Umar Khayyam

First published Tue Sep 6, 2011; substantive revision Fri Feb 10, 2017
Of knowledge naught remained I did not know,
Of secrets, scarcely any, high or low;
All day and night for three score and twelve years,
I pondered, just to learn that naught I know.
(Rubā‘iyyāt, Sa‘idī 1991, p. 125)

Umar Khayyam was a polymath, scientist, philosopher, and poet of the 11th century CE. Whereas his mathematical works and poetry have been the subject of much discussion, his recently edited and published philosophical works have remained a largely neglected area of study. In what follows, we shall review and comment on the salient features of Khayyam’s poetry and philosophy, their relationship with one another, and Khayyam’s pioneering views on mathematics.

Traditionally, Umar Khayyam’s significance in the annals of Islamic intellectual tradition is due to, his Rubā‘iyyāt (quatrains) and his scientific works, especially those in the field of mathematics. The latter have always been overshadowed by his poetry. In recent years, critical editions of the philosophical works of Khayyam have been published which not only provide us with an insight into his philosophical thought but also provide a context for a more philosophical interpretation of the Rubā‘iyyāt.

In his Rubā‘iyyāt, Khayyam challenged religious doctrines, alluded to the hypocrisy of the clergy, cast doubt on almost every facet of religious belief, and appears to have advocated a type of humanism. It is no wonder that some referred to him as the “Eastern Voltaire” (Dole 1901, 81). This Western image, solidified by the Victorian sense of the exotic, romantic, and often erotic notions attached to the East, was echoed through the rendition of the Rubā‘iyyāt by Edward FitzGerald in the 19th century.

1. The Formative Period

Abu'l Fatḥ Umar ibn Ibrāhīm Khayyām, commonly known as Umar Khayyām, is almost certainly the best known Iranian poet-scientist in the West. He was born in the district of Shādyakh of Nayshābūr (originally “Nayshāpūr”) in the province of Khorāsān sometime around 439 AH/1048 CE,1 and died there between 515 and 520 AH/1124 and 1129 CE.2 Considering the word “Khayyām,” means “tent maker,” it is likely that his father Ibrāhīm or forefathers were tent makers. Khayyām is said to have been quiet, reserved, and humble. His reluctance to accept students drew criticism from opponents, who claimed that he was impatient, bad tempered, and uninterested in sharing his knowledge. Given the radical nature of his views in the Rubā‘iyyāt, he may merely have wished to remain intellectually inconspicuous.

The secrets which my book of love has bred,
Cannot be told for fear of loss of head;
Since none is fit to learn, or cares to know,
‘Tis better all my thoughts remain unsaid. (Rubā‘iyyāt, Tirtha 1941 p. 266.)

Khayyam’s reference to Ibn Sīnā as “his teacher” has led some to speculate that he actually studied with Ibn Sīnā. Although this is incorrect, several traditional biographers indicate that Umar Khayyam may have studied with Bahmanyār, an outstanding student of Ibn Sīnā.3

Following a number of journeys to Herat, Ray, and Iṣfahān (the latter being the capital of the Seljuqs) in search of libraries and in pursuit of astronomical calculations, Khayyam’s declining health caused him to return to Nayshābūr, where he died in the district of Shādyākh.

2. The Philosophical Works and Thoughts of Umar Khayyam

Khayyam wrote little, but his works—some fourteen treatises identified to date—were remarkable. They can be categorized primarily in three genres: mathematics, philosophy, and poetry. His philosophical works which have been edited and published recently are:

  1. “A Translation of Ibn Sīnā’s (Avicenna’s) Lucid Discourse” (Khutbah al-ghurra’ Ibn Sīnā) (Aminrazavi, 2007, 303–317.)
  2. “On Being and Necessity” (Risālah fī’l-kawn wa'l-taklīf) (Aminrazavi, 2007, 321-342 )
  3. “On the Necessity of Contradiction in the World, Determinism and Subsistence” (Ḍarurat al-taḍād fi'l-‘ālam wa'l-jabr wa'l-baqā’) (Aminrazavi, 2007, 344–368 )
  4. “The Light of the Intellect on the Subject of Universal Knowledge” (Risālah al-ḍiyā’ al-‘aqlī fī mawḍū‘ al-‘ilm al-kullī) . This treatise has also been called “The Treatise on Transcendence in Existence” (Al-Risālah al-ūlā fi'l-wujūd).
  5. “On the Knowledge of the Universals Principles of Existence” (Risālah dar ‘ilm kulliyāt-i wujūd).
  6. “On Existence” (Risālah fi'l-wujūd)4
  7. “Response to Three Philosophical Problems” (Risālah jawābān līthulth masā’il) (Mālik (ed.). 412–422 )

Except the first work mentioned above which is a free translation and commentary on a discourse by Ibn Sīnā, the other six philosophical treatises represent Khayyam’s own independent philosophical views. It is noteworthy that Khayyam’s philosophical treatises were written in the Peripatetic tradition at a time when philosophy in general and rationalism in particular was under attack by orthodox Muslim jurists—so much that Khayyam had to defend himself against the charge of “being a philosopher.”

“A philosopher I am,” my enemies falsely say,
But God knows I am not what they say;
While in this sorrow-laden nook, I reside
Need to know who I am, and why Here stay. (translation by the author.)

In “On Being and Necessity”, Khayyam defines “philosophy” along the Peripatetic line: “The essential and real issues that are discussed in philosophy are three, [first], ‘is it?’…second, ‘what is it?’…third, ‘why is it?’” (Mālik (ed.), 335). While these are standard Aristotelian questions, for Khayyam they have a wider range of philosophical implications, especially with regard to the following topics:

  1. The existence of God, His attributes and knowledge
  2. Gradation of being and the problem of multiplicity
  3. Eschatology
  4. Theodicy
  5. Determinism and free will
  6. Subjects and predicates
  7. Existence and essence

2.1 The existence of God, His attributes and knowledge

In accordance with Peripatetic tradition, Umar Khayyam refers to God as the “Necessary Being” and offers several cosmological,5 teleological, and ontological (Risālah fi'l-wujūd, 112) arguments for His existence. Khayyam discusses issues such as necessity, causality, and the impossibility of a chain of causes and effects continuing ad infinitum. Among other topics pertaining to God which Khayyam discusses are God’s knowledge of universals and particulars and the complex nature of Divine essence.

2.2 Gradation of Being and the Problem of Unity and Multiplicity

For Khayyam, the most complex philosophical problem is to account for the gradation of beings and the manner in which they are ranked in terms of their nobility. In “On Being and Necessity”, Khayyam asserts:

What remains from among the most important and difficult problems [to solve] is the difference among the order of existents…. Perhaps I, and my teacher, the master of all who have proceeded before him, Avicenna, have thoughtfully reflected upon this problem and to the extent that it is satisfactory to our intellects, we have understood it.6

In his treatise “On the Knowledge of the Universal Principles of Existence,” (Risālah dar ‘ilm kulliyāt-i wujūd, in Malik, 381) as well as a number of his other works, Khayyam adopts the Neoplatonic scheme of emanation and offers an analysis of a number of traditional philosophical themes within this context.

2.3 Eschatology

Khayyam has been accused of believing in the transmigration of the soul and even corporeal resurrection in this world. This is partially due to some of the inauthentic Rubā‘iyyāt that have been attributed to him.

Khayyam’s philosophical treatises indicate that he did believe in life after death, and in this regard his views were in line with traditional Islamic eschatological doctrine. Khayyam the poet, however, plays with the notion of life after death in a variety of ways. First, he casts doubt on the very existence of a life beyond our earthly existence; second, he says that based on our very experience in this world, all things seem to perish and not return. Some of his poems play with the idea of the transmigration of the soul (taṇāsukh). This is more symbolic than actual; in numerous poems he tells us that we turn to dust and it is from our dust that other living beings rise. Khayyam’s comments regarding the possibility of life after death may well have been an indirect criticism of the orthodox jurists who spoke of the intricacies of heaven and hell with certainty.7

2.4 Theodicy (The Problem of Evil)

The problem of theodicy, which Khayyam handles both philosophically and poetically, is one of the most prevalent themes in his quatrains, yet his approach differs in each medium. It is an irony that while in his philosophy Khayyam offers a rational explanation for the existence of evil, in his Rubā‘iyyāt he strongly condemns the presence of evil and finds no acceptable justification for its presence. One may argue that such an inconsistency bears witness to the fact that the philosophical treatises and the Rubā‘iyyāt are not authored by the same person. While this remains a possibility, it is also reasonable that these seemingly contradictory works might belong to the same person. The discrepancy speaks to the human condition that despite our rationalization of the problem of evil, on a practical and emotional level we remain fundamentally bewildered by the unnecessary presence of so much pain and suffering.

Qāḍī Abū Naṣr, a statesman and scholar from Shirāz, posed the following question to Khayyam:

It is therefore necessary that the Necessary Being be the cause of the emergence of evil, opposition and corruption in the world. This is not worthy of Divine status. So how can we resolve this problem and the conflict so evil will not be attributed to the Necessary Being? (Ḍarurat al-taḍād fi'l-‘ālam wa'l-jabr wa'l-baqā’, Malik)

In his work “On the Necessity of Contradiction in the World and Determinism and Subsistence,” Khayyam offers three arguments to exonerate God from being the origin of evil by identifying evil with non-existence or absence. God, Khayyam argues, has created the essences of all the contingent beings, which are good in and of themselves since any being, ontologically speaking, is better than non-being.8 Evil therefore represents an absence, a non-being for which God cannot be blamed.

2.5 Determinism and Free Will

Both his Western and Eastern expositors consider Khayyam to be a determinist (jabrī). However, his views on the subject matter are far more complex, as he demonstrates in On Being and Necessity, a work devoted almost entirely to the issue. It is noteworthy that instead of the traditional use of the term “determinism” (jabr), Khayyam uses the concept of necessity (taklīf) to denote determinism or predestination. In his work “On the Necessity of Contradiction in the World, and Determinism and Subsistence,” Khayyam indicates that determinism is close to his philosophical perspective provided it is not taken to its extreme:

As to the question of his Highness [Qāḍī Nasawī] concerning which of the two groups (determinists or free will) are closer to truth I say initially and in the first sight, perhaps the determinists are closer to truth provided we do not enter into their nonsensical and absurd [claims] for those are far from truth. (Ḍarūrat al-taḍād fi'l-‘ālam wa'l-jabr wa'l-baqā‘, 169 )

Khayyam identifies three types of determinism:

  1. Universal-cosmic
  2. Socio-political
  3. Ontological

By “Universal-cosmic determinism” Khayyam means we have been thrown into this world by accident, which creates in us a sense of bewilderment and existential anxiety. Khayyam expresses this when he says:

With Earth’s first Clay They did the Last Man knead,
And there of the Last Harvest sow'd the Seed:
And the first Morning of Creation wrote
What the Last Dawn of Reckoning shall read. (Rubā‘iyyāt, FitzGerald 1859, p. 41)

In the cosmic and universal sense, our presence in this world and our entry and exit is predetermined, a condition that Khayyam bemoans throughout his Rubā‘iyyāt.

The second sense of determinism is Socio-economic, which is rarely addressed by Muslim philosophers. Khayyam observed:

God created the human species such that it is not possible for it to survive and reach perfection unless it is through reciprocity, assistance, and help. Until food, clothes, and a home that are the essentials of life are not prepared, the possibility of the attainment of perfection does not exist. (Ḍarūrat al-taḍād fi'l-‘ālam wa'l-jabr wa'l-baqā‘, 143).

Finally there is “ontological determinism,” which relies on a Neoplatonic scheme of emanation which Khayyam considers to be “among the most significant and complex of all questions,” since “the order of the world is in accordance to how the wisdom of God decreed it” (Fi'l- kawn wa'l-taklīf, 145). He continues, “Necessity is a command which is issued from God Most High, so people may attain those perfections that lead them to happiness” (Fi'l- kawn wa'l-taklīf, 143). This Greek concept of happiness, restated by Fārābī as “For every being is made to achieve the ultimate perfection it is susceptible of achieving according to its specific place in the order of being,” (Al-Fārābī 1973, 224 ) implies that at least our ontological status is pre-determined.

2.6 Subjects, Predicates, and Attributes

In a complex discussion, Khayyam presents his views on the relationship between the subject, predicate, and attributes using a mixture of original insight and Aristotelian precedent. Dividing the attributes into two parts, essential and accidental, he discusses essential and accidental attributes and their subdivisions such as abstract (i‘tibārī) and existential (wujūdī) (Risālah fi'l-wujūd, 102). Continuing the argument in “The Necessity of Contradiction, Determinism, and Subsistence” (Ḍarūrat al-taḍād fi'l-‘ālam wa'l-jabr wa'l-baqā‘, 164), Khayyam proposes that conceiving essential attributes necessitates the presence of a priori (badawī) concepts such as “animality which is an essential attribute of man.”

2.7 Existence (wujūd) and Essence (māhiyyah)

Khayyam’s ontological views can be formulated in the following ways:9

  1. The existence of an existent being is the same as its essence. This view is attributed to Abu'l-Ḥasan Ash‘arī, Abu'l-Ḥasan Baṣrī and some of the other Ash‘arite theologians.
  2. Commonly known as the principality of essence (iṣālat al-māhiyyah), this view maintains that essence is primary and existence is added to it. Many philosophers such as Abū Hāshim Jubā’ī and later Suhrawardī and Mīr Dāmād came to advocate this view.
  3. Commonly known as the principality of existence, (iṣālat al-wujūd), this view maintains that existence is primary and essence is then added.

Khayyam in Risālah fi'l-wujūd writes that “existence is abstract (secondary) (i‘tibārī) by way of emanation.” In addition, section seventeen of this treatise, entitled “Existence is an Added Concept to Essence” states, “The traces of existence can be found in all things such as accidents and there is no doubt that existence is a concept added to essence, that is intelligible (Ḍarūrat al-taḍād fi'l-‘ālam wa'l-jabr wa'l-baqā‘, 111). Clearly Khayyam supports the principality of essence. By relying on reductio ad absurdum, he concludes that if essence were to be secondary, it would have to exist prior to itself, which is impossible. Khayyam states “essence is primary and nothing else,” because “essence was non-existent and then became existent.” He goes on to argue “essence does not need existence [to exist] and [its existence] is not in relation to an existent since [if] essence prior to existing was non-existing (ma‛dūm), then how can something need something else [in order to exist] prior to its existence?” (Ḍarūrat al-taḍād fi'l-‘ālam wa'l-jabr wa'l-baqā‘, 125).

This may lead the reader to believe that Khayyam was the first Muslim philosopher to support the theory of the principality of essence, but a more careful reading reveals an interesting twist: namely, that Khayyam’s understanding of how essences came to be casts doubt on his belief in the principality of essence. Towards the end of the Risālah fi'l-wujūd he uses the Neoplatonic scheme of emanation to explain the origin of essences and states: “Therefore, it became clear that all substances (dhāt)10 and essences (māhiyyah) emanate from the essence of the First Exalted Origin, in an orderly fashion, may glory be upon Him.” The traditional Neoplatonic scheme, at least in Ibn Sīnā’s version, clearly considers this succession to be existential, whereby levels of existence emanate from the One. Khayyam replaces essence with existence here and the question is whether he equates them and thereby deviates from his teacher Ibn Sīnā. Khayyam furthermore explains that “they [essences] are all good in themselves and there is no evil in them in any form or fashion” (Ḍarūrat al-taḍād fi'l-‘ālam wa'l-jabr wa'l-baqā‘, 130). This deviates from the standard definitions of an essence and is much closer to Plato’s forms than the traditional notion of māhiyyah.

It appears that Khayyam equates existence and essence as having emanated from God in an orderly fashion, but there is no explanation of how essence becomes primary and existence secondary. In fact, if existence did not exist how could essences come to be? They would have to come to be without Being-be there to receive them, as it were. Either essence or existence emanated from God separately, in which case their priority and posterity are not essential as is the relationship between father and son, or their priority is accidental. The latter is not the type of priority that Khayyam has in mind; if essence is to be essentially prior to existence, they both could not have been emanated from God and one should be a byproduct of the other, i.e., an ontological level of reality.

In another work, The Brightening of the Intellect on the Subject of Universal Knowledge,11 Khayyam offers three reasons why existence is not added to essence and therefore is primary. A summary of his reasons is as follows:

  1. Existence cannot be added to essence; otherwise an infinite succession will follow.
  2. Existence is not added to essence; otherwise essence should have existed prior to existence, and this is absurd.
  3. With regard to the Necessary Being, existence clearly is not added to essence, for dualism would follow.

To refute the primacy of essence over existence, Khayyam offers an argument based on the relationship between subject and predicate. He argues that “Existence exists and does not need another existence;” (Risālah fi'l-wujūd) but, cognizant of the counterargument, he also states that one may object by saying that the same argument holds true with regard to essence. So one can say, “A man is a man through man-ness and man-ness does not need another man-ness to be man-ness” (Risālah fi'l-wujūd).

Although the distinction between the principality of wujūd (aṣālat al-wujūd) and the principality of māhiyyah (aṣālat al-māhiyyah) can be found among early Muslim philosophers, the subject matter became particularly significant in later Islamic philosophy, especially through the School of Iṣfahān and the work of its most outstanding figure, Mullā Ṣadrā. This is important for our discussion since Umar Khayyam may simply have presented the arguments for and against the priority and posterity of essence and existence without attaching much significance to their philosophical consequences, as was the case in later Islamic philosophy.

Khayyam’s philosophical works are the least studied aspects of his thought, and were not even available in published form until a few years ago. They permit a fresh look at overall Khayyamian thought and prove indispensable to an understanding of his Rubā‘iyyāt. In his philosophical works, Khayyam writes as a Muslim philosopher and treats a variety of traditional philosophical problems; but in his Rubā‘iyyāt, our Muslim philosopher morphs into an agnostic Epicurean. A detailed study of Khayyam’s philosophical works reveals several explanations for this dichotomy, the most likely of which is the conflict between pure and practical reasoning. Whereas such questions as theodicy, the existence of God, soul and the possibility of life after death may be argued for philosophically, such arguments hardly seem relevant to the human condition given our daily share of suffering.

It is in light of the distinction between “is” and “ought,” the “ideal” and the “actual,” that discrepancies between Khayyam’s Rubā‘iyyāt and his philosophical views should be understood. Khayyam’s Rubā‘iyyāt are the works of a sober philosopher and not that of a hedonistic poet. Whereas Khayyam the philosopher-mathematician justifies theism based on the existing order in the universe, Khayyam the poet, for whom suffering in the world remains insoluble, sees very little evidence to support theism or any type of eschatological doctrine.

3. The Rubā‘iyyāt (Quatrains)

Here with a Loaf of Bread beneath the Bough,
A Flask of Wine, a Book of Verse—and Thou
Beside me singing in the Wilderness—
And Wilderness is Paradise enow. (Rubā‘iyyāt, FitzGerald 1859, 30)

Although Umar Khayyam’s Rubā‘iyyāt have been admired in the Persian speaking world for many centuries, they have only been known in the West since the mid 19th century, when Edward FitzGerald rendered the Rubā‘iyyāt into English.

The word Ruba‘ī (plural: Rubā‘iyyāt), meaning “quatrain,” comes from the word al-Rabi‘, the number four in Arabic. It refers to a poetic form which consists of a four-lined stanza and two hemistiches for a total of four parts. Also known as tarānah (snatch) or dobaītī (two-liner), its short and simple form provides a type of “poetic punch line.”

The overwhelming majority of the literary works on the Rubā‘iyyāt have been devoted to the monumental task of determining the authentic Rubā‘iyyāt from the inauthentic ones. In our current discussion, we shall bypass that controversy and rely on the most authoritative Rubā‘iyyāt in order to provide a commentary on Khayyam’s critique of the fundamental tenets of religion. The salient feature of his critique address the following:

  1. Impermanence and the quest for the meaning of life
  2. Theodicy
  3. The here and now
  4. Epistemology
  5. Eschatology
  6. Determinism and free will
  7. Philosophical wisdom

3.1 Impermanence and the quest for the meaning of life

The Rubā‘iyyāt’s overarching theme is the temporality of human existence and the suffering that one endures during a seemingly senseless existence. Clearly, such a view based on his observation of the world around him is in sharp contrast with the Islamic view presented in the Quran: “I (Allah) have not created the celestial bodies and the earth in vain.” (Quran, 38:27 ) Umar Khayyam was caught between the rationalistic tradition of the Peripatetics deeply entrenched in the Islamic religious universe and his own failure to find any meaning or purpose in human existence on a more immediate and experiential level. Khayyam the poet criticizes the meaninglessness of life whereas Khayyam the philosopher remains loyal to the Islamic Peripatetic tradition which adheres to a theocentric world view.

Using the imagery of a kuzah (“jug”) and clay throughout the Rubā‘iyyāt, Khayyam alludes to the temporality of life and its senselessness:

I saw the potter in the market yesterday
Pounding and pounding upon a piece of clay
“Behold,” said the clay to the potter
Treat me gently for once like you, now I am clay (translation by the author.)

Khayyam fails to see a profound meaning in human existence; his existential anxiety is compounded by the fact that we are subject to our daily share of suffering, a concept that runs contrary to that of the all merciful and compassionate God of Islam.

3.2 Theodicy and Justice

The problem of suffering has an ominous presence in the Rubā‘iyyāt, which contains both Epicurean and Stoic themes. On theodicy, Khayyam remarks:

In what life yields in this Two-door monastery
Your share in the pain of heart and death will tarry
The one who does not bear a child is happy
And he not born of a mother, merry (translation by the author.)

And also:

Life is dark and maze-like, it is
Suffering cast upon us and comfort in abyss
Praise the Lord for all the means of evil
Ask none other than He for malice (translation by the author.)

It is an irony that while Khayyam complains about theodicy and human suffering throughout his Rubā‘iyyāt, in his philosophical works he offers a treatise almost entirely devoted to a philosophical justification of the problem of evil. It is noteworthy that theodicy as a theological and philosophical problem in Islam never received the attention it did in Western intellectual tradition. In early Islamic history theodicy was briefly discussed by a number of theologians, but the subject matter was soon dropped, partially because the orthodox theologians saw it as questioning God’s wisdom.

3.3 Here and Now

For Khayyam the poet, traditional metaphysics, or what he calls “the tale of the seventy-two nations,” is merely a flight of fancy for the human condition, which he describes as a “sorrow laden nest.” The art of living in the present, a theme dealt with in Sufi literature, is a type of wisdom that must be acquired, since living for the hereafter and heavenly rewards is conventional wisdom more suitable for the masses.

On this Khayyam asserts:

Today is thine to spend, but not to-morrow,
Counting on morrow breedeth naught but sorrow;
Oh! Squander not this breath that heaven hath lent thee,
Nor make too sure another breath to borrow (Whinfield 2001, 30; modified by the author.)

And also

What matters if I feast, or have to fast?
What if my days in joy or grief are cast?
Fill me with Thee, O Guide! I cannot ken
If breath I draw returns or fails at last. (Whinfield 2001, 144)

Khayyam’s emphasis on living in the present, or as Sufi’s say “Sufi is the Son of time,” along with his use of other Sufi metaphors such as wine, intoxication and love making, have been interpreted by some scholars as merely mystical allegories.12 Although a mystical interpretation of the Rubā‘iyyāt has been advocated by some, it remains the view of a minority of scholars.

The complexity of the world according to Khayyam the mathematician-astronomer necessitates the existence of a creator and sustainer of the universe; and yet on a more immediate and existential level, he finds no reason or meaning for human existence. This leads to the theme of doubt and bewilderment, since reason necessitates that every design should have a designer—and yet one fails to find a designer or a purpose for the very existence of the design.

3.4 Doubt and Bewilderment

Humans, Khayyam tells us, are thrown into an existence they cannot make sense of:

The sphere upon which mortals come and go,
Has no end nor beginning that we know;
And none there is to tell us in plain truth:
Whence do we come and whither do we go. (Whinfield 2001, 132)

The inconsistency between a seemingly senseless existence and a complex and orderly world leads to existential and philosophical doubt and bewilderment. The tension between Khayyam’s philosophical writings in which he embraces the Islamic Peripatetic philosophical tradition, and his Rubā‘iyyāt where he expresses his profound skepticism, stems from this paradox. In his Rubā‘iyyāt Khayyam embraces humanism and agnosticism, leaving the individual disoriented, anxious and bewildered; whereas in his philosophical writings he operates within a theistic world where all things are as they should be. Lack of certainty with regard to religious truth leaves the individual in an epistemologically suspended state where one has to live in the here and now irrespective of the question of truth.

Since neither truth nor certitude is at hand
Do not waste your life in doubt for a fairyland
O let us not refuse the goblet of wine
For, sober or drunken, in ignorance we stand (translation by the author.)

3.5 Eschatology

The Rubā‘iyyāt casts doubt on Islamic eschatological and soteriological views. Once again the tension between Khayyam’s poetic and philosophical modes of thought surfaces; experientially there is evidence to conclude that death is the end.

Behind the curtain none has found his way
None came to know the secret as we could say
And each repeats the dirge his fancy taught
Which has no sense-but never ends the lay (Whinfield 2001, 229)

In the Rubā‘iyyāt, Khayyam portrays the universe as a beautiful ode which reads “from dust we come and to dust we return,” and “every brick is made from the skull of a man.” While Khayyam does not explicitly deny the existence of life after death, perhaps for political reasons and fear of being labeled a heretic, there are subtle references throughout his Rubā‘iyyāt that the hereafter should be taken with a grain of salt. In contrast, in his philosophical writings we see him argue for the incorporeality of the soul, which paves the path for the existence of life after death. The irreconcilable conflict between Khayyam’s observation that death is the inevitable end for all beings, and his philosophical reflections in favor of the possibility of the existence of life after death, remains an insoluble riddle.

3.6 Free Will, Determinism and Predestination

Khayyam is known as a determinist in both the East and the West, and deterministic themes can be seen in much of the Rubā‘iyyāt. But if we read his Rubā‘iyyāt together with his philosophical writings, the picture that emerges may be more rightly called “soft determinism.” One of Khayyam’s best known quatrains in which determinism is clearly conveyed asserts:

The Moving Finger writes; and, having writ,
Moves on: nor all your Piety nor Wit
Shall lure it back to cancel half a Line,
Nor all your Tears wash out a Word of it (Rubā‘iyyāt, FitzGerald 1859, p. 20)

In his philosophical treatise “On the Necessity of Contradiction in the World, and Determinism and Subsistence” Khayyam adheres to three types of determinism. On a universal or cosmic level, our birth is determined in the sense that we had no choice in this matter. Ontologically speaking, our essence and our place on the overall hierarchy of beings appears also to be predetermined. However, the third category of determinism, socio-political determinism, is manmade and thus changeable.

At first they brought me perplexed in this way
Amazement still enhances day by day
We all alike are tasked to go but Oh!
Why are we brought and sent? This none can say. (Rubā‘iyyāt, Tirtha 1941, 18)

Thus a reading of the Rubā‘iyyāt in conjunction with Khayyam’s philosophical reflections brings forward a more sophisticated view of free will and determinism indicating that Khayyam believed in free will within a form of cosmic determinism.

3.7 Philosophical Wisdom

Khayyam uses the concept of “wine and intoxication” throughout his Rubā‘iyyāt in three distinct ways:

  1. The intoxicant wine
  2. The mystical wine
  3. The wine of wisdom

The pedestrian use of wine in the Rubā‘iyyāt, devoid of any intellectual significance, emphasizes the need to forget our daily suffering. The mystical allusions to wine pertain to a type of intoxication which stands opposed to discursive thought. The esoteric use of wine and drinking, which has a long history in Persian Sufi literature, refers to the state of ecstasy in which one is intoxicated with Divine love. Those supporting the Sufi interpretation of Rubā‘iyyāt rely on this literary genre. While Khayyam was not a Sufi in the traditional sense of the word, he includes the mystical use of wine among his allusions.

Khayyam’s use of wine in the profound sense in his Rubā‘iyyāt is a type of Sophia that provides a sage with philosophical wisdom, allowing one to come to terms with the temporality of life and to live in the here and now.

Those imprisoned by the intellect’s need to decipher
Humbled; knowing being from non-being, they proffer
Seek ignorance and drink the juice of the grape
Those fools acting as wise, scoffer. (modified by the author)

Khirad (wisdom) is the type of wisdom that brings about a rapprochement between the poetic and discursive modes of thought, one that sees the fundamental irony in what appears to be a senseless human existence within an orderly and complex physical universe. For Khayyam the mathematician-astronomer, the universe cannot be the result of a random chance; on the other hand, Khayyam the poet fails to find any purpose for human existence in this orderly universe.

As Spring and Fall make their appointed turn,
The leaves of life one aft another turn;
Drink wine and brood not—as the Sage has said:
“Life’s cares are poison, wine the cure in turn.” (Sa‘idī 1994, 58 )

4. Khayyam the Mathematician and Scientist

In several respects Khayyam’s mathematical writings are similar to his texts in other genres: they are relatively few in number, but deal with well-chosen topics and carry deep implications. Some of his mathematics relates in passing to philosophical matters (in particular, reasoning from postulates and definitions), but his most significant work deals with issues internal to mathematics and in particular the boundary between geometry and algebra.

4.1 Solutions of Cubic Equations

Khayyam seems to have been attracted to cubic equations originally through his consideration of the following geometric problem: in a quadrant of a circle, drop a perpendicular from some point on the circumference to one of the radii so that the ratio of the perpendicular to the radius is equal to the ratio of the two parts of the radius on which the perpendicular falls. In a short, untitled treatise, Khayyam leads us from one case of this problem to the equation x3 + 200x = 20x2 + 2000.13 An approximation to the solution of this equation is not difficult to find, but Khayyam also generates a direct geometric solution: he uses the numbers in the equation to determine intersecting curves of two conic sections (a circle and a hyperbola), and demonstrates that the solution x is equal to the length of a particular line segment in the diagram.

Solving algebraic problems using geometric tools was not new; in the case of quadratic equations methods like this date back at least as far as the Greeks and probably to the Babylonians. Predecessors such as al-Khwārizmī (early 9th century) and Thābit ibn Qurra (836–901 CE) already had solved quadratic equations using the straightedge and compass geometry of Euclid’s Elements. Since negative numbers had not yet been conceived, Muslim mathematicians needed to solve several different types of quadratic equations: for instance, x2 = mx + n was fundamentally different from x2 + mx = n. For cubics, there are fourteen distinct types of equation to be solved. In his “Treatise on Demonstration of Problems of Algebra”14 Khayyam notes that four of these fourteen have been solved and says that al-Khāzin (d. 961/971) was one of the authors, having solved a problem from Archimedes' treatise On the Sphere and Cylinder that al-Māhānī (fl. ca. 860) had previously converted into a cubic.

In the Algebra, Khayyam sets out to deal systematically with all fourteen types of cubic equations. He solves each one in sequence again through the use of intersecting conic sections. In an algebra where powers of x corresponded to geometrical dimensions, the solution of cubic equations was the apex of the discipline. Nevertheless, even here Khayyam was able to advance algebra by considering its unknowns as dimension-free abstractions of continuous quantities.15 Khayyam also considers circumstances under which certain cubic equations have more than one solution. Although he does not handle this topic perfectly, his effort nevertheless stood out from previous efforts.

A geometric solution to a cubic equation may seem peculiar to modern eyes, but the study of cubic equations (and indeed much of medieval algebra) was motivated by geometric problems. Khayyam was nevertheless explicitly aware that the arithmetic problem of the cubic remained to be solved. He never produced such a solution; nor did anyone else until Gerolamo Cardano in the mid-16th century.

4.2 The Parallel Postulate and the Theory of Ratios

The process of reasoning from postulates and definitions has been basic to mathematics at least since the time of Euclid. Islamic geometers were well versed in this art, but also spent some effort examining the logical foundations of the method. They were unafraid to revise and improve upon Euclid’s starting points, and they rebuilt the Elements from the ground up in several ways. Khayyam’s Explanation of the Difficulties in the Postulates of Euclid16 deals with the two most important issues in this context, the parallel postulate and the definition of equality of ratios.

Euclid’s fifth “parallel” postulate states that if a line falls on two given lines such that the two interior angles add up to less than two right angles, then the given lines must meet on that side. This statement is equivalent to several more easily understood assertions, such as: there is exactly one parallel to a given line that passes through a given point; or, the angles of a triangle add up to two right angles. It has been known since the 19th century that there are non-Euclidean geometries that violate these properties; indeed, it is not yet known whether the space in which we live satisfies them. The parallel postulate, however, was not subject to doubt at Khayyam’s time, so it is more appropriate to think of Islamic efforts in this area as part of the tradition of improving upon Euclid rather than as the origin of non-Euclidean geometry. Khayyam’s reconstruction of Euclid is one of the better ones: he does not try to prove the parallel postulate. Rather, he replaces it with two statements, which he attributes to Aristotle, that are both simpler and more self-evident: two lines that converge must intersect, and two lines that converge can never diverge in the direction of convergence. Khayyam then replaces Euclid’s 29th proposition, the first in which the parallel postulate is used, with a new sequence of eight propositions. Khayyam’s insertion amounts to determining that the so-called Saccheri quadrilateral (one with two altitudes equal in length, both emerging at right angles from a base) is in fact a rectangle. Khayyam believed his approach to be an improvement on that of his predecessor Ibn al-Haytham because his method does not rely on the concept of motion, which should be excluded from geometry. Apparently Naṣīr al-Dīn al-Ṭūsī agreed, since he followed Khayyam’s path a century or two later.

Book II of Explanation of the Difficulties in the Postulates of Euclid takes up the question of the proper definition of ratio. This is an obscure topic to the modern reader, but it was fundamental to Greek and medieval mathematics. If the quantities joined in a ratio are whole numbers, then the definition of their ratio poses no difficulty. If the quantities are geometric magnitudes, the situation is more complex because the two line segments might be incommensurable (in modern terms, their ratio corresponds to an irrational number). Euclid, following Eudoxus, asserts that A/B = C/D when, for any magnitudes x and y, the magnitudes xA and xC are both (i) greater than, (ii) equal to, or (iii) less than, the magnitudes yB and yD respectively. There is little wonder that Khayyam and others were unhappy with this definition, for while it is clearly true, it does not get at the heart of what it means for ratios to be equal.

An alternate approach, which may have existed in ancient Greece but is only known for certain to have existed from the 9th century CE, is the “anthyphairetic” definition (Hogendijk 2002 ). The Euclidean algorithm is an iterative process that is used to find the greatest common divisor of a pair of numbers. It may be applied equally well to find the greatest common measure of two geometric magnitudes, but the algorithm will never terminate if the ratio between the two magnitudes is irrational. A sequence of divisions within the algorithm results in a “continued fraction” that corresponds to the ratio between the original two quantities. Khayyam, following several earlier Islamic mathematicians, defines the equality of A/B and C/D according to whether their continued fractions are equal.

One may wonder why the proponents of the anthyphairetic definition felt that it was more natural than Euclid’s approach. There is no doubt, however, that it was preferred; Khayyam even refers to the anthyphairetic definition as the “true” nature of proportionality. Part of the explanation might be simply that the Euclidean algorithm applied to geometric quantities was much more familiar to medieval mathematicians than to us. It has also been suggested that Khayyam’s preference is due to the fact that the anthyphairetic definition allows a ratio to be considered on its own, rather than always in equality to some other ratio. Khayyam’s achievement in this topic was not to invent a new definition, but rather to demonstrate that each of the existing definitions logically implies the other. Thus Islamic mathematicians could continue to use ratio theorems from the Elements without having to prove them again according to the anthyphairetic definition.

Book III continues the discussion of ratios; Khayyam sets himself the task of demonstrating the seemingly innocuous proposition A/C = (A/B) (B/C), a fact which is used in the Elements but never proved. During this process he sets an arbitrary fixed magnitude to serve as a unit, to which he relates all other magnitudes of the same kind. This allows Khayyam to incorporate both numbers and geometric magnitudes within the same system. Thus Khayyam thinks of irrational magnitudes as numbers themselves, which effectively defines the set of “real numbers” that we take for granted today. This step was one of the most significant changes of conception to occur between ancient Greek and modern mathematics.

4.3 Root Calculations and the Binomial Theorem

We know that Khayyam wrote a treatise, now lost, called Problems of Arithmetic involving the determination of n-th roots (Youschkevitch and Rosenfeld 1973 ). In his Algebra Khayyam writes that methods for calculating square and cube roots come from India, and that he has extended them to the determination of roots of any order. Even more interestingly, he says that he has demonstrated the validity of his methods using proofs that “are purely arithmetic, founded on the arithmetic of the Elements.” If both of these statements are true, then it is hard to avoid the conclusion that Khayyam had within his power the binomial theorem (a + b)n = an + nan−1b + … + bn, which would be the earliest appearance of this important result in medieval Islam.

4.4 Astronomy and Other Works

Khayyam moved to Isfahan in 1074 to help establish a new observatory under the patronage of Malikshah, the Seljuk sultan, and his vizier, Nizam al-Mulk. There is little doubt that Khayyam played a major role in the creation of the Malikī calendar, the observatory’s most significant project. In addition to the calendar, the Isfahan observatory produced the Zīj Malikshah (of which only a fragment of its star catalogue survives); it seems to have been one of the more important astronomical handbooks.

Several treatises on other scientific topics are also attributed to Khayyam: a work on music theory that uses ratios to deal with musical intervals, another on weights and balances, and another on a mathematical problem in metallurgy. All of his texts seem to have been taken seriously.

5. Khayyam in the West

5.1 Orientalism and the European Khayyam

The earliest extant translation of the Rubā‘iyyāt was produced by Thomas Hyde in the 1760s when his translation of a single quatrain appeared in the Veterum Persarum et Parthorum et Medorum Religionis. It was not until the 19th century, however, that the Western world and literary circles discovered Umar Khayyam in all his richness.

The voyage of the Rubā‘iyyāt to the West began when Sir Gore Ouseley, the British ambassador to Iran, presented his collection to the Bodleian Library at Oxford University upon his return to England. In the 1840s Professor Edward Byles Cowell of Oxford University discovered a copy of the Ruba‘iyyat of Khayyam and translated several of the Rubā‘iyyāt. Amazed by their profundity, he shared them with Edward FitzGerald, who took an immediate interest and published the first edition of his own translation in 1859. Four versions of FitzGerald’s Rubā‘iyyāt were published over his lifetime as new quatrains were discovered. Realizing the free nature of his work in his first translation, FitzGerald chose the word rendered to appear on the title page in later editions instead of “translation” (Lange 1968).

5.2 The Impact of Khayyam on Western Literary and Philosophical Circles

While the connection between the Pre-Raphaelites and Umar Khayyam should not be exaggerated, the relationship that Algernon Charles Swinburne, George Meredith, and Dante G. Rossetti shared with Edward FitzGerald and their mutual admiration of Khayyam cannot be ignored. The salient themes of the Rubā‘iyyāt became popular among the Pre-Raphaelites and their circle (Lange 1968). Khayyam’s popularity led to the formation of the “Omar Khayyām Club of London” (Conway 1893, 305) in 1892, which attracted a number of literary figures and intellectuals. The success of the Club soon led to the simultaneous formation of the Omar Khayyām Clubs of Germany and America.

In America, Umar Khayyam was well received in the New England area where his poetry was propagated by the official members of the Omar Khayyām Club of America. The academic community discovered Khayyam’s mathematical writings and poetry in the 1880s, when his scholarly articles and translations of his works were published. Some, such as William Edward Story, praised Umar as a mathematician and compared his views with those of Johannes Kepler, Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz, and Isaac Newton, while others drew their inspiration from his literary tradition and called themselves “Umarians.” This new literary movement soon attracted such figures as Mark Twain, who composed forty-five burlesque versions of FitzGerald’s quatrains and integrated them with two of FitzGerald’s stanzas entitled AGE-A Ruba‘iyat (Twain, 1983, 14). The movement also drew the attention of T.S. Eliot’s grandfather William Greenleaf Eliot (1811–1887), two of T.S. Eliot’s cousins, and T.S. Eliot himself. Umar Khayyam’s Rubā‘iyyāt seems to have elicited two distinct responses among many of his followers in general and the Eliot family in particular: admiration for a rational theology on the one hand, and concern with the rise of skepticism and moral decay in America on the other.

Among other figures influenced by the Rubā‘iyyāt of Umar Khayyam were certain members of the New England School of Transcendentalism, including Henry Wadsworth Longfellow, Ralph Waldo Emerson, and Henry David Thoreau (Aminrazavi 2013; for a complete discussion on Umar Khayyam in the West see Aminrazavi 2007, 204–278).

6. Conclusion

In the foregoing discussion, we have seen that Umar Khayyam was a philosopher-sage (ḥakīm) and a spiritual-pragmatist whose Rubā‘iyyāt should be seen as a philosophical commentary on the human condition. The salient features of Umar Khayyam’s pioneering work in various branches of mathematics were also discussed. Khayyam’s mathematical genius not only produced the most accurate calendar to date, but the issues he treated remained pertinent up until the modern period.

For Khayyam, there are two discourses, each of which pertains to one dimension of human existence: philosophical and poetic. Philosophically, Khayyam was the last Peripatetic in the Persian speaking world before philosophical thinking eclipsed the Eastern part of the Islamic world for several centuries. Khayyam defended rationalism against the rise of orthodoxy and made an attempt to revive the spirit of rationalism which was so prevalent in the first four centuries in Islam. Poetically, Khayyam represents a voice of protest against what he regards to be a fundamentally unjust world. Many people found in him a voice they needed to hear, and centuries after he had died his works became a venue for those who were experiencing the same trials and tribulations as Khayyam had.


Primary Works

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