Walter Chatton

First published Tue Jun 20, 2006; substantive revision Thu May 18, 2023

Walter Chatton or more rarely “Catton” (c. 1290–1343) was an English theologian and philosopher who trained at Oxford around the same time as his famous colleague and frequent philosophical target, William of Ockham. More inclined to speculative metaphysics and less skeptical of reason than Ockham, Chatton was one of the most energetic and gifted critics of the influential brand of nominalism which arose in early fourteenth-century England around Ockham. As a constructive philosopher, Chatton was not a system-builder, but a defender of certain parts of the more systematic philosophy of John Duns Scotus, and an advocate of perspectivist accounts of cognition. Historically he is an interesting figure because he combined the realist tendencies of Scotism with the appreciation of logic and language we see in Ockham; thus it is common to find Chatton defending Scotistic theses and criticizing Ockham using the same sorts of semantic ideas that Ockham himself popularized. His unyielding attacks on Ockham bore him fruit intellectually and otherwise: we have evidence of Ockham changing his mind on several seminal issues as a direct result of Chatton’s critiques. Moreover, he seems to have built a very successful ecclesiastical career, no doubt based in part on his cleverness; he served as an advisor to two popes, and earned for himself, but did not live long enough to enjoy, a bishopric in Wales. His stature as a theologian rose high enough in his lifetime that his opinions on sacramental efficacy were remembered and cited at the Council of Trent, two hundred years after his death.

Although his importance has long been known to Ockham specialists, complete critical editions of his work have only recently become available, and detailed scholarly analysis of his views, influence, and intellectual life are in a nascent stage. Consequently, this article will not summarize his positions under broad, modern headings such as ‘metaphysics’, ‘epistemology’, etc., but will rather present exposition and analysis of his contributions to several narrower problems which remain philosophically viable today.

1. Life

Chatton’s life and career can be divided into four stages.[1]

Childhood, ordination, and philosophical training (birth to 1315). Walter Chatton was born between 1285 and 1290 in the small village of Chatton, just west of Durham, in the far north of modern England. He entered the Franciscan Order before the age of 14, and was ordained a subdeacon on 20 May, 1307. He very likely received his early education and philosophical training in the north as well.

Early bachelor of theology studies (1315 to 1321). During this period Chatton finished his early education and was sent south to Oxford to study theology. There he came in contact with William of Ockham who was lecturing at Oxford at this same time, although at a slightly more advanced career stage. Chatton began to oppose Ockham very early and very vocally, and this opposition was to last the entire duration of his Oxford career (i.e., into the early 1330s).

Advanced bachelor studies and regency (1321 to 1332). We have the least amount of hard biographical data for this period, although it is clearly the most interesting and intense intellectual period of his life. Textual evidence allows us to argue with varying degrees of certainty that four of his five extant works – Reportatio, Lectura (which includes the separately edited Collatio et Prologus), Quodlibet, De paupertate evangelica, and Sermo de visione beatifica – were written during this period.[2] We have long possessed reasonable dates (although they are wide, in one case) for the first two of these works: he probably delivered his Reportatio lectures during the academic biennium 1321–23, and his Lectura must have been written between 1324 and 1330.[3] The first three works listed above are of primary philosophical importance in his corpus. During this period Chatton delivered an important set of lectures in which Ockham’s thought is strenuously criticized (probably in London), completed his training at Oxford, and attained the final academic rank marking that achievement, regent master, in academic year 1329–1330.[4]

Later career in Avignon, and death (1332 to 1343/4). Chatton is known to have been in Avignon on 17 January, 1333. He was summoned there in order to participate in hearings against Thomas Waleys, and eventually he served as an advisor to Pope Benedict XII. His career took an excellent upward turn in 1343 when he was appointed bishop of the Welsh See of Asaph, but this good fortune reversed itself when it turned out the position was not really vacant. That winter, earthly good fortune gave up on Chatton completely, and he died in Avignon, late in 1343 or perhaps early 1344.[5]

2. Intellectual World

Three points should be noted about Chatton’s intellectual environment. First, the theological context in which Chatton and his contemporary philosopher-theologians operated was religiously framed but not intellectually static or sterile. The central metaphysical tenets of the faith were treated as fixed-points, not hypotheses, but mediaeval Latin philosophers varied widely in their attitudes, and much of this variability is easily recognizable to modern people – there are skeptics, realists, nominalists, etc.

A second, connected point concerns the genres of mediaeval philosophical writing. Much of mediaeval philosophy was written in the form of commentaries or debates with contemporaries (sometimes polemical, sometimes not). There are no mediaeval ‘research articles’ and not many systematic, seemingly spontaneous meditations on philosophical topics by theologians. There was little concern, in short, with doctrinal or topical originality, broadly speaking. Rather, to exposit past masters with clarity and ingenuity, to match wits skillfully with one’s contemporaries – these were the chief activities of the philosopher-theologians. All Chatton’s written works were commissioned in an academic or ecclesiastical context, hence all are in this way theological, but they contain much which almost any modern person would identify as philosophically interesting and innovative.

Third, it is useful to know that Chatton’s immediate academic and intellectual world was small and intense, shaped mostly by figures and events at the University of Paris and at Oxford. His primary opponents, interlocutors, and sources were Aristotle and Augustine among the ancients, but among contemporaries and near-contemporaries he cites Thomas Aquinas, John Duns Scotus, William Ockham, Richard Campsall, Adam Wodeham, and Peter Auriol. In particular, much of his writing is so shaped by debates against Ockham (some of them conducted not only in writing but almost certainly face-to-face) that his mature views are nearly unintelligible in their details apart from Ockham’s philosophy, and vice versa. Especially illustrative of this interdependence is Chatton’s anti-Ockhamist ontological principle, often called his ‘anti-razor’.

3. The Anti-Razor

3.1 Ontological Commitment

Philosophers frequently disagree about what is real. Sometimes they disagree so profoundly on this matter for so long a time that they see themselves as members of schools or parties in a conflict, or as part of larger historical trends that play themselves out over and over in the history of ideas. For example, some philosophers tend to argue for all kinds of invisible metaphysical structure in the world – that numbers, properties, causality, free will, etc., are all entities in their own right, somehow existing independently of our grasp or use of them, as real in their own way as the ordinary physical objects we seem constantly to rely on in daily life. We usually call such people ‘realists’. But others see this outlook as a theoretical extravagance, a needless proliferation of ontology. We tag partisans of such views ‘nominalists’.

It often happens that parties on either side of such debates will seek leverage against their opponents by articulating higher level rules meant to govern metaphysics itself – rules meant to apply, not to the question ‘What is real?’, but instead to the question ‘What methods of argument are rightly applied to the question “What is real?”’ In other words, philosophers sometimes argue not about what is real but about what is the best way to argue about what is real. The goal is often negative: if a philosopher does not believe in the existence of some entity \(X\), he or she may try to show that a philosophical opponent leans on a weak or irrational style of argumentation generally when arguing that \(X\) exists. Occasionally such debates show an intense connection with philosophy of language, since one common way to make a realist argument that \(X\) exists is to say that, for instance, certain sentences cannot be true or false unless entities like \(X\) exist. Under the influence of the articulate twentieth-century American philosopher W. V. O. Quine, this issue – when and whether certain facts about language require us to admit that certain kinds of entities exist – is often referred to as ‘ontological commitment’.

Quine himself was a nominalist, as was Ockham. Both of them repudiated certain realist styles of argumentation in the metaphysics of their own times. Ockham in particular was so famous for this attitude that we still discuss reductionary explanatory tendencies under the label ‘Ockham’s razor’ – do not multiply entities beyond necessity.

3.2 The Chatton Principle

But as it is usually understood today, this is not a principle that Ockham believed in or defended; neither is it specific enough of a principle of ontological commitment to attach seriously and exclusively to one philosopher. Ockham’s actual theory of ontological commitment was something like this:

No extra-mental distinction among extra-mental things (res) should be assumed unless it can be proved (a) by arguments from self-evident premises, or premises of indubitable experience or, (b) by unquestionable experience of extra-mental things, or (c) by some infallible authority such as the Bible, the Saints, or certain Ecclesiastical pronouncements.

Since it gives negative advice, telling us when not to make a distinction among things, it is reductive in orientation, and we might call it one example of a principle of parsimony. Ockham coupled this attitude to a complex and original theory of how sentences get to be true. When coupled these two theories yielded interesting arguments which reject the existence of motion, and of most relations.

Chatton seemed to think that relying on this standard would yield bad results in certain cases; in particular he thought that despite Ockham’s insistence to the contrary, certain semantic arguments could be adduced to establish the existence of a restricted class of relations. He developed his attack on Ockham and supported his own ontological commitment to real relations with a counter-razor he called propositio mea = ‘my proposition’ and an ars respondendi = ‘a method of responding’, and also simply regula mea = ‘my rule’. I shall call it the ‘Chatton Principle’, to contrast with ‘Ockham’s Razor’.

Here is an early general formulation of the Chatton Principle from Reportatio I, d. 30, q. 1, a. 4:

  1. Consider an affirmative proposition, which, when it is verified, is verified only for things; if three things do not suffice for verifying it, one has to posit a fourth, and so on in turn [for four things, or five, etc.]. (Reportatio I, 10–48, paragraph 57, p. 237)

He states different versions of the Principle in other places, but throughout his career the basic idea is always the same: we must admit that there are as many things as are required to make a certain proposition true.

Later on, due to the Principle’s increasing importance to him, and to Ockham’s direct criticisms of it (some of which are recorded, for example in his Quodlibeta Septem I, 5), Chatton developed a long defense for the Principle and a richer formulation of it. The richest formulation of the Principle we have is from Lectura I, d. 3, q. 1, a. 1:

  1. Whenever an affirmative proposition is apt to be verified for actually existing things, if two things, howsoever they are present according to arrangement and duration, cannot suffice for the verification of the proposition while another thing is lacking, then one must posit that other thing. (Lectura I, d. 3, q. 1, a. 1, paragraph 4, p. 2)

Similar versions occur in his Collatio et Prologus.[6]

By itself, this principle is trivial, of course, since anyone would agree that we should posit as many entities as we need. But there is more to the theory than this. Chatton explicitly breaks his Principle into two parts for purposes of justification and for application as well. His full theory can be thought of as a two-stage meditation on ontology. Stage one is given in version (2) above. To summarize stage one, we could say that language can serve as a guide to ontology in a certain way; setting aside the passage of time and the occurrence of motion – think of an ‘ontological snapshot’, if you like – and given a true proposition \(p\), we can investigate systematically the question of what kinds of things (what kind of ontological snapshot) are necessary to make \(p\) true, and hence we can conclude from \(p\)’s truth that those kinds things must exist. The question at stake here is truth-makers. What this first part of the Chatton Principle says is (1) that the truth-makers of propositions are things (res), and (2) that, under certain conditions, propositions are a guide to ontology.

As noted, this is all well and good as far as it goes; we must posit as many things in reality as are sufficient to make the proposition true, when it is true. But all by itself this simply begs the question of sufficiency. Chatton sees this and so claims therefore that the Chatton Principle involves a second stage:

  1. Hence it is required to posit a second proposition … and it is this: those things are not sufficient to account for the fact that a proposition is true with which it is consistent that, in whatever way they are present according to arrangement and duration without a new thing, the proposition would be false. (Lectura I, d. 3, q. 1, a. 1, paragraph 17, p. 7)

Here Chatton gives us a test for when a certain number of entities is insufficient to make a true sentence true. His test is phrased in terms of the consistency of the falsehood of the proposition and the existence of certain things without another. By studying other texts we are able to see that Chatton has in mind a kind of a priori version of Mill’s methods. We are to imagine, within the absolute power of God, whether the causal powers attributed to the kinds of entities in a given ontological snapshot would be sufficient to make the proposition in question turn out true. If they are not, we then imagine other entities coming into being, adding each to the ontological snapshot one at a time, checking to see after each addition whether the proposition would at that point have to be true. So long as the insufficiency remains, we add another object to the picture. We check that the insufficiency remains via consistency: so long as there remains no manifest contradiction between the existence of the currently considered snapshot and the falsehood of the proposition, the insufficiency remains, and we must continue to posit more things. Given this method, it would seem to follow that, for any set of entities, if the causal powers of those entities are found wanting on the basis of consistency and yet the proposition in question were known to be true, then another kind of entity, with its attendant causal powers, would have to exist.

At this point we might ask what licenses us to conclude that the entity whose existence Chatton proves is indeed a res? Can’t propositions get to be true and false for other reasons besides a res coming to be or passing away? Chatton did not think they could, at least in most cases, and his Principle exhibits this commitment in version (2) above; the only way to add to an ontological snapshot is to add things (res) to the picture. Hence he relies on and is clearly committed to an assumption which says that if an existent makes a difference to truth then it must be a real thing (res). This assumption can be found in Aristotle (e.g., Physics, 225a 1–20) and Scotus (e.g., Ordinatio I d. 30 qq. 1–2, n. 41). Often called the principle of contradictories, it can be stated as follows: “There can be no passage from contradictory state to contradictory state without the generation or corruption of some thing (res).”

3.3 Ockham’s Criticism of the Chatton Principle

Ockham explicitly rejects this assumption as needlessly profligate and it is precisely on this point that he attacked the Chatton Principle.[7] Ockham’s strategy for overcoming Chatton’s (and Scotus’) realist results is two-fold: (1) he reforms the principle of contradictories by expansion; and (2) he capitalizes on this expansion by offering an alternative semantic account (connotation theory) which explains what happens when a proposition passes from being true to being false.

Ockham opens up the principle of contradictories by deriving from the proposition, “There can be no passage from contradictory to contradictory apart from the generation or corruption (of some thing)”, the following expansion:

It is impossible for contradictories to be successively verified for one and the same thing, except (i) on account of local motion of something, or (ii) on account of the passage of time, or (iii) on account of the production or destruction of some thing. (Ockham, Scriptum = OTh IV), I, d. 30, q. 1, p. 396, lines 8–9)

Clearly this is just Scotus’ principle of contradictories, expressed in clause (iii), with clauses (i) and (ii) added by Ockham. The thrust of Ockham’s alteration is to recognize that there are more ways to account for change in truth value besides changes in what things there are; a change in time or a change of location can also explain it. But, if Ockham’s version is correct and Scotus’s is not, then Chatton’s plurality argument using his Principle will not go through: we don’t have to posit that \(n + 1\) things exist if \(n\) things will not explain the truth of some true proposition, since the truth may be adequately explained simply by the passage of time or the occurrence of change. It is absolutely clear that Ockham’s expansion of the principle of contradictories and Chatton’s ‘howsoever they are present according to arrangement and duration’ clause in version (2) of the Principle above play off each other, and in these formulas we see some of the intense mutual influence between Ockham and Chatton.

Notice too that Chatton’s clause essentially forces us to hold time and movement as constants, and only then ask what would make the true proposition true. In this way, he forces us to see that a res must in fact be posited in such cases, since there is no change of place or lapse of time to explain the passage from contradictory to contradictory. By itself this begs the question against Ockham, and Chatton’s principle has no general leverage against Ockham. In the end the Chatton Principle had to be supplemented with direct attacks on Ockham’s alternative semantics, viz., connotation theory.

4. Categories and Universals

Mediaeval philosophers accepted the ten categories in Aristotle’s Categories: substance, quantity, quality, relation, time, place, action, passion, position, and state or having. They wondered, however, whether categories were categories of concepts or words or things, on what basis one could arrive at all ten, and whether Aristotle’s list was exhaustive. Chatton addresses a number of questions about categories, positioning himself between Scotus and Ockham. While Scotus argues that the categories are primarily ontological – there are ten basic extra-mental essences or natures – and secondarily semantic (conceptual and linguistic), Ockham argues that the categories are purely semantic. Like Scotus, Chatton holds that there are ten basic classes of things, but like Ockham, Chatton insists that the categories are ten kinds of terms. What is notable about Chatton’s contribution to theories of categories is that he uses the Chatton Principle to argue for the ontological classes that underpin the categories.

4.1 Semantic Categories

The categories are categories of simple terms, ultimately concepts (e.g., substance, redness) but also the words of conventional languages (e.g., ‘substance,’ ‘redness’), that pick out extra-mental things of various kinds. Chatton describes a category in the traditional manner as:

an essential order of predicables, through which the intellect is naturally apt to descend from a transcendental concept by dividing and compounding to assemble a specific definition of some thing. (Lectura I, d. 8, q. 1, a. 3, paragraph 118)

A category is an ordered set of predicates, produced by the activity of the intellect, arranged according to degree of generality from a most general genus concept (substance) down to a least general species concept (human being), passing through the intermediate levels of more or less general genus concepts (body, organism, animal). Above the categories are ‘transcendental’ concepts like being, which signify the items of more than one category and are, therefore, even more general than the concepts of any one category. Below the categories are individual concepts like this human being or Socrates that pick out one and only one thing.

Category concepts are important for constructing the definitions with which we express the essential properties of things. Chatton’s particular interest are the real definitions of species concepts – “specific definitions” – and the things that those concepts signify, which are, to use modern terminology, natural kinds like human beings and roses. Specific definitions are constructed by compounding a genus concept and an essential difference concept. For example, the definition of human being is rational animal, where ‘rational’ is the essential difference and ‘animal’ is the genus; the definition of animal is sentient organism, where ‘sentient’ is the essential difference and ‘organism’ the genus. Two key semantic features, connected to definitions, were commonly ascribed to category concepts, which are (1) essential and (2) universal predicates. The terms ‘animal’ and ‘sentient’ are essentially predicable of each and every term falling under ‘animal,’ e.g., ‘cat,’ ‘human being,’ ‘frog,’ etc., precisely because ‘animal’ and ‘sentient’ appear in the definitions of ‘cat,’ etc.

Although categorial items are not extra-mental things, Chatton mentions classes of categorial things, suggesting there are things in categories and genera. He explains that an individual (individuum), an extra-mental thing, is in a category if the species concept that signifies it can be essentially predicated by all the genus concepts within its categorial line (Lectura I, d. 8, q. 1, a. 1, paragraph 93). Socrates is in the category of substance, in a manner of speaking, because substance, body, organism, and animal are all essentially predicable of human being and human being is essentially predicable of the individual concept Socrates or this human being, pointing to Socrates.

In asking how we arrive at the canonical ten categories, Chatton argues against Peter Auriol and Ockham’s view that the categories are generated by asking ten different questions of a substance. On this view, the responses to “what is it” form the category substance (e.g., ‘animal,’ ‘body’), to “how many” or “how much” form the category quantity (e.g., ‘three’), to “how is it” form the category quality (e.g., ‘brown,’ ‘curved’), to “whose is it” or “in respective of what is it” form the category relation (e.g., ‘mother,’ ‘similar’) and so on. Chatton objects to this view on three grounds: (1) we can ask many more questions of substance than these ten so the choice is arbitrary without further elaboration; (2) why limit the questions to questions about substance? Why not ask “how much” or “what is it” of quality too? And finally (3) God would end up in all or most of the categories since we can ask these questions of him.

4.2 Ontological Classes

Chatton thinks that there are ten categories and that they are those ten, namely substance, quantity, quality, relation, time, place, action, passion, position, and state or having, because there are ten basic classes of real things for which we construct specific definitions, the terms of which come out of the categories. The categories are devised to define and thus neatly map onto ontological classes. Chatton disapproves of Ockham’s contention that there are ten categories for only two sorts of things, substances and some of their qualities. To establish his ontological claim, Chatton argues for each class on a case-by-case basis, employing the Chatton Principle (see above 3.2). He had already done this in the case of relations in the earlier Reportatio, arguing that we are ontologically committed to certain classes of relational entities in order to make the propositions “a heat causes heat” or “the soul causes an intellection” and “Plato generates Socrates” true. Now, in the Lectura, he argues that we must grant the existence of substances, qualities, and quantities as really distinct from one another as well as from relations, which include not only relations proper but also the six kinds of relations picked out by the last six categories, namely time, place, action, passion, position, and state. Here is a reconstruction of his argument for quantities found in Lectura 1, d. 8, q. 1, paragraph 109:

  1. Suppose this proposition \(p\) is true: “it is naturally impossible for the quantities of two hosts in the Eucharist to exist in the same spatial arrangement at the same time.”
  2. Neither substances nor qualities are sufficient to make \(p\) true because substances and qualities, if posited, are consistent with \(p\) being false.
  3. The existence of substances, qualities, and quantities is sufficient to make \(p\) true because substances, qualities and quantities, if posited, are inconsistent with \(p\) being false.
  4. Therefore, we must posit the existence of quantities.

Chatton’s appeal to the Eucharist, where a piece of bread miraculously converts into the substance of the body of Christ, is unsurprising in the late medieval context though striking to modern eyes. Transubstantiation forced medieval theologians, trained in Aristotle’s metaphysics and natural philosophy, to think about a number of philosophical issues including the inherence (or non-inherence) of accidents in their substances but also the ontological status of quantity. Prior to consecration, the host is a piece of bread whose substance is bread substance and has various perceptible accidental qualities and quantities, e.g. being-white, being-round, having such and such dimensions, etc. During consecration, when the bread substance has been converted into the substance of the body of Christ, all the bread’s perceptible accidents remain present yet without being anchored in the bread substance.

With respect to premise (2), Chatton argues that substances, at least extended substances, cannot make \(p\) true, since there are no such substances on the altar at all. The substance of the body of Christ is present in every consecrated host, on every altar, but unextended while the extended substance of the bread is of course absent. Nor does Chatton think that \(p\) is true of qualities because qualities clearly can naturally exist in the same spatial arrangement at the same time. The very same body or parts of a body can be white and cold all over and at once. So, neither extended substances nor qualities suffice to make \(p\) true. A third entity is necessary and this, Chatton thinks, is a quantity, an entity of which it is true to say that two such entities cannot naturally exist in the same spatial arrangement at the same time. No two quantities, or quantified bodies, can naturally penetrate one another; rather, the one will push out the other. Interestingly, Chatton associates quantity principally with impenetrability rather than extension, conceding to Ockham that substances and qualities may be extended by themselves and irrespective of having any quantity. They cannot, however, be impenetrable without some quantity. This explains why \(p\) refers to two hosts that cannot naturally interpenetrate rather than one whose parts are extended to establish the category of quantity.

4.3 Natures and Individuation

The genus and species concepts that we find in the categories are what mediaeval philosophers took to be universals, which following Aristotle they unanimously agreed are what is “predicable of many” (On Interpretation 7, 17a38–b1). No one disagreed that the term ‘humanity’ was predicable of many particular human beings. The pressing metaphysical question was rather whether there is a property of being-human, i.e. humanity, that all singular human beings share or not, which would explain why it is true to say that Plato and Socrates, for instance, are human beings. The realist holds that there is some kind of universal entity – a repeatable and instantiable property – that all the particular entities or members of some kind exemplify. But since it is obvious that Socrates and Plato are both human beings and yet that each is a singular, individual entity, the realist also has to give some account of how the property of being-human is individuated so as to constitute Socrates on the one hand and Plato on the other. The nominalist, by contrast, denies that any such universal entity exists, holding instead that all entities are just particular.

Chatton wades into the debate between Scotus, a realist, and Ockham, a nominalist, most extensively in Lectura d. 2, q. 5, defending Scotus’ position against Ockham’s unrelenting attack contained in the latter’s Ordinatio d. 2, q. 6. We see that Chatton adopts Scotus’ basic picture of the metaphysical structure of substances, both immaterial substances like angels and material substances like human beings, cats, and trees. In each case, the particular entities of a given kind, for instance each and every human being, are constituted by various natures – humanity, animality, etc. – and what Chatton calls an ‘individual property.’ Also known as a haecceity, the individual property of, say Socrates, is what individuates each substantial and accidental nature such that they are Socrates’s humanity, animality, whiteness, etc. and not Plato’s, who has his own individual property that makes his humanity, animality, whiteness. his own. The nature of humanity as such is a repeatable and instantiable property but as individuated, Socrates’s humanity is not; it is utterly individual and singular. Scotus thought, and Chatton emphasizes this in the face of Ockham’s conviction that every thing is radically particular, that natures never exist as such out there in external reality. Natures either exist in extra-mental reality as individuated and singular, Socrates’s humanity and Plato’s humanity each being numerically one and distinct from one another, or natures exist in the mind as universal concepts where they are indeed predicable of many.

Chatton insists that despite the fact that Socrates’s humanity can only exist as individuated, as Socrates’s humanity and no one else’s, nonetheless if taken as such and in abstraction from its instantiation in Socrates, humanity is the sort of thing for which it is not contradictory to be instantiated by another individual, like Plato. The reason, he thinks, is that the definition of Socrates’s humanity, definable as ‘rational animal’, is intrinsically general, containing no reference to Socrates that would restrict its signification to his and only his humanity. If Socrates’s humanity were intrinsically particular to him, its definition would have to be something like ‘this rational animal’ pointing at Socrates. Yet, this cannot be the case for the simple reason that human beings other than Socrates exist and each of their humanities is likewise definable as ‘rational animal’ and not ‘this rational animal’.

The upshot of this is that there must be some kind of distinction within Socrates between his humanity as it is definable by its specific definition and his individual property (e.g., Lectura 2, d. 5, paragraph 24). In light of this distinction, it is, then, not contradictory (Chatton uses the expression “not repugnant to”) to Socrates’s humanity to be Plato’s even though it is in fact impossible for Socrates’s humanity to be Plato’s. This complicated line of counter-factual reasoning finds its inspiration in Scotus but takes centre-stage in Chatton’s discussion of natures and individuation. It is not repugnant to natures, taken as such, to be instantiated by multiple particular entities of the same kind at once. It is repugnant to natures, as individuated, to be instantiated by multiple particular entities of the same kind at once.

It should now be clear what Chatton means when he says that an individual is in a category. Socrates is the individual res whose species concept – ‘human being’ – is essentially predicated by all the genus concepts within its given categorial line – ‘animal,’ ‘body,’ ‘substance’ – and he is nothing but a set of individuated natures. Similarly, the whiteness that inheres in Socrates, whose specific concept ‘whiteness’ is essentially predicated by ‘colour,’ ‘sensible quality,’ ‘quality’ is an individuated nature. Individuals, or rather individuated natures, fall into the ten basic classes of things that are signified by category concepts.

5. Indivisibilism

5.1 Who is an Indivisibilist?

It is perhaps surprising that fourteenth-century theologians and philosophers were quite interested in the infinite, in continuity, and in the question of whether certain entities called indivisibles exist and if so how; we use the term indivisibilists for those who attest to these entities. Especially important indivisibilists in England were Henry of Harclay (d. 1317) and Chatton himself; they were the first two English figures to defend indivisibilism in the fourteenth century, a significant stance to take given that indivisibles were frequently rejected or given limited reality by contemporaries. These English indivisibilists were opposed by people such as Adam Wodeham (d. 1358) and Thomas Bradwardine (d. 1349), basing themselves in Aristotle’s Physics and in Ibn Sina (d. 1037) as transmitted through al-Ghazālī’s Maqāṣid al-filāsifa, which circulated widely in Latin translation, sometimes under the title Intentiones philosophorum. While modern people often associate the infinite with mathematics, Aristotle, Chatton, and Harclay's interests in the infinite and in arguments about indivisibles usually operated in a roughly physical context. Despite this focus, critics of indivisibilism drew freely on al-Ghazālī’s (borrowed) arguments against indivisibles, which were rather mathematical and Euclidean in character, and Chatton and Harclay were bound to respond, especially since these mathematical objections were discussed by John Duns Scotus (d. 1308), a towering figure for both men.

5.2 What is Indivisibilism? Infinite Divisibility and Continuity

It is fairly easy to give a cursory statement of what an indivisible is supposed to be in this period, and to motivate, in a general way, what lies behind disagreements concerning them. The root problem involves a collision between the discrete and the continuous. There are some things we want to see as absolutely smooth, gapless, and whole, call them continua; however, certain modes of thinking about continua force us to rely on discrete entities to measure or analyze them. A modern example might be the geometric line and any set of numbers we lay against it; it is not easy to relate a set of discrete objects such as the real numbers to the absolutely smooth line of geometry in a way that is practically and conceptually satisfying. The medieval debate reflects a similar collision of intuitions. To take the physical side of the issue first, motion seems absolutely smooth, time seems absolutely smooth, space seems likewise smooth (Aristotle declared this to be so in the Physics, and moreover claimed that as it is with any one of these three, motion/time/space, so too with the others). Again, the intensification of qualities seems smooth. So we have a handful of very important quantities that come in various magnitudes as well as processes and alterations that are prima facie continuous. Mathematical examples of continua from the Euclidian side include geometrical objects like lines and planes and solids.

However, measurement and analysis of these continua, physical or mathematical, make us want to posit discrete things, for example, locations for motion and for space, discrete instants to analyze time, points help us analyze lines, lines planes, and so on. If on the one hand such analyses are veridical, then the discrete entities might be thought to be ‘in’ the continua somehow, but how exactly? Compositionally? Only analytically, in the mind? If compositionally, then physically, or in some other way? What way? If on the other hand these discrete things do not lie in or compose or otherwise intimately relate to their continua, then how do they measure them? What else could they measure?

The stakes are not merely philosophical. Ancient mathematicians had sometimes conceived of a circle as a regular polygon with infinitely many short side lengths, and Archimedes, no indivisibilist, nevertheless declared that surfaces were composed of all the lines in them. If we think these discrete entities have an intimate connection to their continua, we may be drawn toward indivisibilism; but then we must try to say how something absolutely smooth and infinitely divisible can be related to the self-contained, distinct, indivisible, and discrete objects that constitute it or are at least in it somehow. If on the other hand we are more impressed with the infinite divisibility of the continuum we may have to reject composition by indivisibles, since while a geometrical line can be divided into other lines, points cannot be so divided.

5.3 Why Argue for Indivisibilism as a Theologian?

The theological consequences of problems raised by continua are more far-reaching and more practical than might be imagined. For example, an angel is indivisible, in some way analogous to a geometric point, but we need to say angels move, and motion is continuous, like a geometric line. Can a discrete point “move” and by doing so trace out a continuous line? Aristotle argued strenuously that nothing indivisible can possibly move absolutely smoothly. But theology requires us to assert that an angel exists in discrete place, then subsequently and successively in another discrete place, even though we cannot say that some of its “parts” were always heading to the new place because as an indivisible it has no parts. But then any angelic motion we might be imagining is not absolutely smooth, but rather jumpy. If angels are indivisible then angelic motion must be “gappy”, and Aristotle teaches us that this is not motion at all.

Chatton wrote about indivisibles and continua chiefly in the context of angelic motion, although he sometimes touched on related issues of minima naturalia, condensation and rarefaction, and questions of whether a will can sin in an instant. Other indivisibilists in his time used indivisibles to treat problems of celestial motion. All these governing contexts are fundamentally physical. Chatton would discuss mathematical issues as required, especially in the face of critique, but he advocated for belief in indivisibles in physical contexts for theological reasons; since he thought that theology needed recourse to real physics involving indivisibles, for him the concept had to be defended and rehabilitated if possible. Opposing him in this were not only many of his contemporaries, but also the authority of Aristotle.

5.4 Chatton’s (Rather Odd-Sounding) Opinions on the Continuum

When Chatton was forced by critics to wander into mathematical issues he did not always handle things skillfully. This fact, together with the authority of Aristotle’s anti-indivisibilism and the explosion of technical and theoretical power dealing with the infinite in modern mathematics have led modern critics to see Chatton’s indivisibilism as hopelessly naïve. Moreover, his Reportatio discussion on indivisibles sometimes displays confusing exposition and abrupt changes of mind, perhaps under pressure from contemporary critiques. If one reads only these texts and thinks of continua in modern terms, the negative assessment of him seems confirmed.

Moreover, his views sound odd when baldly stated. Chatton claims, in relation to the question whether angelic motion is continuous or discrete, that we must investigate the prior question “Is a quantum composed from indivisibles, either permanent indivisibles or successive indivisibles?” And his response is that, yes, quanta are composed of indivisibles, but in potentia, where in potentia seems to imply an unusual part/whole relationship: these indivisibles are not naturally separable from the wholes they compose, moreover they do not exist separately and then aggregate to compose these wholes by joining with other indivisibles in making them be one thing per se. Indivisibles are in continua, they can be said to make up that which they are a part of, but not by aggregation or conglomeration. Moreover, while God can complete the division of any finite continua, such continua themselves are only finitely divisible! It is this finitist claim that seems most baffling.

Overall, we have an odd-sounding view, and it is hard to see why someone would hold it. The best way to understand Chatton’s indivisibilism fairly is to turn from his Reportatio toward a different text and to view his opinions as a direct response to Aristotle’s anti-indivisibilist arguments. Therefore some of these arguments must be briefly exposited.

5.5 How Aristotle Attacked Indivisibles

Aristotle’s most famous arguments against the composition of continua out of indivisibles are in Physics, VI.1. His discussion is a bit disjointed. It can be difficult to untangle and arrange the pieces for interpretation, or even to know how and when to distinguish different arguments in the text. Chatton focuses on two arguments in Chapter 1, the most famous of which is known as the touching argument (Physics, VII.1, 231a21–231b10) I present the reasoning of this argument as I think Chatton understood it below.

The main conclusion of the touching argument is this:

There can be no discrete indivisible entities composing a continuous extended magnitude.

The argument is by cases, and it tries to show that these three concept-clusters

discrete/indivisible / composing a continuous extended magnitude

are completely incompatible.

Upon assuming for reductio that discrete indivisibles could compose an extended continuum, there are four scenarios Aristotle thinks we must consider. To generate them, pick any two such alleged indivisibles composing a continuum. Then these indivisibles either (1) touch a third indivisible or (2) do not touch a third indivisible. Suppose they do touch a third indivisible. Two subcases appear: they touch it either (1a) both in the same spot, or (1b) each in different spots. On the other hand, if they do not touch a third indivisible it is for one of two reasons: either (2a) they have gaps in between them, or (2b) their extremities are one.

The touching argument is supposed to show that the assumptions of each subcase pull apart the above concepts at some junction or other. In arguing through each of the subcases we will boldface the concepts which are being pulled apart or dislodged, and underline the lever being used to do it. The destabilization always comes at the expense of one of the concepts, as we will carefully note.

For case (1), the lever that pries the concept cluster apart is the concept of touching. Take supposed discrete indivisibles A and B, then consider discrete indivisible C. (It is easiest if we start by trying to imagine C in between them.) That they are all able to touch is presupposed by the fact that they are all discrete. Since it is possible, let us assume it is actually the case that A and B touch C, and consider the two subcases.

(1a) If they touch C in the same spot, then since C is indivisible, A and B must coincide, and hence cannot compose an extended magnitude, presumably because if two discrete indivisibles add nothing to the extension of the magnitude then no amount of them can produce any extension at all. In this subcase the fact that they are discrete ensures the possibility of touching, but the indivisibility of C and its being touched in the same spot undermine the claim that they compose a continuous extended magnitude. The conflict is with the extended bit. Allowing “⇔” to symbolize indivisibles touching and “=” indivisibles coinciding, we could picture the problem like this:

A=BC; therefore, A and B do not compose an extended magnitude

(1b) If they touch C in different spots, then A and B can remain discrete, but we must conclude C has more than one spot on it, hence is not indivisible. Here discrete ensures the possibility of touching, but touching in different spots makes discrete and indivisible come apart. We can picture the situation like this:

ACB; therefore, C is not indivisible

By the law of excluded middle and dilemma, discrete either makes indivisible and composing a continuous extended magnitude inconsistent, or else makes itself inconsistent with indivisible, assuming that indivisibles touch. The concept cluster is thus completely inconsistent under the assumption of touching.

What happens when we assume they do not touch? There are two possibilities and so two non-touching cases to reason through: (2a) they do not touch because they are separated, or (2b) they do not touch because they have their extrema in common. Under either assumption we can again undermine at least one element of the concept cluster.

If (2a) holds, then since they are separated, they can no longer be seen as composing a continuous extended magnitude. We can picture it like this:

A C B; therefore, they are not continuous

The problem now is obviously with the continuous bit of that complex concept; the magnitude they would compose is now ‘gappy’.

If (2b) holds then since A, B, and C have their extrema in common, they are really one, in which case A, B, and C are no longer discrete. The situation can be pictured like this (we can no longer really use distinct symbols to illustrate):

ABC; therefore, they are not discrete

Aristotle assumes from previous discussion that there are exactly three ways things can be in a spatial or temporal order, as he puts it, can be in succession: two successive items either have their extremities as one (continuous; e.g., two halves of a line) or have their extremities together (contiguous; e.g., a bronze sphere immersed in water) or have their extremities such that nothing of the same kind intervenes between (merely in succession; e.g., two houses). Case (1) above shows what would happen if two discrete indivisibles’ extremities were not one but still touched, that is, if they were contiguous but not continuous; case (2a) shows what would happen if they were merely in succession, and case (2b) shows what would happen if their boundaries were one, that is, if they were continuous. Hence Aristotle seems to feel he has captured all relevant cases here.

Let us summarize the incompatibilities. Assuming there could be discrete indivisibles composing a continuous extended magnitude:

(1a) their touching as a whole makes extended untenable;

(1b) their touching by parts makes indivisible untenable;

(2a) their being separated makes continuous untenable;

(2b) their having extremities as one makes discrete untenable.

Hence, we may conclude it is impossible that discrete indivisibles compose an extended continuum.

Notice every concept in the cluster gets its due, except the concept composing, which is never contradicted, but rather frames the whole argument; together with his discussion of “in succession” it gives us the four cases and helps insure they are exhaustive. We can detect a nice symmetry in the touching argument thus analyzed:

(1) Discrete indivisibles that touch have a problem composing extended continua. There are two ways to view their touching, compositionally speaking: (a) the first undermines the extension of the continuum they allegedly compose, (b) the second undermines their own indivisibility.

(2) Discrete indivisibles that do not touch also have a problem composing extended continua. There are two ways to view their non-touching, compositionally speaking: (a) the first undermines the continuity of the continuum they allegedly compose, (b) the second undermines their own discreteness.

Moreover, in the same chapter of the Physics Aristotle gives another anti-indivisibilist argument that supplements or works with or perhaps overlaps the touching argument (it is not easy to say exactly what he intended). Chatton tends to treat it as if it is somewhat separable, or at least as if it requires additional response. We might view it as an attempt to address the concept of composing. This second argument connects composition and infinite divisibility in continua, but in an anti-indivisibilist vein, and can be reconstructed as follows:

Everything composed of certain realities is divisible into those realities as parts, and everything divisible into parts must have those parts touching each other while they are in it. Now continua are composed either of divisible realities or indivisible realities. If into divisible realities, then these parts touch by sharing a boundary, and there is no problem; they form a continuum and are themselves divisible, in fact infinitely divisible. If into indivisible realities, then these realities must touch, and we have all the problems the touching argument brought out under cases (1a) and (1b). Therefore, continua are composed exclusively of divisibles, are divisible exclusively into divisibles, and are infinitely divisible. (see Physics, VII.1, 231b10–17)

We can distill all of this into a single statement resembling a slogan:

Discrete indivisibles have a problem composing extended continua: insofar as they are indivisible, they cannot compose anything extended; insofar as they are discrete, they cannot compose anything continuous.

The slogan makes it easy to understand why Aristotle’s anti-indivisibilist arguments were felt by many in Chatton’s time to be decisive on the issue of indivisibles and the continuum. When stated in this way anti-indivisibilism sounds almost like common sense. But Chatton thought this was an illusion.

5.6 Chatton’s Response to Aristotle in Four Conclusions

Chatton thought the touching argument could be defanged in one move. Looking carefully at Aristotle’s arguments Chatton notices that the discreteness of the indivisibles and a kind of temporal notion of composition are really doing most of the work. Aristotle is imagining what would happen if small, discrete, separated, independently existing things would come together and make a continuum; he is thinking of Democritus in particular, and of his atoms, existing in actu apart from anything they might compose. But this view has very little relevance to what Chatton was trying to do with indivisibles in theology. Although the motion of an indivisible may be problematic and needs to be clarified, the first step to getting indivisibles positively involved in the physics of angelic and celestial motion is simply to reverse their banishment by Aristotle. Chatton did not oppose the touching argument merely because he was forced to when his critics raised it against him; rather Chatton’s treatment of indivisibles denies the relevance of the touching argument because he thinks the perceived universality of its conclusion is merely illusory.

In Quaestio de compositione continui, a text which dates from the 1320’s and which contains a better organized and clearer discussion than his Reportatio of the same time period, Chatton (or possibly one of his followers) offers four conclusions, each of which sounds a bit strange in isolation, but which make sense in the context of the touching argument. First we quote him, then give some analysis that may relieve some of the strangeness:

Conclusion #1: ...I hold three conclusions. First, that no continuum is composed of indivisibles existing in actu, because there is a contradiction between the terms “continuum” and “an indivisible in actu”. This is because if there is a continuum, its parts are so related that none exists on its own, actually [in actu] separated from the other parts; but if an indivisible did actually [in actu] exist, it would have to exist on its own, separated from other parts of the same kind. Democritus says the opposite, positing the continuum to be composed from atoms, which form a “continuum” merely through a kind of congregation. Aristotle proceeds against him for this reason, but Aristotle’s arguments do not apply to someone who agrees that “continuum” and “indivisible in actu” contradict, [as I do]. (Quaestio de compositione continui, paragraph 56)

Chatton’s main concession here is that “indivisible in actu entails discrete”, and discrete does conflict with continuous, as Aristotle shows. This seems to mean that Chatton concedes the whole of subcase (2a) in the touching argument but denies its relevance. Aristotle’s case (2a) applies to Democritus, for example, but not to those who believe instead in indivisibles in potentia:

Conclusion #2: The second conclusion is that the continuum is composed of indivisibles in potentia. (Quaestio de compositione continui, paragraph 57)

Here Chatton claims, not surprisingly, that there is another kind of indivisible; these he calls “indivisibles in potentia”, which can compose a continuum. Given the concession in the first conclusion, it must be the case that these indivisibles in potentia are not discrete.

This is the master key to understanding Chatton’s critique of Aristotle. For it is the discreteness of the contained indivisible that Chatton denies, and which he views as doing all the work in the touching argument, not only in case (2a), but even in cases (1a) and (1b). This fact about the touching argument is easy to miss, since it may seem as if the conflict between discrete and continuous only occurs in case (2). But it is discreteness that insured the possibility of touching, and since both of subcases under case (1) depend upon touching to get the inconsistencies, without the assumption of their discreteness (what Chatton calls their being in actu), none of the arguments in case (1) can even get started. Hence Chatton believes he has, with these two paragraphs, dispensed with cases (1a), (1b), and (2a) in the touching argument in one go.

But really case (2b) is also taken care of, since in that subcase Aristotle simply shows that indivisibles are not discrete, something Chatton already conceded. Hence, he sidesteps the entire touching argument with these first two conclusions.

Two further conclusions that Chatton gives seemed strange to his contemporaries and stranger still to us. They are aimed at the final argument sketched in 5.5 above, the one relating composition and infinite divisibility in continua. That argument forces Chatton to take a stand on how his indivisibles in potentia compose a continuum, and on infinite divisibility in such a way that he evades Aristotle’s reasoning in that argument. His next conclusion begins the process:

Conclusion #3: The third conclusion is: while no creature could, granting the way the world actually works, complete the division of a continuum, or divide it into pieces without the part they just divided having parts of its own, or see an indivisible entity on its own; nevertheless, God could do any of these things, and he could confer upon a creature the power to do any of them as well. And why not, given that God can perfectly well make physical fire affect our souls [in hell], and can make it so that the human eye can see a spiritual creature? (Quaestio de compositione continui, paragraph 58)

Chatton’s third claim is that indivisibles in potentia are not naturally the bottom level of division of any extended magnitude. However, God can complete the division of a continuum into partless parts (indivisibles) and cause one of them, or indeed any indivisible, to be seen alone (he is thinking of angels here). Such a thing would be an indivisible in actu. This suggests that for him indivisibles in actu are, for example, what the bottom level would be if God supernaturally completed the division of an extended continuum; there is no contradiction involved with such indivisibles “being in” an extended thing or with them being the supernatural result of dividing it, there is only a problem with them discretely composing it, which Chatton already denied. The indivisible parts of true continua do not and cannot metaphysically precede them in order to compose them. Chatton in effect denies the first premise of the argument, thatEverything composed of certain realities is divisible into those realities as parts”; continua are composed of indivisibles in potentia, but divisible, and that only by God, into indivisibles in actu. This leads to a surprising corollary: God can break the geometric line into lowest constituents, but he cannot restore it from those pieces, since this is a contradiction.

What recourse does the Aristotelian have at this point? Perhaps simply to point out that however it goes with divisibility and with the touching of indivisibles, nevertheless continua are infinitely divisible, and indivisibles aren’t divisible, so they cannot be integral parts of continua. This is practically to define “continuous” as “infinitely divisible”, but nevertheless it is a powerful intuition, and Aristotle would certainly not be the last to insist on it. Chatton’s final conclusion is aimed at this last gasp. He simply denies, on theological grounds, that a finite continuum is infinitely divisible, and this helps explain the motivation for what is otherwise his strangest claim:

Conclusion #4: I say, therefore, that in all existing things there are only finitely many entities, whether of an indivisible or divisible kind. Nor could God make it be the case that infinitely many things compose any continuum in the physical world, nor could He make it the case that, in any existing thing, there are parts composing it so numerous that there can’t be more [absolutely]; but rather, [it is correct merely to say that] the components will be so great a plurality that there cannot be more in the particular thing, because [absolutely speaking] God can always make more of something beyond any given plurality. (Quaestio de compositione continui, paragraph 82)

Chatton’s final conclusion breaks into four parts:

(1) All existing things, because finite, have at most finitely many entities in them or composing them [naturally].

(2) It is logically impossible for any existing thing [even a continuum] to have infinitely many entities in it or composing it, where “infinite” means “so many things that there cannot be more, absolutely speaking”. Nothing can be an absolute plenum.

(3) It is logically possible that a given thing cannot have any more entities in it as a particular individual thing. There is such a thing as relative fullness.

(4) The reason for (2) and (3) is that God by his absolute power can make more of a thing beyond any given number of that thing. Absolute fullness would restrict God’s absolute power and so is impossible, as (2) claims; while relative fullness is self-consistent and consistent with God’s absolute power and so is possible, as (3) claims.

The upshot of these four clauses is that no finite thing is infinitely divisible into parts; no physical thing because all such are finite, nor anything else if ‘infinite’ means so much there cannot be more in it, for a given object cannot always have more in it and remain the same object, and, speaking generally, even if continuum c were composed of infinitely many entities of type e, God can always make more e’s. Aristotle’s argument connecting composition and infinite divisibility uses an illegitimate view of infinity, given divine power.

Chatton had more to say about how indivisibles touch, and his ideas were again original and useful enough that even Wodeham, his staunchest critic, was willing to apply them in certain contexts, remarking that Chatton’s arguments were a rational way to defend an unreasonable conclusion. But overall we should say that Chatton’s indivisibilism is not an organic theory of structure of continua meant to undergird mathematics or even physics, rather, it simply shows a way to go against Aristotle in order to save the theological situation.

6. Future Contingents

6.1 A Fatalist Argument

What philosophers call the problem of future contingents goes together naturally with the related and more well-known problem of free will and determinism. In the Middle Ages, as now, we really find a cluster of several related problems radiating from a single common conundrum or paradox. One important difference is that the mediaeval problem has some theological branches that today receive less philosophical attention. For example, few modern philosophers seriously consider the seeming inconsistency between veridical prophecy and the contingency of the future, or whether angels of high rank can reveal future contingents to inferior angels, but these were important issues with their own test cases in the Middle Ages. Moreover, the problem was far more stark, severe, and difficult for mediaeval Christian thinkers than for modern secular philosophers, since it was doctrinally unacceptable to solve the problem by ejecting some element of the paradox – all elements of the paradox were important pieces of Christian doctrine. One felicitous consequence of this struggle is that some very original and deep philosophy was created and employed in an attempt to find a stable solution. I will briefly present the conundrum at the heart of the matter, and then examine Chatton’s own radical and relatively original solution to the problem.[8]

Consider the following grouping of ideas, objects, and events in our universe (Chatton’s usual Latin terms for certain cognates are distinguished in parentheses):

1. necessity 8. contingency (f. sg. contingentia, –ae)
2. universal causality 9. human free will
3. universal bivalence (=every proposition is determinately either true or false) 10. contingent things (n. pl. contingentia,-um)
4. God’s foreknowledge 11. planning and working for the future
5. veridical prophecy 12. future contingent propositions (propositiones contingentes de futuro)
6. predestination 13. the undetermined future
7. providence 14. merit for good acts, freely done

No kind of strict paring between list entries across from each other on the right and left is intended here. Rather, we should notice three things. (1) All of the putative objects and phenomena on the left-hand under the heading RIGID are elements of the universe that are firm and unchanging, and their existence seems to entail a kind of immutability of reality; the world cannot be otherwise. (2) Those putative objects under OPEN, by contrast, seem indeterminate and loose, and their existence demands recognition of alternatives; the world can be otherwise. (3) It is common and quite attractive to believe in the existence of many of the elements on the left and on the right simultaneously, but it seems clear that the implications of that belief are often contradictory, entailing that one and the same piece of reality both can be otherwise and cannot be otherwise in the same way at the same time. In short, certain mixtures of these elements, right and left, are nearly irresistible parts of our total outlook on the universe, but unfortunately they seem to yield contradictions. Not every pairing of items yields a paradox, e.g., 1 and 8 do not. There can be both necessity and contingency in the world. The reader is invited to consider, however, just how many left-right pairings from these lists do seem both attractive and impossible.

There are as many possible solutions to these paradoxes as may be imagined, but there are really only three ways out; either: (1) accept the rigid element of reality at the expense of the open element, or (2) accept the open element at the expense of the rigid element, or (3) show that the contradiction between the two is only a seeming contradiction. Most mediaeval philosophers took this third approach in their solutions.

By the time Chatton was writing, it was quite common to present a basic fatalist or necessitarian argument to show that God’s foreknowledge, which seems deeply connected to his providence, is not consistent with future contingent things and events. Here is Chatton’s version of this standard fatalist argument:

Herein lies the difficulty of this question – if it were consistent with the contingency of future events that God knows future contingents, then this consequence would follow: ‘God knew that the Antichrist will come; therefore the Antichrist will come’. The antecedent of this consequence is necessary, as is the consequence itself, hence the consequent is necessary. But the [necessary] consequent ‘the Antichrist will come’ is not consistent with the contingency [of the future event the Antichrist comes]. Therefore [God’s knowledge is not consistent with the contingency of the future]. (Reportatio I, 10–48, d. 38, paragraph 2, p. 347)

Two things to note. (1) The coming of the Antichrist is a standard example of a future event that is anticipated but which seems contingent; however, there is no special importance attached to the content of the example; equally popular was the less dramatic example ‘Socrates will sit’. (2) A consequence is what we call a consecution today (something of the form ‘\(p\) therefore \(q\)’), but in this case we can, without distortion, model the reasoning by treating it as a conditional. The fatalist argues that (IF God knew the Antichrist will come THEN the Antichrist will come) is necessary, and moreover, the antecedent, ‘God knows the Antichrist will come’, is also necessary, since God’s knowledge is certain and firm. But if (IF \(p\) THEN \(q)\) is necessary, and furthermore the antecedent \(p\) is necessary, it follows by uncontroversial logical principles that the consequent \(q\) is necessary; hence we can conclude that the coming of the Antichrist is necessary, which violates our assumption that the future is open. Chatton summarizes the fatalist argument this way:

This whole thing can also be made more compact with the formula: ‘God knew that \(a\) will be; therefore \(a\) will necessarily be’. (Reportatio I, 10–48, d. 38, paragraph 2, p. 347)

This is the argument to be defeated. After brief consideration of some other views, including Peter Auriol’s, which seems to have influenced him in certain respects, Chatton draws together the threads of his discussion into a solution that is quite original and radical, but which he supports only hesitantly, not apparently out of intellectual reservations but out of fear of falling into heresy. Although his hesitation makes it difficult to pin him down, a reasonably secure reconstruction of his ideas seems possible. His solution has two parts: (1) He offers a counter-argument to the fatalist’s reasoning, and (2) he clarifies the way God knows future contingents.

6.2 Chatton’s Anti-Fatalist Argument

I present the first part of his solution as an annotated argument. First, we should state the fatalist argument generally. For any contingent object \(a\) we have:

  1. Necessarily (IF God knows that \(a\) will be THEN \(a\) will be).
  2. Necessarily God knows that \(a\) will be.
  3. Necessarily \(a\) will be.

Or, in modern notation:

  1. \(\Box(p\rightarrow q)\)
  2. \(\Box p\)
  3. \(\Box q\)

This argument is clearly valid by application of the K-axiom and modus ponens, i.e., by the K-axiom we can go from the necessity of the consequence, \(\Box(p\rightarrow q)\), to the necessity of both parts, \(\Box p\rightarrow \Box q\), and then we just apply modus ponens at line (2).[9]

Chatton rebuts this argument by denying the second premise. He claims that when ‘\(a\)’ names a contingent thing, the sentence ‘God knows that \(a\) will be’ is contingent, not necessary. His counter-argument is based on two pieces of philosophical analysis (premises 1 and 4 below), and a theory of equivalence (premise 7):

  1. To assert a sentence of the form ‘\(a\) will be’ really means either to assert: (i) that ‘\(a\) will be’ is true, or (ii) that ‘\(a\) is’ will be true. These two expositions are non-equivalent, since one can be true while the other is false. [Explicit premise. Chatton claims to borrow this analysis from an opinion that was making the rounds at Oxford when he studied there.]
  2. If \(a\) names a contingent thing, then option (i) is right out, since this would entail that there is no reason to take trouble about the future. [Explicit premise. Chatton draws the fatalistic inference from option (i) and thereby rejects that option.]
  3. Therefore, option (ii) holds: if ‘\(a\)’ names a contingent thing in ‘\(a\) will be’, we must understand the sentence ‘\(a\) will be’ to be equivalent to the following contingent sentence ‘“\(a\) is” will be true’. [From 1 and 2. ‘“\(a\) is” will be true’ must be contingent, because otherwise it is no different in meaning or fatalistic consequences from option (i).]
  4. From now on let ‘\(a\)’ name a contingent thing. Now, the sentence ‘God knows that \(a\) will be’, properly exposited, is equivalent to this conjunction: ‘God knows \(a\) AND \(a\) will be’. [Explicit premise. This analysis is Chatton’s original contribution.]
  5. Therefore the following expository equivalences hold: ‘God knows that \(a\) will be’ = ‘God knows \(a\) AND \(a\) will be’ = ‘God knows \(a\) AND “\(a\) is” will be true’. [From 3 and 4.]
  6. ‘God knows \(a\) AND “\(a\) is” will be true’ has a contingent conjunct, namely the second conjunct. [From 3.]
  7. When a proposition is exposited by a conjunction, if one of the conjuncts of the exposition is contingent, the original proposition is as well. [Implicit premise.]
  8. ‘God knows that \(a\) will be’ is contingent. [From 5, 6, and 7.]

To sum up, the first part of Chatton’s response comes to this:

  1. ‘God knows that \(a\) will be’ is equivalent to the conjunction ‘God knows \(a\) AND “\(a\) is” will be true’.
  2. The sentence ‘God knows \(a\)’ is of course necessary, but ‘“\(a\) is” will be true’ is contingent, therefore the conjunction of the two sentences is contingent.
  3. Therefore, since ‘God knows that \(a\) will be’ is equivalent to a contingent sentence, it is itself contingent.

Two remarks need to be made. First, premise 4 seems to have originated with Chatton, and he was followed in this by the next generation of Oxford theologians, for example, Robert Holcot.[10] Second, even if we accept this argument, Chatton still owes us an explanation of what the first conjunct means in the conjunction ‘God knows \(a\) AND “\(a\) is” will be true’. On the assumption that \(a\) is a contingent future thing, we can still sensibly ask, how can God possibly know this future contingent \(a\)? Chatton admits that this conjunct is necessary, but this fact, together with the firmness of divine knowledge, seems to violate our sense of \(a\)’s contingency; it seems we can just raise the problem of future contingents all over again, focusing on the left-hand conjunct. There is yet another problem. Does the fact that God knows contingent \(a\) entail that his knowledge changes when \(a\) comes into existence in time? Fortunately, Chatton is aware of these difficulties and tries to solve them by distinguishing God’s knowing a thing from his cognizing it.

6.3 God’s knowing versus God’s cognizing

Chatton claims it can still be true that God knows \(a\) when \(a\) is a future contingent object, provided we understand God’s grasp of \(a\) as divine cognition:

… [T]he larger proposition ‘God knows that \(a\) will be’ is equivalent to this copulative sentence – ‘God knows \(a\) and \(a\) will be’. This I will concede, as long as the ‘knowing’ referred to in the definiendum is taken to be a cognition. (Reportatio I, 10–48, d. 38, paragraph 28, p. 352.)

Chatton explains his idea of divine cognition by recourse to an analogy, a distinction, and a claim about all operations of the divine intellect.

Chatton’s analogy is this: cognition is to knowledge as apprehension is to assent or assertion. Just as apprehension implies the mere grasp of something without additional judgment about it, so too cognition implies the mere grasp of something, without the additional affirmative judgment implied in the term ‘knowledge’. Hence, when Chatton uses the phrase ‘God knows \(a\)’ in the above solution, it should be understood as ‘God cognizes \(a\)’, meaning that we are only talking about God’s grasp of \(a\), not about any kind of approval, disapproval, agreement, disagreement, etc. (Reportatio I, 10–48, d. 39, paragraph 14, p. 363). In cognizing, the divine intellect is somehow holding \(a\) without confirming it, judging it, or creating it. Only one part of the divine intellect is in play, not divine assent or the divine will.

Another difference between knowledge and cognition is that knowledge is necessarily of a present existent, whereas cognition does not have this restriction (Reportatio I, 10–48, d. 38, paragraph 42, p. 355). The upshot of the distinction in this context is that God cannot know future objects, for example, since they are not yet; however, he can cognize them.

Finally (and this claim he intends to apply to both divine cognition and divine knowledge), God’s knowledge and cognition are neither mediated by propositions nor are they generally of propositions (Reportatio I, 10–48, d. 39, paragraph 14, p. 363; Quodlibet, q. 1, paragraph 36). Chatton holds that God’s intellectual activity is not discursive or representative in any way, and that the usual objects of divine intellectual activity are not propositions, but rather real things, that is, res. God does not require any mediator in the operation of his intellect with respect to creation; for example, he requires no concepts or propositions in order to know or to cognize. Rather, God directly cognizes (for example) the future contingent things (res) that he cognizes, whether those things are people, the shoes on their feet, or even occasionally and somewhat trivially, the spoken, written, or mental propositions they talk, write, or think with. God sees them all through a kind of direct vision or intuition. As noted above, Chatton was a realist about relations, and since relations are accidents inhering in their subjects, for God to cognize a future res is also for him to cognize the relational accidents of that res. So, in cognizing a res, God cognizes everything about it, and so directly cognizes all the situations or states of affairs of this res as well, Thus, his grasp of it is complete. Because it has no intermediary, God’s cognition is not something separate from him; there is no determinate representation of a thing by which he cognizes. Consequently, divine cognition is, in a sense, not really distinct from God himself.

With the idea of divine cognition thus developed, we can now return to the problems we raised at the end of the last section. First, we asked: How can ‘God knows \(a\)’ be necessary when \(a\) is both future and contingent? After all, it seems the firmness of God’s knowledge of \(a\) and the determinacy of his concepts of \(a\) are a sign that \(a\) cannot be otherwise. But now we have our answer. By ‘God knows \(a\)’ Chatton means only ‘God cognizes \(a\)’, and divine cognition is (1) non-judgmental and non-voluntaristic, (2) not necessarily of determinate existents, and (3) a complete, though non-discursive, direct awareness. Consequently, when God cognizes some future \(a\), that cognition is in no way judgmental, confirming or otherwise approving of \(a\), nor does it entail the existence of \(a\), although it does grasp all that matters about \(a\). In short, divine cognition is an omniscience that does not interfere in any way with the natural operation or condition of \(a\), nor does it force \(a\) to exist, or imply it already does. The divine will is out of the picture; mere cognition of \(a\) is not causative of \(a\). Neither do we have to worry about the rigidity of some structure called ‘God’s knowledge’ and its relation to \(a\). All divine intellection is direct, and so God does not have a body of propositions about \(a\) or any intermediary concepts of \(a\) by which he cognizes it.

In short, Chatton’s view is that the necessity we detect in ‘God knows \(a\)’ attaches to God as a necessary cognizer, i.e., it attaches to the divine intellect alone, not to the objects it cognizes or to some distinct, determinate body of truths called ‘God’s knowledge’. It is almost as if, for Chatton, ‘God cognizes [future contingent] \(a\)’ simply means, ‘the all-seeing God exists and contingent \(a\) will exist’.

From these considerations we also get Chatton’s answer to the second difficulty: Does God’s knowledge of the world change when the world changes? Chatton can formulate his answer with the same notion of cognition. There is no change implied in God when contingent \(a\) comes into existence: (1) God’s cognition has not changed, certainly, since cognition is indifferent to existence, but (2) God’s knowledge has not changed either, at least not in any serious sense. For there are only three ways that God’s knowledge could be said to change: (2a) it could be that the mental proposition ‘Socrates is sitting’ in God’s intellect goes from being false to true, say, when standing Socrates sits, i.e., it literally changes truth value in God’s mind; or (2b) it could be that Socrates is now sitting and before he was not, and so before God’s knowledge contained the proposition ‘Socrates is not sitting’ but now it contains the proposition ‘Socrates is sitting’ instead; or similarly, (2c) it could be that Socrates is now sitting and before he was not, and so before God knew the non-seated Socrates which was signified by ‘Socrates is not sitting’ but now he knows the seated Socrates signified by ‘Socrates is sitting’.

(2a) and (2b) are not a problem because God’s knowledge is not generally of propositions, nor is it mediated by them. And even when it is of propositions, there is nothing special about how he knows a proposition’s shift from truth to falsity, as distinguished from any other form of change. (2c) is not a problem, because Chatton famously held that the thing signified by ‘Socrates is sitting’, is exactly the same as the thing signified by ‘Socrates is not sitting’.[11] God cognizes of every proposition when it will be true; he cognizes the “truth career” of each proposition. But he cognizes this at once, as of now. And when a proposition he cognizes becomes true, he knows it. But again, this is no change in God, who does not think discursively, but rather sees every created thing, including propositions, as res.

There are still many questions we would like answered here, of course. For example, what is the ontological status of the not-yet existing things that God cognizes? Exactly what does God cognize when he cognizes a present non-existent? These issues require a more extensive treatment than can be given here.

7. The Intellectio Theory of Concepts

In the last half of the twentieth century the most documented and discussed aspect of Chatton’s thought concerned his views on human cognition and the metaphysics of concepts. He was not especially innovative on these topics, but he had considerable influence on contemporary debates, having brought about a dramatic change of heart in Ockham concerning the nature of general concepts.

Ockham famously rejected the existence of anything metaphysically universal outside the human mind; he was an uncompromising nominalist in the mediaeval debate on universals. His rejection followed, not from his razor, but from his conviction, supported through long argumentation, that the very idea of a ‘universal substance existing outside the mind’ was simply incoherent, contradictory, or false. No adequate theory of this idea had been or could ever be given; everything outside the mind is irreducibly individual, not on account of some distinct individuating force, as Scotus had said, but simply in se ipso. On his view, the only things in reality that could in any way be truly denominated ‘universal’ are the general concepts existing in the human mind, for example the concept man or the concept white. The general concept white is universal, but only in the following reduced, metaphysically innocuous sense: white applies to many individual things.

This line of thought led Ockham quite naturally to offer an account of the metaphysical status of general concepts. To what Aristotelian category do they belong? Are concepts in the human mind substances, that is, ‘things’ in their own right, and so are in their own way as real and independent as people and horses? Or are they instead accidents, that is, not stand-alone entities, but rather modifications of stand-alone entities, the way for Aristotle tall is not a stand-alone subject, but simply a way that a stand-alone subject can be? Ockham began his career defending the first option, but ended it defending the latter. The cause of this transformation was the sustained attacks of Walter Chatton.

Ockham’s early theory of concepts, often dubbed ‘the fictum theory’, was probably influenced in some measure by the work or at least the terminology of Peter Auriol. According to Ockham’s first account, a concept is an Aristotelian substance, but not a normal material substance, such as a human being, nor a nonmaterial substance, such as an angel – such beings can be the subjects of accidents and so could be said to have esse subjectivum (=subjective being) – rather, concepts are in an entirely different class of substances, which have the sort of existence in the mind that an object fashioned by thought has, to wit, esse objectivum (the being of a thought-object), or, as he sometimes says, a concept is a fictum (=a mentally-fashioned being).

Chatton criticized this theory relentlessly, primarily on the ground that concepts as ficta are an unnecessary intermediary between the cognizer and the thing cognized, such that the cognizer would be immediately aware only of the general concept, and not of the individuals picked out by the general concept. In short, the fictum theory is not consistent with direct realism, which was a hallmark of Ockhamist epistemology. Chatton suggested that it made the most sense from an Aristotelian point of view to treat concepts as accidents, and not as substances at all. On Chatton’s view, concepts are modifications of the soul, and in particular my concept of \(X\) is nothing more than my act of thinking about \(X\). Concepts are not intermediaries that we then think with, but are rather simply our very acts of thinking themselves, i.e., my concept of \(X\) is just my intellectio (=act of thinking) of instances of \(X\). In response to Chatton’s criticism and his positive alternative, Ockham abandoned his fictum theory, at first with some hesitation, wavering between this early theory and Chatton’s new intellectio model, subsequently embracing it more fully, and finally, in his most mature philosophical reflection on the topic, even arguing against the old fictum theory. The stages of Ockham’s change of mind are well documented in the different versions of his commentary on the Sentences, and are even an important source for our dating of those different versions.

8. Virtues and Intentions

Throughout the late 1320s and into the 1330s Chatton became increasingly interested in questions of virtue and vice, the objects of moral acts, and the role of intentions in ethics.[12] Much of what he says follows or agrees with Scotus and opposes Ockham.

Mediaeval philosophers often made much of the distinction between willing or intending to do a thing and actually doing it. Let \(A\) be any action that a human being might contemplate, choose, and want to execute. Then person \(P\)’s willing \(A\) is considered an interior act with respect to \(A\), because the willing is internal to the human soul. This is meant to contrast with the corresponding exterior act, that is, the event that \(P\) actually executes \(A\). Note that \(A\) itself may be in some sense ‘interior’, e.g., let \(A =\) thinking well of my enemy. Then, although \(A\) is itself internal inasmuch as thinking takes place in my mind, nevertheless we can distinguish the interior act of willing to think well of my enemy from the exterior act thinking well of my enemy. Thus ‘interior’ and ‘exterior’ here signify primarily the distinction between choosing to do \(A\) and doing \(A\), not so much the internal and external activities per se.

It was Ockham’s considered view, evidenced in many of his writings, that only the interior act was properly regarded as meritorious or sinful; the corresponding exterior act makes no moral difference. Ockham is unwilling to allow external factors to play any significant role in moral evaluation. Chatton argues against this in many ways, the most effective being theological: for example, Christ always willed to redeem humanity, so if willing were sufficient, then his exterior act of being executed on the cross was unnecessary. Similarly, intending to confess would be as meritorious as actually confessing. However, Chatton also points out several philosophical disadvantages to Ockham’s overall position.

Ockham’s insistence that the interior act alone is subject to moral appraisal leads him to pack as much as he can into the act of will to be evaluated, and Chatton often criticized this strategy as disingenuous. For example, Ockham seemed to think of the objects of moral acts as anything the intellect needs to consider in advising the will to act, including even the circumstances under which the act is done; acts are finely distinguished with circumstances as a part of their identity conditions. For example, we cannot evaluate the internal act ‘willing to tell a lie’, since it is too general; to properly identify and evaluate this interior act we must specify it with all its morally relevant circumstances. So, strictly speaking, we should rather evaluate whether it is right to will to tell a lie to cover up a certain fact, to a certain person, to whom we are related in a certain way, etc.

Chatton opposed this view. The objects of moral acts can (and often should) be thought of in a far more reduced sense, including only the exterior action of the actor himself, which the intellect approves and which the will then wills (that is, the case of virtuous acts). Circumstances are, properly speaking, variables existing on the perimeter of a moral act, while the objects and goals of acts are, properly speaking, more intimate to the act itself. Chatton admits that sometimes, when the will has a complex object that includes temporal, causal, or locative qualifiers, these ‘circumstances’ can be said in a certain way to be an object of the act. But such conditions, insofar as they are objects of the act, are therefore not in the same way the environment surrounding the act, and so are no longer really circumstances in those cases. There are two practical implications of this point. (1) Ockham writes and argues as though in his ethics he considers only internal factors in moral evaluation, and excludes the external completely, but this result is obtained only by sneaking in external factors through the back door, and building them into the objects of the will, making them internal only by ad hoc stipulation. (2) If, with Chatton and against Ockham, we reject the idea that every act of will must include all its circumstances as a partial object, we thereby make it possible to say that some acts of will are intrinsically good (or bad) no matter what circumstances they are done in. This possibility is important for Ockhamist ethics, because Ockham insists that there is (and indeed that there must be) at least one intrinsically good act of will, which he identifies with loving God for his own sake. But if we always roll the circumstances of an act up with the intended object of the act, then it is possible to make any seemingly virtuous act wicked by ‘in-building’ bad intent, and so no act can be intrinsically virtuous. Chatton constructs this example against Ockham:

For example, when I love my neighbor for the sake of God, it is required that love of God move me toward a love of neighbor. But this fact can be understood in two ways. (1) It can be understood that the object taken as a whole is loved, that is, the entire object neighbor for the sake of God. In this case the act that has this as an object can be done malevolently, say for the sake of desirability, or more for the sake of desirability than for the glory of God. (2) Alternatively, my friend could be loved by me for the sake of God in the sense that love of God itself is the very thing that moves me and causes my love of him. In this second case the love is virtuous. (Quodlibet question 12, paragraph 14.)

Similarly, a person could love God for his own sake for the sake of something unworthy:

I say that the act of ‘loving God for his own sake’ can, as a whole, be done malevolently; therefore, in order that it be done benevolently, some additional necessary factor must be present. It is clear that this act can be done malevolently, since a person can have as his total object loving God for his own sake for the sake of money. (Quodlibet question 12, paragraph 13)

It might be objected that loving God for his own sake for the sake of money is an impossible object for the will, since good and evil objects or motives cancel each other out. But it is not clear how this affects Chatton’s point, since the human will really can (and sometimes does) have impossible objects and motives associated with it.

9. Conclusion

It is sometimes suggested that Walter Chatton was not a very original philosopher. There is some fairness in this claim, but it is also a little misleading. What is true is that he is not as recognizably important a figure today as Ockham or Aquinas, and that his philosophy tends to be negative (i.e., critical) and conservative in character, in the following respect: in many of his writings we find him attacking the novel work of others, frequently Ockham, and sometimes defending the more accepted work of others, frequently Scotus. Moreover, he did not strive to develop and set out a unique systematic view of reality, that is, a system of his own. But, in fairness, such was not the goal of philosophical theology in the fourteenth century. Moreover, as the examples above show, Chatton was philosophically quite creative, and incisive in his attacks on Ockham’s thought. So while we find no evidence of a large following after his death (there was no large Chattonian ‘school’ or ‘movement’ that we know of), he did have considerable influence well into the middle of the fifteenth century in England, particularly on those who reacted strongly to Ockham’s nominalism and semantic theory, and also in the intricate and intense debate over future contingents.


The majority of secondary literature on Chatton is in English, Italian, and French, but some important work is in German as well.

Chatton’s Works


  • De paupertate evangelica. A short treatise on the Franciscan poverty controversy. Edited in Decima L. Douie, “Three treatises on Evangelical Poverty,” Archivum Franciscanum Historicum 24 (1931): 341–69. Continued in 25 (1932): 36–58, and 26 (1932): 210–40.
  • Lectura super Sententias. This central work, dated 1324–1330, has been critically edited and published, and now appears in three volumes:
    • Lectura super Sententias: Liber I, distinctiones 1–2. Ed. Joseph C. Wey and Girard J. Etzkorn. [Studies and Texts 156] Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 2007.
    • Lectura super Sententias: Liber I, distinctiones 3–7. Ed. Joseph C. Wey and Girard J. Etzkorn. [Studies and Texts 158] Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 2008.
    • Lectura super Sententias: Liber I, distinctiones 8–17. Ed. Joseph C. Wey and Girard J. Etzkorn. [Studies and Texts 164] Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 2009.
  • Reportatio super Sententias. This central work, dated 1321–1323, has been critically edited and published, and now appears in four volumes:
    • Reportatio super Sententias: Liber I, distinctiones 1–9. Ed. Joseph C. Wey and Girard J. Etzkorn. [Studies and Texts 141] Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 2002.
    • Reportatio super Sententias: Liber I, distinctiones 10–48. Ed. Joseph C. Wey and Girard J. Etzkorn. [Studies and Texts 142] Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 2002.
    • Reportatio super Sententias: Liber II. Ed. Joseph C. Wey and Girard J. Etzkorn. [Studies and Texts 148] Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 2004.
    • Reportatio super Sententias: Libri III–IV. Ed. Joseph C. Wey and Girard J. Etzkorn. [Studies and Texts 149] Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 2005.
  • Reportatio et Lectura super Sententias: Collatio ad Librum Primum et Prologus. Ed. Joseph C. Wey, CSB. [Studies and Texts 90] Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 1989. Cited above as “Collatio et Prologus”. Not really a separate work, this is simply the most polished version of the prologue of his Sentences commentaries listed above; it may have been meant as an introduction to his Lectura, and probably dates to the same period.
  • Sermo de visione beatifica. Edited in M. Dykmans, “Les Frères Mineurs d’Avignon au début de 1333 et le sermon de Gautier de Chatton sur la vision béatifique.” Archives d’historie doctrinale et littéraire du moyen age 78 (1971): 105–148. Composed in 1333 in Avignon.
  • Quodlibet. We have only an unpublished transcription of Chatton’s Quodlibet, which is being edited by Girard Etzkorn, Christopher Schabel, and Rondo Keele. It records debates that took place in 1329–30.

Sometimes Attributed but Doubtful

  • Logica Campsale Anglicj ualde utilis et realis contra Ocham. Edited in Edward A. Synan, The Works of Richard Campsall, vol. 2 of 2, [Studies and Texts 58] Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 1982. The author is listed therein as ‘pseudo-Richard Campsall’, and his real identity is unknown. Chatton is sometimes suggested as a candidate for authorship but it is not likely his work. However, it shows his influence quite clearly, and cites his anti-razor explicitly in two places.
  • Quaestio de compositione continui. This is a defense of Chatton’s indivisibilist stance on the continuum. The textual evidence for attributing this work to him is not strong, but the Quaestio is doctrinally very close to Chatton’s views in Reportatio II, and quotes that work verbatim. It is edited in Murdoch and Synan, “Two Questions on the Continuum: Walter Chatton (?), O.F.M. and Adam Wodeham, O.F.M.” Franciscan Studies 26 (1966): 212–88.

Important Primary Texts by Contemporaries of Chatton

  • Adam Wodeham (1298–1358). Lectura secunda in librum primum Sententiarum. Ed. Rega Wood. 3 vols. St. Bonaventure, New York: The Franciscan Institute, 1990.
  • –––, Tractatus de indivisibilibus. Ed. and trans. Rega Wood. St. Bonaventure, New York: The Franciscan Institute, 1988.
  • Robert Holcot, Seeing the Future Clearly: Questions on Future Contingents by Robert Holcot. Eds. Paul A. Streveler, Katherine H. Tachau, Hester G. Gelber, and William J. Courtenay. The Pontifical Institute Studies and Texts 119. PIMS: Toronto, 1995.
  • William of Ockham. Guillelmus de Ockham, Opera Theologica. 7 vols. Series ed. Gedeon Gál. St. Bonaventure, New York: The Franciscan Institute, 1974–1988. (Cited as ‘OTh.’)
  • –––, Guillelmus de Ockham, Opera Philosophica. 10 vols. Series ed. Gedeon Gál. St. Bonaventure, New York: The Franciscan Institute, 1967–1986. (Cited as ‘OPh.’)

Secondary Sources and Older Critical Editions of Chatton

  • Adams, Marilyn McCord. 1987. William Ockham, 2 volumes, Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • –––, 1977. “Ockham’s Nominalism and Unreal Entities,” Philosophical Review, 86(2): 144–76.
  • Adriaenssen, Han Thomas, 2017. “Peter Auriol on the Intuitive Cognition of Nonexistents: Revisiting the Charge of Skepticism in Walter Chatton and Adam Wodeham,” Oxford Studies in Medieval Philosophy, 5: 151–80.
  • Auer, Johann, 1953. “Die ‘Skotistische’ Lehre von der Heilgewissheit Walter von Chatton, der erste ‘Skotist’,” Wissenschaft und Weisheit, 16: 1–19.
  • Baudry, Léon, 1943–45. “Gauthier de Chatton et son commentaire des Sentences,” Archives d’historie doctrinale et littéraire du moyen age, 14: 337–69.
  • Boehner, Philotheus, 1946. “The Realistic Conceptualism of William of Ockham,” Traditio, 4: 303–336.
  • Bornholdt, Jon, 2017. Walter Chatton on Future Contingents: Between Formalism and Ontology, Leiden: E. J. Brill.
  • Brampton, C. K., 1964. “Gauthier de Chatton et la provenance des mss. lat. Paris Bibl. Nat. 15886 et 15887,” Etudes Franciscaines, 14: 200–205.
  • Brower-Toland, Susan, 2015. “How Chatton Changed Ockham’s Mind: William Ockham and Walter Chatton on Objects and Acts of Judgment.” Intentionality, Cognition and Mental Representation in Medieval Philosophy, Gyula Klima (ed.), New York: Fordham University Press, 204–34.
  • –––, 2013. “Can God Know More: A Case Study in Later Medieval Discussions on Propositions.” Later Medieval Metaphysics: Ontology, Language, and Logic, Charles Bolyard and Rondo Keele (eds.), New York: Fordham University Press, 161–87.
  • –––, 2012. “Medieval Approaches to Consciousness: Ockham and Chatton.” Philosophers’ Imprint 12(17). available online
  • –––, 2011. “Walter Chatton.” Encyclopedia of Medieval Philosophy Between 500 and 1500, Henrik Lagerlund (ed.), Dordrecht: Springer, 1377–81.
  • –––, 2007. “Ockham on Judgment, Concepts, and the Problem of Intentionality,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 37: 67–110.
  • Brown, Stephen F., 1985. “Walter Chatton’s Lectura and William of Ockham’s Quaestiones in libros Physicorum Aristotelis.” Essays Honoring Allan B. Wolter, William A. Frank and Girard J. Etzkorn (eds.), St. Bonaventure, New York: Franciscan Institute, 82–115.
  • Courtenay, William J., 1978. Adam Wodeham: An Introduction to His Life and Writings, Leiden: E. J. Brill.
  • Corvino, Francesco, 1955. “Sette questioni inedite di Occam sul concetto,” Rivista critica di Storia della Filosofia, 10: 263–88.
  • Cova, Luciano, 1985. “L’unita della scienza teologica nella polemica di Walter Chatton; con Guglielmo D’Ockham,” Franciscan Studies, 45: 189–230.
  • –––, 1975. “La Quarta Questione del Prologo del ‘Commento sulle Sentenze’ di Walter Catton.” Rivista critica di storia della filosofia, 30: 303–330.
  • –––, 1973. Commento alle Sentenze PrologoQuestione terza, Rome: Edizione Dell’Ateneo.
  • Dumont, Stephen D., 1989. “Theology as Science and Duns Scotus’s Distinction Between Intuitive and Abstractive Cognition,” Speculum, 64(3): 579–99.
  • Douie, Decima L., 1932. “Three treatises on Evangelical Poverty.” Archivum Franciscanum Historicum, 24 (1931): 341–69; continued in 25 (1932): 36–58, and in 26: 210–240.
  • Dykmans, M., 1971. “Les Frères Mineurs d’Avignon au début de 1333 et le sermon de Gautier de Chatton sur la vision béatifique,” Archives d’historie doctrinale et littéraire du moyen age, 78: 105–148.
  • Emden, A. B., 1957. A Biographical Register of the University of Oxford to A. D. 1500 (Volume 1), London: Oxford University Press.
  • Etzkorn, Girard J., 1987. “The Codex Paris Nat. Lat. 15.805,” Archivum Franciscanum Historicum, 80: 321–33.
  • Fitzpatrick, Noel A., 1971. “Walter Chatton on the Univocity of Being: A Reaction to Peter Aureoli and William Ockham,” Franciscan Studies, 31: 88–177.
  • Friedman, Russell L., 2013. Intellectual Traditions at the Medieval University: The Use of Philosophical Psychology in Trinitarian Theology Among the Franciscans and Dominicans 1250–1350, 2 volumes, Leiden: E. J. Brill.
  • Gál, Gedeon, 1967. “Gualteri de Chatton et Guillelmi de Ockham controversia de natura conceptus universalis,” Franciscan Studies, 27: 191–212.
  • Gelber, Hester Goodenough, 1974. Logic and the Trinity: A Clash of Values in Scholastic Thought 1300–1335, Ph.D. Dissertation, the University of Wisconsin, Ann Arbor: University Microfilms.
  • Grellard, Christophe, and Robert, Aurélien (eds.), 2009. Atomism in Late Medieval Philosophy and Theology Leiden: E. J. Brill.
  • Hoffmann, Tobias, 2008. “Walter Chatton on the Connection of the Virtues,” Quaestio, 8: 57–82.
  • Karger, Elizabeth, 1996. “Mental Sentences According to Burley and the Early Ockham,” Vivarium, 34(2): 192–230.
  • –––, 1995. “William of Ockham, Walter Chatton and Adam Wodeham on the Objects of Knowledge and Belief,” Vivarium, 33(2): 171–196.
  • Keele, Rondo, 2015. “The Early Reception of Peter Auriol at Oxford, Part I: From Ockham to the Black Death,” Recherches de Théologie et Philosophie médiévales, 82 (2015): 301–361.
  • –––, 2013. “Iteration and Infinite Regress in Walter Chatton’s Metaphysics,” Later Medieval Metaphysics: Ontology, Language, and Logic, Charles Bolyard and Rondo Keele (eds.), New York: Fordham University Press, 206–22.
  • –––, 2007. “Can God Make a Picasso? William Ockham and Walter Chatton on Divine Power and Real Relations,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 45(3): 395–411.
  • –––, 2007. “Oxford Quodlibeta from Ockham to Holcot,” Theological Quodlibeta in the Middle Ages: The Fourteenth Century, Christopher Schabel (ed.), Leiden: E. J. Brill.
  • –––, 2003. “The So-Called Res Theory of Walter Chatton,” Franciscan Studies, 61: 37–53.
  • –––, 2002. Formal Ontology in the Fourteenth-Century: The Chatton Principle and Ockham’s Razor, Ph.D. dissertation, Indiana University, Bloomington.
  • Kelley, Francis E., 1981. “Walter Chatton vs. Aureoli and Ockham Regarding the Universal Concept,” Franciscan Studies, 41: 222–49.
  • Kitanov, Severin Valentinov, 2003. “Displeasure in Heaven, Pleasure in Hell: Four Franciscan Masters on the Relationship between Love and Pleasure, Hatred and Displeasure,” Traditio, 58: 285–340.
  • Knudsen, Christian, 1985. “Chatton contra Ockham über Gegenstand und Einheit von Wissenschaft und Theologie,” Cahiers de l’Institut du moyen-âge grec et latin, 50: 3–112.
  • –––,1975. “Ein Ockhamkritischer Text zu Signifikation und Supposition und zum Verhaltnis von Erster und Zweiter Intention,” Cahiers de l’Institut du moyen-âge grec et latin, 14: 14–26.
  • Knuuttila, Simo, 1997. “Positio Impossibilis in Medieval Discussions of the Trinity,” Vestigia, Imagines, Verba. Semiotics and Logic in Medieval Theological Texts (XIIth–XIVth Century), C. Marmo (ed.), Turnhout: Brepols, 277–88.
  • Martin, Christopher J., 1997. “Impossible Positio as the Foundation of Metaphysics or, Logic on the Scotist Plan?” Vestigia, Imagines, Verba. Semiotics and Logic in Medieval Theological Texts (XIIth–XIVth Century), C. Marmo (ed.), Turnhout: Brepols, 255–76.
  • Longpré, P. Efrem, 1923. “Gualtiero di Catton: Un Maestro Francescano D’Oxford,” Studi Francescani, 9: 101–114.
  • Maurer, Armand, 1978. “Method in Ockham’s Nominalism,” The Monist, 61(3): 426–43.
  • –––, 1984. “Ockham’s Razor and Chatton’s Anti-Razor,” Mediaeval Studies, 46: 463–75.
  • Murdoch, J. and Synan, E., 1966. “Two Questions on the Continuum: Walter Chatton (?), O.F.M. and Adam Wodeham, O.F.M.,” Franciscan Studies, 26: 212–88.
  • Normore, Calvin, 1987. “The Tradition of Mediaeval Nominalism,” Studies in Medieval Philosophy (Studies in Philosophy and the History of Philosophy: Volume 17), John F. Wippel (ed.), Washington, D. C.: Catholic University of America Press.
  • Nuchelmans, Gabriel, 1980. “Adam Wodeham on the Meaning of Declarative Sentences,” Historiographiae Linguistica, 8(1–2): 177–87.
  • O’Callaghan, Jeremiah, 1955. “The Second Question of the Prologue to Walter Catton’s Commentary on the Sentences on Intuitive and Abstractive Knowledge,” Nine Mediaeval Thinkers, J. Reginald O’Donnell C.S.B (ed.), Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies.
  • Panaccio, Claude, 2004. Ockham on Concepts, Aldershot: Ashgate.
  • –––, 1999. Le discours intérieur de Platon à Guillaume d’Ockham, Paris: Seuil.
  • Pelletier, Jenny, 2016. “Walter Chatton on Categories,” Documenti e studi sulla tradizione filosofica medievale, 28: 381–410.
  • –––, 2016. “Walter Chatton on Enumerating the Categories,” Vivarium, 54: 311–34.
  • –––, 2015. “Chatton and Ockham: A Fourteenth Century Discussion on Philosophical and Theological Concepts of God,” Franciscan Studies, 73: 147–67.
  • Piché, David, 2017. “Raisons de croire et vouloir croire: le débat entre Durand de Saint–Pourçain, Gauthier Chatton et Guillaume d’Ockham,” The Language of Thought in Late Medieval Philosophy, Jenny Pelletier and Magali Roques (eds.), Dordrecht: Springer, 201–16.
  • Reina, Maria Elena, 1970. “La prima questione del Prologo del ‘Commento alla Sentenze di Walter Catton’,” Rivista critica di storia della filosofia, 25: 48–74; 290–314.
  • Robert, Aurélien, 2012. “Le vide, le lieu et l’espace chez quelques atomistes du XIVe siècle,” La Nature et le Vide dans la physique médiévale (Etudes dédiées à Edward Grant), J. Biard and S. Rommevaux (eds.), Turnhout: Brepols, 67–98.
  • Robinson, Jonathan, 2014. “Walter Chatton on Dominium,” History of Political Thought, 35(2): 656–82.
  • Schabel, Chris, 2000. “Oxford Franciscans After Ockham: Walter Chatton and Adam Wodeham,” Commentaries on Peter Lombard’s Sentences, G. P. Evans (ed.), Leiden: E. J. Brill.
  • –––, 2000. Theology at Paris, 1316–1345, Aldershot: Ashgate.
  • –––, 1998. “Paris and Oxford Between Auriol and Rimini,” Medieval Philosophy (Routledge History of Philosophy: Volume III), John Marebon (ed.), London: Routledge.
  • Schierbaum, Sonja, 2016. “Chatton’s Critique of Ockham’s Conception of Intuitive Cognition,” A Companion to Responses to Ockham, Christian Rode (ed.), Leiden: E. J. Brill, 15–46.
  • Sharpe, Richard, 2001. A Handlist of Latin Writers of Great Britain and Ireland Before 1540, second edition, Turnout: Belgium, pp. 730–31
  • Slotemaker, John T., 2015. “Walter Chatton and Adam Wodeham on Divine Simplicity and Trinitarian Relations,” Quaestio, 15: 689–97.
  • Spade, Paul Vincent (ed.), 1999. The Cambridge Companion to Ockham, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Spade, Paul Vincent, and Ashworth, E. J., 1992. “Logic in Late Medieval Oxford,” The History of the University of Oxford (Volume II), J I. Catto and Ralph Evans (eds.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 35–64
  • Tachau, Katherine H., 1988. Vision and Certitude in the Age of Ockham, Leiden: E. J. Brill.
  • Wey, Joseph C., 1989. Introduction to Reportatio et Lectura super Sententias: Collatio ad Librum Primum et Prologus, Studies and Texts 90, Toronto, pp. 1–8.

Other Internet Resources

  • Mediaeval Logic and Philosophy, maintained by Paul Vincent Spade (Indiana University). (Includes material broadly relevant to Chatton.)
  • The Peter Auriol Homepage, maintained by Russ Friedman. Includes a description of the Auriol editing project, a bibliography-in-progress of Auriol studies, some Auriol texts and translations.

[Please contact the author with other suggestions.]

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Rondo Keele
Jenny Pelletier <>

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