Thick Ethical Concepts
Evaluative terms and concepts are often divided into “thin” and “thick”. We don’t evaluate actions and persons merely as good or bad, or right or wrong, but also as kind, courageous, tactful, selfish, boorish, and cruel. The latter are examples of thick concepts, the general class of which includes virtue and vice concepts such as generous and selfish, practical concepts such as shrewd and imprudent, epistemic concepts such as open-minded and gullible, and aesthetic concepts such as banal and gracious. These concepts stand in an intuitive contrast to those we typically express when we use thin terms such as right, bad, permissible, and ought. (Concepts are often regarded as non-linguistic representational items that can serve as the meanings of linguistic expressions and as constituents of propositions; terms are linguistic items that can be used to express concepts. The precise relation between concepts and language may be complicated, however. In what follows, small capitals denote concepts and italics denote terms.) Typically when someone calls an action bad, they evaluate it negatively without committing themselves to much if anything by way of non-evaluative description. This descriptive thinness of bad makes it more general than selfish or cruel. Even if calling something selfish evaluates it as bad in some way or respect, not just any bad act can count as selfish; it must also involve the agent giving a certain degree of priority to herself over others. So the application of thick terms and concepts seems somehow to involve both evaluation and non-evaluative description.
It is primarily this combination of evaluation and non-evaluative description that has attracted philosophical attention to thick concepts in ethics since the mid-twentieth century. Thick concepts have been thought to provide leverage in various debates concerning the nature of evaluative thought and talk and to illuminate such questions as whether there is a robust fact-value distinction, whether ethical claims enjoy a significant kind of objectivity, and how evaluative classifications relate to non-evaluative classifications. Doing justice to the full diversity and complexity of moral thinking has also been thought to require more attention to thick concepts. The focus on thin concepts over the thick in much of the history of Western moral philosophy threatens to simplify and mislead also in normative ethics, where the revival of virtue ethics as a major alternative to deontology and consequentialism coincides with increased attention to thick terms and concepts in metaethics. Interest in thick concepts has also extended from ethics to other areas of philosophy such as epistemology and aesthetics. Several questions run through all these motivations for focusing on thick concepts. We have a “combination question”: how exactly do thick terms and concepts combine evaluation and non-evaluative description? We have a “location question”: is evaluation somehow inherent to thick terms and concepts, such as perhaps an aspect of their meaning, or merely a feature of their use? We have a “delineation question”: how do thick terms differ from the thin and from other kinds of evaluative terms (such as pejorative expressions)? Given answers to these questions, what broader significance within ethics and applications outside of ethics might thick ethical concepts have? What follows is a survey of various attempts to answer these questions.
- 1. What Are Thick Concepts? Background and Preliminaries
- 2. Do Thick Concepts Have Distinctive Significance?
- 3. The Combination Question: How Do Thick Concepts Relate Evaluation and Description?
- 4. The Location Question: How Are Thick Concepts Evaluative?
- 5. The Delineation Question: How Do Thick and Thin Concepts Differ?
- 6. Thick Concepts Outside of Ethics
- Academic Tools
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- Related Entries
1. What Are Thick Concepts? Background and Preliminaries
The designation “thick concept” for concepts that combine evaluation and non-evaluative description originates in Bernard Williams’s Ethics and the Limits of Philosophy (Williams 1985). Williams seems to have drawn the label “thick” from the notion of “thick description” introduced by Gilbert Ryle and adapted to other purposes by the anthropologist Clifford Geertz. Ryle characterizes thick descriptions as descriptions of human activities not as mere bodily motions but as involving intentional and purposive detail which help us to understand those activities (Ryle 1968). In Geertz’s terminology thickness is a matter of the culturally specific significance of such details (Geertz 1973). Unlike thick concepts, thick descriptions in Ryle’s and Geertz’s senses needn’t involve evaluation. But one connection to Williams’s terminology is that many thick concepts incorporate culturally specific information (cf. Scanlon 2003). Different societies might have sufficiently different understandings of courage to have distinct concepts of it, and some might lack a concept altogether. There is similar cultural specificity to the kind of sexual morality in which chaste plays a role and the kind of honor culture in which noble has a point (cf. Williams 1985: 141ff.). While the terminology of “thick” and “thin” concepts originates in Williams, he wasn’t the first to spot the distinction he uses these labels to pick out. For instance, when R.M. Hare distinguishes “primarily” and “secondarily” evaluative words in The Language of Morals, his examples of the former are paradigmatic thin concepts and some of his examples of the latter are paradigmatic thick concepts. (Hare 1952: 121–2; see also the discussion of persuasive definitions in Stevenson 1938.)
The examples of thick and thin terms and concepts with which we began exhibit an intuitive contrast: terms like generous, cruel, and tactful appear descriptively more specific or rich in content than terms such as wrong or good, which seem more general or more purely evaluative. Even if calling something selfish evaluates it as bad in some way or respect, not just any bad act can count as selfish; it must also involve the agent giving some significant degree of priority to herself over others. How this intuitive contrast is best understood is subject to several controversies and may have no theory-neutral answer.
First, in saying that thick terms and concepts are in some sense both evaluative and descriptive, what is meant by these notions? Illustrative examples of descriptive terms include square, gold, wombat, spotted, recursive, beer, unequal in income, and (plausibly) painful. Paradigmatic examples of evaluative terms include thin terms such as good, bad, ought, right, and wrong. We cannot distinguish the evaluative and the descriptive simply in terms of different functions in our thought and talk. For if judgments involving thick concepts are evaluative judgments, then cognitivists and non-cognitivists disagree about their function. According to non-cognitivists, the primary function of evaluative terms is to express and induce conative attitudes, such as desire, preference, or (dis)approval, which aren’t truth-apt. (A desire for world peace is no more the sort of thing that can be true or false than a command like “Shut up!”) But according to cognitivists, evaluative terms are like descriptive terms in that their primary function is to express cognitive states such as beliefs, which are apt to be assessed as (robustly) true or false. Nor can we capture the distinction between thick and thin terms by identifying the descriptive with the factual: to assume that evaluations cannot be factual would be to assume the kind of distinction between “facts” and “values” which thick concepts are sometimes thought to undermine (see section 2.1). In neutral terms we may not be able to do much better than to say that the purely descriptive terms are given by a big list of terms that would generally be classified as falling on the is-side of the distinction between is and ought and all the rest are evaluative terms (Jackson 1998: 120). Descriptive terms would thus be purely non-evaluative. This boundary may not be sharp; in particular, it might be vague whether thick terms such as honest should be classified as purely descriptive or partly evaluative (Jackson 1998: 120). And even if not vague, it is a matter of controversy, as we’ll see in section 4. In any case, if we take the evaluative to exclude only the purely non-evaluative, then non-evaluative description will be something given in purely non-evaluative terms. The interesting feature of thick terms and concepts is that even if they count as evaluative on a binary distinction, they are supposed to straddle the distinction.
Second, it is remarkably difficult to find a suitably neutral positive characterization of what thick concepts are, beyond the idea that they somehow combine evaluation and non-evaluative description. Williams characterizes the application of thick concepts as both “action-guiding” and “guided by the world”: their application depends on the way the world is, but also “if a concept of this kind applies, this often provides someone with a reason for action” (Williams 1985: 140; see also Moore 2006; Heuer 2012; Smith 2013: 102–5). By contrast, the application of thin evaluative concepts is supposed to be purely action-guiding and not world-guided. But moral realists presumably think that the application of thin concepts is also world-guided: whether a thin concept truly applies depends on how the world of objective values lies. Other existing characterizations either suffer from similar problems in failing to characterize thick concepts, or else are either not very informative or too theory-laden (see, e.g., Gibbard 1992, Dancy 1995, Scanlon 2003, Kyle 2020, and for critical discussion Eklund 2011).
Third, the intuitive contrast between thick and thin terms as terms that somehow combine evaluation and non-evaluative description classifies as thick not only paradigmatic thick concepts in the style of cruel, courageous, and kind, but also “respect-relative” evaluative concepts, pejorative terms, and more. The claims “This is a good knife” or “Charlie is good with children” ascribe ways of being good in certain non-evaluatively described respects. Not just any good thing can be a good knife; it must also be a knife, and knife is a non-evaluative concept. Similarly, speaking of people as “krauts” or “wingnuts” involves evaluating them negatively on the basis of, respectively, their nationality and political affiliation, and calling someone a jerk involves evaluating him (it usually is a he) negatively for having certain sorts of non-evaluative features that make a person unlikeable. But it is controversial whether paradigmatic thick concepts work in the same way as concepts for specific ways of being good and pejoratives. It is also unclear whether “affective” terms such as admirable and contemptible are substantially similar to paradigmatic thick terms and concepts. Finally, some philosophers investigate “dual character concepts” (for an overview and references, see Reuter 2019). These are supposed to be similar to thick concepts in involving both description and evaluation, but distinctive in that their descriptive and evaluative dimensions, while related, are independent. For instance, there is a sense in which a person may count as an artist if certain descriptive conditions, such as making sculptures for a living, are met. But there is also a sense in which a person may count as an artist if she satisfies norms concerning what an artist should be or do. A person may count as an artist in one sense but not the other. This might be regarded as evidence that artist encodes two independent dimensions of content, which are weighted differently in different contexts of use. One alternative analysis of such different uses of words like artist is that these words are polysemous. In that case they would stand for different concepts in different occurrences, rather than one concept with multiple dimensions of content. The relationship between dual character and thick concepts may thus depend on what notion of concepts we work with. This issue has rarely been addressed in detail in the literature on thick concepts. Either way, questions arise concerning whether dual character concepts and thick concepts are normative or evaluative in the same kind of way and whether some concepts might be both thick and dual character. Some suggest that empirical investigation can shed light on the nature of dual character concepts and their relation to thick concepts (Reuter 2019; Liao et al. 2020).
Despite these complications in characterizing thick terms and concepts, they are widely agreed to be of potentially high significance. An important assumption in many metaethical debates is that the evaluative and the non-evaluative can be sharply distinguished. If the evaluative and non-evaluative aspects of thick terms or concepts aren’t separable into distinct components, these debates may be impacted in a fundamental way. Starting with some prominent arguments in the literature concerning the significance of thick concepts will naturally lead us to fundamental questions about their nature.
2. Do Thick Concepts Have Distinctive Significance?
It is one thing to say that thick concepts are a distinctive kind of evaluative concepts, another to say that this gives them distinctive philosophical significance not carried by thin concepts. Among various arguments which attribute distinctive significance to thick terms and concepts, two have been particularly influential: arguments concerning the “is-ought gap” and the distinction between facts and values, and the “anti-disentangling” argument. We’ll also briefly address questions bearing on the relative priority of thick and thin concepts in evaluative thought.
2.1 The Is-Ought Gap and the Fact-Value Distinction
It is common to think that the intuitive contrast between is and ought marks an important gap between distinct domains, and sometimes this gap is identified as a distinction between “facts” and “values”. Thick concepts may be thought to challenge such dichotomies between facts and values (Murdoch 1970; Williams 1985: 140–5; Dancy 1995; Putnam 2002: 34–45). To avoid misunderstanding, note that an important gap can be held to exist even if values are a special kind of facts. For instance, according to so-called Hume’s Law, one cannot derive an ought from an is (Hume 1739–40: §3.1.1). Any (non-trivial) valid argument for an evaluative conclusion must somehow (perhaps implicitly) involve evaluative content in its premises. This logical or conceptual barrier can be generalized to concern various relations of reasonable inference between the non-evaluative and the evaluative. The underlying thought is that evaluative and normative statements commend things and guide action, whereas purely non-evaluative statements play no such practical role by themselves. The resulting claim that there is no reasonable (non-trivial) inference to any evaluative conclusion from any set of purely non-evaluative premises is sometimes called “the autonomy of ethics” (Rynin 1957; Prior 1960).
Even if evaluative conclusions that deploy thin terms such as right and wrong cannot be derived from purely non-evaluative premises, a conceptual gap between evaluative and non-evaluative statements requires the same to be true also of evaluative conclusions that deploy thick terms. Philippa Foot argues that thick terms such as rude undermine the is-ought gap: calling something rude is evaluative because it expresses condemnation in the same kind of way as bad and wrong do, but this evaluation can be derived from a non-evaluative description (Foot 1958). Consider the following inference:
O: x causes offense by indicating lack of respect
R: x is rude
Foot claims that it would be inconsistent to accept O but deny R (Foot 1958: 507–9). But then it would seem that a thick evaluative claim, namely that x is rude, is an analytic consequence of a purely non-evaluative claim: part of what rude means is that anything that causes offense by indicating lack of respect is rude. (Foot targets her argument at non-cognitivists such as R.M. Hare, but the issue arises wherever a statement deploying a thick term is counted as evaluative in meaning.)
A common reply is that Foot’s argument yields absurd consequences when applied to thick terms that one regards as objectionable, as embodying values that should be rejected. Many people regard the thick terms chaste and lewd as objectionable because they reject the kind of sexual morality these terms are normally used to convey. Atheists are likely to regard blasphemous and sinful as objectionable on similar grounds, and a laissez-faire capitalist who thinks that there is nothing bad about selfishness may well regard selfish as objectionable in its normal negative use. Whether one regards a concept as objectionable depends on whether the values the concept is associated with are ruled out by one’s own values; a concept is in fact objectionable if the values it embodies ought in fact to be rejected. Consider now inferences that are identical in form to Foot’s but deploy objectionable thick terms:
O*: x is an overt sexual display
L: x is lewd
If O analytically entails R and R commits us to a condemnation of its object, then O already commits us to this negative attitude. O* should then likewise commit us to a negative attitude towards its object. But there is no inconsistency in accepting that some actions are overt sexual displays and yet refusing to condemn anything merely for being an overt sexual display. The point is clearer still if thick claims entail thinner claims to the effect that something is good or bad in a certain way.
x causes offense by indicating lack of respect.
So, x is rude.
So, x is bad in a certain way.
x is an overt sexual display.
So, x is lewd.
So, x is bad in a certain way.
If these entailments hold, then, by the transitivity of entailment, the non-evaluative claim “x is an overt sexual display” commits anyone who accepts it to the claim that x is bad in a certain way. But there is no inconsistency in accepting the former and rejecting the latter. What one seems to be at most required to accept is that x is lewd in some non-evaluative sense. The English language might have no other word for expressing that evaluatively neutral sense, but there are various ways to indicate that one means lewd in that way, such as using scare quotes or a certain tone of voice. Exactly the same should then go for rude. So Foot is mistaken about what “x is rude” entails. (This reply is modeled on R.M. Hare’s reply that Foot’s argument delivers the wrong results for formally identical inferences that involve racial or ethnic slurs; see Hare 1963: 188–9, and also Eklund 2011. Substituting slurs with objectionable thick terms allows us to bracket the issue whether slurs and thick terms are evaluative in the same way. Hare’s basic reply to Foot needn’t suppose that they are. For discussion, see section 4 of the supplementary document “Additional Debates about Thick Concepts and Their Significance”.)
It is unclear whether this reply shows that the is-ought inferences Foot asks us to consider are invalid. The fact that someone who regards lewd as objectionable refuses to condemn overt sexual displays doesn’t show that it is impossible for O* to be true while L is false. Perhaps someone who accepts O* but refuses to assert L (unless it is clear that she is using lewd in an evaluatively neutral sense) is like someone who refuses to say about prunes what she has already accepted about dried plums (Foot 1958: 509). Refusing to call something a prune makes it no less true that it is a prune. Perhaps the same is true of thick terms and the non-evaluative descriptions that Foot claims can be used in their stead. Either way, these complications prompt the question of how tightly thick and thin terms are connected.
Whether thick terms help undermine the is-ought gap depends on the way in which thick terms are evaluative. If at least some thick terms are such that the sentences in which they figure are entailed by non-evaluative sentences and the evaluations they convey belong to their meanings or truth-conditions, then thick terms would constitute counterexamples to the is-ought gap. It couldn’t be that O is true but R is false. If thick terms like rude have truth-conditional equivalents such as O that are evaluatively neutral, the evaluation might attach to rude only as a matter of linguistic convention and not be entailed by the propositions that rude is used to express. If the evaluative contents of thick terms were in this way “detachable” from the propositions they are used to express, they would undermine at most a linguistic is-ought gap at the level of thick terms and sentences, but not a conceptual is-ought gap at the level of thick concepts and propositions. Another possible view is that thick terms aren’t evaluative even by linguistic convention, but are merely commonly used evaluatively. Then thick terms couldn’t be invoked to undermine even a linguistic is-ought gap. (Here note a terminological matter. Some who think that evaluation is only pragmatically associated with terms like courageous or rude take this to mean that there are no thick concepts, but only loaded words; see Blackburn 1992 and, on the general phenomenon, Stevenson 1938. This is what we should say if a thick concept must be both evaluative and descriptive as a matter of meaning. Others who accept a pragmatic view are happy to talk about terms or concepts such as courageous or rude as thick, using “thick” to refer to terms and concepts that characteristically involve both evaluation and non-evaluative description in some way or other; see Väyrynen 2013. This entry adopts the latter usage.) This “location question” concerning how thick terms are related to the evaluations they normally convey is the topic of section 4.
The is-ought gap discussed above is a gap between different kinds of representations, whether linguistic or conceptual. This kind of gap is what philosophers sometimes have in mind when they distinguish “facts” and “values”. But sometimes they mean an ontological gap between facts and values or evaluative and non-evaluative facts and properties. Even if there is a linguistic or conceptual gap among our evaluative and non-evaluative representations, it doesn’t directly follow that there are no thick evaluative properties that aren’t separable into distinct evaluative and non-evaluative components (Eklund forthcoming). Such properties would violate a sharp ontological distinction between values and non-evaluative facts. But that debate concerns moral metaphysics rather than thick concepts.
2.2 The “Anti-Disentangling” Argument
Thick terms and concepts challenge the is-ought gap only if they are evaluative in meaning and have analytically sufficient non-evaluative application conditions. It also seems plausible that thick terms and concepts have some necessary non-evaluative application conditions. A bad act can be selfish only if it involves giving greater priority to oneself over others in some way and rude only if it causes offense, a good act can be generous only if it involves giving to others out of one’s own resources. An argument offered by John McDowell is often interpreted as showing that there can be no non-evaluative description that is both necessary and sufficient for the application of a thick term and, moreover, that this bears on whether the evaluative and non-evaluative aspects of thick terms and concepts are separable into distinct components (Williams 1985: 140–1; Dancy 1995; Kirchin 2010).
McDowell is concerned with
whether, corresponding to any value concept, one can always isolate … a feature that is there … independently of anyone’s value experience being as it is. (McDowell 1981 : 200–1)
He targets non-cognitivism in particular as a view that requires the possibility of isolating a non-evaluative feature of this kind. McDowell’s argument against this possibility is often called the “disentangling argument” (1981 : 202; cf. 216).
- If an evaluative concept E can be “disentangled” into a non-evaluative description D that is co-extensive with E and an evaluation that gives the evaluative orientation of E, then it would be possible to master the extension of E, and thus group together exactly the items to which competent users would apply E, without understanding its evaluative orientation.
- It isn’t possible to anticipate the usage of E in a way required for mastering its extension without understanding the evaluative orientation of E.
- Therefore, E cannot be disentangled into non-evaluative description D that is co-extensive with E plus an evaluation that gives the evaluative orientation of E.
Given the conclusion, the label “anti-disentangling argument” would seem more accurate (Roberts 2011). In support of (D2), McDowell asks us to imagine “a specific conception of some moral virtue … current in a reasonably cohesive moral community” and then consider an “outsider” to the evaluative perspective of those who deploy the concept (McDowell 1981 : 201). An example might be someone who cannot even imaginatively engage with the kind of sexual morality that is normally conveyed by applying lewd to overt sexual display. Many people find it implausible that such an outsider could master the extension of lewd by grasping a non-evaluative content that applies to all and only the items the insiders call lewd (assuming there is one), and that this is so in principle, not merely because of the contingent limitations of our language. Unless there is a way to grasp the extension without engaging with insiders’ evaluative perspective, it would seem that evaluative classifications are in principle not graspable with purely non-evaluative representational resources (McDowell 1981 : 216).
The key question for present purposes is how the anti-disentangling argument bears on thick terms and concepts. (On the argument itself, see Lang 2001; Miller 2003: 250–4; and Roberts 2011, 2013a.) The question isn’t straightforward. McDowell makes a general claim about evaluative terms. But many writers take it to bear on how thick terms and concepts combine evaluation and non-evaluative description, specifically by favoring Inseparability over Separability (Williams 1985; Kirchin 2010):
Separability: The evaluative and non-evaluative aspects of thick terms and concepts are distinct components that can at least in principle be “disentangled” from one another. (Hare 1952: 121–2; Hare 1981: 17–8, 73–5; Blackburn 1992, 1998: 101ff.; Burton 1992; Miller 2003: 244–54; Richard 2008: 28–33; Elstein and Hurka 2009; Smith 2013; Kyle 2020)
Inseparability: Thick terms and concepts are or represent irreducible fusions of evaluation and non-evaluative description which cannot be “disentangled”. (Williams 1985: 129–30, 140–1; Putnam 2002: ch. 2; Kirchin 2010, 2017: ch. 2; Roberts 2011; Harcourt and Thomas 2013)
Saying that the anti-disentangling argument favors Inseparability over Separability misstates the case, however. The argument gets a grip on thick terms only under the following assumption:
Descriptive Equivalence: For every thick term or concept, someone has or could acquire an independently intelligible purely non-evaluative description with the same extension.
According to Descriptive Equivalence, the extensions of thick terms are determined only by their non-evaluative content; evaluative content makes no difference to what things fall under a thick term. If this means that an outsider who doesn’t share the evaluative outlook associated with a thick concept should nonetheless be able to anticipate the insiders’ use, then the anti-disentangling argument rules out Descriptive Equivalence. But that favors Inseparability only if Separability entails Descriptive Equivalence; as we’ll see in section 3, that assumption is highly controversial. (For problems with Descriptive Equivalence itself, see Sreenivasan 2001.)
Significant issues are at stake here. If Separability entails Descriptive Equivalence but Descriptive Equivalence is false, then thick terms and concepts cannot be analyzed or reduced to thin evaluation plus non-evaluative description. For instance, rude couldn’t mean bad for causing offense by indicating lack of respect. In that case, thin terms wouldn’t enjoy conceptual or explanatory priority over the thick, and moral theorists would risk ignoring or distorting a substantial range of moral phenomena if they focused exclusively on the thin. But if Separability doesn’t entail Descriptive Equivalence, thick concepts may be explicable in terms of thin evaluation plus non-evaluative description even if the anti-disentangling argument is sound.
The debate discussed above has largely supposed that a descriptive equivalent would be encoded in the meaning of a thick term, and thus would presumably be something that competent speakers should in principle be able to articulate. But we would struggle to say what the very many ways of being cruel, for instance, have in common without relying on our understanding of cruel (Little 2000: 279). Our poor track record in capturing the extensions of thick terms in independently intelligible non-evaluative terms should then count against Descriptive Equivalence. But note that, so far as the anti-disentangling argument goes, a non-evaluative description could be necessarily extensionally equivalent to an evaluative term or concept without belonging to the latter’s meaning. An evaluative concept could be held to have a non-evaluative “shape” as a matter of a necessary a posteriori equivalence, perhaps in the way that the necessary synthetic equivalence of “x is water” and “x is H2O” is discoverable only a posteriori. (D1) clearly allows this possibility. (D2) must then remain plausible if ‘possible’ is read as including the possibility of mastering the extension of an evaluative term by latching onto a non-evaluative necessary extensional equivalent (provided there is one) in an a posteriori way. The notion of disentangling in McDowell’s argument is therefore not semantic or conceptual. The argument’s real conclusion seems rather to be:
Shapelessness: The extensions of evaluative terms and concepts aren’t unified under independently intelligible non-evaluative relations of real similarity, not even as a matter of synthetic a posteriori truth that isn’t settled by the meanings of evaluative terms or concepts. (Miller 2003: 250–4; Kirchin 2010; Roberts 2011, 2013a; Väyrynen 2014)
If Shapelessness were true, that would explain why the sort of disentanglement targeted by McDowell’s argument isn’t possible. Indeed, the non-evaluative shapelessness of the evaluative is often thought to provide a particularly good explanation of why (D2) is plausible (Roberts 2011: 506).
Although Shapelessness is a general issue about evaluative concepts, its bearing on thick concepts is worth noting. Suppose an outsider could anticipate insiders’ use of an evaluative term in new cases by using similarities between old cases and new cases to infer whether the evaluative term applies in the new cases. Shapelessness entails that such similarities would have to be evaluative. If so, Descriptive Equivalence is false. Conversely, insofar as the extensions of evaluative terms can be mastered on the basis of non-evaluative similarities, Shapelessness is false. The way thick terms involve non-evaluative description may be thought to make them a particularly suitable test case for these general issues about evaluative concepts. But note, finally, that thick concepts do so only if their evaluative aspects are somehow built into them, such as perhaps as a matter of meaning. The commitment here is to:
Inherently Evaluative: The meanings of thick terms and concepts somehow contain evaluation.
This generic thesis covers a range of options regarding what sort of evaluation the meanings of thick terms and concepts might be thought to contain and how they contain it. Some version of Inherently Evaluative clearly is presupposed by Inseparability. By contrast, Separability allows (though doesn’t entail) that thick terms and concepts might convey evaluation only pragmatically, as a matter of use. Different answers to this location question are, again, the topic of section 4.
2.3 Reflection, Knowledge, and Priority
Thick concepts and their relation to the thin bear also on knowledge in ethics. Bernard Williams famously claims that, unlike in science, in ethics “reflection can destroy knowledge” (1985: 148; see also Williams 1995). Thick terms and concepts are parochial, in that they tend to have “interest” or a “point” only in the context of some particular evaluative outlooks or practices. The notion of lewdness as we know it really only has a life within a particular kind of sexual morality. That is why those who regard lewd as an objectionable term typically refrain from using it. Industriousness seems to count as a positive quality only against some such evaluative frame as the Protestant work ethic. (Otherwise, what’s the point?) This would explain why, as (D2) in the anti-disentangling argument claims, an unsympathetic outsider might not be able to master the extensions that particular moral communities assign to their thick terms. Now consider what Williams calls a “hypertraditional society”: a maximally homogenous and minimally reflective society whose ethical reflection only employs thick concepts (Williams 1985: 142). Suppose T expresses one of their thick concepts in their language. And suppose that claims of the form x is T can express truths and qualify as knowledge (see also Williams 1995). Williams suggests that a judgment involving a thin concept such as good or bad “is essentially the product of reflection” (Williams 1985: 146). Since the hypertraditional society is unreflective, its members don’t deploy good or bad. In that case we cannot suppose that T entails either. Now suppose a person from the hypertraditional society has knowledge that x is T but comes to reflect on her practices and acquires thin concepts. If thick concepts reflect social worlds, reflection that stands back from social practices must rely on thin concepts. Through reflection, the person may come to reject her traditional way of life and the evaluative perspective that goes with it, inferring from x is T that x is bad. Or she may come to endorse it, inferring that x is okay. Williams suggests that “when someone stands back from the practices of the society and its use of these concepts and asks whether this is the right way to go on”, the sort of reflection that occurs “characteristically disturbs, unseats, or replaces … traditional concepts” (Williams 1985: 146, 148). But if the person ceases to possess her traditional concept T through thinly evaluative reflection, then presumably her previous knowledge that x is T is destroyed. Williams’s thinking rests on controversial assumptions about ethical knowledge which we cannot pursue here. Nor can we pursue fascinating issues concerning the implications of being deprived of certain concepts (Fricker 2007: ch. 7). Let’s simply note that it isn’t clear that losing traditional convictions through reflection leads to a loss of concepts. You might instead retain your concepts shorn of their traditional evaluative trappings, and either find them a new evaluative point (such as using what was a positive concept negatively) or shelve those concepts as ones that have no distinctive point or use in structuring your experience (Richard 2008: 33; Väyrynen 2013: 123–5, 245). In the latter case the evaluative point of a thick concept wouldn’t be constitutive of the concept.
An important general issue about thick concepts is in the mix here either way. Consider the following widely accepted view about the relation between thick and thin concepts:
Thin Centralism: Thin terms and concepts are conceptually and/or explanatorily prior to thick terms and concepts. (Hare 1952, 1963, 1981; Blackburn 1992, 1998, 2013; Elstein and Hurka 2009; Smith 2013)
If good and bad are conceptually prior to T, the members of a hypertraditional society cannot grasp T without also grasping them. But then they cannot lose T when they draw a reflective inference from x is T to a thin evaluation. Similarly the truth or falsity of x is T, and the status of its acceptance as knowledge, will depend partly on whether x is good or bad. But these thin evaluative facts may be discernible to an outsider, thereby limiting the extent to which thick concepts resist mastery by those who cannot imaginatively inhabit the evaluative outlook within which it has a point. The same consequences would seem to follow from:
No Priority: Thick and thin terms and concepts are conceptually and explanatorily interdependent, with neither being prior to the other. (Hurley 1989: 13; Dancy 1995; Tappolet 2004)
Like Thin Centralism, No Priority entails that one cannot grasp thick concepts without grasping thin concepts. Thus it seems that Williams must reject Thin Centralism and No Priority, and must instead accept one of the following views about the relationship between thick and thin concepts:
Non-Centralism: Thick and thin terms and concepts in general exhibit no interesting relations of conceptual and/or explanatory priority or interdependence. (Väyrynen 2013: 250)
Thick Centralism: Thick terms and concepts are conceptually and/or explanatorily prior to thin terms and concepts. (Explicit statements are rare, but see Chappell 2013 and Annas 2016.)
Under Non-Centralism it might be difficult to explain why thin evaluative reflection should tend to lead to a loss of traditional thick concepts. Thick Centralism rules out Separability (see section 3), but note in addition that Williams needs a version of Thick Centralism on which the claim that grasping thin concepts requires grasping specific thick concepts is compatible with the possibility of subsequently losing those thick concepts through reflection that deploys thin concepts. Regarding thick concepts in this way as a throwaway ladder might not yield a stable form of Thick Centralism. An important potential implication of Thick Centralism is that since not everyone shares the same thick concepts, there might be no evaluative language that is “conceptually homogeneous” across cultures or across disagreements within a culture (cf. Williams 1995). Williams further argues that we can draw significant conclusions about the nature of not just ethical knowledge but also of evaluative truths and their objectivity specifically from reflection on thick terms and concepts, but these arguments are highly controversial (see Williams 1985: 135–6, 146–55; Quinn 1987; Scheffler 1987; Williams 1995; Lang 2001; Moore 2003; Kirchin 2017: ch. 172–80).
For a summary of some further questions about the significance of thick concepts, see section 1 of the supplementary document “Additional Debates about Thick Concepts and Their Significance”.
All these arguments regarding the distinctive significance of thick concepts point us to the same cluster of issues: the combination question regarding how thick terms combine evaluation and non-evaluative description, the location question regarding how the evaluations they may be used to convey relate to their meaning or content, and the delineation question regarding how thick terms and concepts differ from the thin (and other evaluative terms). Let’s now turn to consider these debates in their own right.
3. The Combination Question: How Do Thick Concepts Relate Evaluation and Description?
The combination question concerns in what way the evaluation and non-evaluative description involved in thick terms and concepts relate. Calling something selfish normally conveys that it is bad, but not just any bad action can qualify as selfish; selfish acts must involve the agent giving greater priority to some of her own interests over others’. (Those interests may be different in different circumstances: one can be emotionally selfish, financially selfish, and so on.) Separabilists hold that thick concepts are a combination of distinct non-evaluative concepts and other (usually thin) evaluative concepts. Philosophers who accept Thin Centralism typically accept Separability. And philosophers (often the same ones) who reject Shapelessness or aim to avoid the anti-disentangling argument also typically accept Separability. But as we’ll see, Separability commits you to neither Thin Centralism nor Shapelessness. While some philosophers writer as if Separabilist views were essentially non-cognitivist (Dancy 1995; Kirchin 2010), cognitivists can well accept Separability (Elstein and Hurka 2009; Smith 2013). Separabilist views are sometimes called “reductive” (Kirchin 2010; Roberts 2013a; Harcourt and Thomas 2013). A word of caution about this label is that Separabilist views needn’t be reductionist in the sense of reducing evaluative properties to non-evaluative ones. By contrast, Inseparabilists hold that the meanings of thick terms and concepts are both evaluative and descriptive but cannot be divided into distinct contents; talk of “combining” evaluation and non-evaluative description is liable to mislead if it suggests putting together distinct elements (Dancy 1995: 268). Thick concepts are a distinct kind of fundamental evaluative concepts. Accordingly Inseparabilist Views are often called “non-reductive”, or views on which thick concepts are “irreducibly thick”. Philosophers who accept Thick Centralism typically accept Inseparability, and those who accept Inseparability typically accept Shapelessness and express sympathy for the anti-disentangling argument. (As we’ll see, these views needn’t cluster as neatly as is sometimes assumed.)
3.1 Separabilist Views
According to Separability, the evaluative and non-evaluative aspects of thick terms and concepts are distinct components that can at least in principle be disentangled from one another. In this section we’ll discuss how Separabilists may specify the non-evaluative descriptive content and its relation to the evaluative content. By way of preliminaries, note that many Separabilists take the evaluative content of thick terms to be located in their truth-conditions, but if those evaluations are some other kind of features of thick terms or their uses, they will be separable from the non-evaluative descriptive contents of thick terms in whatever way such features are in general separable from truth-conditional meaning (see section 4). While Separabilists often take this evaluative content to be thin, Separability as such doesn’t require this. The evaluative content of “What you did was tactless” might not be “What you did was pro tanto bad” but more like “What did you did was bad in a certain way”, where the specification of the “certain way” will introduce descriptive information, such as “pertaining to manners”. Alternatively the evaluative contents of thick terms might be given by affective concepts such as admirable or amusing (Tappolet 2004; for criticism, see Harcourt and Thomas 2013). On neither view does Separability entail Thin Centralism, although if admirable means simply worthy of admiration, Thin Centralism can be maintained. Note that when we see below some Separabilists proposing an “analysis” of thick terms, they needn’t be understood as claiming that any actual language allows us to give a satisfactory statement of a putative analysis of a thick term or concept. Our inability to provide such a statement doesn’t show that the term or concept is unanalyzable or that Inseparability is true.
In what kind of relation does the evaluative content E of a thick term stand to its non-evaluative descriptive content D if they are separable? In section 2.1 we saw a simple view about the connection: D entails E. But this threatens an is-ought gap which many want to maintain, commits you to Descriptive Equivalence, and makes you vulnerable to the anti-disentangling argument. (From any such D we can construct an independently intelligible purely non-evaluative description with the same extension as the thick term in question.) We also think that in some way selfish actions are bad in a certain way because or in virtue of the agent giving a certain degree of priority to herself over others; the connection doesn’t seem merely conjunctive. Separabilists might then seek to analyze thick terms or concepts as featuring a relation which is explanatory but where D doesn’t entail E. In this vein, Stephan Burton suggests that thick terms can be analyzed as meaning “x is E in virtue of some particular instance of D” (Burton 1992; see also Tappolet 2004). Selfish, for instance, would mean something like “bad in a certain way in virtue of some particular instance of giving priority to oneself over others”. For E to hold in virtue of some particular instance of D is for E to depend on “the various different characteristics and contexts” of D. You might not count as selfish if you benefit yourself over benefiting two other people to the same degree each as you benefit yourself but things may be different if seven other people are in the mix, and what counts as the relevant kind of prioritizing of oneself varies depending on whether the context concerns emotional or financial selfishness, and so on. So D alone isn’t sufficient for E, and the further non-evaluative detail about particular instances of D which is needed for E isn’t built into the meaning of selfish (Burton 1992: 31). This avoids the anti-disentangling argument. For although E is still (contextually) separable from D, D won’t be coextensive with selfish and an outsider’s grasp of the extension of D won’t be enough for her to master how insiders apply selfish. Separabilists might also have other ways of securing these benefits. Brent Kyle argues that Separabilists have no reason to accept an analysis which inserts an explanatory relation into the content of thick concepts, and offers an alternative (discussed below) which also avoids the anti-disentangling argument (Kyle 2020: 916–17, 923).
Since Separabilists can deny Descriptive Equivalence, the anti-disentangling argument cannot establish Inseparability. But what is meant to constrain the selection of the non-evaluative “characteristics and contexts” which are needed to determine whether a thick term applies? And can these be grasped without drawing on our antecedent understanding of the thick term? If not, those drawn to Thin Centralism won’t be satisfied, and Burton’s proposal will also fall short as a non-circular analysis of meaning. Here we’ll consider two other Separabilist proposals for solving these problems about how thick terms combine evaluative and non-evaluative information.
Daniel Elstein and Thomas Hurka offer two patterns of analysis for thick terms as “sketches intended to illustrate the general resources the reductive view has” in solving these problems (Elstein and Hurka 2009: 531). Each allows Separabilists to accept Thin Centralism while explaining why an outsider to the relevant evaluative practice couldn’t grasp the extension of a given thick term. Each of Elstein and Hurka’s patterns of analysis locates evaluation in the meanings of thick terms. On the first, the non-evaluative content of a thick term is only partially specified within its meaning: its meaning specifies good-making (or bad-making) non-evaluative properties of a general type, but may not specify what exactly these good-making properties are. An example they give is that “x is distributively just” means
x is good, and there are properties X, Y, and Z (not specified) that distributions have as distributions, or in virtue of their distributive shape, such that x has X, Y, and Z, and X, Y, and Z make any distribution that has them good. (Elstein and Hurka 2009: 522)
This analysis separates non-evaluative description from evaluation, and grasping it requires grasping good. But grasping the non-evaluative information that distributively just only applies to distributions won’t be enough to know just which distributions fall into its extension. That requires knowing which properties of distributions are good making. Similarly, mastering how insiders apply distributively just requires knowing which properties they take to make distributions good. In this way, Separabilists can agree that “evaluation drives extension” (a phrase from Blackburn 1992; see also Gibbard 1992). Thus they can accept the second premise of the anti-disentangling argument while rejecting its first premise (which presupposes Descriptive Equivalence).
On Elstein and Hurka’s first pattern of analysis, a thick term involves only a “global” evaluation that “governs the whole concept”: anything to which distributively just applies is good, and we can identify the general non-evaluative type to which it belongs independently of any evaluation. Their second pattern of analysis, which is meant to fit many virtue and vice concepts, supplements the global thin evaluation with a further thin evaluation that is embedded within non-evaluative description. An example they give is that “act x is courageous” means something like
x is good, and x involves an agent’s accepting harm or the risk of harm for himself for the sake of goods greater than the evil of that harm, where this property makes any act that has it good. (Elstein and Hurka 2009: 527)
The reference to “goods” is an “embedded” evaluation: you can’t even specify the general type of those actions which courageous evaluates globally as good without knowing what count as good goals. But determining this will again require evaluations which an outsider cannot access simply by knowing the non-evaluative content of courageous (Elstein and Hurka 2009: 526–7). Note how global and embedded evaluations differ: you can grasp the embedded evaluation of what count as good goals without any view on what counts as courageous (or even without having the concept), but not so with the global evaluation. (To have a view of what property of the relevant type makes anything that has it good is to have a view on what counts as courageous, on their analysis.) Below “evaluation” means global evaluation unless noted otherwise.
Brent Kyle proposes a different way for Separabilists to avoid the anti-disentangling argument. According to his positive account of the meaning of thick concepts, the Expansion View, thick concepts are expanded contents of thin terms. An expanded content is, roughly, the semantic content of a predicate with modifiers: that Chuck is ready to party and that Chuck is ready for work are among the expanded contents that “Chuck is ready” can express in different contexts of utterance, and likewise for “Shaq is agile” and the proposition that Shaq is agile for a basketball player. Kyle proposes that, similarly, admirable is an expanded content of worthy, namely worthy-[of-admiration], that courageous can be analyzed as some such expanded content of true as true-[to-a-good-cause-despite-risk], and that kind can be analyzed as some such expanded content of good as good-[to-someone-as-an-end] (Kyle 2020: 918–22). The Expansion View contends that all thick concepts have correct analyses of the sort which these rough approximations aim to illustrate. One question about it is how to distinguish, say, courageous from at least certain utterances of reckless in a non-circular way. Many reckless acts satisfy at least the toy analysis of courageous as true-[to-a-good-cause-despite-risk]. The Expansion View is a form of Separability because it requires that thick concepts are composed in part of thin ones (for details, see Kyle 2020: 924–25). But it doesn’t imply that any thick concept can be disentangled into a thin evaluative content plus a non-evaluative description that is co-extensive with the thick concept.
Separability promises to make it clear how thick terms are both evaluative and descriptive. Unless we accept also Descriptive Equivalence, the evaluative contents of thick terms will be provided by independently intelligible evaluative concepts (thin concepts, or affective concepts, or good-in-a-way concepts), and their non-evaluative meanings will be inherited from distinct non-evaluative information. Conjoining Separability with Thin Centralism would also promise theoretical economy: we could explicate a wide range of evaluative concepts on the basis of just a few basic thin concepts and non-evaluative concepts which we need to recognize anyway. (This putative advantage assumes Inherently Evaluative. It isn’t guaranteed by Separability as such; Kyle’s Expansion View yields a form of Separability which accepts Inherently Evaluative but doesn’t require Thin Centralism.) The converse won’t follow from Inseparabilism even if Thick Centralism is true, since thick terms are much more numerous than thin terms. Below we’ll discuss whether Inseparabilists can provide as clear an explanation.
Separability has also been claimed vital for normative criticism of thick concepts. Simon Blackburn claims that those who apply cute to adult women
react to an infantile, unthreatening appearance or self-presentation in women … with admiration or desire (the men) or envy and emulation (the women)
and that we couldn’t criticize this attitude as objectionable if the non-evaluative aspects of cute were inseparable from the admirability or enviability which those non-evaluative aspects are taken to ground (Blackburn 1998: 101). In response one might point out that Inseparability allows that thick terms and concepts entail non-evaluative descriptions of the sort of general type that figures in Elstein and Hurka’s analyses (“has to do with infantile, unthreatening appearance”), so long as these entailments don’t exhaust their descriptive aspects. This in turn opens up room for the specifically normative criticism that no specific features of this general type make admiration or envy appropriate when possessed by adult women. But Inseparabilists must be able to square this idea with their account of how thick terms are evaluative. So let’s now turn to Inseparability.
3.2 Inseparabilist Views
According to Inseparabilists, thick terms and concepts are irreducibly thick: their meanings involve both evaluation and non-evaluative description without this being a matter of combining constituent evaluative and non-evaluative contents. For instance, cruel expresses a sui generis evaluative concept which isn’t a combination of pro tanto bad or bad in way W with some non-evaluative content. How then is the idea that thick terms are both descriptive and evaluative to be understood, if not in terms of combining evaluative and descriptive components? It cannot be that their meanings are both wholly evaluative and wholly non-evaluative (which is how we are understanding the descriptive); that would be contradictory.
The challenge to Inseparabilists is to pin down more precisely how thick terms are both evaluative and descriptive in ways that are continuous with, respectively, thin evaluative concepts and non-evaluative concepts. Simply stipulating new technical notions would leave their claims about the distinctive philosophical significance of thick concepts unsatisfactory. Not just any conceptual entailment of a term seems constitutive of its meaning; while “x is a horse” entails that x is a mammal, it also entails that x isn’t a wombat (or a mountain, or a beer bottle), but not being a wombat (etc.) isn’t part of the meaning of horse (Dancy 2013: 49). But some entailments are such that competence with the term requires grasping them, and thick concepts and descriptive concepts are similar in having non-evaluative entailments of this sort. It is a matter of meaning that lewd acts involve overt sexual display, selfish acts involve the agent giving priority to herself over others, and so on. There is also a methodological rationale for focusing on entailments: linguists study word meanings by considering patterns in competent speakers’ entailment and contradiction judgments, synonymy judgments, and judgments about truth-conditions because these reflect relations among the sorts of entities that semantic theories assign to linguistic expressions as their meanings (Chierchia and McConnell-Ginet 2000: ch. 1). (A complication is that the meanings of words may not map one-to-one onto the concepts those words may be used to express. Writers on thick concepts often don’t say what they take concepts and their relation to word meanings to be.)
What should Inseparabilists say about the common way in which thick and thin concepts are evaluative? Several views have been proposed, but a simple proposal will hopefully suffice to give a feel for the issue. Thick and thin concepts might be thought similar in that both have intrinsic practical relevance (Dancy 2013: 56–7). Whereas the relevance of a non-evaluative concept such as water to your actions needs to be explained by citing other considerations, such as your desire to quench thirst or the fact that you are stranded in the desert, no further explanation is needed for the practical relevance of thin concepts like ought or thick concepts such as courage. It is “to be expected” that courageousness makes a practical difference: it is normally, even if not always, something to aspire to and admire. Whereas competence with non-evaluative concepts requires only the ability to determine whether the concept applies, competence with an evaluative concept requires also grasping its general evaluative point—the sorts of practical difference its instantiation can make in a particular case. For thick concepts, the sort of difference may vary from case to case: rudeness is usually inappropriate, but sometimes neutral and sometimes positively called for. One problem with this view is that its metaethical commitments are too controversial for a general distinction between evaluative and non-evaluative concepts. For example, under the “internalist” view of normative reasons, according to which there is a reason for an agent to perform a particular action only if the action is suitably related to the agent’s motivations, courageous and morally good have no more intrinsic practical relevance than water and wombat (Williams 1981). Whether their application makes a difference to your reasons will depend on your motivations. It is also controversial that “objectionable” thick concepts have intrinsic practical relevance. Why then should other thick concepts?
For a summary of other Inseparabilist views on how thick and thin concepts are evaluative, see section 2 of the supplementary document “Additional Debates about Thick Concepts and Their Significance”.
Debates about Separability and Inseparability frequently lead to two further issues. The first is that Inseparability requires that thick terms and concepts are inherently evaluative in meaning and that most Separabilists also take evaluation and non-evaluative description to be combined within the meanings of thick terms and concepts, not merely their use. The second issue is that if thick terms and concepts are inherently evaluative, it isn’t enough to specify the shared sense in which both thick and thin concepts are evaluative. To preserve a distinction, we must also ask specify how they differ. (And if thick terms and concepts aren’t inherently evaluative, we must instead say how they differ from other non-evaluative descriptive concepts.) The next two sections address these issues in turn.
4. The Location Question: How Are Thick Concepts Evaluative?
Both the debate about Separability and Inseparability and the putative broader significance of the thick depend on assumptions about how thick terms are evaluative. While everyone agrees that thick terms are somehow linguistically associated with evaluations, the crucial assumption of many of these arguments is that utterances involving thick terms (T-utterances, for short) are evaluative specifically as a matter of the conditions that must hold for such utterances to express true propositions. If the extension of a thick term has a descriptive equivalent, then evaluation makes no difference to the truth-conditions of the utterances involving that term. A natural explanation of why an outsider who grasps the non-evaluative content of a thick term couldn’t master the extension of a thick term would be be that its truth-conditions include some evaluative condition which the outsider doesn’t grasp. And thick terms can challenge a logical is-ought gap only if T-utterances have an evaluative truth-condition, since logical relations are relations between truth-conditions. Accordingly Inseparabilists and many Separabilists take evaluation to contribute to semantic content—the kind of meaning that determines the reference or truth-conditions of sentences involving thick terms.
The view that the evaluations normally conveyed by T-utterances are conveyed by the same mechanism as semantic or truth-conditional content in general is, however, controversial. Utterances can communicate information that doesn’t contribute to their truth-conditions, and in section 4.2 we’ll see several ways they can do so, either in virtue of other linguistic conventions or conversational principles and mechanisms. If we use the label “semantic” narrowly to refer only to truth-conditional properties of utterances, and use the label “pragmatic” broadly to cover the other ways for utterances to convey information, then the view that thick terms are globally evaluative as a matter of the truth-conditions of T-utterances may be called the “Semantic View” and the views according which thick terms convey global evaluation through some other mechanism of information transfer may be called “Pragmatic Views”. (To avoid confusion, also bear in mind that “pragmatic” is often used more narrowly to refer only to features of utterances that are explained by conversational principles rather than linguistic conventions.)
4.1 The Semantic View
The most widely accepted view of the relation between thick terms and evaluation is:
Semantic View: The semantic (truth-conditional) meanings of thick terms and concepts contain global evaluations.
We can assess the relative plausibility of Semantic and Pragmatic Views by seeing how well they explain various patterns of the kinds of linguistic behavior on which linguists rely in assessing claims about whether some feature of an utterance is part of its truth-conditions or not. The data we’ll briefly consider below focus on what we called global evaluations in section 3.1; Pragmatic Views can allow the meanings of thick terms to contain embedded evaluation (Väyrynen 2013: 42–3). The data don’t by themselves entail either the Semantic View or any version of the Pragmatic View. These views should rather be understood as claiming to constitute part of the best explanation of a wide body of linguistic data involving thick terms.
Some of the relevant linguistic data seem easy to explain if thick terms are semantically evaluative. Consider the assertions in (1)–(2):
- # Making fun of an insecure person just for fun is cruel and not bad in any way for it.
- Speaker A: It was courageous of Sue to stand up to that racist on the bus.
- # Speaker B: Sure, courageous—and not good in any way for it.
In both (1) and the exchange in (2), the denial of an evaluation that is normally conveyed by cruel and courageous sounds odd, or infelicitous (indicated by “#”). If the first half of (1) has a global evaluation of something as bad in a certain way as part of its truth-conditions, the oddness of (1) can be neatly explained as reflecting a logical contradiction between its two halves. The same would go for the exchange in (2): A’s and B’s utterances entail contradictory claims about whether Sue’s act was good in any way. (See Kyle 2013a for a discussion of how the Semantic View might allow that (1) isn’t odd in all contexts.)
It is natural to assume that if a thick term conveys an evaluation as a matter of truth-conditions, that evaluation is either positive or negative but not both and the evaluation is the same in all contexts where the term is used to make an assertion. (We’ll discuss non-assertive contexts below.) But many paradigmatic thick terms can be used to evaluate negatively in some contexts while positively in others. Some philosophers claim that the Semantic View cannot explain this “contextual variability” in the evaluative valence of T-utterances. Although frugal normally conveys a positive evaluation, calling someone whose “main job is dispensing hospitality” frugal counts as a criticism (Blackburn 1992: 286). Similarly, although cruel normally conveys a negative evaluation, it might be thought to convey positive evaluation when the cruelty of an action is “just what made it such fun” (Hare 1981: 73). Such variability might be thought to show that thick virtue concepts aren’t evaluative concepts (Brower 1988). However, variability in valence is compatible with the Semantic View (Väyrynen 2011). These examples might be thought to involve a non-literal use of the thick term or to convey the non-typical evaluation not by way of word meaning but by way of speaker meaning. (What the speaker means in using some word can come apart from the meaning that the word has in the language. I can intend to be speaking about plums of any kind when I use the word prune but that doesn’t make it any less the case that in English prune means dried plums.) Or it might be that the normal evaluation is built into the truth-conditions of the sentences involving it and the opposite evaluation can be explained in terms of one of the pragmatic mechanisms we’ll consider in section 4.2. Or it might be that although thick terms are semantically evaluative, their valence isn’t fixed but rather their meanings allow involve different evaluations in different contexts (Dancy 1995). These also don’t exhaust the options for a semantic explanation of variability (Kyle 2020: 926). More generally, it doesn’t seem promising to explain valence reversal by appeal to lexical deflationism, ambiguity, or echoic use of language (Cepollaro 2018).
A stronger challenge to the Semantic View is based on two more complex sets of linguistic data about thick terms: the evaluations normally conveyed by T-utterances seem to survive embedding in various complex sentences that usually block truth-conditional content, and those evaluations seem to be defeasible in ways that truth-conditional content isn’t.
The first set of data concern what happens when atomic sentences involving thick terms are embedded in various complex sentences; truth-conditional content often doesn’t survive such embedding. The data are clearest in the case of objectionable thick concepts which were introduced in section 2.1. (The most comprehensive presentation of the data can be found in Väyrynen 2013: ch. 3.) The word chaste applies to a certain kind of sexual restraint. It is typically used to convey positive evaluation to the effect that such restraint is praiseworthy or good in a certain way. If chaste is in fact objectionable and the evaluation that makes it so is part of its truth-conditions, then nothing is chaste; chaste fails to refer. If instead the associated evaluation that makes chaste objectionable is truth-conditionally irrelevant, chaste may be true of things which just don’t “fit” the evaluation; it will “misevaluate” (Eklund 2011).
Those who reject the evaluation of sexual restraint as good and thus find chaste objectionable in its customary positive use (call them chaste-objectors) are at least typically reluctant to utter sentences like (3):
- Isolde is chaste.
Interestingly, chaste-objectors are also reluctant to use chaste when it is embedded in negation, questions, modal operators such as possibly and might, and the antecedent of the conditional.
- Isolde isn’t chaste.
- Is Isolde chaste?
- Isolde might be chaste.
- If Isolde is chaste, so is Tristan.
None of (4a–d) entail that Isolde is chaste. So chaste-objectors’ reluctance to utter (4a–d) seems hard to explain if the positive evaluation associated with chaste is part of the truth-conditions of (3). Since the evaluation survives when chaste is embedded under operators that block truth-conditional content, it appears to “project” outside of the truth-conditions of chaste. This kind of projection behavior is a general feature of T-utterances, since virtually any thick term seems to be in principle open to being regarded as objectionable. As we’ll see in section 4.2 below, this projection behavior is characteristic of certain truth-conditionally irrelevant pragmatic contents and is thus well explained by many Pragmatic Views.
The Semantic View may, however, offer a different explanation of these projection data. One option is that T-utterances normally convey two kinds of evaluations. Perhaps chaste is semantically evaluative and, in addition, someone who uses the word thereby conveys that she approves of the semantically associated way of valuing (namely, valuing people or behavior positively for showing sexual restraint). Insofar as this latter aspect projects from embeddings that block truth-conditional content and the reluctance of chaste-objectors to utter (4a–d) can be explained as being due only to the latter aspect, their reluctance doesn’t show that chaste isn’t also semantically evaluative. (Eklund forthcoming.) This proposal seems, however, unable by itself to explain the defeasibility data discussed below, which suggest that even the associated evaluations themselves can be suspended without infelicity.
Another explanation of the projection data is due to Brent Kyle. It comes in two pieces. The first concerns (4a). When you say someone is not happy, you only say that they lack the quality of being happy, not that they are unhappy. But normally, in the absence of an explicit note to the contrary, we tend to interpret the claim that someone isn’t happy as conversationally implicating (conveying, suggesting) that they are unhappy. It should then be equally plausible that not chaste similarly conversationally implicates unchaste. Since those who find chaste objectionable should also be reluctant to imply that anyone is unchaste, this would explain why chaste-objectors are reluctant to utter (4a). So what about (4b–d)? To be a chaste-objector you must have concluded that things aren’t good simply for showing a certain kind of sexual restraint. If the Semantic View is true, it follows that nothing can be chaste. But each of (4b–d) implies that the speaker considers it a live possibility that Isolde is chaste. No wonder, then, that chaste-objectors are reluctant to assert (4b–d). Since these explanations focus on truth-conditionally irrelevant implications of (4a–d), they are compatible with the Semantic View (Kyle 2013a: 13–19). In appealing to two distinct types of implicature, this piecemeal explanation is less parsimonious than Pragmatic Views which make do with just one mechanism, but whether that makes the explanation worse overall is a complex question up for debate. (For this methodological issue, see section 3 of the supplementary document “Additional Debates about Thick Concepts and Their Significance”.)
The second set of data concern the possibility of denying or suspending an evaluation that a T-utterance normally conveys without rejecting the utterance itself. Truth-conditional contents cannot be denied in this way. If I say “Gerald asked three questions at Heather’s talk” and you reply “No, he asked two”, you reject my utterance as false. But if you reply “ No, he asked four”, you aren’t rejecting the truth of my utterance but only its conversational implicature that Gerald asked exactly three questions. In (1) and (2) direct denials of evaluation following assertive T-utterances are odd. But consider:
- Whether or not Isolde is chaste, she is in no way good for her sexual restraint. (Cf. Väyrynen 2013: 66)
- Whether or not this is a good thing, Isolde can be truthfully and neutrally described as being chaste. (Cf. Bergström 2002: 5)
- The carnival was a lot of fun. But something was missing. It just wasn’t lewd. I hope it’ll be lewd next year. (Due to Matti Eklund)
If these utterances can be acceptable, that would be evidence that the evaluation normally conveyed by chaste isn’t part of its truth-conditions. A speaker of (7) makes it clear that she would rejoice in a more sexually explicit carnival, thus shedding a commitment to evaluating the carnival negatively if it were more explicit. If that evaluation were part of the truth-conditions of lewd, we would expect (7) not to sound coherent on a literal use of lewd. The denial in (5) and suspension in (6) don’t concern only whether the speaker approves of the way of valuing associated with the thick term but also that evaluation itself. An utterance of (5) brackets the question whether the truth-conditions of (3) hold and denies the evaluation either way. If you forced a chaste-objector to judge (3) as either true or false, she might prefer to classify it as true while using something like (5) to signal that she is using chaste non-evaluatively. Uttering (6) would be a way for someone who is agnostic about whether chastity is good in any way to suspend the evaluation while conceding that the truth-conditions of (3) hold. It isn’t clear how either (5) or (6) could be compatible with locating the evaluation in the truth-conditions of (3). So the proponents of the Semantic View may need to claim that utterances of (5)–(7) either don’t involve literal uses of thick terms or are infelicitous despite the fact that many speakers don’t find them to be linguistically odd as utterances.
One radical way to reconcile the Semantic View with the defeasibility data is to argue that a condition can be part of what constitutes the meaning of an expression even if the expression doesn’t satisfy the condition and even if the condition can be competently rejected by users of the expression. On this view, chaste might entail good for showing sexual restraint as a matter of meaning even if things to which chaste applies in fact aren’t good in any way and even if some semantically competent speakers reject the evaluation without rejecting (1). In developing this view, Matti Eklund argues that it isn’t ad hoc because there are other concepts that can plausibly be treated as inconsistent in this kind of way (Eklund 2011).
The debate about whether the evaluations normally conveyed by thick terms are defeasible quickly gets complex and technical. (A fuller discussion of the defeasibility data and their explanation can be found in Väyrynen 2013: 66–95.) Sometimes the linguistic intuitions on which we rely in assessing competing explanations may also be less firm or not as widely shared as we would like. An additional complication is that some evidence about how people in fact reason with positive and negative thick terms suggests that evaluations are more easily defeasible for positive thick terms than for negative ones (Willemsen and Reuter 2020). Existing work largely assumes that positive and negative thick terms behave in largely the same ways. Asymmetrical valence effects would thus complicate matters for both Semantic and Pragmatic Views. How much they would do so depends on how deep a difference in meaning the asymmetry would reflect. Pascale Willemsen and Kevin Reuter (2020) propose that the valence effect is due to a difference in the social norms guiding positive and negative evaluative language, but the issue is under-explored. Another further issue concerns whether certain kinds of denials of T-utterances focused on the evaluations that they normally convey are better understood as instances of the truth-conditional negation that we learn about in logic classes, or of “metalinguistic” negation which targets aspects of utterances other than their truth-conditional content.
4.2 Pragmatic Views
Understanding how else thick terms might be related to evaluation than by way of truth-conditions requires a brief look at how utterances can in general communicate information that isn’t part of their truth-conditions. Linguists and philosophers of language have identified several other mechanisms of information transfer by which a speaker can communicate information, such as a proposition, that isn’t part of the truth-conditions of her utterance. If this further information is false, that isn’t usually thought to make the utterance itself false, but merely odd in some way. Some of these mechanisms operate on other features besides truth-conditions which terms may have in virtue of linguistic conventions, others operate through distinct conversational mechanisms. (For a fuller discussion of these mechanisms in the context of thick terms, see Väyrynen 2013: ch. 5.)
One way for utterances to communicate further information is presupposition:
- A: “I don’t regret being a member of the
Presupposition: A was a member of the Communist party.
How exactly presuppositions of utterances are related to their truth-conditions is a complex topic. Perhaps A’s utterance can be true even if the presupposition is false: you can’t regret something you never did. Either way, linguists largely think that the presupposition isn’t part of the truth-conditions of A’s utterance, but only part of the “common ground” of the conversation. Among writers on thick concepts, Allan Gibbard and Gopal Sreenivasan speak of the evaluations conveyed by T-utterances as presuppositions, but without developing the view in detail (Gibbard 1992; Sreenivasan 2001: 26). More detailed and sophisticated developments can be found in Cepollaro and Stojanovic (2016) and Cepollaro (2020). An open question about this view is whether the relevant presuppositions are better understood pragmatically, as conveying the speaker’s beliefs about the conversation’s common ground, or semantically, as something that expressions carry as part of their meaning. A worry about presuppositional views is that the evaluations normally conveyed by objectionable thick concepts have no prospect of being added to the common ground of the conversation when some addressees find them objectionable, whereas presuppositions not already in the common ground are expected to be added to it unless challenged. Resources for addressing both of these issues might, however, be available in the complex and subtle contemporary work on presupposition in linguistics (cf. Cepollaro 2020: ch. 4).
Utterances can communicate further information by way of conventional implicature (Grice 1975: 25).
- A: “Shaq is tall but agile.”
Conventional implicature: Shaq’s agility is unexpected given his tallness.
There is significant consensus that “Shaq is tall but agile” and “Shaq is tall and agile” are true in all the same circumstances. But the latter doesn’t communicate a contrast between tallness and agility. The implicated contrast proposition isn’t part of the truth-conditions of B’s utterance. The implicature is widely regarded as conventional because the contrast seems to be part of the standing meaning of but in English; a speaker who finds no difference between what and and but communicate is in some sense not fully competent with but. An implicature of an utterance that needn’t be carried by an utterance of a truth-conditionally equivalent sentence is said to be “detachable” from the utterance (Grice 1975: 39). In section 2.1 we saw that according to R.M. Hare the evaluative content of thick terms is detachable in this sense. But he doesn’t say whether he thinks that the evaluative contents of thick terms are conventional implicatures. If the evaluations normally conveyed by T-utterances were conventional implicatures (or semantic presuppositions, for that matter), then thick terms would be inherently evaluative in meaning, but not as a matter of truth-conditions. One problem for this view is that conventional implicatures aren’t defeasible in the ways that the evaluations normally conveyed by T-utterances seem to be: “Whether or not Shaq’s agility is unexpected given his tallness, Shaq is tall but agile” sounds very odd.
A third way for utterances to communicate further information is conversational implicature. Imagine the following conversation at the campus cafeteria:
- A: Are you coming to Jack’s party?
B: I have to work.
Conversational implicature: B can’t come to the party.
The implicature doesn’t look like part of the truth-conditions of B’s utterance. All that B says is that she has to work. That doesn’t become false if B attends the party after all. The implicature is conversational because A has to work it out from B’s utterance by relying on contextual observations and rules of cooperative communication, such as that B wouldn’t utter a sentence that isn’t directly relevant to A’s question unless she was trying to convey something that is relevant, namely that she won’t be coming to the party. (Grice 1975: 26–31.) Among writers on thick concepts, Simon Blackburn occasionally suggests that the evaluations normally conveyed by thick terms are conversational implicatures (Blackburn 1992; his 1998 is harder to read this way; see also Zangwill 1995: 322). But this view doesn’t explain the projection data above: conversational implicatures mostly don’t survive embedding under negation, questions, and so on, except by coincidence. (If B had said “I don’t have to work”, she wouldn’t have implicated that she can’t come to the party.) The evaluations normally conveyed by T-utterances are also not as directly deniable as conversational implicatures: “I have to work, but I don’t mean to imply that I won’t be coming to the party” sounds perfectly fine, unlike the similarly direct denials in (1) and (2) above. Unlike most views on how thick terms convey evaluation, the conversational implicature view has also been tested empirically. In a study designed to test whether the evaluative aspects of thick concepts are separable from their non-evaluative aspects, Willemsen and Reuter (2020) found evidence that the two aren’t separable in the way that conversational implicatures are separable from the contents whose utterances generate those implicatures. Further empirical studies to test other semantic and pragmatic hypotheses about the relationship between thick terms and evaluation would be a welcome development in the debate.
So the conversational implicature view about the relationship between thick terms and evaluation cannot explain either set of the linguistic data in section 4.1. The other two do better. Both presuppositions and conventional implicatures project in ways suggested by (4a–d). These views also predict that (1) should sound odd: “I regret being a member of the communist party and I never was a member” sounds close to contradictory, and so does “Shaq is tall but agile and his being agile isn’t unexpected given his tallness”. Pragmatic presuppositions in particular also promise to be defeasible in the ways the evaluations normally conveyed by T-utterances may be taken to be on the back of examples like (5)–(7). But there might be suitably weak notions of semantic presupposition that also can claim this advantage.
The pragmatic view developed by Pekka Väyrynen identifies a type of pragmatic content that projects and is defeasible but needn’t readily become mutually taken for granted by conversational participants to explain the evaluations normally conveyed by T-utterances. He proposes:
Not-At-Issue View: Global evaluations are implications of T-utterances which are normally “not at issue” in their literal uses in normal contexts, and which arise conversationally. (Väyrynen 2013: 122)
When someone calls Rihanna’s show lewd, or Donald Trump’s stump speech unhinged, a negative evaluation is a generalized implication of the utterance in the sense that it is part of the standard or default interpretation of such utterances, not a one-off occurrence. Its generalized status is explained by social facts such as that it isn’t common in these parts to use chaste, cruel, generous, and so on, neutrally. It is common knowledge that those who use a given thick term for the most part accept certain evaluations and their utterances for the most part accurately reflect their acceptance of those evaluations. (Such social facts may also help explain why thick terms seem more intimately connected to evaluation than other non-evaluative terms that are often used evaluatively, such as chocolatey and athletic.) But the implication is “not at issue” in the sense that the evaluation is not the main point of her utterance but rather is part of the background that the speaker takes for granted (but needn’t assume his audience to accept) in making the utterance. The main point is to assert that the thing in question falls under the term, against the background evaluation that things falling under the term tend to be bad in a certain sort of way. Insofar as the presence of the evaluation can be explained conversationally, we can expect it to be open to be denied or suspended by objectors in the ways suggested by the defeasibility data above. And a general feature of various kind of backgrounded contents is that they project in ways illustrated by (4a–d). (For more on this version of the Pragmatic View, see Väyrynen 2013: chs. 5–6.)
If this kind of Pragmatic View is correct, thick concepts seem to lack the broader significance that some have assigned to them. The evaluations normally conveyed by T-utterances will be separable from thick terms in whatever way pragmatic not-at-issue implications are in general separable from the utterances that generate them. And if the conclusion that thick terms aren’t semantically evaluative shows that there are no irreducibly evaluative thick concepts that we must possess in order to think about their subject matter, thick concepts cannot undermine the is-ought distinction, force us to rethink reflection and objectivity in ethics, or be conceptually or explanatorily prior to or interdependent with thin concepts (Väyrynen 2013: ch. 10). However, the relationship between language and concepts is vexed in this area, and may interfere with the implications of Pragmatic Views for the significance of thick concepts. (For discussion, see Väyrynen 2013: 44–51; Zangwill 2013; Eklund forthcoming.) The overall plausibility of the Pragmatic View depends on several further issues. One concerns its implications regarding thin terms. For instance, if thin terms are also open to being regarded as objectionable, then the behavior exhibited by objectionable thick terms in section 4.1 above either supports a pragmatic view of thin terms as well or doesn’t support the Pragmatic View of thick terms and concepts (Eklund forthcoming). Insofar as we are convinced that thin terms are semantically evaluative, this result might be bad news for the Pragmatic View. (But see Sundell 2016, who argues that thin aesthetic terms aren’t inherently evaluative in meaning, but merely used evaluatively.) This leads us to our last topic: how do thick and thin concepts differ from one another?
For a summary of further comparisons between Semantic and Pragmatic Views, see section 3 of the supplementary document “Additional Debates about Thick Concepts and Their Significance”.
5. The Delineation Question: How Do Thick and Thin Concepts Differ?
A crucial feature of the intuitive characterization of thick terms and concepts with which we began is that they differ from the thin with respect to the non-evaluative information each encode. Even if cruel acts are bad, not all bad acts can be cruel; cruel acts must involve, and are distinguished from other bad acts by, non-evaluative qualities such as taking pleasure in causing others to suffer. The thickening agent in thick terms is non-evaluative description. This contrast with the thin may be understood in two kinds of ways: as a difference in kind, or as a difference in degree. As we consider each option in turn, we’ll see that the question of how thick and thin terms and concepts differ has no theory-neutral answer.
5.1 Thick and Thin Differ in Kind
One way for thick and thin to differ in kind would be for thin terms express purely evaluative concepts and for thick terms to express concepts that aren’t purely evaluative but encode also non-evaluative information. An early version of this proposal is due to Bernard Williams: thin terms are wholly action-guiding whereas thick terms are both action-guiding and world-guided (Williams 1985: 152). His particular version is problematic: the notion of action-guidingness isn’t as clear as one would like and many philosophers take also thin terms to be world-guided in the sense that their application depends on how the world is. (For a more recent version, see Dancy 2013: 47–51.) In its general form, this proposal presupposes the Semantic View but is available to both Separabilists and Inseparabilists. Similarly, although Williams denies Thin Centralism concerning the relations of conceptual and explanatory priority between thick and thin concepts, the general proposal could be combined with Thin Centralism or the No Priority view. A potential problem for it is that it isn’t clear whether all paradigmatic thin concepts are wholly evaluative, given the intuitive idea that thick terms are those that somehow involve both evaluation and non-evaluative description. If ought implies can as a conceptual or analytic matter, then its application will be restricted by the non-evaluative condition that the agent is able to perform the action (Väyrynen 2013: 7). In that case ought wouldn’t look descriptively much thinner than some terms that are often classified as thick. The application of admirable, for instance, is non-evaluatively constrained only by the non-evaluative features of admiration. As noted in section 3.2, not all entailments of an expression are encoded in its meaning and it isn’t straightforward to determine which are. But competence with at least certain concepts ought can be used to express may well require that if we think you ought to do something, we would accept that you can do it if the question came up.
Another way to think that thick and thin differ in kind is generated by Pragmatic Views. These views entail that thick terms aren’t evaluative as a matter of truth-conditions, but are only used evaluatively. Insofar as thin terms are evaluative as a matter of truth-conditions, they will clearly differ in kind from the thick. Here the difference in kind would be such as to support Non-Centralism. However, as noted above, some arguments for Pragmatic Views might imply that thin terms are equally not evaluative as a matter of truth-conditions but only used evaluatively. There would then be no difference in kind (in this respect, anyway) between thick and thin. It would remain a separate question whether there are any interesting relations of conceptual or explanatory priority between thick and thin concepts.
5.2 Thick and Thin Differ in Degree
The second view about the relationship between thick and thin is that they differ only in degree, not in kind. Samuel Scheffler suggests this view in objecting to Bernard Williams’s claim that thick and thin differ in kind. He observes that there are many evaluative terms that are hard to classify as either thick or thin, such as just, fair, impartial, rights, autonomy, well-being, and consent. They are less rich in non-evaluative content than terms such as cruel or tactful, although richer than good or right. But if descriptive thickness is a matter of degree, then perhaps a binary division of evaluative concepts into thick and thin is an “oversimplification” (Scheffler 1987: 417–8). We might instead think of the distinction in terms of a continuum of descriptive thickness or specificity, where Scheffler’s examples lie between paradigmatic thick and thin terms. On the thin end we might either allow that some thin terms are purely evaluative and treat them as a limiting case, or we might hold that even the maximally thin concepts are a little bit thick. Those holding the latter view have advocated either Thin Centralism (Smith 2013) or Thick Centralism (Chappell 2013), but the latter view, unlike the former, seems compatible also with the No Priority View.
Whatever the merits of this view about how thick and thin differ only in degree, it doesn’t follow simply from conceding that evaluative terms may be descriptively thick to varying degrees. This concession allows a binary distinction between purely thin evaluative concepts and thick evaluative concepts that are characterized by having some or other degree of non-evaluative content (cf. Dancy 2013: 48–9). More definite conclusions about Scheffler’s proposal would require reflection on whether his examples could plausibly belong to a separate third category of evaluative terms that are neither thick nor thin, and on whether a principled distinction can be drawn between different kinds of non-evaluative content. In the latter case a paradigmatic thin term such as ought might be a little bit thick if it implied can, and yet lack a kind of non-evaluative content that is possessed only by thick terms proper. Perhaps, for instance, the non-evaluative aspects of tactful and cruel distinguish their meanings from other evaluative terms in a way that can doesn’t do with ought.
If thin terms are evaluative as a matter of truth-conditions, then any version of the difference-in-degree view requires that the Semantic View is true of thick terms. It fits with Pragmatic Views only if these take thick and thin terms both to be related to the evaluations they convey in the same way (whether as a matter of presupposition, implicature, or some kind of not-at-issue content). Either way it will be a further question whether the view is best combined with Thin Centralism, Thick Centralism, No Priority View or Non-Centralism. Again the question whether thick and thin differ in degree or in kind has no theory-neutral answer but depends on the correct substantive theory of thick terms and concepts.
A final proposal we’ll consider can be developed either as saying that thick and thin terms differ in kind or that they differ in degree. R.M. Hare denies that thin terms are purely evaluative; actual usages of thin terms like good will always carry some descriptive meaning. Instead, thick and thin terms both incorporate evaluative and non-evaluative information. The difference is that thin terms have their evaluative meaning “more firmly attached” to them than their non-evaluative meaning, whereas thick terms have their non-evaluative meaning “more firmly attached” to them than their evaluative meaning (Hare 1963: 24–25; see also the distinction between primarily and secondarily evaluative words in Hare 1952: 121–2). The idea is that evaluative terms can be distinguished in terms of which sort of meaning is less likely to change when speakers alter their usage of a term. If laissez-faire capitalists begin to use selfish positively, we are much more likely to still understand them than if they started using selfish to describe generous acts. We would be less likely to be accused of misusing kind and generous if we began to use them negatively to condemn bleeding hearts than if we started using them to describe cruel and selfish acts. Hare takes this to suggest that the non-evaluative meanings of thick terms are more firmly attached to them than their evaluative meanings. Thin terms display the opposite behavior. We will understand those who use good to evaluate promise-breaking, torture, and enslavement of their enemies positively, whereas we would be liable to be misunderstood or accused of misusing the word if we started using good to express negative evaluations of helping and respecting others. Such descriptive ossification of thin terms, while not impossible, would seem very much like an exception rather than the rule. (Hare 1952: 123 notes that a good effluent functions as a descriptive technical term in sewage disposal manuals.) So the evaluative meanings of thin terms (in particular, their action-guiding function) seem to be more firmly attached to them than their non-evaluative meanings.
Hare’s proposal seems quite ecumenical. If you worry that the talk of evaluative and non-evaluative meanings suggests that Hare’s proposal is committed to Separability, note that it can be reformulated as follows: thick and thin terms are typically used to perform two kinds of speech acts, describing and evaluating, and they differ with respect to how likely a speaker is to be misunderstood or accused of misusing the term if one or the other of these speech acts is changed. For instance, a speaker who uses selfish to evaluate positively acts which we typically describe as selfish would be more likely to be understood than a speaker who uses selfish to describe generous acts and evaluate them negatively, whereas the opposite pattern holds for thin terms. This version of the proposal seems compatible with Inseparability. Nor does the proposal entail the Semantic View. Instead of taking evaluative and non-evaluative meanings both to be semantic meanings, the less firmly attached meaning can be taken as a speaker meaning instead. One way to interpret Hare’s distinction between primarily and secondarily evaluative words is that the latter carry evaluation only as a speaker meaning whereas the former carry non-evaluative description only as a speaker meaning (Hare 1952: 121–4). The Pragmatic View is well suited to treating the evaluations normally conveyed by T-utterances as speaker meanings, especially if they are best explained by conversational mechanisms. Here we can finally ask whether Hare’s proposal makes thick and thin different in kind or degree. You might think the latter: how firmly two things are attached is a matter of degree. However, the distinction between semantic and speaker meaning makes a difference-in-kind reading available. If the non-evaluative meanings of thick terms are semantic meanings and their evaluative meanings are speaker meanings but thin terms work the other way around, then Hare’s proposal regarding what kind of meanings thick and thin terms are more firmly attached to would be a difference in kind.
For a summary of how thick terms and concepts relate to a further sort of evaluative terms, pejoratives, see section 4 of the supplementary document “Additional Debates about Thick Concepts and Their Significance”.
6. Thick Concepts Outside of Ethics
Thick concepts have been a stable topic of debate among moral philosophers since the seminal discussion in Williams (1985) and have enjoyed something of a resurgence in ethics since 2010 or so. Thick concepts are also receiving increasing attention in such other areas of philosophy as epistemology, aesthetics, legal philosophy, and more. (Such attention is often motivated, as in ethics, by dissatisfaction with the extant state of the field.)
For some while now, aestheticians and philosophers of art have paid attention to thick aesthetic concepts such as garish, delicate, and balanced, in addition to thin(ner) concepts such as beautiful and ugly. Some of these discussions go back to the 1950s, predating the post-Williams debate in ethics, but concern some of the same issues even if they don’t use the label “thick” (Beardsley 1982 and Sibley 2001; see also Burton 1992 and Zangwill 1995). Also relevant is the recent attention to “dual character concepts” (section 1) in art (Liao et al. 2020). Discussions of thick aesthetic concepts often mirror discussions in ethics about whether thick terms are evaluative as a matter of truth-conditions or only pragmatically (recent examples includes Bonzon 2009, Zangwill 2013, and Stojanovic 2016). Of particular interest and potentially broader significance is the emerging exploration of whether also thin aesthetic terms might be plausibly treated as only pragmatically evaluative (Sundell 2016).
There has been increasing attention in epistemology to thick epistemic concepts such as gullible, quick to jump to conclusions, and open-minded. This is particularly common in virtue epistemology, which seeks to explain epistemic properties such as knowledge and justified belief in terms of the cognizer’s intellectual virtues and vices. Whether focusing on thick epistemic concepts can lead to a preferable epistemology is the topic of several papers in a special issue of the journal Philosophical Papers (Kotzee and Wanderer 2008; see also Battaly 2001). A foundational question here is whether there is a distinction between thick and thin epistemic concepts and whether it be understood in the same way as the distinction between thick and thin ethical concepts (Väyrynen 2008; Roberts 2018a). For instance, are thick epistemic concepts supposed to be thick in the sense that they involve evaluation and non-evaluative description, or in the sense that they involve epistemic and non-epistemic content? (These are different distinctions even if epistemic content is often evaluative and non-epistemic content often non-evaluative.) These discussions almost invariably assume that knowledge is a thin concept. But Brent Kyle argues that knowledge is better understood as a thick concept and uses its thickness to cast light on why the so-called Gettier problem for definitions of knowledge arises (Kyle 2013b).
Beyond ethics, aesthetics, and epistemology, attention to thick concepts has been more scattered. In legal philosophy, David Enoch and Kevin Toh suggest not only that legal statements often express concepts that seem thick, such as crime and inheritance, but also that legal is itself a thick concept. Specifically, it involves both a representation of certain social facts and a kind of evaluative endorsement. Treating legal as a thick concept allows debates about the nature of law to draw on the broader philosophical context of debates about thick concepts in ethics, and in this way has potential to introduce new input into and options for thinking about the nature of law. (Enoch and Toh 2013.) In metaphysics, Gideon Yaffe argues that if we treat free will as a thick concept that involves positive evaluation of items that fall under it, we are better able to explain certain facts about freedom of will than if we proceed with the more standard assumption that freedom of will is a non-evaluative concept (Yaffe 2000). Finally, the idea of a thick concept has also been invoked to do significant work in various areas of applied philosophy. Empirical research on moral judgment in psychology and neuroscience may be criticized for having restricted its studies to judgments involving thin concepts and ignoring thick concepts, especially if thick concepts are irreducibly thick (Abend 2011; see also FitzGerald and Goldie 2012). In environmental ethics, classifying concepts such as ecological integrity as thick might be thought to buttress their normative significance (Shockley 2012). In risk theory, arguing that concepts of risk and safety are thick might help to show how these concepts can be evaluative without being socially constructed (Möller 2012). Outside of philosophy, it has been suggested that sociological research into specific groups’ or societies’ repertoires of thick concepts can deliver insights into how thick concepts work which cannot be obtained from the armchair and provide access to important aspects of social life which aren’t accessible via thin concepts (Abend 2019). Time will tell whether thick concepts will come to make a greater impact in these and other areas.
Attention to thick concepts in various areas of philosophy is often inspired by dissatisfaction with dominant lines of research and the hope that thick concepts will redirect the work in these areas. We have seen that cashing out this hope often requires substantial assumptions regarding issues such as the anti-disentangling argument, shapelessness, the inseparability of evaluation and description, and the location of evaluation in the semantics and pragmatics of thick terms. A plausible theory of thick concepts may then not give thick concepts the significance their fans take them to have, and either way these assumptions attract substantial resistance in their own right. On the other hand, those who find thick concepts to have little distinctive significance nonetheless must ensure that evaluative and normative domains can be accounted for in terms of thin concepts in a way that addresses the concerns that inspire interest in thick concepts. Any complete theory of normativity and value must therefore reckon somehow or other with the fundamental issues concerning thick concepts.
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Other Internet Resources
- Thick Concepts, entry by Brent Kyle in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
- Thick Aesthetic Concepts in Extreme Metal, blog post.