Notes to Units and Levels of Selection

1. These are questions addressed by a number of researchers, including Austin Booth, Robert Brandon, Richard Dawkins, John Dupré, Marcus Feldman, Andy Gardner, Scott Gilbert, Peter Godfrey-Smith, Charles Goodnight, Alan Grafen, James Griesemer, David Hull, Ben Kerr, Philip Kitcher, Richard Lewontin, Sandra Mitchell, Maureen O’Malley, Samir Okasha, Alex Rosenberg, Eugene Rosenberg, Ayelet Shavit, Deborah Shelton, John Maynard Smith, Elliott Sober, Kim Sterelny, Elisabeth Vrba, Michael Wade, Ken Waters, Stuart West, George C. Williams, David S. Wilson, Edward O. Wilson, William Wimsatt, Sewall Wright, Ilana Zilber-Rosenberg, and many others.

2. Methods of relating interactor traits with genotypic or genic fitness include those of Arnold & Fristrup 1982; Heisler & Damuth 1987; Damuth & Heisler 1988, Sober & Wilson 1998; Wade 1985. Other approaches include Colwell 1981; Craig 1982; Crow & Aoki 1982; Crow & Kimura 1970; Hamilton 1975; Lande & Arnold 1983; Li 1967; Lloyd 1988; Ohta 1983; Price 1972; Uyenoyama 1979; Uyenoyama & Feldman 1980; Wade 1978, 1980; Wade & Breden 1981; Wade & McCauley 1980; D.S. Wilson 1983; D.S. Wilson & Colwell 1981; Wimsatt 1980a,b. See discussion of some of the model differences in Lloyd [1988] 1994; Okasha 2004a,c. See Sober & Wilson 1994, 1998 and Okasha 2006 for extended discussions.

3. See Aoki 1982; Boorman & Levitt 1973; Fisher 1930; Ghiselin 1974; Leigh 1977; Levin & Kilmer 1974; Maynard Smith 1964, 1976; Uyenoyama 1979; Williams 1966.

4. Examples of suggested techniques within the philosophical community include Brandon’s use of Salmon’s notion of screening off (1982, 1990), Lloyd on contextual analysis, and the work by Wimsatt and Lloyd on the additivity approach (Wimsatt 1980a,b; Lloyd [1988] 1994; see Sarkar 1994 and Godfrey-Smith 1992 for criticisms of this last approach, and Wade & Griesemer 1998 and Okasha 2004a and 2006 for a partial defense of it). Biologists have also suggested a variety of statistical techniques for addressing this issue. See, for example, the work of Arnold and Fristrup, Heisler and Damuth, David Sloan Wilson, and Wade (Arnold & Fristrup 1982, Heisler & Damuth 1987, Damuth & Heisler 1988, D.S. Wilson & Colwell 1981, and Wade 1985, 2016 respectively).

5. Lewontin 1970, 1974; Franklin & Lewontin 1970; Slatkin 1972; see discussion in Wimsatt 1980a, Brandon 1982.

6. Brandon (1985) argues that such a view, which separates the level of adaptation from that of beneficiary, cannot be explanatory. Although I sympathize with Brandon’s conclusions, they follow only under his set of definitions, which Dawkins and other genic selectionists would certainly reject.

7. For explicit assumptions that being a unit of selection involves having an adaptation at that level, see Brandon 1982, 1985; Burian 1983; Mitchell 1987; Maynard Smith 1976; Vrba 1984.

8. For example, Williams 1966, Bock 1980, Dunbar 1982, Ghiselin 1974, Gould & Lewontin 1979, Hull 1980, Lewontin 1978, Mayr 1978.

9. Note that Williams says that “natural selection would produce or maintain adaptation as a matter of definition” (1966: 25; cf. Mayr 1976). This comment conflicts with the conclusions Williams draws in his discussion of Waddington; however Williams later retracts his bithorax analysis (1985). Williams is committed to an engineering definition of adaptation (personal communication 1989).

10. For example, Heisler & Damuth 1987; Damuth & Heisler 1988; Slatkin & Wade 1978; Uyenoyama 1979; Uyenoyama & Feldman 1980; Wade 1978, 1985; D.S. Wilson 1975, 1983. See Goodnight & Stevens 1997 for review.

11. “The inclusive fitness method uses the approach of optimizing fitness, and thus is appropriate when the details of the evolutionary rates are either equal or unknown. The multilevel selection approach attacks the evolution of altruism as a competing rates problem. This approach will often be best in experimental situations because the strength of group and individual selection can be directly measured using contextual analysis, and the problem can be solved even if the “optimal” phenotype is not experimentally knowable” (Goodnight 2013: 1545.

12. As G.C. Williams himself has acknowledged, in a discussion on species selection:

The answer to all these difficulties must be Lloyd’s…idea that higher levels of selection depend, not on emergent characters, but on any and all emergent fitnesses. (1992: 27)

13. Dawkins 1982b: 81, my emphasis; see pp. 4, 5, 52, 84, 91, 113, 114. Compare an alternative formulation of Dawkins’ central question:

When we say that an adaptation is “for the good of” something, what is that something?…I am suggesting that the appropriate “something,” the “unit of selection” in that sense, is the active germ-line replicator. (1982a: 47)

This particular formulation, I think, asks two questions, one about who the beneficiary of the selection process is and one about who possesses adaptations. Griesemer and Wimsatt’s studies (1989) on Weismannism are of great help here.

14. Note that Williams, even though he “keeps his books” in terms of genes, argued against the notion that particular group traits were group adaptations because these group traits are not properly understood as benefiting the group in the proper historical selection scenario (Williams 1966).

15. Alex Rosenberg argues this line in his recent book Darwinian Reductionism: Or, How to Stop Worrying and Love Molecular Biology (2006).

16. The line of argument was pursued by Sterelny and Kitcher (1988), by Waters (1991), and by Kitcher, Sterelny and Waters (1990). While there are substantive differences between their views, especially about scientific realism, the discussion will be restricted here to what they have to say narrowly about genic selectionism and genic pluralism.

17. John Odling-Smee and Kevin Laland argue that the genic approach cannot accommodate the consequences of niche-constructing activities, even taking into account the extended phenotype stance (2011).

18. It is taken as given that there are a variety of ways to model any selection process in population genetics; the question here concerns specific information structured into those models. For example, Kerr and Godfrey-Smith (2002) investigate various consequences of pursuing research using, alternatively, organismic and trait group models, and their paper is a useful modern application and explanation of Ilan Eschel’s 1972 work. But note that the authors help themselves at the start of the paper to all the higher level information. See Lloyd [1988] 1994: Ch. 4, for a discussion of structured population models and the consequences of various parameter changes.

19. It should be noted that this result does not eliminate the possibility of the genic level acting as interactors in a given case; the results rather refer to the reduction of genotypic and higher level models to the allelic level.

Copyright © 2017 by
Elisabeth Lloyd <>

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