Skepticism in Latin America
This entry examines the development and impact of the study of philosophical skepticism throughout Latin America. It also highlights some significant trends and important contributions made to this venerable tradition by a number of Latin American philosophers.
Skepticism is a philosophical activity of investigation characterized by the notion of suspension of judgment. Whereas dogmatists affirm or deny a proposition on a given philosophical topic, skeptics neither affirm nor deny any proposition, i. e., they remain uncommitted to any dogmatic doctrine. According to skeptics, the basic opposition in philosophy is that between those who endorse a philosophical theory and those who, after having inquired into the truth, did not find an answer to the questions under examination. That is why skepticism came to be seen by dogmatic philosophers as a major challenge to their philosophical project of finding the truth. Epistemologists and metaphysicians alike set themselves the task of overcoming skepticism in order to establish their own doctrines. Thus, one constantly finds dogmatic philosophers trying to refute the skeptic. One criterion to accept a philosophical proposal is to determine to what extent it overcomes the skeptical challenge.
In ancient times, skepticism had two main different forms: Pyrrhonism and Academic skepticism. Rediscovered in the Renaissance, skepticism became one of the pillars of modern philosophy, not only after modern skeptics, such as Michel de Montaigne, Pierre Bayle and David Hume, gave new impulse to it, but also because of the many answers to it developed by philosophers such as Francis Bacon, René Descartes, George Berkeley and Immanuel Kant. In the analytic tradition, from G. E. Moore and Bertrand Russell onwards, skepticism is a central topic of concern. This surprisingly long history shows not only how deep is the skeptical challenge, but also how fascinating the skeptical stance turns out to be.
Similarly to philosophers in many other parts of the world, Latin American philosophers have faced skeptical challenges and have devoted close attention to skepticism. They adopt, by and large, the same understanding of skepticism, share the same historical tradition, from Pyrrho to contemporary analytic philosophy, that philosophers elsewhere have engaged with, and carry out the same kind of research as scholars all over the world do. What is specific about Latin American scholars on skepticism is the fact that they are, in general, more sympathetic toward skepticism than philosophers elsewhere tend to be. Consequently, one finds not only studies on the history of skepticism and philosophical criticisms, but also developments of new forms of skepticism, which are worth considering with some care.
- 1. Introduction
- 2. Historical Background
- 3. Skepticism rediscovered
- 4. Neo-Pyrrhonism
- 5. Reactions to neo-Pyrrhonism
- 6. Contemporary skepticism
- 7. History of modern skepticism
- 8. History of ancient skepticism
- 9. Skepticism and literature
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
It may not be a mere coincidence that in 1991 Oswaldo Porchat, a leading Brazilian philosopher, and in 1994 Robert J. Fogelin coined the word “neo-Pyrrhonism” to describe their respective philosophical positions. That coincidence reflects both the increasing significance of the scholarship on skepticism, in Latin American and in Anglo-American philosophy, and a more sympathetic attitude toward this venerable tradition.
To write about skepticism in Latin America is more difficult than one may expect. First, the phenomena to be described are complex and multifarious. Interest in skepticism is widespread in this part of the world, and by no means confined to one country or to a small group of philosophers. On the one hand, the significance of skepticism in the philosophy of each country seems to vary wildly; on the other, the history of studies on skepticism in each country has its own internal development, despite many connections among the various countries involved. Second, interest in skepticism is so recent in Latin America that not enough time has elapsed to provide some perspective on the issue. It is perhaps still too soon to give an entirely balanced view of skepticism in the region. But we will attempt our best to achieve that.
An interesting feature of the Latin American way of approaching skepticism is by not taking it just as the embodiment of an opponent to be refuted. At the very least, there is not a widespread prejudice against skepticism. On the contrary, many Latin American philosophers have strong sympathy for the skeptical proposal, and even those who are not skeptics themselves do not think that if the assumption of a philosophical thesis leads to skepticism, this constitutes a kind of reductio ad absurdum of the initial assumption. Skepticism is, for many Latin American philosophers, at least a prima facie tenable position. That does not mean, of course, that the majority of those Latin American philosophers who deal with skepticism are skeptics, but we do find many that consider themselves as such. Even for those who are not skeptics, the significance of philosophical skepticism is undeniable, and Latin American philosophers have made efforts to understand carefully its meaning and historical role.
The best way to introduce skepticism in Latin America is not to explain what goes on in each country, but to report what Latin American philosophers have said concerning those topics that caught their attention. However, we will begin by presenting a brief historical background and the thought of the two founding fathers of Latin American work on skepticism: Oswaldo Porchat (Brazil) and Ezequiel de Olaso (Argentina). Special care must be taken with their work, because together they set the stage for a proper understanding of what happens in all other Latin American countries. We will then examine what Latin American philosophers have been doing both in contemporary skepticism and in the history of this philosophical tradition. Ours is not an exhaustive account, and being selective, it is unable to accommodate every proposal in the field. We hope, however, to give a fair idea of what has happened and is currently taking place, in order to situate the reader and prompt additional research in the area.
2. Historical Background
Contemporary studies of skepticism began in Latin America thanks to the works of Oswaldo Porchat and Ezequiel de Olaso, a distinguished Argentinian historian of philosophy. Due to their works, skepticism has attracted a significant, although somewhat scattered, amount of attention in Latin America. Both were already interested in skepticism before they met for the first time. In 1968, Porchat gave a famous lecture, published in the following year, in which he called attention to a basic skeptical problem that every philosopher should try to overcome: the problem of the conflict of philosophies (roughly, the fact that philosophical doctrines often disagree on their answers to any given philosophical question). Given his B.A. in classics and his Ph.D. dissertation on Aristotle’s conception of science, it is not surprising that Porchat came to know ancient skepticism very well. His perspective was philosophical, and he identified his own philosophical experience with that of the ancient skeptics. In the same year of 1969, Olaso defended his Ph.D. dissertation on “Leibniz and the Ancient Skeptics” at Byrn Mawr College (Pennsylvania), in which he showed that Leibniz had a deep knowledge of Greek skepticism, whose modes he clearly identified in the Cartesian arguments. Thus, one can say that skepticism in Latin American began in the end of the 1960s.
In 1975, invited by Porchat, Olaso went to Brazil where he became a professor at the State University of Campinas (UNICAMP) until 1977. This fact had a profound influence on the development of the studies of skepticism in both countries and even in other Latin American countries. Their mutual collaboration proved very fruitful. Philosophers interested on skepticism soon got in touch, for they organized seminal conferences on the topic (1986, in Campinas, Brazil; in 1992, in Buenos Aires, Argentina; unfortunately, no proceedings were published). Throughout the years, many other conferences on skepticism were held (in Brazil, Argentina, and Mexico) in which philosophers from many countries took part and collective books on skepticism appeared.
Porchat’s and Olaso’s influence was huge. They were the founding fathers of skepticism in Latin America. One can speak of a second generation that was in touch from the 1990s onwards because they paved the way first. Philosophers in Brazil, Argentina, Mexico, and Colombia have been collaborating in the last twenty years because they both inaugurated a friendly, collaborative way of doing philosophy that has been preserved by their followers. Though Olaso, Porchat and some of their disciples were in touch with many philosophers from other countries and had a far-reaching influence, there is no single, integrated explanation for that widespread interest.
There is no doubt that skepticism flourished in Brazil like in no other Latin American country. It is perhaps not amiss to say that Porchat’s neo-Pyrrhonism is the most important achievement of Latin American skepticism, providing material for further systematic discussions. In Brazil, an important group of philosophers around Porchat was organized throughout the country in the 1980s, and they were devoted not only to understand the history of skepticism but also to discuss contemporary skepticism, by developing it and criticizing it. The group held conferences every year, sometimes twice a year, and many books, individual monographs and edited collections, were published. Moreover, Porchat was professor and supervisor of a number of young philosophers as well as a reference to all other philosophers studying skepticism. Even philosophers who were not primarily interested in skepticism found the group’s way of doing philosophy quite attractive. In fact, the group has always systematically invited non-skeptical philosophers to enrich its discussions. As a result, as time went by, the group grew larger and larger.
Argentina, Mexico, and Colombia have also shown a lot of interest in skepticism with many important contributions to it, albeit perhaps not as systematically as in Brazil. In Argentina, work on skepticism remained at first somewhat confined to Olaso and to some historians of modern philosophy around him. Later, there has been a growing interest in Argentina, this time from philosophers belonging to the analytic tradition, who were (and still are) also in touch with the Brazilian group, including, more recently, a new impulse to the study of ancient skepticism.
In Mexico, there is also a deep interest in skepticism. History of skepticism was not neglected, as we can be seen from the works of Laura Benítez and José Antonio Robles, among others, both of whom worked with Olaso (and Popkin). Their focus is on modern skepticism. Some Mexican philosophers, working within a Kantian tradition, focused on transcendental arguments as weapons against skepticism. Others work on contemporary skepticism in connection to questions such as disjunctivism and perception. Finally, skepticism and its connections to fallibilism and skeptical or epistemic concepts, such as doubt and certainty, were a major theme of some Mexican philosophers.
There has also been some interest in skepticism in many other countries, most notably in Colombia. Usually, this interest is combined with a classic author, such as Descartes, Hume, or Kant, or with an analytic philosopher, like Wittgenstein or Dennett. More recently, an interest in ancient skepticism has also arisen. In other countries such as Peru, Chile and Uruguay, the interest in skeptical issues is more scattered. No more than a minor or incidental interest in either the history of skepticism or in current epistemological questions that bear on the skeptical challenge is found.
3. Skepticism rediscovered
The study and diffusion of skepticism in Argentina and in other countries such as Brazil and Mexico owes a great deal to Ezequiel de Olaso. When Olaso died, Porchat noted that, despite not being a skeptic himself, Olaso “was indeed the father of Brazilian skepticism” (Porchat 1997). But his leadership and influence was vast, as Popkin testified:
Ezequiel de Olaso was one of the most prominent historians of philosophy. He contributed enormously to arousing interest in a wide range of topics in the history of philosophy through his writings, his teachings and his lectures in Latin America, North America and Europe. (Popkin 1997)
Olaso taught in many universities both in Argentina and elsewhere. His Ph.D. dissertation has not been published, but many papers resulted from it. Olaso wrote a number of important papers on skepticism, both ancient and modern. He explored many authors in the 17th and 18th centuries: Hume, Benito Jerónimo Feijóo, Rousseau, Hobbes, and Leibniz. These developments were summarized in Olaso 1994. Many of his papers are dedicated to Hume’s skepticism. Olaso argued that Hume was an Academic skeptic, not a Pyrrhonist, as Popkin had supposed. More importantly, his study of certain Enlightenment authors made Popkin revise his interpretation that, apart from Hume, there was no interest at all in skepticism during the 18th century.
Olaso’s work was not limited to the presence of skepticism in modern philosophy. He also devoted his efforts to interpret certain concepts of the main lexicon of skepticism. He was not only interested in skepticism from a historical point of view, but also from a philosophical perspective: he argued vigorously against the coherence of the skeptical position in “Zétesis” (Olaso 1988) a detailed paper on ancient Pyrrhonism, in which he displayed both an accurate understanding of this philosophical stance and a highly critical attitude toward the Pyrrhonian conception of investigation. His assessment of the concept of zétesis was very influential. Olaso interpreted it as an inquiry whose goal was suspension of judgment, which defined Pyrrhonism, and contrasted it to the open inquiry led by Academic and modern skeptics, whose goal is truth. Among his contributions, one finds also the distinction between the concept of doubt, or suspension of the mind, and the concept of epokhé, or suspension of judgment, which would be the proper attitude of a skeptic, because it is beyond doubt itself and tries to overcome it. These new interpretations were part of his debate with scholars like Naess, Chisholm, Mates, Frede and, of course, Porchat in order to find an acceptable form of contemporary skepticism. Based on Ortega y Gasset’s distinction between belief and knowledge, he proposed new accounts of Moore’s notions of common sense and certainty (Olaso 1975a) and the critical analysis carried out by Wittgenstein (Olaso 1999).
Olaso’s work on skepticism opened up two main directions that were followed by many philosophers, whether under his direct influence or not. First, skepticism emerged as an epistemological problem and, in the light of the linguistic turn, he set the task of reinterpreting and making sense of this philosophical stance. Second, he initiated a scholarly investigation of the history of skepticism; particularly of modern skepticism, but also both versions of its ancient form.
It is now time to present in some detail Porchat’s neo-Pyrrhonism, for it is arguably the most important contribution to Latin American skepticism. His seminal paper, “On What Appears”, was published in 1991, laying the foundations and the outline of his skeptical stance. Later, in a number of papers, he explored the main ideas further, corrected minor points, developed new aspects, and wrote some introductory and accessible texts.
One of the merits of Porchat’s neo-Pyrrhonism is that it provides a general, articulated philosophical stance that one can adopt. Skepticism is not, as it is usually presented in epistemological circles, a mere doubt on this or that topic that should be superseded, that is, it is not a methodological doubt or an expedient to strengthen a dogmatic position. For most philosophers concerned with skepticism, the coherence and intelligibility of the skeptical position is not really important. Any doubt, however crazy, may be useful, if it allows the philosopher to learn something about an argument. But Porchat does not think so. For him, skepticism is thought of as an articulated, plausible stance proposed by some philosophers. Porchat’s neo-Pyrrhonism is not even confined to a broad epistemological doctrine, since it is meant to be a general philosophical attitude, which includes epistemological aspects, but is not restricted to them.
One should also emphasize that his neo-Pyrrhonism has to be sharply distinguished from Cartesian skepticism. Porchat makes it clear that neo-Pyrrhonian aporiai are a different sort of argument from Cartesian doubts. In particular, neo-Pyrrhonism is not committed to mentalism (the doctrine that one can conceive the mind, and its representations, as independent from the body) and does not it invite any sort of solipsism. Thus, most of the criticisms leveled against Cartesian skepticism do not apply to neo-Pyrrhonism.
Neo-Pyrrhonism has two parts: one negative, and the other positive. The two most important concepts of the negative part are diaphonía (the conflict among the various philosophical doctrines) and epokhé (the suspension of judgment). For Porchat, ataraxía, or tranquility of mind, is not an essential ingredient of Pyrrhonism and it is more of historical interest. Given the conflict of philosophies, Porchat draws the skeptical conclusion: being genuinely unable to choose between the various philosophical views, he suspends his judgment. He argues vigorously that the disagreement between philosophies is undecidable. Not even his previous “philosophy of the common view of the world” (Porchat 1975, 1979) is able to solve or avoid the conflict. The conflict involves the dogmatism not only of philosophers of the common view of the world, but also of ordinary people. However, not all philosophies are part of the conflict, since some philosophies are not dogmatic: they do not intend to describe the ultimate nature of things.
Porchat (1993) distinguishes between two kinds of skeptical arguments: dialectical and empirical. This is a significant contribution of Porchat’s neo-Pyrrhonism to skepticism. Let us consider, first, dialectical arguments. The mode of diaphonía, in Porchat’s neo-Pyrrhonism, is the crucial one. But, of course, Porchat also considers the other modes of Agrippa as important skeptical weapons against dogmatism. More importantly, he recognizes that for ancient Pyrrhonism the skeptical method of antinomies (arguing both pro and con with equal persuasiveness) is indispensable against the dogmatic claim that some doctrines and arguments are felt stronger than others. That is, the method is indispensable to neutralize that dogmatic experience of unbalanced arguments, by making stronger the weaker arguments. By arguing on both sides of an issue, the skeptic experiences them as being equally strong. Why do they seem equally powerful in the skeptic’s intellectual experience? For the following reason: any criterion proposed to decide the issue will itself be part of the dispute, and disagreement about it re-emerges. Skeptics do not commit themselves to these dialectical arguments. They just use what dogmatists admit against dogmatism. Their whole point is to induce suspension of judgment in dogmatists while still maintaining their own epokhé.
There is, however, another route toward suspension of judgment. Skeptics can employ arguments they are able to endorse, which lead to the conclusion that one ought to suspend judgment. As skeptics (Pyrrhonists) live their ordinary life like everyone else, they can also reason like everyone else. They can search for the conjunction of phenomena in the world, establish empirical correlations, and infer the presence of fire from the fact of smoke or the occurrence of a wound from the presence of a scar. Empirical reasoning leads us from one phenomenon to another. Couldn’t it be the case that such empirical arguments lead to suspension of judgment? These arguments have as premises what is apparent, and they do not indicate a conclusion beyond the phenomena, since epokhé, their conclusion, is an intellectual experience. According to Porchat (1993), Aenesidemus’ modes are empirical, not dialectical, arguments in support of epokhé.
With regard to the positive part, neo-Pyrrhonism presents a detailed account of the crucial notion of phainómenon. Porchat thought, in an earlier phase, that phainómenon was to be identified with, or assimilated to, phantasía (Porchat 1985, 1986). That explains why he once construed that notion as implying some form of mentalism: what appears was conceived of as a mental representation. He later rejected that identification (Porchat 1991). On his new explanation, phainómenon is best accounted for by another crucial notion: bíos, or common life. After all, says Sextus Empiricus, what appears is bíos. Thus, Sextus’ explanation of the skeptical standard of action is also an explanation of the notion of phainómenon. By paying close attention to the fourfold everyday observances, one may understand better what the phainómenon is. At the same time, common life is to be understood as what is apparent (what appears to those who live it), not as a reality in itself.
According to Porchat, phenomena are a kind of residue from suspension of judgment; they are what is left after we have suspended judgment about dogmatic discourse. And once dogmatism is left behind, life is what is left for us. The phenomena impose themselves to us, and it is not up to us to accept them or not. One could say that phenomenon is what is “given” to us, but that is misleading, for in one sense it is not “given” at all. At first, Porchat asserted that language is a kind of constitutive ingredient of the phenomena and language permeates all our experience (Porchat 1991); later, perhaps to avoid some Kantian or idealist connotation, he preferred to talk of an association between what appears and language (Porchat 1995, 2013). Thus, phenomena are impregnated by language, not given to us.
One important comment Porchat makes concerning phenomena is that they are always relative to someone. In fact, they may be personal or public. Something may appear to someone or to more than one person, maybe even to all of us. For instance, it may appear to you right now that your are reading this article; and it may appear to many of us that Brasilia is the capital of Brazil; and it may appear to all of us that there are trees in the world. Here it can be noted that there is no solipsistic tendency in neo-Pyrrhonism, since many people in fact share most phenomena. That solipsism is not an inherent tendency in neo-Pyrrhonism can already be seen due to the connections between the phenomena and common life. After all, what is apparent to us are objects and events in the world, part of the life all of us live.
Another remark is that phenomena are sensible or intellectual. When something appears to the senses, such as the perception of a table in front of you, it is a sensible phenomenon; when it appears to the intellect, such as a law, it is an intellectual phenomenon. For Porchat, there is no sharp line between these two kinds of phenomena. A sensible phenomenon also has some intellectual aspect: when you see a table in front of you, the very idea of a table includes in it something that goes beyond what is present in your sensory modalities. However, although Porchat does not develop this idea explicitly, most intellectual phenomena seem to have a reference to something sensible, or at least to have something sensible in its origin. Therefore, many phenomena are typically of one kind, always including both a sensible and an intellectual aspect in them. Very recently, however, Porchat dropped that doctrine, and he now prefers to distinguish between two kinds of phenomena (Porchat 2013).
Porchat’s interpretation of Pyrrhonism seems closer to Frede’s (1997) than to Burnyeat’s (1980). It seems that, for him just like for Frede, skeptics have many beliefs in ordinary life, but are not committed to philosophical beliefs (beliefs about the truth of various philosophical views about the world). His neo-Pyrrhonism, therefore, would seem to be an urbane form of skepticism (cf. Barnes 1992). However, the very distinction at the basis of that dispute between Frede and Burnyeat presupposes what Porchat rejects: a contrast between philosophers and ordinary people. From a neo-Pyrrhonist point of view, both are typically, though not always, dogmatists: most philosophers are dogmatists and so are ordinary folk; dogmatic philosophers only tend to be more refined in some of their conceptions.
The crucial distinction is that between dogmatism and non-dogmatism. Sometimes, ordinary people are not dogmatic, and neither are some philosophers, such the skeptics (Pyrrhonists). For Porchat, many contemporary philosophers are skeptics or have a skeptical tendency without knowing it (Porchat 2001). Thus, what matters for a neo-Pyrrhonist is not whether the skeptic has no beliefs whatsoever or only ordinary beliefs, but whether he has dogmatic beliefs (concerning ádela) or non-dogmatic beliefs (concerning what appears, that is, the world or bíos). Frede would have missed the point concerning the scope of epokhé for not having understood properly the notion of phainómenon (Porchat 1991).
Accordingly, the basic neo-Pyrrhonian distinction is that between the phenomena and what is said about the phenomena. Dogmatic discourse is about the phenomena. When dogmatists say “roses are red” they mean “roses are really red”, and they have a theory to explain what that alleged reality consists in. Thus, they are no longer talking about the world, but about a further reality posited by their theory. No one disputes whether a rose appears red, but whether it is in fact red. Not all discourse, however, is about the phenomena and some merely expresses the phenomena. Such is ordinary language in daily life, and such is also the use of language by neo-Pyrrhonists: they use language to express what appears to them (or to us, if the phenomenon is a common one), but not to state how things really are. In this sense, “roses are red” expresses how roses appear to us; and in this sense, neo-Pyrrhonists may even say it is true that roses are red and that we know it. Therefore, neo-Pyrrhonism is not, in one sense of the word, a form of relativism, since it accepts an objective knowledge about the world.
Two other Pyrrhonian concepts are updated by the neo-Pyrrhonist in the positive part: haíresis and zétesis. According to Porchat, neo-Pyrrhonists have a doctrine or “a skeptical view of the world”. This skeptical view of the world is an elaboration of how things appear to neo-Pyrrhonists. Skeptical discourse should be understood as an expression of phenomena. Thus, neo-Pyrrhonists may articulate explicitly their own view of the world. Since most phenomena are common, especially those that concern philosophical issues, neo-Pyrrhonists will try to make explicit our ways of thinking, at least as they see them. However, each skeptic will have his or her own skeptical view of the world, since this view depends also on the circumstances in which they live.
Lastly, it should be noted that neo-Pyrrhonists are empiricists, but their empiricism is improved by current philosophy of science. For instance, they may endorse the hypothetic-deductive method. For them, we can explore the world empirically, and in their skeptical view of the world they may incorporate scientific results. For instance, we think that the earth moves, and we no longer think that the earth is at the center of the universe. Scientific results may and do have important impacts on our view of the world, including on the neo-Pyrrhonists’. Porchat went as far as to distinguish between a philosophical realism and a scientific realism (Porchat 1991, 1994), asserting that neo-Pyrrhonists need not be instrumentalists, but could hold scientific realism, although not, of course, philosophical realism. If there is objective knowledge of the common world, it seems that the sciences can improve on that knowledge being guided by an experimental method such as the hypothetic-deductive. Neo-Pyrrhonian zétesis is not only a philosophical inquiry to destroy dogmatism, as in the case of Sextus, but also an empirical exploration of the world of phenomena.
5. Reactions to neo-Pyrrhonism
Neo-Pyrrhonism provoked a lot of different reactions in Brazil and elsewhere. Since it is impossible to review them all here, our purpose will be to give a fair idea of them.
The first important reaction came from philosophers concerned with scientific knowledge. Hilan Bensusan and Paulo Souza (1994) thought that Pyrrhonism was an outdated philosophy. In the face of contemporary science, Pyrrhonism would no longer be a viable alternative, for it had not the adequate concepts to explain that science. Therefore, the fact that science has evolved in unforeseeable ways is an objection to neo-Pyrrhonism. Luiz Henrique de Araújo Dutra (1993, 1995, 1996, 1997b), also criticizing Porchat’s conception of science, came to propose another skeptical position, which he called “alethic skepticism”. Dutra thought that the metaphysical notion of truth is indispensable to scientific research. Both held that modern science establishes theories that cannot be doubted by the neo-Pyrrhonist. Otávio Bueno has a more sympathetic proposal toward skepticism and develops a neo-Pyrrhonist approach to contemporary science by combining it with van Fraassen’s view (Bueno 2015). Neo-Pyrrhonian empiricism emphasizes the notion of empirical adequacy.
A second kind of response was given by those who want to develop or improve on basic features of neo-Pyrrhonism. Some, such as Plínio Junqueira Smith (1995b), tried to purify neo-Pyrrhonism from what still looked like a dogmatic notion. For instance, the idea that dogmatism is a disease and that the skeptic (Pyrrhonist) offers a better way of life by curing dogmatists of their disease may be mere prejudice. Therefore, the skeptical idea of therapy is perhaps dogmatic. The notion of common life as used by the neo-Pyrrhonist also seems to be an inheritance of Porchat’s “philosophy of the common view of the world” (Porchat 1975, 1979). The skeptical view of the world has an undeniable personal aspect. Waldomiro José da Silva Filho explored, on the one hand, skeptical difficulties in common life neglected by the neo-Pyrrhonist (Silva Filho 2015) and, on the other, difficulties in self-knowledge, thereby trying to extend neo-Pyrrhonism to subjects not touched upon by Porchat (Silva Filho 2007, 2008).
Another important discussion intended to correct and improve on neo-Pyrrhonism concerns the neo-Pyrrhonist view on truth. Porchat developed in an important paper a skeptical doctrine of truth (Porchat 1995). According to Porchat, once they have divorced from a metaphysical notion of reality, neo-Pyrrhonists can defend a correspondence theory of truth: what we say and what appears would be correlated in our experience; it appears that there is a link between what we say and what appears to us. Eduardo Barrio (2000), however, thinks that the only alternative to a neo-Pyrrhonist is to adopt a deflationist theory of truth, like the redundancy theory, and that any correspondence theory would imply dogmatism.
An unexpected and important development of neo-Pyrrhonism came from philosophers who were also concerned with political philosophy. They were interested in knowing what would be the skeptical (Pyrrhonian) proposal in politics. Porchat (in conversation) has always been very clear on this issue, for he holds that the skeptic could have any political doctrine, including a radical one: from extreme right to extreme left. After all, skepticism would not exclude any content of phainomena. But most think that not all alternatives are accessible to a skeptical position. Renato Lessa (1995) argues that the neo-Pyrrhonist would be a liberal; Paulo Jonas de Lima Piva (2002) thinks he could be a social democrat or a socialist; Cicero Romão Araújo (2007, 2008) connects the notion of skepticism with the notion of citizenship. This debate opened up a new line of research concerning skepticism.
Very recently, an internal criticism of neo-Pyrrhonism emerged and it deserves to be mentioned. Vitor Hirschbruch Schvartz (2015) and Diego Machuca (2013a) argue for a rustic version of neo-Pyrrhonism, according to which Pyrrhonists hold no beliefs, and do not stop short of all the consequences that one should derive from the force of the skeptical attack on dogmatism. A truly skeptical position would destroy all beliefs, whether ordinary or philosophical. Accordingly, Schvartz and Machuca see themselves as rustic neo-Pyrrhonists, and do not accept Porchat’s neo-Pyrrhonism with its non-dogmatic beliefs.
But there have been many external criticisms whose intention is to reject neo-Pyrrhonism. Roberto Bolzani Filho developed an incisive criticism of Porchat’s neo-Pyrrhonism. Bolzani (1996, 2003) identified a sort of “naturalized reason” or some dogmatic presuppositions in the idea of a “healthy philosophy” in Porchat’s thinking. One could apply to skepticism the same kind of argument that the skeptic uses against other philosophies. In the end, skepticism would be part of the conflict among philosophies it tries to avoid. Bolzani also attempted to show that, despite Porchat’s intention, neo-Pyrrhonism is an outdated way of philosophizing. Roberto Horácio de Sá Pereira (2003) presented a Kantian answer to Porchat’s neo-Pyrrhonism. He raised a number of difficulties to understand Porchat’s conception of phenomena, and argued that an acceptable solution would come only from a transcendental philosophy. These two criticisms, if sound, should make one reconsider neo-Pyrrhonism. More recently, Pereira (2015) came to defend naive realism against Pyrrhonism.
6. Contemporary skepticism
Just as in many other parts of the world, contemporary skepticism in Latin America deals with epistemological issues within analytic theory of knowledge. Many anti-skeptical strategies, such as contextualism and externalism, deserved close scrutiny by Latin American philosophers. Also the transcendental strategy has captured the attention of many philosophers interested in skepticism. But contemporary skepticism is not confined to epistemology alone and it engages with, more broadly, analytic philosophy as a whole. Analytic worries about language and, more specifically, the notion of meaning have led to the development of a new form of skepticism, known as meaning skepticism. We will review some of the discussions on these topics, beginning with the connections between skepticism and analytic philosophy.
Danilo Marcondes de Souza Filho (Brazil) developed some skeptical concepts using Austin’s pragmatist view of language, and he also identified many common ideas between Wittgenstein and Pyrrhonism (Marcondes de Souza Filho 1988, 1996a,b). Thus, Marcondes was articulating Pyrrhonism further in a similar spirit as Porchat. Another groundbreaking work on skepticism derived from the linguistic turn is that of Samuel Cabanchik (Argentina). Cabanchik was interested in the possibility of a linguistic form of skepticism or skepticism about meaning not only in Wittgenstein, but also in Aristotle and Francisco Sanchez. His main focus, however, was Wittgenstein, about whom he wrote two books (2003, 2010) and many papers (1990, 2008a,b).
Marcondes’ and Cabanchik’s concern with analytic philosophy and its relation to skepticism was truly a guide to other philosophers. The connections between skepticism and the philosophy of the later Wittgenstein have been highlighted by many scholars. Plínio Junqueira Smith (1994) tried to show the strong affinities between Wittgenstein’s later philosophy and ancient Pyrrhonism, to which Paulo Roberto Margutti (Brazil) (Pinto 1996a) offered a criticism. In the same spirit, Guadalupe Reinoso (Argentina) (2006, 2008, 2009) calls our attention to the value of skepticism in both Sextus and Wittgenstein as an ars vivendi: their criticism of language’s bewitchment, anti-theoretical perspective, and conception of philosophy as a therapy. Magdalena Holguín (Colombia) (1997) and R. Meléndez (Colombia) (2014) also analyze the relations between skepticism and Wittgenstein. Pamela Lastres (Peru) (2011) has recently been doing some promising work on Wittgenstein and Moore, but also on Pyrrhonian skepticism. It is also worth noting that Oscar Nudler (Argentina) (2010) has developed what he calls a “philosophy of the limits”, inspired both by Wittgenstein and the Socratic awareness of our ignorance, which, although not properly skeptic, is a doctrine at least closely associated with skepticism.
More recently, Glenda Satne (Argentina) (2003, 2005a,b, 2008) also pursued a line of research based on analytic theories of meaning and, more specifically, on meaning skepticism. She has been busy with skeptical arguments derived from contemporary semantics, such as Quine’s argument from the indeterminacy of radical translation, Putnam’s model-theoretic argument, Dummett’s argument from the manifestation of linguistic knowledge and, above all, Kripke’s (or Kripkenstein’s) skeptical arguments. Meaning skepticism was also the subject of a very well informed book by Silvio Mota Pinto (Brazil/Mexico) (2009, 2014), and Efraín Lazos (Mexico) (2002) published interesting papers on Wittgenstein, Kripke, and meaning skepticism as well.
Thus, the connection between skepticism and analytic philosophy became a topic to be further explored by Latin American philosophers. Porchat had argued that contemporary analytic philosophy was to a good extent skeptical without knowing it. According to him, many analytic philosophers don’t understand very well what skeptics had said and what they call a skeptic does not correspond to skepticism, properly understood. If they had the appropriate knowledge of the history of skepticism, they would perhaps acknowledge the skeptical orientation of their doctrines. It is not clear, however, that that is the case in analytic philosophy. One debate that has received some attention is how far this or that analytic philosopher is close to skepticism. For instance, against Porchat’s opinion about Quine, Marcos Nascimento Bulcão (Brazil) wrote a book on Quine’s naturalistic realism, denying that he is a skeptic (Bulcão 2008). However, the perception of a skeptical Quine still persists in some places.
Davidson is another analytic philosopher whose connections to skepticism have been assessed by Latin American philosophers. Eleonora Orlando (Argentina) (2000) wrote a paper criticizing Davidson, for his conception of language would end up, despite his intentions, into a kind of semantic skepticism. Cristian Barturén (Peru), on the other hand, is interested on Davidson’s critique of global Skepticism. Otávio Bueno (Brazil/USA) criticized the way in which Davidson tries to respond to skepticism (Bueno 2005).
The relation between P.F. Strawson and skepticism has also been assessed by a number of Latin American scholars on contemporary skepticism or on analytic philosophy. Perhaps the most important contribution comes from a Mexican group. We will talk more about them below, when we discuss transcendental arguments as an anti-skeptical strategy. Sergio Sanchez (Argentina) (2006), Marco Franciotti (2009) and Plínio Junqueira Smith (2015) have also done some work in this topic.
Other analytic philosophers engaged with the issue further. To give but one example, Miguel Ángel Fernández (Mexico) (2014) criticized the incoherence of the anti-skeptical epistemology of belief attribution developed by Crispin Wright. According to Fernández, Wright intends to combine two desiderata in a single anti-skeptical strategy, to wit, a concessive element to the skeptic, on the one hand, and a rescue element, on the other. However, he argues, that combination is impossible.
Perhaps one should note that contemporary skepticism was also developed along other philosophical traditions, not only of an analytic orientation. Under the influence of Wittgenstein, but also of Stanley Cavell, Mario Gensollem (Mexico) (2006) explored the role of skepticism not only in philosophy, but also in common life. He came to embrace the Cavellian thesis that philosophical skepticism is the best expression of the intrinsic finitude of human nature. Sergio Sánchez (Argentina) (2006) called attention not only to Strawson’s but also to Heidegger’s assessment of skeptical arguments. Jônadas Techio (Brazil) (2013) also investigated, from a Cavellian and Heideggerian points of view, the importance of philosophical skepticism.
Skeptical worries are usually linked to epistemological issues. We find in Mexico a group of philosophers who have a very strong connection to skepticism. They go as far as proposing new forms of skepticism. Armando Cíntora (Mexico) (2010), for instance, holds a Pyrrhonian position in philosophy of science. According to Cíntora, a methodological Pyrrhonism would be of great help to liberate scientists from the dogmas that keep them captive when they try to develop their scientific research. Just like in Sextus’ case, Cíntora argues that this kind of methodological Pyrrhonism is not an epistemic paralysis: Pyrrhonian scientists can practice science, since they are aware of the non-dogmatic (temporal) character of their ontological, methodological and semantic principles. Such acknowledgment will keep them safe from a dogmatic outlook.
Jorge Ornelas (Mexico) (2012, 2014a; Cíntora and Ornelas 2013a), a younger member of that group, focused on the main anti-skeptical strategies in contemporary philosophy (contextualism, belief-attribution epistemology, dogmatism, transcendental approach, externalism, etc.). Ornelas tried to show that none of these strategies succeed or dislodge the traditional skeptical challenge, chiefly because they lack a satisfactory diagnosis of the motivations behind the skeptical problematic. Therefore, they fall prey to a double error: not only do they fail to eradicate the basic motivations behind skepticism, but also they pay no attention to the fact that the traditional skeptical problematic emerges only for theories and concepts of knowledge that do not threaten ordinary knowledge attributions.
Fallibilism and skepticism were the topics of some papers written by Guillermo Hurtado (Mexico). Hurtado (2002a) holds that, although these two positions are closely related, one must keep them apart; he rejects fallibilism because it is revisionist. Not much later, he argues in favor of using more fine-grained epistemic terms. According to Hurtado (2005), one should distinguish various senses of “doubt”, introduce the notion of “suspicion”, and accept various degrees of certainty. His basic idea is to enrich the vocabulary of epistemology, including more sophisticated skeptical terms.
Many, of course, reject the skeptical position. Paulo Francisco Estrella Faria (Brazil) (2007, 2012), for instance, argued against skepticism. In fact, he thinks, skepticism is committed to a kind of idealism, even in the case of Porchat and despite his explicit rejection of this philosophical view. According to Faria, any assertion implies a claim to absolute truth and, if skeptics assert anything, as they do in ordinary life, then they are committed to what they would rather avoid. The skeptic view of language is, therefore, untenable, and there is a type of pragmatic contradiction in the skeptic’s position. That criticism has been endorsed by Roberto Horácio de Sá Pereira (Brazil) (2003, 2015).
The works of Eleonora Cresto (Argentina) and Alejandro Miroli (Argentina) also distance themselves from the skeptical position. Cresto (1996, 1997) focused on anti-skeptical strategies that arise from naturalistic positions, whether along Wittgensteinian lines or following F. Dretske and other reliabilists. Miroli (2007, 2008, 2010), in turn, dealt with scientific skepticism, addressing both general cases and socially important ones. He also examined Dretske’s relevant alternatives argument, and tried to determine which kinds of alternatives one should exclude and which one can neglect in knowledge attributions.
Several additional epistemological strategies were put under close scrutiny by Latin American epistemologists. Here are a few of them. Diana Hoyos (Colombia) (2006) works on contemporary theory of knowledge, linking the concepts of epistemic responsibility, Gettier examples and skepticism. Jorge Gregorio Posada (Colombia) (2007) has responded to her work. Ignacio Ávila (Colombia) (2003) confronts Davidson’s thesis that most of our beliefs are true with the corresponding skeptical challenge. Another popular anti-skeptical strategy is contextualism. Flávio Williges (Brazil) devoted his Ph.D. dissertation to that subject, from which resulted a paper (Williges 2013), and André Joffily Abath (Brazil) (2012) uses contextualism to refute Cartesian skepticism.
Among the anti-skeptical strategies, the one that invokes transcendental considerations deserves special mention. A group of philosophers in Mexico is the most distinguished one concerning this Kantian-Strawsonian-inspired answer to skepticism. Pedro Stepanenko (Mexico) explored the anti-skeptical potential of the Kantian concept of the synthetic unity of apperception in many papers (2001, 2002a, 2006, 2007, 2008). According to his interpretation, this unity should be considered as the unity of our mental states that is possible only through the inferential relations to their contents. This unity makes possible the self-consciousness that any argumentative practice requires. If we could suspend judgment with respect to any subject, we would renounce to establish inferential relations among the contents of our mental states; in that case, there would be no consciousness unity, nor knowledge of our mental states.
In that same Kantian group, the works of Efraín Lazos (México) are outstanding. Lazos (2002, 2014) was able to combine Kantian and Wittgensteinian anti-skepticism to produce new perspectives on the skeptical challenge. More recently, Lazos appealed to a transcendental strategy based on the works of Barry Stroud to show the anti-skeptical force of transcendental arguments. Isabel Cabrera (Mexico) (1999) edited a book on transcendental arguments, in which the force and limits of such arguments as tools against skepticism are assessed. Cabrera (2002) also worked out the relations between Buddhism and skepticism. In particular, she showed that both in Buddhism and in Humean skepticism there is an attack on the notion of substance, and that the lack of commitment to substances in one’s understanding of the world has a therapeutic function, namely, to avoid suffering.
The so-called Agrippan trilemma is an important argument for contemporary skepticism. Some Latin American philosophers have tried to answer this deep, difficult skeptical challenge. José de Teresa (Mexico) (2000, 2013, 2014) developed an anti-skeptical strategy inspired in Plato’s dialectic. According to de Teresa, Plato’s strategy is effective against the trilemma presented by the skeptic, because it escapes the three alternatives under consideration.
Among the Agrippan modes, however, the most important for Latin American skepticism seems to be diaphonía or disagreement. We saw how important it is to Porchat’s neo-Pyrrhonism (1969, 1991, 1993). Some efforts have recently been made to compare the skeptical, Agrippan mode of diaphonía to contemporary reflections on disagreement. Of particular importance is Diego Machuca’s (Argentina) (2013a) idea that diaphonía is different from disagreement. Machuca accuses contemporary epistemologists who defend that disagreement leads to suspension of judgment of dogmatism. According to Machuca, they base their arguments on dogmatist principles to reach suspension of judgment. It also deserves to be noted Otávio Bueno’s (Brazil) defense of diaphonía from recent attacks, such as Barnes’ criticism (Bueno 2013). Bueno offers an interpretation of diaphonía free from the problems that arise from faulty interpretations. Perhaps this is another topic in which one may discover some original contributions from Latin American skepticism. There has also been some efforts to extend the mode of disagreement in contemporary skepticism into logical matters (Barrio 2015), as well as some discussion concerning evaluative judgments and the notion of relative truth (Orlando 2014).
7. History of modern skepticism
The history of skepticism has also attracted the attention of many scholars throughout Latin America. As in most places, historical investigation tended to concentrate in the modern period, mostly on Cartesian and Humean skepticism, though many other authors, such as Montaigne, Bacon, Bayle, and Kant, were also on the spot. Although Brazilian scholarship has perhaps made more contributions, one should not neglect the huge and widespread interest in modern skepticism throughout Latin America.
The most important work on the history of skepticism is arguably that of José Raimundo Maia Neto (Brazil), who worked with Popkin. Maia Neto got interested in skepticism through his contact with Danilo Marcondes and, some time later, with Porchat’s works. His main contribution is that Academic skepticism played a more important role in modern skepticism than Popkin’s interpretation recognizes (Maia Neto 1997a, 2005, 2013a). According to Maia Neto, Popkin emphasized the importance of Pyrrhonism for modern philosophy, but neglected the fact that Academic skepticism was also widely known and used by many philosophers. In order to defend this interpretation, Maia Neto wrote a number of papers on philosophers like Montaigne (Maia Neto 2004, 2012), Pierre Charron (Maia Neto 2014), Descartes (Maia Neto 2001), Gassendi (Maia Neto 1997b) and Pierre-Daniel Huet (Maia Neto 2008a,b). In fact, he explored the whole modern skepticism from Montaigne onwards, with important texts on Pascal (Maia Neto 1995), Bayle (Maia Neto 1996), and Hume (Maia Neto 1991).
Another important contribution is that of Luiz Antonio Alves Eva (Brazil), who has studied in great detail Montaigne’s Essays, publishing two books (2004, 2007b) and a number of papers in Brazil and elsewhere (2001a, 2012, 2013a). Still in Brazil, Renato Lessa (Brazil) (1995, 2003) has done some work on Montaigne’s political skepticism, showing that skeptics, by acknowledging the role of habit, would be realists in politics. Smith (2012a), criticizing Eva’s interpretation, who insists on the affinities between Montaigne and ancient skeptics, tries to uncover more differences. In Argentina, there has also been some work on Montaigne’s skepticism. In addition to Fernando Bahr (Argentina), to whom we shall return, Soledad Croce (Argentina) (2006, 2007), for instance, has published many papers on what she takes as the practical skepticism of Montaigne.
Luiz Eva (Brazil) (2006, 2008, 2011) also focused on the relations between Francis Bacon and skepticism. He proposed some careful interpretations of the Theory of the Idols and skeptical arguments stemming from ancient Pyrrhonism and from Montaigne and Sanchez. He showed not only the skeptical origins of most Baconian idols, but also how their structure changed the skeptical Modes, thereby revealing what is properly new in Bacon. Silvia Manzo (Argentina) (2009) wrote on the same subject, holding a balanced view, in which there is a double attitude in light of the skeptical threat. More recently, she returned to that topic (Manzo forthcoming), providing a reconstruction of Francis Bacon’s reception of Academic skepticism. She deals with the assessment of ancient skepticism throughout Bacon’s writings and argues that he, on the one hand, approved of the state of doubt and the suspension of judgment and, on the other hand, rejected the notion of acatalepsia. Plínio Junqueira Smith (Brazil) (2012b), referring to both scholars, showed that Bacon’s main focus is on the propositions “nothing is known” and “nothing can be known”, to which he devoted careful attention. According to him, Bacon used skeptical weapons to reject the whole traditional philosophy (including skepticism), not only to criticize dogmatism, thereby distancing himself from it.
Danilo Marcondes (Brazil) (2009, 2012) has been doing original, important research on the ancient Modes and the discovery of the New World. This discovery offered not only many more examples of the same kind of diversity Europeans were familiar with, but also of a different, more radical kind, strengthening the force of the skeptical Modes. That is a vast and rich literature not yet explored by scholars on the history of skepticism.
As expected, Cartesian skepticism is one of the main objects of study. In almost every country we find scholars trying to understand its sources, the nature of its arguments, their force and persuasiveness. One decisive contribution, already noted above, is that of Porchat, who credited Descartes’s methodological use of skepticism a special place in the philosophy. In Porchat’s view of the 1980s (Porchat 1985, 1986), there was a strong affinity between ancient skepticism and Cartesian doubt, so that one could speak properly of a skeptic-Cartesian model. The problem of the external world became, thereby, a crucial issue for those concerned with skepticism, because it was thought of as a skeptical problem. Following his lead, many other philosophers in Brazil, like Paulo Francisco Estrella Faria (2007), Luiz Eva (2001b, 2013b), Alexandre Noronha Machado (2007a), Flávio Williges (2007), among others, wrote papers on the topic.
In Mexico, concern with Cartesian skepticism was once the dominant focus of research on skepticism. One reason for this predominance is the connection between the group of Laura Benítez (Mexico) and José Antonio Robles (Mexico) with Ezequiel de Olaso and Richard Popkin. This group was strongly oriented toward the work of Descartes and modern science. Consequently, Cartesian skepticism or methodological skepticism was an important subject to them. Many members of the group shared, perhaps implicitly, the belief that the Cartesian anti-skeptical strategy was successful to avoid disastrous skeptical consequences. Benítez (1987), for instance, has devoted many of her works to Cartesian studies, and explored the positive methodological aspects of Cartesian skepticism to reach plain certainty, as well as the relevance of skepticism for discussions concerning the nature of human knowledge.
Something similar can be said about the situation in Colombia, where Jean Paul Margot (2003) and Adolfo León Gómez (2002) gave a lot of attention to Cartesian skepticism. Also very important are the contributions of Mauricio Zuluaga, who has examined contemporary interpretations of Cartesian skepticism, especially those based on the closure principle (Zuluaga 2012), the Agrippan Trilemma (Zuluaga 2005) and the relations between Pyrrhonism and Cartesian skepticism (Zuluaga 2014). Zuluaga published an important book that emerged from his Ph.D. dissertation (Zuluaga 2007) and, with Margot, edited a collection (Margot and Zuluaga 2012), in which one finds many papers on modern skepticism, including on Montaigne, featuring scholars from Colombia and elsewhere.
In Peru we also find some interest in the relation between Descartes and skepticism. Jorge Secada (2000) has done work on Descartes and Suarez, but focused on Descartes with regard to skepticism. Humberto Quispe (1996) has also done research on this topic, mainly under the influence of Jorge Secada.
French skepticism of the 17th century was given some attention, although not as much as one would like. Besides the already noted contribution by José Raimundo Maia Neto (Brazil), the works of Flávio Fontenelle Loque (Brazil) (2012) and Fernando Bahr (Argentina) deserve to be highlighted. Loque’s book is on the relation between skepticism and religion, more specifically on the very notion of a Christian skepticism. He devoted attention not only to Montaigne and Pierre Charron, but also to François de la Mothe Le Vayer. Bahr (1999, 2000a,b, 2001, 2002, 2004, 2010) focused mainly on Pierre Bayle, whose skeptical arguments touch on three main points: the problem of evil, the foundations of religious belief and civil tolerance. These topics led Bahr to study both the 18th century, where he examines the influence of Bayle on Hume (that was the topic of his Ph.D.), and to the first half of the 17th century, where he focused his attention on the relation between La Mothe Le Vayer and Descartes. Plinio Junqueira Smith (2013) shows the importance of the skeptical method both in Bayle's historical work and in his philosophical thinking. Sébastien Charles (Québec, Canada) (forthcoming a,b) has also been working recently on some French skeptics, namely Simon Foucher and Pierre-Daniel Huet. His historical research follows the current trend of erudition, discovering and exploring less known figures, but who were very important at their time.
Berkeley’s reaction to skepticism or his alleged skepticism did not go unnoticed, despite not having received enough attention. One exception is José Antonio Robles (Mexico). Robles (1996) shows that the Berkeleyan skeptical thesis that rejects the existence of a material substance has important consequences, such as the rejection of many other subsidiary problems: matter’s indivisibility and the idea of an extended God. Jaimir Conte (Brazil) (2008) also explored the connections between Berkeley and skepticism in an important paper. Sébastien Charles (Québec, Canada) (2003) wrote a book on the early reception of Berkeley’s immaterialism in France. At that time, Berkeley was considered the greatest skeptic, until Kant pronounced Hume to be even greater. Charles shows, with plenty of erudition, how this image of Berkeley was created in France.
Not much attention was given to skepticism in the 18th century French materialist philosophy. However, Paulo Jonas de Lima Piva (Brazil) (2007, 2008a,b) has done some work focusing especially on Diderot. Sébastien Charles (Québec, Canada) (2007) called attention to some clandestine skeptical manuscripts as well as to many less known skeptics of the period, not only in France, but also in Germany. Charles (2012) and Rodrigo Brandão (2008) explored the relations between Voltaire and skepticism.
An important contribution to understand Hume’s skepticism was provided by Plínio Junqueira Smith, who published a book (1995a) on that topic and many papers (2011a,b). His main idea is that the debate between Hume’s skepticism and Hume’s naturalism presupposes a false dichotomy. What commentators call Hume’s naturalism is what Hume himself called his skepticism. Moreover, commentators tend to think of skepticism as a mere negative doctrine, not paying enough attention to its positive side. He also devoted much effort to show how Hume’s mitigated skepticism was connected to ancient skepticism, in both its forms, and to modern skepticism. One should also note the works of Livia Guimarães (Brazil) (1996, 2008) who has devoted her career to the study of Hume’s thought, not only his skepticism, but also many other aspects of the philosophy of the greatest modern skeptic. Humean scholarship has increased so much in Brazil that it is not possible to give a fair survey of its status in a limited space.
Interest in Hume’s skepticism is not confined to Brazil. Lisandro Aguirre (Argentina) (2007, 2008, 2010a,b), for instance, has published many papers on Hume. His main point is that Hume follows Pyrrhonism precisely when he thinks he is avoiding it, i.e., when Hume is saved by nature, he thinks he is not a Pyrrhonian, but in fact that would be the hallmark of a Pyrrhonist. Humean skeptical arguments are also studied in Colombia, for instance by Catalina Gonzalez (2010, 2011). Humean skepticism was perhaps what generated Peruvian interest in modern skepticism. Although Juan Bautista Ferro Porcile (Peru) was mainly concerned with logic, he lectured extensively on modern philosophy, especially in the empiricist tradition and in the Humean branch of skepticism, on which he published an influential paper.
The relations between Kant and skepticism attracted much attention in Latin America, most of all in Mexico. We have already seen that a group of philosophers, most notably Pedro Stepanenko (2002a, 2006, 2007), Efraín Lazos (2014), Isabel Cabrera (1999), and Jorge Ornelas (2005), combined historical scholarship with systematic worries, producing a number of publications on transcendental arguments and skepticism, discussing the works of Wittgenstein, P.F. Strawson and Barry Stroud, among others, from a Kantian point of view. Stepanenko, in particular, was more historically orientated. Roberto Horácio de Sá Pereira (2003) and Marco Franciotti (1994, 1995), in Brazil, follows a similar path. In Colombia, Alejandro Rosas (Colombia) (1990) opened up this field of research with an influential paper. Following this path, Catalina González (Colombia) (2010) developed a historical study of the relations between Kant and his ancient skeptical sources.
More recently, still in Mexico, Ornelas (2014a, 2015) developed an interpretation of Kantian anti-skepticism, according to which the “Refutation of Idealism” is not relevant, as is commonly assumed, but the “Fourth Paralogism” is. Plínio Junqueira Smith (2008a) holds a similar view, while at the same time offering a wider interpretation. According to Smith, Kant responded to three different kinds of modern skepticism: Cartesian skepticism concerning the external world (which Kant came to recognize, in the second edition of the Critique of Pure Reason, as an idealist problem, not a skeptical one); Baylean skepticism and the antinomies, and Humean skepticism on the objective validity of the categories.
Luis Eduardo Hoyos (Colombia) (2001) has already published his important book El escepticismo y la filosofía trascendental in which he assesses the argumentative potential of the transcendental argument against Humean skepticism as received in the philosophical German scene of the 18th century. Hoyos works motivated a number of Colombian philosophers to devote their attention to the subject and the period. Ignacio Ávila (Colombia) (1996) explored this same vein, while Carlos Patarroyo (Colombia) sides with the Kantian position against Humean skepticism. Catalina González (Colombia) (2011) worked out the distinction between Academic skepticism and Pyrrhonism in Kant.
As many scholars have perceived the fundamental importance of Kant to modern skepticism (and vice versa), it should not come as a surprise that many others also perceived what is now called post-Kantian skepticism. Perhaps the first important study on the topic is that of Luis Eduardo Hoyos (Colombia) (1995), when he publishes his Ph.D. dissertation, followed by two papers (Hoyos 1998, 1999), to which Raúl Meléndez (Colombia) (2000) replied. Interest in post-Kantian skepticism is spreading around. Eduardo Brandão (Brazil) (2013) devotes his attention to skepticism in philosophers such as G.E. Schulze, Arthur Schopenhauer, and Fichte. Ricardo Cattaneo (Argentina) (2009, 2010) focuses both on discussions on skepticism in Kantian and post-Kantian philosophy (Jacobi, Schulze) and on the interpretation and assimilation of skepticism in Hegel and German Idealism. Luiz Fernando Barrère Martin (Brazil) (2007a,b, 2011) has written his Ph.D. dissertation and published some papers on Hegel and skepticism.
Sergio Sánchez (Argentina) is an important reference for studies concerning skepticism in the 19th and 20th century. Sánchez (2010) focused on the presence of skepticism in Nietzsche, especially the influence of Sextus and Cicero. In his papers, one important topic is that of Nietzsche’s analysis of belief and its relation to skepticism. In connection with Nietzsche, Kathia Hanza (Peru) (2011) has explored different sides of skepticism. The works of Rogério Lopes (Brazil) (2006, 2012) on Nietzsche and skepticism, very similar in spirit to those of Sánchez and Hanza, also deserve to be mentioned.
8. History of ancient skepticism
Ancient skepticism has also attracted a lot of attention, though, like in almost all places, it has received less attention than modern skepticism. Roberto Bolzani Filho (Brazil) published a book (Bolzani 2013) and a number of papers on the topic (Bolzani 1990, 1998, 2000, 2005a). His book on Academic skepticism and Pyrrhonism is very carefully written, well informed, and presents a detailed account of the relationship between these two forms of ancient skepticism. Vitor Hirschbruch Schvartz (2012) defends a rustic interpretation of Sextus Empiricus. Recent scholarship is improving, as is shown by the works of Rodrigo Pinto de Brito (Brazil) (2014) on Sextus.
More recently, studies on ancient skepticism grew thanks to the works of Diego Machuca (Argentina) (2006a,b, 2009, 2013a). His Ph.D. dissertation was on Sextus’ ethics. Afterwards, he has published many papers and reviews, as well as organized events. He has also edited a number of important collections on the history of skepticism (2011a,b, 2013b). It is fair to say that no one gave more impulse to improve Latin American scholarship on ancient skepticism than he did. With Duncan Pritchard, Machuca is the editor of the International Journal for the Study of Skepticism. Thus, both for his personal papers and books and for his involvement in organizing research, Machuca is a leading figure in ancient skepticism.
Colombia has also given its contribution to the field. In Cuadernos de Filosofía y Letras, we find not only the first book of the Esbozos Pirrónicos of Sextus Empiricus translated by the philologist and Hellenist Jorge Páramo (1989), but also many papers by scholars such as Popkin, Giorgio Tonelli, Porchat and Olaso, together with an examination of the importance of philosophical skepticism by Carlos B. Gutiérrez (Colombia) (1989). In Mexico, Ornelas (Mexico) (2013, 2014b) read Sextus’ works carefully, and found theoretical resources that can help with the engagement with contemporary epistemological issues.
Studies on the history of skepticism before the modern period are not restricted to Pyrrhonism and Academic skepticism. It should not go unmentioned Maurício Pagotto Marsola’s paper (Brazil) (2007) on Plotinus and skepticism, for this is a very unexpected aspect of Plotinus’ philosophy. In connection to the origins of Medieval Philosophy, and especially Augustine and Descartes, Luis Bacigalupo (Peru) (1999) has also done some research. Rodrigo Pinto de Brito (Brazil) (2015) has been working on the impact of skepticism in Christian thought.
One should also pay attention to Mauricio Beuchot (Mexico) (1996, 2003) who devoted two papers to skepticism in the Middle Age. His point is that skepticism attracted some attention even before Renaissance. According to him, many medieval authors developed skeptical positions. Among them, Augustine’s Platonic Christianity appealed to Academic skepticism in its theory of illumination, in which Augustine emphasized the fallibility of human knowledge; Averroes’ theory of double truth, according to which there are two kinds of truth (truths for science and truths for faith) similarly has a skeptical tone, and those who thought that God could perhaps fool us were considering skeptical argument (Ockham, Pedro Lombardo, Tomás de Aquino and Buenaventura, among others). Beuchot also remembers that Nicolás d’Autrecourt, a French monk (1300–1350 approximately), active in the University of Paris, anticipated Humean skepticism concerning causality.
9. Skepticism and literature
Perhaps it should also be mentioned some other studies on the history of skepticism. On the one hand, there are some literary studies. Machado de Assis, one of the best Brazilian writers, has been seen as a skeptic by many people. One reason is that Machado read and used extensively Montaigne’s skepticism. José Raimundo de Maia Neto (1994) published a book on the topic. The novelty of his book is that it was the first discussion on Machado’s skepticism based on the history of skepticism. Paulo Roberto Margutti Pinto (2007) and Gustavo Bernardo Krause (2007a) discussed Maia Neto’s interpretation, and Maia Neto replied to them. Krause is a Brazilian novelist as well as a professor of literature who published many books and papers on skepticism and literature (Krause 2004), on Machado (Krause 2006) and other writers such as the well-known Brazilian poet Carlos Drummond de Andrade (Krause 2007b). On the other hand, Paulo Roberto Margutti Pinto has been studying the history of Brazilian philosophy, in which he sees an important role for skepticism long before Porchat brought it to center stage. In Pinto 2010, he argues for the influence of Francisco Sanches on Brazilian colonial thought. One of the reasons for Porchat’s success is that it seems that Brazilian thought has always had, at least in some places, a tendency towards skepticism. Machado de Assis would not be an exception.
Multiply Cited Edited Collections
|[TFM]||Bahr, Fernando (ed.), 2010, Tradición clásica y Filosofía Moderna: el juego de las influencias, Santa Fe, Universidad Nacional del Litoral.|
|[LCM]||Beltrán, Julio, and Carlos Pereda (eds.), 2002, La certeza, un mito? Mexico: Universidad Nacional Autónoma de México.|
|[CNA]||Brunsteins, Patricia and Ana Testa (eds.), 2007, Conocimiento, normatividad y acción, Córdoba, Universidad Nacional de Córdoba.|
|[SEC]||Charles, Sébastien and Plínio Junqueira Smith (eds.), 2013, Skepticism in the Eighteenth Century: Enlightenment, Lumières, Aufklärung, Dordrecht: Springer.|
|[ASE]||Charles, Sébastien and Plínio Junqueira Smith (eds.), forthcoming, Academic Skepticism in Early Modern Philosophy, Dordrecht: Springer.|
|[DFE]||Cíntora, Armando and Jorge Ornelas (eds.), 2014, Dudas Filosóficas. Ensayos sobre Escepticismo Antiguo, Moderno y Contemporáneo, México: Universidad Autónoma Metropolitana/Gedisa.|
|[CPH]||Dutra, Luis Henrique de Araújo and Plínio Junqueira Smith (eds.), 2000, Ceticismo: perspectivas históricas e filosóficas, Florianópolis: Editora da Universidade Federal de Santa Catarina.|
|[PAM]||Machuca, Diego (ed.), 2011, Pyrrhonism in Ancient, Modern, and Contemporary Philosophy, Dordrecht: Springer.|
|[DAS]||Machuca, Diego (ed.), 2013, Disagreement and Skepticism, New York and London: Routledge.|
|[SMA]||Maia Neto, José Raimundo, Gianni Paganini, and John Christian Laursen (eds.), 2009, Skepticism in the Modern Age: Building on the Work of Richard Popkin, Leiden and Boston: Brill.|
|[IOH]||Mattio, Eduardo and Carolina Scotto (eds.), 2006, Interpretación, objetividad e historia: perspectivas filosóficas, Córdoba, Argentina: Universidad Nacional de Córdoba.|
|[SHP]||Popkin, Richard H. (ed.), 1996, Skepticism in the History of Philosophy: A Pan-American Dialogue, Dordrecht: Kluwer.|
|[CPF]||Silva Filho, Waldomiro José (ed.), 2005, O ceticismo e a possibilidade da filosofia, Ijuí: Editora da Universidade de Ijuí|
|[RIF]||Silva Filho, Waldomiro José and Carlos Caorsi (eds.), 2008, Razones e interpretaciones. La filosofía después de Davidson, Buenos Aires, Argentina: Del Signo.|
|[ESC]||Silva Filho, Waldomiro José and Plínio Junqueira Smith (eds.), 2007, Ensaios sobre o Ceticismo, São Paulo, Brazil: Alameda Editorial.|
|[ACC]||Silva Filho, Waldomiro José and Plínio Junqueira Smith (eds.), 2012, As consequências do ceticismo, São Paulo, Brazil: Alameda Editorial.|
|[NOP]||Smith, Plínio Junqueira (ed.), 2015, O neopirronismo de Oswaldo Porchat, São Paulo, Brazil: Alameda Editorial.|
|[FHU]||Smith, Plínio Junqueira and Michael B. Wrigley (eds.), 2003, O Filósofo e sua História: Uma Homenagem a Oswaldo Porchat, Campinas, Brazil: Universidade de Campinas.|
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We are grateful to Fernando Bahr (Argentina), José Tomás Alvarado (Chile), Mauricio Zuluaga (Colombia), Jorge Ornelas (Mexico), Pablo Quintanilla (Peru), and Carlos Caorsi (Uruguay) for their feedback on this entry. We also would like to thank Edward N. Zalta for his help in correcting and improving this entry.