Notes to Walter Chatton

1. The paucity of documentary evidence makes it difficult to construct an accurate and detailed biography for Walter Chatton. The best overall discussion of the biographical source material on Chatton is Courtenay [1978], pp. 66–74. Other sources consulted include: Keele [2002], pp. 9–15; Emden [1957], pp. 395–96; Gelber [1974], pp. 185–205; Brown [1985], pp. 82–115; Baudry [1943–45], pp. 337–69; Brampton [1964], pp. 200–205; Longpré, [1923], pp. 101–114; and Douie [1931–32].

2. The exception is Sermo de visione beatifica, which was likely written in Avignon in 1333, and so belongs to the next stage; see Dykmans [1971]. For the dating of De paupertate evangelica see Douie [1931], p. 345. The list of Chatton's works was compiled from Sharpe, [2001], pp. 730–31, Fitzpatrick [1971], pp. 88–177, and Wey [1989], pp. 1–2.

3. The Lectura dates are based on mention of Ockham's Summa logicae, which gives a terminus post quem of 1324; Wodeham's citation in 1330 of Lectura material gives a terminus ante quem of 1330.

4. Courtenay [1978], p. 67. Courtenay cites the Oxford Historical Society's Munimenta Civitatis Oxonie as his source. Emden cites this same source as evidence that Chatton was in Oxford in the spring of 1330, involved on the side of the Franciscan Order in a court case.

5. Three areas in which scholars have attempted to determine his life and career in more detail have been more controversial, viz., (1) his exact birth year, (2) to which career stage his Reportatio belongs – bachelor lectures or preparation for bachelor lectures, and (3) the location of the Reportatio's composition. Clearly answers to (2) and (3) bear on each other, but also will bear on the answer to (1), since answers to (2) and (3) suggest to us how old Chatton might have been around 1321–1323, the firm dates of the Reportatio.

6. For example, Collatio et Prologus, p. 33, lines 464–66: “Ubi propositio affirmativa verificatur pro rebus, si pauciores uniformiter praesentes sine alia re non poterunt sufficere, oportet plures ponere.]…” and p. 85, lines 252–254: “Item, ibi sufficiens necessitas ponendi tres res, ubi propositio verificatur pro rebus, et duae res qualitercumque praesentes sine alia re non sufficiunt ad eius veritatem….”

7. It is absolutely clear that Ockham takes the principle of contradictories to be the central tenet behind realist arguments for relations, for example; he calls it the “general argument” behind this “common opinion”. Ockham, Scriptum (=OTh IV), I, d. 30, q. 2, 321, lines 16–17; similarly, he cites it as an opposing view throughout Scriptum I d. 30.

8. The only study I know which discusses Chatton's ideas on future contingents in any detail is Schabel [2000b], pp. 231–40; I have found this work very useful in preparing my account here. This reconstruction is based on Chatton's Reportatio super Sententias, Book I, distinctions 38–41, the locus primus for his treatment of the subject. In his latest extant work, Quodlibet, we find four questions on related subjects, but the discussion there focuses almost exclusively on revelation and prophecy, whereas the Reportatio texts treat the problem more broadly, focusing on the issue of divine foreknowledge and predestination.

9. All normal modal logics, and hence most plausible accounts of alethic modality, include the K axiom.

10. Holcot simply repeats Chatton's solution in Quodlibet 3.2. See Holcot [1995], pp. 71–72.

11. Like the early Wittgenstein, Chatton thinks a proposition has both a true and a false pole, or, as Chatton puts it, a proposition and its negation signify exactly the same res. If it were otherwise, then ‘Socrates is sitting’ and ‘Socrates is not sitting’ would not be contradictories, that is, they would not contradict each other over one and the same piece of reality.

12. Consequently, this summary relies on his writings from the late 30s, viz., his Quodlibet, especially questions 1, 12, and 16. There is no other scholarly literature on his ethical views.

Copyright © 2023 by
Rondo Keele
Jenny Pelletier <>

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