Richard the Sophister

First published Wed Aug 4, 1999; substantive revision Sat Nov 26, 2016

Richard the Sophister (Richardus Sophista) was an English philosopher/logician who studied at Oxford most likely sometime during the second quarter of the thirteenth century. Richard's identity is uncertain, but he is known to be the author of a collection of logically puzzling sentences, sometimes called “sophisms”, entitled Abstractiones. The puzzling aspect of these sophisms is variously caused by semantic or syntactic ambiguities involved in certain logical or “syncategorematic” words such as “all”, “every”, “or”, “if…then”, “and”, “not”, “begins”, “ceases”, “except”, “necessary”, “possible”, etc.

1. Abstractiones

The title “Abstractiones” was apparently meant to capture the “excerpted” nature of this collection of sophisms that are presented in a somewhat summary fashion.[1] This collection of sophisms became a kind of logical textbook used to teach students to identify sophistical fallacies. This book was probably used in several medieval universities for several decades, from the late thirteenth well into the fourteenth centuries. Richard is often referred to as “Magister Abstractionum” or “Magister Richardus Sophista” to give emphasis to the masterful, albeit summary, treatment of a very large collection of over three hundred such sophism sentences.[2] The title “sophista” simply meant “logician”.

The seven known manuscripts of the Abstractiones date from the late thirteenth to the early fourteenth centuries:[3]

Ms B = Brugge, Stedelike Bibliotheek, 497
Ms C = Oxford, Corpus Christi College, E 293B
Ms D = Oxford, Bodleian Library, Digby 24
Ms K = København, Det Kongelige Bibliotek, Fragm.1075
Ms O = Oxford, Bodleian Library, Digby 2
Ms P = Paris, Bibliothèque Nationale lat. 14069
Ms R = London, British Library, Royal 12.F.xix

Only two of these manuscripts (B, D) are complete; the remaining five are in varying degrees of fragmentation. Two manuscripts (O, R) appear to be derivative texts, or redactions, of the Abstractiones.

The dating of the composition of the Abstractiones appears to have been around the 1230's or 40's. Earliest references to the Abstractiones appear from the late thirteenth century in a manuscript at Worcester Cathedral Library, Q. 13, which is confidently dated no later than 1295, and probably as early as 1270.[4] Worcester Q. 13 contains four references to the “Magister Abstractionum.” Another reference to the Abstractiones can be found in a Quodlibetal Question of William of Alnwick, “Does God know infinitely many things (Utrum Deus cognoscat infinita)?”, q. 9 probably dating from around 1320. Walter Burley's tract, De Exceptivis, edited by L. M. de Rijk, contains a reference to the Magister Abstractionum.[5] An interesting reference can also be found in William of Ockham's Summa Logicae and additional references can be found in Ps. Richard of Campsall, John of Reading and Adam Wodeham.[6]

The fact of the existence of two derivative texts of the Abstractiones as well as the numerous known references by accomplished logicians some seventy years after its composition indicate that the Abstractiones was a quite popular book that survived the test of time. Although as compared to sophism literature of the fourteenth century Richard's analysis of sophisms appears somewhat unsophisticated, as compared to treatments of sophisms of his contemporaries Richard's analyses are qualitatively similar. Richard's greatest accomplishment lay, perhaps, in his ability to encapsulate and summarize a huge number of such logical puzzles, presenting for the student a handy reference book filled with examples of a host of logical fallacies.

An edition of Richard's Abstractiones finally appeared in 2016, edited by Sten Ebbesen, Mary Sirridge, and E. Jennifer Ashworth, published by Oxford University Press in the series Auctores Britannici Medii Aevi.

2. Examples of Sophisms

In order to give the reader a better understanding of the content of this book of Abstractiones, it might be helpful to list a few examples of the sophism sentences discussed in it and to illustrate Richard's treatment of just one of these. As noted above, our book contains over three hundred sophism sentences. A random sampling includes these examples:

(1) Every man is every man (Omnis homo est omnis homo)

(16) Whatever exists or does not exist exists (Quicquid est vel non est est)

(39) Everything other than an animal which plus Socrates are two differs from Socrates (Omne aliud quam animal quod et Sortes sunt duo differt a Sorte)

(79) The whole Socrates is less than Socrates (Totus Sortes est minor Sorte)

(96) If you know that you are a stone you do not know that you are a stone (Si tu scis te esse lapidem tu non scis te esse lapidem)

(157) Nothing is true about nothing (De nihilo nihil est verum)

(187) You have not ceased to eat iron (Tu non cessas comedere ferrum)

(215) All ten except one are nine (Omnia X praeter unum sunt IX)

(278) It is impossible that you know more than you know (Impossibile est te scire plura quam scis)

From the above rather small list of sophisms, it can already be noticed that some sentences are more complex, and thus more logically puzzling, than others. Some sentences do not seem puzzling in themselves at all, but become puzzling only within a certain “context” that is set up within which arguments proving and disproving the sophism must be developed. Such a context was called a “casus”.[7] It seems likely that the proving and disproving of the sophism sentence was done along the lines of a medieval oral “disputatio” within the classroom setting. This is the way Richard writes up his summaries: Proposal of the sophism, sometimes within a casus; arguments establishing the truth of the sentence; arguments establishing the falsity of the sentence; resolution of the sophism along with identification of the sophistical fallacy involved.

The very first sophism sentence treated is one of the least complicated (this sophism involves no casus):

Every man is every man

Proof: This man is this man, that man is that man and so forth for each individual man, therefore every man is every man.

Another proof: No proposition is more true than one in which the same thing is predicated of the same thing….

Disproof: This proposition is true, “some man is not every man” and, similarly, “no man is every man”; therefore it is false that every man is every man.

Solution: The solution to the sophism is to note that “every man” is equivocal as to reference to every man taken singularly (as in “any man”) and as to every man taken as a whole (as in “all men”). Mixing the two senses of “every” from subject to predicate causes the logical puzzle.

As noted, this sophism sentence is relatively uncomplicated and it is easy to spot the obvious fallacy involved, but Richard's text proceeds with increasingly more difficult and intricate sophism sentences, many of which engage the mind in complex mental acrobatics. The fallacies noted throughout are the standard ones discussed in Aristotle's De Sophisticis Elenchis: the fallacy of equivocation; the fallacy of accident; the fallacy of the composite and divided senses; the fallacy of the consequent; the fallacy of absolute and qualified senses; the fallacy of many causes of truth; amphiboly; improper supposition.

3. Richard's Identity

There is still no certainty as to the identity of the Magister Abstractionum. Because of the colophon appended to the two complete manuscripts of the Abstractiones, we know, of course, that his name was “Richard”:

Expliciunt ista, quae tu, Ricarde Sophista,
fecesti, morum flos et doctor logicorum.
Dirige scribentis, Spiritus alme, manum.
Expliciunt Abstractiones
(Digby 24, f.90rb)

(These [sophisms] are complete, which you, Richard the Sophister,
Flower of virtue and teacher of logic, have produced.
Turn the scribe's hand [from its task], nurturing Spirit.
The Abstractiones are complete.)

De Rijk suggested the name Richard Fishacre, disagreeing with the suggestion of Richard Fitz-Ralph offered by Macray on the basis that the dating of the text within the second quarter of the thirteenth century is more consistent with Fishacre's chronology.[8] Jan Pinborg suggested the name Richard Rufus also on grounds that the dating of the Abstractiones is consistent with Rufus' being at Oxford.[9] It is generally assumed that the author is English. Pinborg offered one further bit of evidence for the name Richard Rufus in that there is some reason to think that certain doctrines of Richard Rufus, as criticised by Roger Bacon, are in the Abstractiones. The primary doctrine in question attributed to Richard Rufus and criticised by Roger Bacon is, in general terms, that the signification of a name can remain in the absence of any actual thing signified by that name, although, as Bacon suggests, the proponents of this view must supply some kind of “habitual being” for the lost actual significate of such names. It is this doctrine of the “esse habituale” that Bacon finds objectionable. That Richard Rufus does seem to have such a doctrine appears clear in his discussion of the question “Whether Christ while three days in the tomb was a man” (“Utrum Christus in triduo mortis fuerit homo”) in distinction 22, book III of his Sentences Commentary.[10]

It would be beyond the scope of this essay to deal with the complexities of both Richard Rufus' treatment of this question as well as Roger Bacon's voiceful criticisms of the notion of the “esse habituale.” The important question here is whether the doctrine espoused by Richard Rufus exactly parallels anything that can be found in the Abstractiones of Richard the Sophister. It is important to find not only terminological similarities but also doctrinal similarities. The terminology within which Richard Rufus makes the above noted distinction is “esse in habitu” versus “esse in actu”, the former he also labels “esse simpliciter”, the latter “esse ut nunc.”[11] Bacon seems to substitute the expression “esse habituale” for the expression “esse in habitu.” Rufus does not use the expression “esse habituale.” As referenced above, Pinborg noticed the expressions “esse consequentiae sive habitudinis” and “esse quod est operatio entis” in the Abstractiones. Bacon also uses the expression “esse habitudinis”, but he seems to recognize a distinction between “esse habituale” and “esse habitudinis”; the latter, he says, “is used about propositions and will be destroyed later when there is talk about propositions.”[12] This remark might indicate that Bacon finds the same doctrinal problem with the “esse habitudinis” that he finds with the “esse habituale” (i.e., it introduces a foil for some kind of fictive being), but we cannot be certain of this, since he never returned to this topic in the Compendium. Richardus Sophista does not use the terminology of “esse habituale/esse actuale”, “esse in habitu/esse in actu” that we find in Bacon and Rufus respectively.[13] Pinborg also noted that William of Ockham criticizes those who make the distinction between “esse consequentiae sive habitudinis” and “esse quod est operatio entis” as ignorant of the simple distinction between hypothetical and categorical propositions, which according to Ockham is all that the distincition amounts to.[14] Pinborg sees Ockham's criticism as possibly making the same point as Bacon, i.e., the terminology invites some kind of talk of fictive being. Although Ockham is probably right to want to eliminate the old terminology in favor of less problematic language, the important questions are whether Richard the Sophister's use of the distinction “esse habitudinis/esse quod est operatio entis” entails anything other than a distinction between types of propositions and whether his use of the distinction comes under the attacks of Roger Bacon on the same way in which these attacks seem relevant to a terminologically similar distinction in Richard Rufus.

A complete answer to these questions would require not only a detailed examination of the use of this distinction in the resolution of sophisms in the Abstractiones, but also an examination of Richard's position regarding terms that “assert non-being” and his account of negation and negatives generally.[15] These tasks are clearly beyond the scope of this essay. With respect to the first question, it will have to suffice to record here that there are only three places in the Abstractiones where Richard employs the distinction in the resolution of sophisms and in none of these is it clear that this is his favored solution.[16] More importantly, Richard's use of the distinction in the resolution of sophisms seems to match the use made of the same distinction (under the terminology “esse habituale/esse actuale”) by William of Sherwood, that is, as essentially a way of marking a distinction between hypothetical and categorical propositions.[17] It has been successfully argued by Braakhuis that the attacks of Roger Bacon do not apply to William's use of the distinction, even though, of all the authors noted so far, only William's terminology is exactly the same terminology used by Bacon.[18] Thus, if the doctrine under attack by Bacon cannot be attributed to William, neither can it be attributed to Richard the Sophister. It appears, then, that Richard Rufus and Richard the Sophister cannot be identified, at least on the basis of these alleged doctrinal and terminological similarities.


  • Braakhuis, H.A.G., 1981, “English Tracts on Syncategorematic Terms from Robert Bacon to Walter Burley” in English Logic and Semantics, Artistarium, Supplementa 1, Nijmegen.
  • Ebbesen, Sten, 1987, “Talking about what is no more. Texts by Peter of Cornwall, Richard of Clive, Simon of Faversham and Radulphus Brito,” Cahiers de l'Institut du Moyen-Âge Grec et Latin 55, Copenhagen.
  • Ebbesen, S., Sirridge, M. and Streveler, P., 2003, “The Pupils of the Master of Abstractions: Abstractiones Digbeianae, Regiae et Venetae”, Cahiers de l'Institut du Moyen-Age Grec et Latin 74, Copenhagen.
  • Kopp, Clemens, 1985, Die “Fallaciae ad modum Oxoniae,” Ein Fehlschlußtraktat aus dem 13 Jahrhundert, dissertaion, Köln.
  • Kretzmann, Norman, et al., (eds.), 1982, The Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy, Cambridge.
  • Lewry, P.O. (ed.), 1985, The Rise of British Logic: Acts of the Sixth European Symposium on Medieval Logic and Semantics , Papers in Mediaeval Studies 7, Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, Toronto.
  • de Libera, Alain, 1986, “Les Abstractiones d'Herve le Sophiste (Hervaeus Sophista),” Archives d'Histoire Doctrinale et Littéraire du Moyen Âge, Paris, 163–230.
  • –––, 1985, “La Littérature de Abstractiones et la Tradition Logique d'Oxford” in Lewry 1985.
  • Macray, G.D., 1883, Catalogi Codicum Manuscriptorum Bibliotecae Bodleianae, Pars Nona, Oxford.
  • Master Richard Sophista, 2016, Abstractiones, edited by Sten Ebbesen, Mary Sirridge, and E. Jennifer Ashworth, Auctores Britannici Medii Aevi 25, Oxford.
  • O'Donnell, J.R., 1941, “The Syncategoremata of William of Sherwood,” Mediaeval Studies 3, 46–93.
  • Pinborg, Jan, 1976, “Magister Abstractionum,” Cahiers de l'Institut du Moyen-Âge Grec et Latin 18, Copenhagen, 1–4.
  • Raedts, Peter, 1987, Richard Rufus of Cornwall and the Tradition of Oxford Theology, Oxford.
  • Read, Stephen (ed.), 1993, Sophisms in Medieval Logic and Grammar, Acts of the 8th European Symposium for Medieval Logic and Semantics, Kluwer.
  • de Rijk, L. M., 1962–67, Logica Modernorum, I–II, van Gorcum, Assen.
  • –––, 1974, “Some Thirteenth Century Tracts on the Game of Obligation,” Vivarium 12.
  • –––, 1985, “Walter Burley's Tract ‘de Exclusivis’. An Edition,” Vivarium 23, 23–54.
  • –––, 1986, “Walter Burley's Tract ‘de Exceptivis’. An Edition,” Vivarium 24, 22–49.
  • Spade, Paul Vincent, 1982, “Obligations: Developments in the Fourteenth Century” in Kretzmann, et al. 1982.
  • Stump, Eleonore, 1982, “Obligations: From the Beginning to the Early Fourteenth Century” in Kretzmann, et al. 1982.
  • Streveler, Paul A., 1993, “A Comparative Analysis of the Treatment of Sophisms in MSS Digby 2 and Royal 12 of the Magister Abstractionum,” in Read 1993.

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Copyright © 2016 by
Paul Streveler

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