Notes to Richard the Sophister

1. In Albert of Saxony's introductory remarks regarding the exceptive term “tantum” in his Perutilis Logica we read this definition of the term “abstractio”: “Abstractio est dubitabilium propositionum collectio (An abstraction is a collection of puzzling propositions)” (Erfurt ms., Amploniana, Cod. Q 242, f. 33v). This section of Albert's treatise is not edited in the 1518 Venice edition. The only other known treatise from the Middle Ages with the title “Abstractiones” is that of a certain Hervaeus Sophista, edited in de Libera 1986. The term “abstractio”, then, seems to refer to a “collection” of sophisms, perhaps with some emphasis upon the “excerpted” nature of such a collection. Indeed, the collection of Hervaeus consists of some 298 sophisms within a space of a mere five folios. Richard considers some 305 sophisms within a space of almost thirty folios in the Digby 24 manuscript.

2. De Rijk 1962–67, Vol. II, pt 1., 62–85 and 444–447.

3. For a description of manuscripts B, D, O, P and R see de Rijk 1962–67. De Rijk was unaware of manuscripts C and K. For a brief description of the C manuscript, see P.O. Lewry, “Oxford Logic 1250–1275: Nicholas and Peter of Cornwall,” in Lewry 1985, 22. For additional descriptions of these manuscripts, see Raedts 1987, 107–111.

4. Ebbesen 1987, 136 and Lewry 1985. The manuscript is dated 1295, but Lewry remarks that the author uses the example “Henricus est rex Angliae”, and Henry died in 1272. Thus the reference to the Magister Abstractionum could be as early as the 1270's.

5. De Rijk 1986: 27.

6. William of Ockham, Summa Logicae, ed. Philotheus Boehner, Gideon Gál, and Stephen Brown (St. Bonaventure, N.Y. 1974), 367. Although this appears to be the only place where Ockham refers explicitly to the Magister Abstractionum, the editors point to other places where they believe he clearly has the Magister in mind (e.g., Summa Logicae III-1, c.16, 405; II, c. 4, 262). For references in Campsall, John of Reading and Adam Wodeham, see the Introduction to the Summa Logicae, 51*, n. 17.

7. The setting up of “contexts (casus)” within which proponents and opponents were obliged to develop their respective arguments gave rise to a special genre of sophism literature called “obligationes”. We note the techniques of “obligatio” especially in the development of sophisms towards the end of the Abstractiones. For a discussion of the historical development of obligations, see Stump 1982 and Spade 1982.

8. De Rijk 1962–67, Vol. II, 71.

9. Pinborg 1976, 1–4.

10. The text of this question can be found in Franz Pelster, “Der Oxforder Theologie Richardus Rufus O.F.M. über die Frage, ‘Utrum Christus in triduo mortis fuerit homo’”, Recherches de Théologie Ancienne et Médiévale, 16 (1949), 259–280. For Bacon's discussion, see Thomas S. Maloney (ed. & tr.), Roger Bacon, Compendium of the Study of Theology, Studien und Texte zur Geistesgeschichte des Mittelalters 20, (Leiden: E. J. Brill, 1988), par. 86–101.

11. Pelster 1949: p. 279, ll. 136–144.

12. Bacon, Compendium, trans. Maloney 1988: par. 103: “Sed adhuc cavillant de esse habitudinis, sed hoc in propositione habet locum, et ideo destruetur postea, cum de propositionibus fiet sermo”. It is worth noting here that Maloney translates “esse habituale” and “esse habitudinis” identically as “habitual being”, but there is warrant from Bacon himself that these are different notions and, perhaps, therefore, should be translated differently.

13. In connection with this terminology, Lewry (1985, p. 22) incorrectly transcribes C 283B at folio 207va as “esse habituale sive commune”, (thus perhaps seeing the terminology found in Bacon's criticism of Rufus) whereas the scribe of the Abstractiones clearly writes “esse habitudinis sive consequentiae”.

14. Ockham, (ed. Boehner et al.,) p. 263.

15. Especially relevant here would be a study of the sophism OMNIS PHOENIX EST, where Lewry (1985) p. 22, sees possible evidence of the Magister adopting notions criticized by Bacon.

16. These are in connection with the following sophisms: (1) OMNE COLORATUM EST: The distinction is introduced as a way of explaining a perceived mistake in one of the arguments in the disproof of the sophism, i.e., “Omne coloratum est. Omne album est coloratum. Ergo omne album est”. It is said that this argument equivocates upon “esse”, for in the first premiss it is “esse operatio entis”, whereas in the second it is “esse habitudinis sive consequentiae”. Richard goes on to interpret the former categorically, the latter hypothetically. Ockham's criticisms (noted above) seem relevant here in that equivocation is a semantic fallacy, whereas the propositional distinction is essentially syntactic. As Ockham notes, any proposition can be turned into one or the other. The important observation, however, is that Richard is not adopting the distinction as a favored solution to the sophism itself, but only as what some people say about a mistake in the disproof of an argument. (2) OMNIS HOMO DE NECESSITATE EST ANIMAL: Here too he offers multiple solutions to the sophism, the second of which is again to note the fallacy of equivocation in connection with “esse”, as above. Here, however, it seems clear that this is not his favored solution to the sophism. Rather he argues the sophism is best solved through application of the composite and divided senses of “necessitas”. (3) OMNIS ASINUS EST HOMO: Here the distinction is offered again as an explanation of a kind of equivocation between two premises of the argument, as in: “Omne animal est homo. Omnis asinus est animal. Ergo omnis asinus est homo”.

17. The distinction can be found in Norman Kretzmann (tr.), William of Sherwood's Introduction to Logic, (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1966), 125–126, and Kretzmann (tr.), William of Sherwood's Treatise on Syncategorematic Words, (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1968), 92–93.

18. Braakhuis 1981, 145–149.

Copyright © 2016 by
Paul Streveler

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