporting a coercive law. But this negative constraint is typically conjoined with a permission: although citizens may not support coercive laws for which they believe themselves to have only a religious rationale, they may support coercive laws for which they believe there is only a plausible secular rationale. As we'll see in a moment, advocates of the DRR furnish reasons to believe that religious and secular reasons have this asymmetrical justificatory role.
2.1 Core Components of the Doctrine of Religious Restraint
The standard view has often been misunderstood, typically by associating the DRR with claims its advocates are free to deny. It will therefore be helpful to dissociate the DRR from various common misunderstandings.
First, the DRR is a moral constraint, one that applies to people in virtue of the fact that they are citizens of a liberal democracy. As such, it need not be encoded into law, enforced by state coercion or social stigma, promoted in state educational institutions, or in any other way policed by the powers that be. Of course, advocates of restraint are free to argue that the state should police violations of the DRR (see Habermas 2006, 10). Perhaps some liberal democracies do police something like the DRR. But advocates of the standard view needn't endorse restrictions of this sort.
Second, the DRR does not require a thorough-going privatization of religious commitment. Indeed, the DRR permits religious considerations to play a rather prominent role in a citizen's political practice: citizens are permitted to vote for their favored coercive policies on exclusively religious grounds as well as to advocate publicly for those policies on religious grounds. What the DRR does require of citizens is that they reasonably believe that they have some plausible secular rationale for each of the coercive laws that they support, which they are prepared to offer in political discussion. In this respect, the present construal of the DRR is weaker than comparable proposals, such as that developed by Robert Audi, which requires that each citizen have and be motivated by some evidentially adequate secular rationale for each of the coercive laws he or she supports (see Audi 1997, 138 and Rawls 1997, 784ff).
Third, the DRR places few restrictions on the content of the secular reasons to which citizens can appeal when supporting coercive laws. Although the required secular reasons must be “plausible” (more on this in a moment), they may make essential reference to what Rawls calls “comprehensive conceptions of the good,” such as Platonism, Kantianism, or utilitarianism. Accordingly, the standard view does not commit itself to a position according to which secular reasons must be included or otherwise grounded in a neutral source—a set of principles regarding justice and the common good such that everybody has good reason, apart from his own or any other religious or philosophical perspective, to find acceptable. Somewhat more specifically, advocates of the standard view needn't claim that secular reasons must be found in what Rawls calls “public reason,” which (roughly speaking) is a fund of shared principles about justice and the common good constructed from the shared political culture of a liberal democracy. That having been said, it is worth stressing that some prominent advocates of the standard view adopt a broadly Rawlsian account of the DRR, according to which coercive laws must be justified by appeal to public reason (see Gutmann and Thompson 1996, Larmore 1987, Macedo 1990, and Nussbaum 2008). We shall have more to say about this view in section 6.
Fourth, the DRR itself has no determinate policy implications; it is a constraint not on legislation itself, but on the configuration of reasons to which agents may appeal when supporting coercive legislation. So, for example, it forbids Rick to support the criminalization of homosexuality when he believes that there are no plausible secular reasons to criminalize it. As such, the moral propriety of the DRR has nothing directly to do with its usefulness in furthering, or discouraging, particular policy aims.
The DRR, then, is a norm that is supposed to provide guidance for how citizens of a liberal democracy should conduct themselves when deliberating about or deciding on the implementation of coercive laws. For our purposes, it will be helpful to work with a canonical formulation of it. Let us, then, formulate the DRR as follows:
The DRR: a citizen of a liberal democracy may support the implementation of a coercive law L just in case he reasonably believes himself to have a plausible secular justification for L, which he is prepared to offer in political discussion.
About this formulation of the DRR, let us make two points. First, in what follows, we will remain largely noncommittal about what the qualifier “plausible” means, as advocates of the standard view understand it in different ways. For present purposes, we will simply assume that a plausible rationale is one that epistemically and morally competent peers will take seriously as a basis for supporting a coercive law. Second, according to this formulation of the DRR, a citizen can comply with the DRR even if he himself is not persuaded to support a coercive law for any secular reason. What matters is that he believes that he has and can offer a secular rationale that his secular cohorts can take seriously.
Suppose, then, we have an adequate working conception of the DRR. The question naturally arises: Why do advocates of the standard view maintain that we should conform to the DRR? For several reasons, most prominent of which are the following three arguments. Of course, there are many more arguments for the DRR than we can address here. See, for example, Andrew Lister's appeal to the value of political community (2013).
3. Three Arguments for the Doctrine of Religious Restraint
3.1 The Argument from Religious Warfare
Advocates of the standard view sometimes commend the DRR on the grounds that conforming to it will help prevent religious warfare and civil strife. According to Robert Audi, for example, “if religious considerations are not appropriately balanced with secular ones in matters of coercion, there is a special problem: a clash of Gods vying for social control. Such uncompromising absolutes easily lead to destruction and death” (Audi 2000, 103). The concern expressed here, presumably, is this: for all we reasonably believe, citizens who are willing to coerce their compatriots for religious reasons will use their political power to advance their sectarian agenda—using the power of the state to persecute heretics, impose orthodoxy, and enact stringent morals laws. In so doing, these citizens will thereby provoke determined resistance and civil conflict. Such a state of affairs, however, threatens the very viability of a liberal democracy and, so, should be avoided at nearly all costs. Accordingly, religious believers should exercise restraint when deliberating about the implementation of coercive laws. Exercising restraint, however, is best accomplished by adhering to the DRR.
According to the liberal critics of the standard view, there are several problems with this argument. First, the liberal critics contend, while there may have been a genuine threat of confessional warfare in 17th century Western Europe, there is little reason to believe that there is any such threat in stable liberal democracies such as the United States. Why not? Because confessional conflict, the liberal critics continue, is typically rooted in egregious violations of the right to religious freedom, when, for example, people are jailed, tortured, or otherwise abused because of their religious commitments. John Locke puts the point thus:
it is not the diversity of Opinions (which cannot be avoided) but the refusal of Toleration to those that are of different Opinions (which might have been granted) that has produced all the Bustles and Wars, that have been in the Christian World, upon account of Religion. (Locke 1983, 155)
If Locke is correct, then what we need to prevent confessional conflict is not compliance with a norm such as the DRR, but firm commitment to the right to religious freedom. A stable liberal democracy such as the United States is, however, fully committed to protecting the right to religious freedom—and will be for the foreseeable future. True enough, there are passionately felt disagreements about how to interpret the right to religious freedom: witness recent conflicts as to whether or not the right to religious freedom should be understood to include the right of religious objectors to be exempted from generally justified state policies (See Koppelman 2013; Leiter 2012). But it is difficult to see, the liberal critics claim, that there is a realistic prospect of these disagreements devolving into violent civil conflict.
Second, even if there were a realistic prospect of religious conflict, liberal critics claim that it is unclear that adhering to the DRR would lower the probability that such a conflict would occur. After all, the trigger for religious war—typically, the violation of the right to religious freedom—is not always, or even typically, justified by exclusively religious considerations. As historian Michael Burleigh has argued, secularists have a long history of hostility to the right to religious freedom and, presumably, that hostility isn't at all grounded in religious considerations (Burleigh 2007, 135 and, more generally, Burleigh 2005).
Third, the liberal critics maintain, when religious believers have employed coercive power to violate the right to religious freedom, they themselves rarely have done so in a way that violates the DRR. Typically, when such rights have been violated, the justifications offered, even by religious believers, appeal to alleged requirements for social order, such as the need for uniformity of belief on basic normative issues. One theological apologist for religious repression, for example, writes this: “The king punishes heretics as enemies, as extremely wicked rebels, who endanger the peace of the kingdom, which cannot be maintained without the unity of the faith. That is why they are burnt in Spain” (quoted in Rivera, 1992, 50). Ordinarily, the kind of religious persecution that engenders religious conflict is legitimated by appeal to secular reasons of the sort mandated by the DRR. (This is the case even when religious actors are the ones who appeal to those secular reasons.)
Finally, liberal critics point out that some religious believers affirm the right to religious freedom on religious grounds; they take themselves to have powerful religious reason to affirm the right of each person to worship as she freely chooses, absent state coercion. So, for example, the 4th century Nestorian Mar Aba: “I am a Christian. I preach my faith and want every man to join it. But I want him to join it of his own free will. I use force on no man” (quoted in Moffett 1986, 216).  A believer such as Mar Aba might be willing to violate the DRR; however, his violation would, according to the liberal critics, help not to cause religious war but to impede it. For Mar Aba's 'sectarian rationale' supports not the violation of religious freedom but its protection.
3.2 The Argument from Divisiveness
If the liberal critics are correct, one of the problems with the argument from warfare is that there is no realistic prospect of religious warfare breaking out in a stable liberal democracy such as the United States. Still, there may be other evils that are more likely to occur under current conditions, which compliance with the DRR might help to prevent. For example, it is plausible to suppose that the enactment of a coercive law that cannot be justified except on religious grounds would engender much anger and frustration on the part of those coerced: “when legislation is expressly based on religious arguments, the legislation takes on a religious character, to the frustration of those who don't share the relevant faith and who therefore lack access to the normative predicate behind the law” (Greene 1993, 1060). This in turn breeds division between citizens—anger and distrust between citizens who have to find some amicable way to make collective decisions about common matters. This counts in favor of the DRR precisely because compliance with the DRR diminishes the likelihood of our suffering from such bad consequences.
To this argument, liberal critics offer a three-part reply. First, suppose it is true that the implementation of coercive laws that can be justified only on religious grounds often causes frustration and anger among both secular and religious citizens. The liberal critics maintain that there is reason to believe that compliance with the DRR would also engender frustration and anger among other religious and secular citizens. To this end, they point to the fact that many religious believers believe that conforming to the DRR would compromise their loyalty to God: if they were prohibited from supporting coercive laws for which they take there to be strong but exclusively religious reasons to support, they would naturally take themselves to be prohibited from obeying God. But for many religious believers this is distressing; they take themselves to have overriding moral and religious obligations to obey God. Similarly, some secular citizens will likely be frustrated by the requirement that the DRR places on religious citizens. According to these secular citizens, all citizens have the right to make political decisions as their conscience dictates. And, on some occasions, these secular citizens hold that exercising that right will lead religious citizens to violate the DRR.
If this is correct, for the argument from divisiveness to succeed, it would have to provide reason to believe that the level of frustration and anger that would be produced by violating the DRR would be greater than that of conforming to the DRR. But, the liberal critics claim, it is doubtful that we have any such reason: in a very religious society such as the United States, it might be the case that restrictions on the political practice of religious believers engenders at least as much frustration as the alternative.
Second, the liberal critics argue, there is reason to believe that conformance to the DRR would only marginally alleviate the frustration that some citizens feel when confronted with religious reasons in public political debate. The DRR, after all, does not forbid citizens from supporting coercive laws on religious grounds, nor does it forbid citizens to articulate religious arguments in public. Furthermore, complying with the DRR does not prevent religious citizens from advocating their favored laws in bigoted, inflammatory, or obnoxious manners; it has nothing to say about political decorum. So, for example, because the DRR doesn't forbid citizens from helping themselves to inflammatory or demeaning rhetoric in political argument, the anger and resentment engendered by such rhetoric does not constitute evidence for (or against) the DRR.
Third, the liberal critics contend that because most of the laws that have a chance of enactment in a society as pluralistic as the United States will have both religious and secular grounds, it will almost never be the case that any of the actual frustration caused by the public presence of religion supports the DRR. Given that the DRR requires not a complete but only a limited privatization of religious belief, very little of the frustration and anger apparently engendered by the public presence of religion counts in favor of the DRR. To which it is worth adding the following point: advocates of the standard view could, with Rorty (1995), adopt a more demanding conception of the DRR that requires the complete privatization of religious belief. But, as many advocates of the standard view itself maintain, it is doubtful that this move improves the argument's prospects. The complete privatization of religion is much more objectionable to religious citizens and, thus, more likely to create social foment. (Rorty, it should be noted, softened his approach on this issue. See Rorty 2003).
There are no doubt other factors that need to be taken into consideration in the calculation required to formulate the argument from divisiveness. But, the liberal critics maintain, it is unclear how those disparate factors would add up. In particular, if the liberal critics are correct, it is not clear whether requiring citizens to obey the DRR would result in less overall frustration, anger, and division than would not requiring them to do so. The issues at stake are empirical in character and the relevant empirical facts are not known.
3.3 The Argument from Respect
The third and most prominent argument for the DRR is the argument from respect. Here we focus on only one formulation of the argument, which has affinities with a version of the argument offered by Charles Larmore (see Larmore 1987).
The argument from respect runs as such:
- Each citizen deserves to be respected as a person.
- If each citizen deserves to be respected as a person, then there is a powerful prima facie presumption against the permissibility of state coercion. (On this basic claim, See Gaus, 2010, Gaus and Vallier, 2009.)
- So, there is a powerful prima facie presumption against the permissibility of state coercion.
- If the presumption against state coercion is to be overcome (as it sometimes must be), then state coercion must be justified to those who are coerced.
- If state coercion must be justified to those who are coerced, then any coercive law that lacks a plausible secular rationale is morally illegitimate (as there will be many to whom such coercion cannot be justified).
- If any coercive law that lacks a plausible secular rationale is morally illegitimate, then a citizen ought not to support any law that he believes to have only a religious rationale.
However, on the assumption that the antecedent to premise (4) is true—that there are cases in which the state must coerce—it follows (given a few other assumptions) that:
- The DRR is true.
That is, the DRR follows from a constraint on what makes for the moral legitimacy of state coercion—viz., that a morally legitimate law cannot be such that there are those to whom it cannot be justified—and from the claim that citizens should not support any law that they realize lacks moral legitimacy.
The argument from respect has received its fair share of criticism from liberal critics. Perhaps the most troubling of these criticisms is that the argument undermines the legitimacy of basic liberal commitments. To appreciate the thrust of this objection, focus for a moment on the notion being a coercive law that is justified to an agent, to which the argument appeals. How should we understand this concept? One natural suggestion is this:
A coercive law is justified to an agent only if he is reasonable and has sufficient reasons from his own perspective to support it.
Now consider a coercive law that protects fundamental liberal commitments, such as the right to exercise religious freedom. Is this law justified to each citizen of a liberal democracy? Liberal critics answer: no. For there appear to be reasonable citizens who have no good reason from their own perspective to affirm it. Consider, for example, a figure such as the Islamic intellectual Sayyid Qutb. While in prison, Qutb wrote an intelligent, informed, and morally serious commentary on the Koran in which he laid the ills of modern society at the feet of Christianity and liberal democracy. The only way to extricate ourselves from the problems spawned by liberal democracy, Qutb argued, is to implement shariah or Islamic legal code, which implies that the state should not protect a robust right to religious freedom. In short, Qutb articulates what is, from his point of view, a compelling theological rationale against any law that authorizes the state to protect a robust right to religious freedom. If respect for persons requires that each coercive law be justified to those reasonable persons subject to that law, and if a person such as Qutb were a citizen of a liberal democracy, then the argument from respect implies that laws that protect the right to religious freedom are morally illegitimate, as they lack moral justification—at least for agents such as Qutb. And for a defender of the standard view, this is certainly an unwelcome result.
This kind of case leads liberal critics of the standard view to deny the fourth premise of the argument from respect. If they are correct, it is not the case that coercive laws must be justified to those who must obey them (in the sense of justified to introduced earlier). Although having a persuasive justification would certainly be desirable and a significant moral achievement, the liberal critics maintain that the moral legitimacy of a law is not a function of whether it can be justified to all citizens—not even to all reasonable citizens. Some citizens are simply not in a strong epistemic position to recognize that certain coercive laws are morally legitimate. In such cases, liberal critics claim that we should do what we can to try to convince these citizens that they have been misled. And we should certainly do what we can to accommodate their concerns in ways that are consistent with basic liberal commitments (see Swaine 2006). At the end of the day, though, we may have no moral option but to coerce reasonable and epistemically competent peers whom we recognize have no reason from their perspective to recognize the legitimacy of the laws to which they are subject. However, if a coercive law can be morally legitimate even though some citizens are not in a strong position to recognize that it is, then (in principle) a coercive law can be justified even if it requires a religious rationale. After all, if religious reasons can be adequate (a possibility that advocates of the standard view do not typically deny), then they are just the sort of reason that can be adequate without being recognized as such even by our morally serious and epistemically competent peers.
It should be conceded, however, that this objection to the argument from respect relies on a particular understanding of what it is for a coercive law to be justified to an agent. Is there another account of this concept that would aid the advocates of the standard view? Perhaps. Nearly all theorists have argued that a coercive law's being justified to an agent does not require that that agent actually have what he regards as an adequate reason to support it (see Gaus 1996, Audi 1997, and Vallier 2014). “The question is not what people do endorse but what people have reason to endorse” (Gaus 2010, 23). Better to understand the concept being a coercive law that is justified to an agent along the following lines:
A coercive law is justified to an agent only if, were he reasonable and adequately informed, then he would have a sufficient reason from his own perspective to support it.
Given this weaker, counterfactual construal of what makes for morally permissible coercion, the argument from respect needn't undermine the legitimacy of the state's using coercion to protect basic liberal commitments. For we can always construe those counterfactual conditions in such a way that those who in fact reject basic liberal commitments would affirm them if they were more reasonable and better informed. In that case, using coercion to ensure that they comply with basic liberal commitments would not be to disrespect them. If this is correct, the prospect of there being figures such as Qutb, who reject the right to religious freedom, need not undermine the legitimacy of the state's coercive enforcement of that basic liberal commitment.
Liberal critics find this response unsatisfactory. After all, if this alternative construal of the argument is to succeed, it must be the case not only that:
Were an agent such as Qutb reasonable and adequately informed, he would have sufficient reason from his own perspective to support coercive laws that protect the right to religious liberty;
Every coercive law that protects basic liberal commitments is such that adequately informed and reasonable secular citizens would have a sufficient secular reason to support it.
These two claims, however, are highly controversial. Let us consider the first. Were we to ask Qutb whether he would have reasons to support laws that protect a robust right to religious freedom if he were adequately informed and reasonable, surely he would say: no. Moreover, he would claim that his compatriots would reject the liberal protection of such a right if they were adequately informed about the divine authorship of the Quran and the proper rules of its interpretation. While Qutb's say-so doesn't settle the issue of who would believe what in improved conditions, liberal critics maintain that his response indicates just how complicated the issue under consideration is. Among other things, to establish that Qutb is wrong it seems that one would have to deny the truth of various theological claims on which Qutb relies when he determines that he would reject the right to religious freedom were he adequately informed and reasonable. That would require advocates of the standard view to take a stand on contested religious issues. However, liberal critics point out that defenders of the standard view have been wary of explicitly denying the truth of religious claims, especially those found within the major theistic religions.
Turn now to the second claim. Some liberal critics of the standard view, such as Nicholas Wolterstorff, maintain that at the heart of liberal democracy is the claim that some coercive laws function to protect inherent human rights. Wolterstorff further argues that attempts to ground these rights in merely secular considerations fail. Only by appeal to explicitly theistic assumptions, Wolterstorff argues, can we locate an adequate justification for the ascription of these rights (see Wolterstorff 2008, Pt. III as well as Perry 2003). What would a reasonable and adequately informed secular citizen make of Wolterstorff's arguments? Would he endorse them?
It's difficult to say. Liberal critics maintain that we are simply not in good epistemic position to judge the reasons an agent would have to support laws that protect basic liberal commitments were he better informed and more reasonable. More exactly, liberal critics maintain that we are not in a good epistemic position to determine whether a secular agent who is reasonable and better informed would endorse or reject the type of theistic commitments that philosophers such as Wolterstorff claim justify the ascription of natural human rights. The problem is that we don't really have any idea how radically a person would change his views were he to occupy these conditions. The main, and still unresolved, question for this version of the standard view, then, is whether there is some coherent and non-arbitrary construal of the relevant counterfactual conditions that is strong enough to prohibit exclusive reliance on religious reasons but weak enough to allow for the justification of basic liberal commitments. (See Vallier 2014 for the most recent and sophisticated attempt to specify those counterfactual conditions.)
4. Liberal Critics of the Doctrine of Religious Restraint
In the last section, we considered three arguments for the DRR and responses to them offered by the liberal critics. In the course of our discussion, we began to see elements of the view that liberal critics of the standard view—critics such as Christopher Eberle, Philip Quinn, Jeffrey Stout, and Nicholas Wolterstorff—endorse. To get a better feel for why these theorists reject the DRR, it will be helpful to step back for a moment to consider some important features of their view.
Earlier we indicated that liberal critics of the standard view offer detailed replies to both the Argument from Religious Warfare and the Argument from Divisiveness. Still, friends of the standard view may worry that there is something deeply problematic about these replies. For by allowing citizens to support coercive laws on purely religious grounds, they permit majorities to impose their religious views on others and restrict the liberties of their fellow citizens. But it is important to see that no liberal critic of the standard position adopts an “anything goes” policy toward the justification of state coercion. Citizens, according to these thinkers, should adhere to several constraints on the manner in which they support coercive laws, including the following.
First, liberal critics of the standard view assume that citizens should support basic liberal commitments such as the rights to religious freedom, equality before the law, and private property. Michael Perry argues, for example, “that the foundational moral commitment of liberal democracy is to the true and full humanity of every person—and therefore, to the inviolability of every person—without regard to race, sex, religion… .” This commitment, Perry continues, is “the principal ground of liberal democracy's further commitment to certain basic human freedoms” that are protected by law (Perry 2003, 36). More generally, liberal critics maintain that citizens should support only those coercive laws that they reasonably believe further the common good and are consistent with the demands of justice. These commitments, they add, are not in tension with the claim that citizens may support coercive laws that they believe to lack a plausible secular rationale. So long as a citizen is firmly committed to basic liberal rights, she may coherently and without impropriety do so even though she regards these laws as having no plausible secular justification. More generally, liberal critics of the DRR maintain that a citizen may rely on her religious convictions to determine which policies further the cause of justice and the common good and may support coercive laws even if she regards them as having no plausible secular rationale.
Second, liberal critics of the standard view lay down constraints on the manner in which citizens arrive at their political commitments (see Eberle 2002, Weithman 2002, and Wolterstorff 1997, 2012a). So, for example, each citizen should abide by certain epistemic requirements: precisely because they ought not to support coercive laws that violate the requirements of justice and the common good, citizens should take feasible measures to determine whether the laws they support are actually just and good. In order to achieve that aim, citizens should search for considerations relevant to the normative propriety of their favored laws, weigh those considerations judiciously, listen carefully to the criticisms of those who reject their normative commitments, and be willing to change their political commitments should the balance of relevant considerations require them to do so. Again, liberal critics deny that even the most conscientious and assiduous adherence to such constraints precludes citizens from supporting coercive laws that require a religious rationale. No doubt, those who support coercive laws that require a religious rationale might do so in an insular, intransigent, irrational, or otherwise defective manner. But they need not do so and, thus, their religiously-grounded support for coercive laws need not be defective.
Third, critics of the standard view need have no aversion to secular justification and so need not object to a state of affairs in which each person, secular or religious, has what he or she regards as a compelling reason to endorse coercive laws of various sorts. (Indeed, they claim that such a state of affairs would arguably be a significant moral achievement—a good for all concerned.) According to the liberal critics, however, what is most important is that parity reigns: any normative constraint that applies to the reasons on the basis of which citizens make political decisions must apply impartially to both religious and secular reasons. Many secular reasons employed to justify coercion—ones that appeal to comprehensive perspectives such as utilitarianism and Kantianism, for example—are highly controversial; in this sense, they are very similar to religious reasons. For this reason, some advocate for a cousin —more or less distant, depending on the formulation—of the DRR, namely, one that lays down restrictions on all religious reasons and on some particularly controversial secular reasons. (See section 6 below.) Moreover, the normative issues implicated by certain coercive laws are so complex and contentious that any rationale for or against these laws will include claims that can be reasonably rejected—secular or religious as the case might be.
If this is right, according to the liberal critics, equal treatment of religious and secular reasons is the order of the day: religious believers have no more, and no less, a responsibility to aspire to persuade their secular compatriots by appeal to secular reasons than secularists have an obligation to aspire to persuade their religious compatriots by appeal to religious reasons. Otherwise put, according to the liberal critics, if we accept the claim that:
If a religious citizen finds herself in a position in which she has excellent reason to believe that she cannot convince a fellow secular citizen to support a coercive law that she deems just by appeal to religious reasons, then she should do her best to appeal to secular reasons—reasons that her cohort may find persuasive;
we should also accept:
If a secular citizen finds herself in a position in which she has excellent reason to believe that she cannot convince a fellow religious citizen to support a coercive law that she deems just by appeal to secular reasons, then she should do her best to appeal to religious reasons—reasons that her cohort may find persuasive.
Recognizing parity of this sort, according to the liberal critics, lies at the heart of what it is to be a good citizen of a liberal democracy. For being a good citizen involves respecting one's fellow citizens, even when one disagrees with them. In a wide range of cases, however, an agent exercises respect not by treating her interlocutor as a generic human being or a generic citizen of a liberal democracy, but by treating her as a person who has a particular narrative identity and life history, say, as an African American, a Russian immigrant, or a Muslim citizen. But doing this often requires pursuing and appealing to considerations that it is likely that one's interlocutors with their own particular narrative identity will find persuasive. And depending on the case, these reasons may be exclusively religious.
To this we should add a clarification: strictly speaking, the liberal critics' insistence on parity between the pursuit of secular and religious reasons is consistent with the DRR. For, as we have construed it, the DRR allows that religious citizens may support coercive laws for religious reasons (so long as they have and are prepared to provide a plausible secular justification for these laws). And while its advocates do not typically emphasize the point, the DRR permits secular citizens to articulate religious reasons that will persuade religious believers to accept the secular citizens' favored coercive laws (for reservations about this practice, see Audi 1997, 135-37 on “leveraging reasons”. See also Schwartzman 2014). Still, the DRR implies that there is an important asymmetry between the justificatory role played by religious and secular reasons. To this issue we now turn.
5. The Primary Concern Regarding the Doctrine of Religious Restraint
Assume that, in religiously pluralistic conditions, religious citizens have good moral reason—perhaps even a moral obligation—to pursue secular reasons for their favored coercive laws. Assume as well that secular citizens have good reason to pursue religious reasons for their favored coercive policies (if only because, with respect to some coercive laws, some of their fellow citizens find only religious reasons to support them). What should citizens do, religious or secular, when they cannot identify these reasons?
According to advocates of the standard view, if a religious citizen fails in his pursuit of secular reasons that support a given coercive law, then he is morally required to exercise restraint. After all, if his pursuit of these reasons fails, then he does not have any secular reason to offer in favor of that law. Liberal critics of the standard view, by contrast, deny that citizens so circumstanced are morally required to exercise restraint. They claim that from the fact that religious citizens are morally required to pursue secular reasons for their favored coercive laws (when that is necessary for persuasion), it does not follow that they should refrain from supporting coercive laws if their pursuit of secular reasons fails. Because our having an obligation to try to bring about some state of affairs tells us nothing about what we ought to do if we cannot bring it about, nothing like the DRR follows from the claim that citizens should pursue secular reasons for their favored coercive laws. According to the liberal critics, a parallel position applies to non-religious citizens: from the fact that non-religious citizens are morally required to pursue religious reasons for their favored laws (when that is necessary for persuasion), it doesn't follow that they should refrain from supporting coercive laws if their pursuit of religious reasons fails. For the liberal critics, parity between the religious and the secular obtains both with respect to the obligation to pursue justifying reasons and with respect to the permission not to exercise restraint when that pursuit fails.
Have we identified a genuine point of disagreement between the liberal critics and advocates of the standard view? It seems so. If the liberal critics are correct, all that can be reasonably asked of religious citizens is that, in a pluralistic liberal democracy, they competently pursue secular reasons for the coercive laws they support. If the pursuit fails, then they may support these laws for exclusively religious reasons. Proponents of the standard view disagree, maintaining that if the pursuit fails, these citizens must exercise restraint. This disagreement is rooted in differing convictions about the justificatory role that religious reasons can play. Once again, advocates of the standard view maintain that religious reasons can play only a limited justificatory role: citizens must have and be prepared to offer (at least certain kinds of) secular reasons for any coercive law that they support, as religious reasons are not enough. The liberal critics deny this, maintaining that no persuasive arguments have been offered to believe this. The DRR highlights this disagreement, as it incorporates an assumption that religious and secular reasons play asymmetrical roles in justifying coercive laws.
As we have explicated the view of the liberal critics, religious citizens are (in a wide range of cases) morally required to pursue secular reasons for their favored coercive laws, but they needn't exercise restraint if they fail in their pursuit. But this position raises a question: What's so bad about requiring citizens to exercise restraint? Why should liberal critics object to this?
According to the liberal critics, one of the core commitments of a liberal democracy is a commitment to religious freedom and its natural extension, the right to freedom of conscience. When citizens use the modicum of political influence at their disposal, liberal critics claim that we should want them to do so in a way that furthers the cause of justice and the common good. So, for example, when a citizen deliberates about whether he should, say, support the invasion of Afghanistan by the United States and its NATO allies, we want him to determine, as best he can, whether the invasion of Afghanistan is actually morally appropriate. In order to determine that, he should be as conscientious as he can in his collection and evaluation of the relevant evidence, reach whatever conclusions seem reasonable to him on the available evidence, and act accordingly. If he concludes that invading Afghanistan would be unjust, then he should oppose it. That he does so is not only his right but also morally excellent, as acting in accord with responsibly held normative commitments is an important moral and civic good.
This, the liberal critics maintain, suggests a general claim. Whatever the policy and whatever the reasons—whether religious or secular—we have powerful reason to want citizens to support the coercive policies that they believe, in good conscience, to be morally appropriate. But that general claim has direct application to the issue at hand. It is possible, the liberal critics claim, for a morally sensitive and epistemically competent citizen to regard only certain religious considerations as providing decisive support for a given coercive law. Nicholas Wolterstorff, to return to an earlier example, maintains that only theistic considerations can ground the ascription of inherent human rights, some of which are protected by coercive law. Arguably, were a citizen to find a position such as Wolterstorff's persuasive, then he should appeal to those considerations that he actually believes to further the cause of justice and the common good. And this should lead us to want him to support that law, even though he does so solely on religious grounds, even if he regards that law as having no plausible secular justification. Good citizenship in a pluralistic liberal democracy unavoidably requires citizens to make political commitments that they know their moral and epistemic peers reject but that they nevertheless believe, with due humility, to be morally required. This ideal of good citizenship, so the liberal critics claim, applies to religious and secular citizens alike.
The portrait that we have offered of the standard view (and that of its liberal critics) is a composite, one which blends together various claims that its advocates make about the relation between coercive law and religious reasons. Because of this approach we have made relatively little explicit mention of particular advocates of the standard view, such as that towering figure of contemporary political philosophy, John Rawls. Of all the contemporary figures who have shaped the debate we are considering, however, none has exercised more influence than Rawls. It is natural to wonder, then, whether we've presented the standard view in its most powerful form and, thus, whether we've omitted a crucial dimension of the debate between the standard view and its liberal critics. We believe not. The version of the standard view that we have considered is one that borrows liberally from Rawls' thought, albeit softened and modified in certain ways. Still, before moving forward, it will be helpful to say something more about Rawls' view. We limit ourselves to the following three observations.
First, Rawls' own position about the relation between coercive law and religious reasons has shifted. In Political Liberalism, Rawls admits that at one point he inclined toward accepting an ambitious version of the DRR according to which each citizen of a liberal democracy ought not to appeal to religious reasons when deliberating about matters of basic justice and constitutional essentials (see Rawls 1993, 247 n.36). In the face of criticism, Rawls modified his position, arriving at a close relative of the DRR, viz., that while an agent may appeal to religious reasons to justify coercive law, he may not appeal solely to these reasons. Secular reasons must be forthcoming (see Rawls 1997).
Second, Rawls places significant restrictions on the content of the secular reasons to which an agent may appeal. To advert to a point made earlier, Rawls argues that when deliberating about matters of basic justice and constitutional essentials, citizens should appeal to “public reason,” which (roughly speaking) is a fund of shared principles about justice and the common good that is constructed from the shared political culture of a liberal democracy—principles that concern, for example, the equality of citizens before the law and their right to a fair system of cooperation. In Rawls' view, when deliberating about these matters, appealing solely to secular comprehensive accounts of the good such as Aristotelianism or utilitarianism is no more legitimate than appealing solely to religious reasons. For all of these comprehensive doctrines will be alien to some of one's reasonable compatriots.
As will have been evident, in our presentation of the DRR, we have relaxed Rawls' stipulation, allowing for the legitimacy of appealing to only secular reasons that have their home in one or another comprehensive conception of the good. This might render the DRR vulnerable to the criticism that it invidiously and arbitrarily discriminates against religion. But the Rawlsian 'public reason' alternative is also vulnerable to criticism. It is not clear, for one thing, that the content of public reason will be rich enough to provide compelling reasons to support genuinely informative positions on matters of basic justice or constitutional essentials. Perhaps, for example, the claims that belong to public reason are only fairly sweeping ones that ascribe basic rights of various sorts but offer no guidance about how they should be weighed (see Quinn 1997, 149-52). Furthermore, it is unclear that appealing to public reason is the best way to respect one's fellow citizens. Perhaps, as Wolterstorff and Stout have argued, respect is better served both by explicitly disclosing to one's interlocutors the reasons one finds most persuasive (whatever they may be) and appealing to reasons that they might most find most persuasive, given their own commitments to one or another comprehensive perspective (see Wolterstorff 1997 and Stout 2004, Chs. 2-4).
In fact, Wolterstorff has argued that, ironically, Rawls' methodology has the implication that appealing to public reason would be to treat others with profound disrespect. For note that when Rawls formulates his version of public reason, he claims that it will incorporate the idea that liberal democracy is a society with a system of fair cooperation over time. How do we identify such a system? Rawls maintains that doing so requires that we set off to the side those who are “unreasonable” – these being those who are “unwilling to honor, or even to propose … fair terms of cooperation” (Rawls 1993, 51). But, as Wolterstorff contends, there are many who do not satisfy Rawls' account of reasonability, including those who think of politics not in terms of distributive justice but other categories such as preserving individual liberty, protecting small government, maximizing their own wealth, and so on. The implication of setting these people off to the side is that, when engaging in public political deliberation about some issue of basic justice, the “reasonable” citizens are free to ignore the views of their “unreasonable” compatriots. This, however, raises the concern that far from advocating a system in which all other citizens are respected as free and equal, Rawls' view has the paradoxical implication that “to follow the duty of civility is perforce to perpetrate injustice” by Rawls' own lights (Wolterstorff 2012, 121).
Third, as Paul Weithman points out (in Weithman 2007), there are really two types of argument that Rawls provides in favor of his position. The first is a variant of the argument from respect. More specifically, it is a relative to the first version of the argument from respect that we considered earlier, which maintains that coercive laws are morally legitimate only if they can be justified to citizens of a liberal democracy with their actual commitments and beliefs. This argument, if the liberal critics are correct, is subject to some fairly powerful replies, among which is that, given the fact that there is widespread pluralism about God and the good among the citizens of liberal democracies, it is impossible for coercive laws that protect basic liberal commitments to be justified to them. The second type of argument that Rawls provides in favor of his favored restrictions on religious reasons, however, appeals not to the claim that justifying coercion on the basis of alien reasons disrespects our compatriots, but to the idea that the reasons on which we rely must be ones that others can endorse as autonomous agents. In Kantian categories, this second line of argument singles out not the evil of heteronomous considerations, but the goodness of considerations that autonomous and reasonable agents could accept as an appropriate basis for settling fundamental political questions.
It is difficult to see, however, that this latter argument genuinely moves beyond the argument from respect. The problem is that it is not evident that the content of what Rawls terms public reason is that to which reasonable and autonomous agents would primarily appeal when attempting to settle fundamental political questions. Once again, the content of public reason may be too thin to settle anything of importance. Moreover, it is unclear that reasonable and autonomous agents would regard as inappropriate a democratic system in which agents bring to the table whatever reasons that seem best to them and vote solely on their basis.
Imagine, for example, a scenario in which citizens of a liberal democracy such as ours must deliberate on an issue of basic justice such as health care reform. One approach these citizens might take is Rawls': they appeal primarily to public reason. Another approach is that they try to forge a consensus about the issue that incorporates features that belong to rather different comprehensive perspectives. According to this latter approach, Jews, Christians, Kantians, Buddhists, and Aristotelians all offer each other the reasons from their own comprehensive perspectives that seem to support health care reform, pointing out to each other the degree to which their reasons overlap. No public reasons are offered, only a plethora of particularistic reasons each of which is reasonably rejected by some citizens. Then the matter is put to a vote. Would an agent who is reasonable and autonomous reject this procedure in favor of appealing to public reason? According to the liberal critics, it is difficult to see why we should believe he would. If so, the connection that Rawls attempts to forge between the exercise of autonomy and public reason is too tight. (In the next section, we discuss a version of ‘public reason liberalism’ that incorporates the basic idea that respect for persons is compatible with each citizen’s offering to one non-shared, non-public reasons for state coercion.)
A final concern is worth airing. Figures such as Philip Quinn, Jeffrey Stout, and Nicholas Wolterstorff interpret Rawls as addressing the issue of how citizens in actual liberal democracies ought to conduct themselves when debating matters of justice and the common good. But there is evidence that Rawls' texts ought not to be read in this way. For, as Rawls indicates at various places, he takes himself to be discussing well-ordered societies. A well-ordered society is such that it contains no egoists, everyone complies with the principles of justice, everyone wants to participate in forms of social life that call forth their own and others' natural talents, treachery and betrayal are absent, and its members want to cooperate with others on terms that are mutually justifiable and affirm only reasonable comprehensive doctrines (Weithman 2012, 65, 162, 169, 310). In short, a well-ordered society is nothing like the actual world but is something approximating a political Utopia.
Suppose Rawls were to establish that in a well-ordered society agents would conform to his favored version of the restrictions on religious reasons. This would not imply that, in those circumstances in which we actually find ourselves, citizens should appeal to his version, thinking of it as a regulatory ideal in their political thinking. Not all ideals, after all, are worth pursuing. It might be, for example, that pursuing the Rawlsian ideal would make it much more difficult for citizens to employ other approaches to political deliberation that would result in a liberal democracy being sufficiently stable for the right reasons, which, says Rawls, should be a primary objective of any liberal democracy. If this were correct, then Rawls's project would have very modest implications for how to think about the relation between religion and public reason, since it would provide little or no guidance for how citizens ought to conduct their behavior (see Cuneo 2013).
7. A Convergent Alternative
Liberal critics of the standard view have not been free of their own critics. We conclude this part of our discussion by articulating one important response.
At the heart of the liberal critics’ conception of religion and public life is a commitment to parity between the religious and the secular: because there are no morally, sociologically, or epistemically relevant differences between religious and secular reasons, religious and secular reasons may play exactly the same role in a citizen’s deliberations or decision-making regarding state coercion. This parity claim seems flatly inconsistent with the DRR – which singles out religious reasons for special, discriminatory treatment. But some theorists have argued that the parity claim, which is so important to the liberal critics, is in fact consistent with a version of the DRR. An argument of this sort has been articulated by Gerald Gaus and Kevin Vallier (Gaus 2012, Gaus and Vallier, 2009, Vallier, 2014).
Gaus and Vallier's argument rests on two central claims. First, state coercion is presumptively wrong; each and every coercive state enactment must be justified by each and every citizen subject to it. By contrast, the lack of any state policy is not presumptively wrong, and so need not be justified – even to citizens whose well-being is affected by the lack of state activity. Second, the reasons by which state coercion is justified need not be shared by (or be accessible to) the citizens who are subject to a given coercive measure. What matters for purposes of the justification of coercion is that each citizen has sufficient reason, as judged from his or her particular perspective, to endorse state coercion. Since this view places no restrictions on the reasons to which an agent might appeal, religious and secular reasons can play exactly the same justificatory role, namely, to defeat what would, in the absence of contrary reasons, be permissible acts of state coercion.
Gaus and Vallier, then, have defended a convergence rather than a consensus account of the standard view. If this account is correct, state coercion must be justifiable to religious citizens as religious believers and when it is not, then state coercion lacks moral legitimacy. The same holds true for non-religious citizens. Although the convergent conception of the standard view accords religious reasons a potentially decisive role in defeating state coercion, and so accords religious reasons a much more prominent role in the justification of state coercion than religious reasons have on most alternative formulations of the standard view, it is also consistent with the DRR. How so?
In any liberal polity, there will inevitably be some secular citizens. If there is nothing to be said from any secular perspective that decisively justifies some coercive measure, and if the only plausible rationale for that coercive measure is a religious rationale, then there will inevitably be some citizens to whom that coercive measure cannot be justified. According to the view under consideration, such a coercive measure would be disrespectful and so illegitimate. So the convergent variation on the standard view maintains the core conviction that religious considerations cannot decisively justify state coercion in pluralistic liberal politics. The implications for the duties of religious citizens seem direct: they ought to restrain themselves from supporting any act of state coercion that they know cannot be justified other than by religious reasons. That is, they must comply with the DRR. If Gaus and Vallier are correct, then, commitment to equal treatment of religion is entirely consistent with a version of the DRR. (Gaus and Vallier, it is worth noting, reject the DRR as an account of the duties of citizens, accepting only a milder version that applies to certain public officials in certain circumstances.)
Although the convergent variation of the standard view will likely be more attractive to liberal critics than familiar alternatives, they still have reason to be skeptical. The convergent conception of the standard view is, after all, demanding: state coercion must pass muster before the bar of religious and secular reasons. However, many citizens will have compelling reasons to reject core liberal commitments. It follows that, according to the convergence view, those liberal commitments will lack justification. If so, liberal critics have reason to reject the convergent view, not because of its implications for religion but for liberalism. Consider in this regard the case of Qtub treated earlier. Qtub seems to have articulated compelling theological objections to the right to religious freedom, and thus articulated compelling theological reasons to deny that the state may coercively enforce that right. In this case, the state's enforcement of the right to religious freedom seems, according to the convergent conception, to lack legitimacy.
8. The New Traditionalism
To this point, we have been primarily concerned to articulate the standard view and lay out the response offered to it by its liberal critics. We have emphasized that there are important differences between these two views. While not trivial, these differences should not be exaggerated, however. Both views are deeply committed to the core components of liberal democracy, including the protection of basic freedoms such as the freedom to practice religion as one sees fit. Furthermore, both views recognize the legitimacy of religious reasons in political deliberation, noting the role of such reasons in important social movements such as the civil rights movement. The main difference between advocates of the standard view and their liberal critics, we've contended, is how they view the justificatory role of these reasons. That said, the liberal critics are not the only or even the most influential critics of the standard view. Indeed, if the central argument of Jeffrey Stout's book Democracy and Tradition is correct, the standard view has generated a worrisome backlash among prominent Christian theologians and political theorists. These theologians and political theorists, who Stout labels the New Traditionalists, reject not only the standard view, but also liberal democracy as such—their assumption being that the standard view is a more or less inevitable outgrowth of liberal democracy. In spite of their fairly radical position, Stout contends that these thinkers need to be taken seriously by the friends of democracy, as they exercise considerable influence in certain sectors of the academy and the culture at large.
Suppose Stout is right to say that New Traditionalists such as John Milbank, Catherine Pickstock, and Stanley Hauerwas are widely influential in the academy and elsewhere. Should they be taken seriously by political philosophers? That depends on what one understands the role of political philosophers to be. Suppose, however, we assume that political philosophers should be multidisciplinary in orientation, engaging with what sociologists, psychologists, and theologians write and say. If we assume this, then taking a multidisciplinary approach in this case seems to make sense. The topic under consideration, after all, is the relation between religion and politics, and theologians have had much to say about their interrelations. Furthermore, while the approach that the New Traditionalists take to our topic is different from that taken by the advocates of the standard view—the New Traditionalists tell a historical narrative about the ills of liberal democracy—the narrative that they tell is a philosophical one. Indeed, it is a narrative whose main lines will be familiar to most philosophers working in ethics and political philosophy. It is natural to want to know whether this historical-philosophical narrative survives philosophical scrutiny. We shall close, then, by considering the narrative that the New Traditionalists tell about the emergence of modern liberal democracies, highlighting the response offered to it by the liberal critics.
8.1 The Declinist Narrative of the New Traditionalism
Those familiar with the work of Alasdair MacIntyre will immediately recognize the New Traditionalists' narrative. For in its broad structure, it bears a close resemblance to the one that MacIntyre tells in his three books After Virtue, Whose Justice? Which Rationality? and Three Rival Versions of Moral Inquiry (MacIntyre 1984, 1988, and 1990, respectively). The MacIntyrean narrative is broadly declinist in character, depicting the degeneration of Western moral and political thought in the following four stages.
In the first stage, the New Traditionalists maintain that the late ancient and the high medieval thinkers of the west embraced a unified philosophical vision that includes three fundamental components. The first component is a commitment to a “thick” teleological account of the human good, according to which human beings have rational natures that can be perfected. The second component is a commitment to the claim that virtue consists in the perfection of our rational nature in both its practical and theoretical dimensions. Practical reason, according to the vision, can ascertain not merely the means to achieve one's ends, but also the very telos or end for human beings. And theoretical reason, so the vision has it, can gain genuine insight into the world by viewing the entire created order as participating in or resembling the divine nature. The third component of the vision is that moral thought and discourse should be framed primarily in terms of the virtues—the virtues providing the dominant conceptuality in terms of which we conduct moral reasoning. To which it is worth adding the following point: advocates of the MacIntyrean narrative do not deny that pre-modern societies had their share of moral, religious, and political problems. Their claim is merely that these societies enjoyed (at least in principle) the shared conceptual resources with which they could coherently address and remedy them.
In the second stage of the narrative, there is a fall into our current fragmented moral and religious condition. Although the New Traditionalists regard different movements and figures as responsible for the fall, they agree on this much: the philosophical vision that unified the societies of pre-modernity fell apart. The teleological worldview was replaced by a nominalist and mechanistic one. Practical reason became instrumentalized—viewed as merely a “slave of the passions,” to use Hume's phrase. And theoretical reason was conceived of as working in a perfectly adequate fashion apart from any commitment to there being a divinely-ordered reality. Furthermore, the language of justice and individual rights supplanted that of virtue. As a result, the state that we now occupy is one in which we no longer enjoy a shared conception of the good, and politics has become—to use MacIntyre's memorable phrase—“civil war by other means.” Without such a conception of the good, we now face all manner of moral, religious, and political problems that we lack the conceptual resources to resolve or even properly understand.
In the third stage of the narrative, New Traditionalists maintain that liberal democracy emerges as the more or less natural political consequence of the fall from the pre-modern state. Liberal democracy, according to the New Traditionalists, is not only a political structure that protects putative individual rights (such as to religious freedom), but is also committed to a broad thesis of neutrality with respect to notions of God and the good. According to this understanding of liberal democracy, the state should not enact laws that require a religious rationale and citizens should therefore comply with the DRR. Given its commitment to neutrality and the DRR, the New Traditionalists claim that liberal democracy is a mode of governance that is fundamentally at odds with the type of traditional religious way of life that informed society during its pre-modern state.
In the final stage of the narrative, New Traditionalists offer proposals of various sorts for how traditionally religious believers should cope with being citizens of a political system whose fundamental commitments are at odds with their own. The proposals are generally not injunctions to transform the liberal state. Rather, they are broadly separatist in nature, exhorting traditional believers to distance themselves from the liberal state, say, by living in small religious communities, which owe their ultimate allegiance to the church or some larger religious tradition. If they are correct, the DRR is both crucial to liberal democracy and an important reason for traditional believers to reject it.
8.2 Two concerns about the narrative
The MacIntyrean narrative is intriguing but highly controversial. Liberal critics have raised the following two objections to it.
The first feature of the narrative to which liberal critics have drawn attention is its highly intellectualized character. If John Milbank and MacIntyre are correct, for example, the fall into secularist liberalism is driven by the influence of some fairly abstract philosophical claims about the nature of reason and existence, which were defended by the medieval philosopher Duns Scotus. By rejecting the broadly Augustinian/Thomistic picture of reason and existence, the New Traditionalists claim, Scotus paved the way for the rise of secularism, which is endemic to contemporary liberal democracies (see Milbank 1990 and MacIntyre 1990, Ch. 7).
Liberal critics maintain that, as a matter of intellectual history, this is not correct. Proponents of broadly Scotistic or anti-theistic views, according to thinkers such as Stout, never had the numbers or clout to change the world as dramatically as New Traditionalists claim. In fact, if Stout is correct, there is a counter-narrative to tell that is at least as plausible as the one that New Traditionalists champion. According to this counter-narrative, we should distinguish two types of secularism: on the one hand, there is secularism as understood by the standard view, which tells us that appeal to religious reasons in public political discourse is insufficient to justify coercive laws. On the other, there is broadly pluralistic secularism, which tells us merely that participants in public political discourse are not in a position to assume that their interlocutors are making the same religious assumptions that they are. Stout maintains that liberal democracy is committed only to secularism of the second sort. Indeed, even critics of the standard view who affirm liberal democracy on religious grounds, such as Wolterstorff, grant that liberal democracy is secular in Stout's second, pluralistic sense. Certainly, the liberal critics maintain, there is nothing about liberalism that commits it to a version of secularism in which the liberal state is an anti-Christian ecclesia or an alternate vehicle for salvation, as some New Traditionalists have claimed (see, for example, Milbank, et al. 1999, 192).
Suppose that the liberal critics are correct in their contention that liberal democracy is committed only to pluralistic secularism. Is this commitment the upshot of a broadly Scotistic view about reason and existence having taken root in modernity? If thinkers such as Stout and Wolterstorff are correct, the answer to this question is also: no. Rather, both Stout and Wolterstorff suggest that liberal democracy's commitment to secularism is the result of Christians themselves recognizing that post-Reformation Christianity itself had become so fragmented that Christians could no longer appeal to scripture and tradition in public discourse under the assumption that their interlocutors would share their views regarding scripture and tradition (see Zagorin 2003).
In support of this contention, Stout appeals to the historian Christopher Hill who maintains that in 17th century English parliamentary politics, one increasingly finds members of parliament appealing rather less to scripture when engaging in public political discourse and rather more to considerations upon which they and their interlocutors could agree. According to this counter-narrative, “secularization was not primarily brought about by the triumph of a secularist ideology….What drove the secularization of political discourse forward was the increasing need to cope with religious plurality discursively on a daily basis under circumstances where improved transportation and communication were changing the political and economic landscape” (Stout 2004, 102). To which Stout adds that secularization (in the second, pluralistic sense specified earlier) thus understood doesn't morally or pragmatically preclude citizens from voicing their religious convictions in the public square. Martin Luther King Jr.'s appeals to religious considerations, for example, were highly politically effective.
The first worry regarding the New Traditionalists' declinist narrative, then, is that it is overly intellectualized, portraying the rise of secularism as owing primarily to the influence of philosophical ideas and not to more mundane sociological facts, such as the need to cope with increasing religious pluralism. The second worry about the narrative is that the New Traditionalists misdiagnose the character of liberal democracy, attributing to its advocates commitments that they needn't accept. To better understand this worry, recall the pattern of argument that the New Traditionalists employ, which is roughly the following:
Liberalism is committed to various philosophical claims and practices that are incompatible with orthodox theism (or at least orthodox theism in its best forms, such as Thomism).
So, orthodox theists should reject liberalism.
What are some of the claims and practices that fit poorly with orthodox theism and to which liberalism is committed? If the New Traditionalists are correct, at least these two: first, liberalism tells us that political systems should be neutral regarding various notions of God and the good; they should not operate with an account of an overriding good for human beings in whose light subsidiary goods can be ordered. Second, liberalism is committed to the claim that moral and political discourse should be couched not primarily in terms of the virtues, but individual rights. This, say the New Traditionalists has rendered liberal democracies a breeding ground for citizens who are individualistic, self-focused, and whose views and behavior are destructive of community. According to the New Traditionalists, these two claims are connected. It is because liberal democracies do not operate with a thick notion of the good that the language of rights has supplanted that of virtue. For in order for the language of the virtues to be intelligible, it must be grounded in a thick account of the good.
When properly qualified, liberal critics such as Stout are willing to grant the first of these claims: liberalism does not in fact operate with a thick notion of the good. But they reject the further claim that this has rendered appeal to the virtues in a liberal democracy irrelevant or somehow deeply conceptually confused. For consider, Stout argues, champions of liberalism within the broadly pragmatist tradition, such as Walt Whitman and John Dewey. These thinkers do not fit well into the MacIntyrean paradigm. At their best, Stout maintains, Whitman and Dewey consciously theorize from the perspective of a broadly pragmatic tradition that is committed to the centrality of the virtues, albeit within a society characterized by competing and rival conceptions of God and the good.
More specifically, Stout maintains that according to pragmatist liberals such as Dewey, good citizens of a liberal democracy aspire to express not only civility and respect in public political discourse, but also to accept some measure of responsibility for the conditions of society and the political arrangements it makes for itself. And to do this, citizens must reason with one another about the ethical issues that divide them and hold each other responsible, in ways that are decent and fair, for what is done and said. If the pragmatist liberals are right, reasoning of this sort requires that citizens of liberal democracies display virtues of various sorts, such as openness to the views of others, proper respect for their positions, and so forth. In an inversion of the MacIntyrean position, Stout contends that it is at least in part because liberal democracies do not espouse some overarching, thick conception of the good that virtues such as civility and respect are especially called for. And, particularly important for our discussion is Stout's further claim that pragmatism of this variety needn't lend any support to the standard view. Expressing the virtues of civility and respect is perfectly compatible with appealing only to religious considerations when making and supporting political decisions.
So, if the liberal critics are correct, one place to press the New Traditionalists' narrative is its claim that only within a thick, overarching account of the human good are the virtues intelligible. There is, however, a second place to press the narrative, which is its skepticism about rights. As intimated earlier, MacIntyre and the New Traditionalists portray individual rights claims as both false and dangerous, indeed, as the upshot of an Enlightenment conception of morality that is inimical to a properly religious way of life (see MacIntyre 1984 and 1983). MacIntyre, for example, writes that not only are rights claims on par with belief in “witches and unicorns,” but also that:
there is no expression in any ancient or medieval language correctly translated by our expression ‘a right’ until near the close of the middle ages: the concept lacks any means of expression in Hebrew, Greek, Latin, or Arabic, classical or medieval, before about 1400, let alone in Old English or Japanese even as late as the mid-nineteenth century. (MacIntyre 1984, 69)
In reply, the liberal critics make two points. First, as a matter of historical fact, it is simply false that rights claims have their conceptual roots in the soil of late medieval nominalism and Enlightenment morality, as MacIntyre claims. Rather, as Wolterstorff argues, appeals to rights are ubiquitous throughout history. One can find them, for example, in the ancient Romans juridical documents such as Justinian's Digest, the writings of the church fathers, and the work of the medieval canon lawyers. Indeed, according to Wolterstorff, appeals to what we call inherent or natural human rights can be traced back to the Hebrew and Christian scriptures (see Wolterstorff 2008, Pts. I-II). If Wolterstorff is correct, the scriptural tradition not only birthed our conception of inherent human rights, but also provides the conceptual soil most conducive to its survival, for it offers the most cogent account of the worth of human beings. If this is true, according to Wolterstorff, there is no incompatibility between the liberal tradition's reliance on rights and a commitment to orthodox theism. To reject liberalism because it is committed to and relies heavily on the notion of rights would be a mistake.
Second, the liberal critics contend that any connection between the appeals to rights in liberalism, on the one hand, and a tendency toward individualism in its citizens, on the other, is highly contingent. Perhaps it is true that contemporary liberal democracies have in fact had a strong tendency to promote individualism, where this is understood as a person's having a distorted focus on her rights to the exclusion of her obligations and responsibilities to others. But if we construe a liberal democracy minimally, as a political structure that effectively protects a certain schedule of individual rights (to religious freedom, speech, due process, and the like), it is plausible to suppose that exclusive focus on individual rights is itself a betrayal of liberalism. After all, claim-rights almost always have correlative obligations: if you have a right to religious freedom, then I have an obligation not to violate that right. Furthermore, I also have an obligation to take feasible measures to support political institutions that protect that right. Any understanding of a liberal democracy according to which citizens may insist on their rights without due regard for the obligations they bear to others and social institutions that protect these rights is arguably both incoherent and a betrayal of basic liberal commitments. Thinkers such as Wolterstorff add that for theists who affirm liberal democracy, it is natural to suppose that citizens who ignore their obligations to respect the rights of their compatriots thereby also violate God's rights. For, according to these thinkers, God has a right to be obeyed, and God demands that we respect the worth of each human being. If the liberal critics are correct, then, any individualism that attends liberal democracy is a corruption. Perhaps it is a corruption to which liberal democracies are prone; but individualism is neither a liberal commitment nor, if thinkers such as Stout and Wolterstorff are correct, an inevitable manifestation of liberal commitments.
The liberal critics, then, are highly suspicious of the New Traditionalists' narrative and the philosophical lessons they glean from it. But suppose, for argument's sake, that the narrative is largely compelling. Even if it is compelling, the liberal critics insist that the New Traditionalists have ignored an important option, viz., a minimalist account of liberal democracy. According to this position, liberalism is committed to the following pair of theses. First, the state is to be neutral with respect to different conceptions of the good. The neutrality in question, however, is inclusive in nature. It does not rule out the appeal to comprehensive conceptions of the good when making fundamental political decisions. Rather, it only rules out the claim that the state is committed to promoting one such conception. Second, the state is to protect a schedule of basic rights and liberties enjoyed by all its citizens. Its role is to ensure that its citizens can enjoy such goods as freedom of religion, freedom of conscience, and equality before the law.
The liberal critics maintain that a view such as this deserves serious consideration by both defenders of the standard view and orthodox religious believers. The challenge that liberal critics such as Stout and Wolterstorff pose to New Traditionalists in particular is this: Given that moral and religious pluralism are here to stay, why would Christians and other people of faith want to reject minimal liberal democracy—liberal democracy shorn of its commitment to the standard view? What morally feasible alternative is there to a political order in which the state employs its coercive powers to protect the rights of each of its citizens?
Proponents of the New Traditionalism find this attempt on the part of the liberal critics to marry liberal democracy with traditional religious belief naïve. If they are right, any political system that professes neutrality with respect to conceptions of God and the good is unacceptable. At best, it will be inhospitable soil for a genuinely virtuous and religious way of life. At worst, any such system will be an attempt to conceal the fact that the deep structure of liberal democracy, with its emphasis on personal freedoms and procedural justice, fits poorly with the thick account of the good that orthodox religious believers endorse. According to these thinkers, the conflict between liberal democracy and traditional religion runs too deep for appeals to minimalist accounts of liberalism to be effective.
The theologico-political problem is one that concerns the problem of political authority. In its contemporary form, it primarily concerns the justification of authoritative political acts, such as the implementation of coercive laws. Can religious reasons justify the implementation of such laws? This is the central question with which political philosophers have been concerned. The standard view tells us that religious reasons are never sufficient to justify coercive law. It therefore champions the DRR, or the claim that, if a citizen is trying to determine whether or not she should support some coercive law, and if she believes that there is no plausible secular rationale for it, then it is impermissible for her to support that law. The main responses to the standard view divides into two types. Liberal critics of the view hold fast to the principles of liberal democracy but reject the DRR—in part for the reason that the DRR is illiberal. New Traditionalists, by contrast, reject both liberal democracy itself and the DRR, viewing the latter as more or less a component of the former. (On this latter point, they agree with advocates of the standard view.)
Is there likely to be any sort of rapprochement between these views? It is difficult to know. Sometimes, however, positions that occupy the conceptual middle-ground in a debate are the best candidates for unifying what can appear to be irreconcilable positions. In the case at hand, the liberal critics appear to occupy this conceptual middle-ground, straddling the standard view and the New Traditionalism. On the one hand, the liberal critics find themselves sympathetic with the political commitments of the standard view but not with the wariness about religion that often animates this position. On the other hand, the liberal critics find themselves sympathetic with some of the religious commitments embraced by the New Traditionalists but not with their suspicion of liberal democracy. Nevertheless, the liberal critics are vulnerable to criticisms from both sides. Advocates of the standard view will charge that they do not take seriously enough the destructive and divisive effects of religion, hard to quantify as they might be. And friends of the New Traditionalism will maintain that they fail to recognize the corrosive effects of liberal democracy on traditional religious ways of life. These are important criticisms, married to passions that deeply divide the proponents of these views. Still, members of all parties to the debate agree that the task at hand is to articulate ways in which citizens of a deeply pluralistic liberal democracy can conduct their behavior in manners that are not only faithful to whatever religious identities they may have, but are also just and contribute to the common good.
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- Boise Center for Religion and American Public Life, at Boston College
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Thanks to David Billings, Rebecca Konyndyk DeYoung, Kevin Vallier, Paul Weithman, Lori Wilson, and several anonymous referees for their helpful feedback on earlier drafts of this essay.